Medieval Theories of Obligationes

First published Wed Jan 19, 2022

[Editor’s Note: The following new entry by Mikko Yrjönsuuri replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous authors.]

In discussion, one is normally expected to stick to the truth, at least as far as one knows it, but one is also expected to avoid denying what one has already accepted. These two expectancies can be understood as general prima facie duties or obligations for a person in a dialectical encounter: duties of honesty and coherence. The medieval theories of Obligationes, or “obligations” were a genre of logic that was concerned especially with the latter. These theories tried to explicate what is logically required for a coherent defense of one’s position. The basic setting in which this duty of coherence was studied, was to imagine or undertake disputations where explicit deviation from truth was allowed through some specific additional obligation laid down at the beginning. The simplest such additional obligation was to require the acceptance of some obviously false sentence that had to be defended in the disputation so that the respondent avoids denying it while allowing the force of logical inferences to constrain the answers. In the treatises, rules were laid out showing from a logical point of view how the defense ought to proceed in order to avoid denying what one has accepted.

1. Obligationes as a branch of logic

As a branch of logic, obligations came to flourish with European medieval logic from the thirteenth century onwards, and they slowly vanished when logic as a discipline, a.k.a. ‘scholastic logic’ retreated in the early modern times. During the peak period in the fourteenth century, many or perhaps even most European logicians wrote a dedicated text on obligations (de obligationibus). These texts were either stand-alone treatises or sections in overall presentations of logic. Of the former kind, treatises by Walter Burley (“Treatise on Obligations”, written c. 1302; Latin text in Green [1963], English translation in Kretzmann and Stump [1988]), Roger Swyneshed (written 1330–35; Spade [1977]) and Robert Eland[1] (written 1335–1370; Spade [1980]) have been particularly important in shaping the modern understanding of the topic. Of the latter kind, for example William Ockham’s Summa logicae (written c. 1323; Boehner, Gál, & Brown [1974]) and Paul of Venice’s Logica magna (written 1397–98; Ashworth [1988]) can be mentioned as outstanding examples.

The technique of obligations assumes a dialectical setting or even something like a game between two persons. This setting is usually very succinctly described in the texts themselves. In a nutshell, what happens in an obligational disputation is that one person, the opponent, is putting forward propositions (propositiones)[2] and another person, the respondent, is expected to give direct evaluations of these propositions as they come. There are two main answers, granting the proposition or denying it. Only rarely, the texts allow other answers like doubting the proposition (see e.g., Uckelman, Maat and Rybalko 2018). The sequence of propositions put forward and answered is taken to be a temporal sequence, but most authors thought that the truth values of the propositions are not to be taken to change during the disputation.

The sequence of propositions evaluated this way is launched by the opponent giving the respondent a specified obligation, in the paradigm case that of granting an obviously false proposition. This specified obligation must be respected throughout the sequence, regardless of how complex the sequence gets. The underlying idea is that although the specified obligation relieves the respondent from always following truth in the evaluations, the requirement of some kind of logical coherence is not suspended.

These special obligations come in different varieties. Most medieval treatments of the branch of logic are divided by discussions of different varieties. The most common is called ‘positio’, or ‘laying down’. In ‘positio’ a false proposition is laid down at the beginning of the disputation, and the respondent remains obligated to grant it whenever the opponent puts it forward. Modern attention has been mainly on positio. (On ‘sit verum’, see Spade 1994–97 and Uckelman 2015.)

Walter Burley, for example, discusses six kinds of obligations (Green 1963, Kretzmann and Stump 1988):

Positio’, where a specified proposition needs to be always granted.
Depositio’ where a specified proposition needs to be always denied.
Dubitatio’, where a specified proposition needs to be always doubted.
Institutio’ or ‘impositio’ where a new meaning is given to some linguistic item.
Sit verum’, where a specified proposition is to be taken as true.
Petitio’, where some other requirement is put on the respondent.

Of these kinds only (1), (2), and (4) are commonly addressed in later discussions of the genre, but all of them can be found in texts other than Burley’s treatise. However, for a general understanding of the technique it does not seem necessary to account for varieties other than ‘positio’.

Almost all the medieval dedicated treatments of obligations proceed through giving rules on how the respondent ought to give the evaluations, or what is to be granted and what is to be denied. The essential rules are based on the idea that each proposition put forward must be recognized as ‘relevant’ or ‘irrelevant’ in relation to the obligation given at the beginning. Thus, if the respondent is given as a ‘positio’ the proposition ‘Plato is running’, the proposition ‘Plato is moving’, and indeed any proposition following from ‘Plato is running’ is to be deemed sequentially relevant. Similarly, any proposition incompatible with ‘Plato is running’ is to be deemed incompatibly relevant: ‘Plato is sitting’ will have to be denied. On the other hand, ‘Socrates is running’ is to be deemed irrelevant at least if it is put forward immediately after the ‘positio’, since there is no logical connection between Plato and Socrates running.

The core two rules of ‘positio’ require the respondent to grant any sequentially relevant proposition, and to deny any incompatibly relevant proposition. These two rules are accepted by all authors, but under different interpretations. Since obligational disputations are technically constituted by sequences of propositions with their respective responses, what is relevant and what is not at a particular step need not be determined solely by the ‘positio’. Also, within the context of obligations, it cannot be taken as univocally given how ‘follows’ (sequitur), or the logical consequence relation, is to be understood.

The core terminology of obligations centers around ‘has to be granted’ (est concedendum) and ‘has to be denied’ (est negandum). These expressions were widely used in medieval European academic texts even outside logic, but normally with the implication that things that have to be granted are true, and vice versa, what is true must be granted. In obligations treatises, both the connection and the contrast of these expressions to truth is of special importance. What is true and what has to be granted are often not the same thing, because propositions are granted as following from the false positio, or on the basis of some other special obligation. That the terms ‘has to be granted’ and ‘has to be denied’ are used in general academic contexts outside obligations can presumably be attributed to the fact that medieval academia predominantly thought about arguments in a dialectical context. Obligations as such would not always be at issue when such terms are used. But it does seem that at least in the fourteenth century, obligations as a branch of logic was taken to address core aspects of what it means when something has to be granted in an argumentative setting.

The medieval logical genre of sophismata (see the entry on sophismata in this encyclopedia) appears especially relevant to obligations. A typical sophism in this sense consists of a case (casus), a sophisma sentence, arguments for and against the sophisma sentence based on the case, and a solution. The case is often imagined rather than real or even genuinely possible. One relatively natural way to think of a sophism would thus be to take the case (casus) as a positio in the sense of obligational disputations. Indeed, Richard Kilvington’s comments of the obligational rules in his Sophismata show him thinking that obligational rules regulate how one ought to evaluate sentences on the basis of the case (casus) in a sophisma. (See Kretzmann & Kretzmann 1990a and 1990b.)

2. Background in Aristotelian logic

The core structure of an obligational disputation is closely similar to what we find from Plato’s dialogues. In a so-called Socratic elenchus Socrates is putting forward questions, and most of them can be and are answered by ‘yes’ or by ‘no’. The sequence of questions in effect builds up an argument leading to a situation where the person responding to Socrates’ questions is often forced to admit the opposite of what was put as a starting point in the dialectical encounter. As a core background assumption, the person answering has to grant to Socrates some propositions because of other propositions that he has already granted. In a somewhat implicit form, the obligational principle that whatever follows needs to be granted is thus present already in the Socratic elenchus. (See e.g., Robinson 1953)

There are however very central differences between the medieval obligational disputations and the Socratic elenchus. Indeed, it seems possible to sum up the similarities as two core ideas:

  1. Both are dialectical encounters constituted by one party putting forward propositions and the other evaluating them.
  2. Both are taken to proceed in a form that is logical, although in the case of Plato the term ‘logical’ needs to be taken with caution for anachronism.

The main difference between Socratic elenchus and medieval obligational disputations is in what happens at the beginning. While Socrates normally challenges his discussion partner on a substantial philosophical thesis whose truth would be important to know, there is no real issue under scrutiny in obligational disputations. The thesis studied in a Socratic elenchus is never known to be obviously false, but this is the standard way to start an obligational disputation.

As is well known, Aristotle developed dialectical encounters in a strictly theoretical manner in his Topics. One question that is still open in the modern scholarship on obligations is to account for the role of Aristotle’s Topics in the development of the obligations genre in the middle ages. Medieval commentaries on Topics do not regularly take up to discuss obligations systematically (see Green-Pedersen 1984). One interesting exception is Boethius of Dacia’s commentary (written in the 1270s; Breen-Pedersen & Pinborg 1976), but the rules that he proposes for obligational disputations appear quite different from what we find from the mainstream authors of the genre itself (e.g., Burley, Swyneshed, and Eland). In any case, even judging on the basis of Boethius’ treatment of the technique in the commentary, the technique does not seem a direct descendant of the so called ‘topical’ tradition in logic.

There is another medieval descendant of the structure of the Socratic elenchus arising more directly from the Aristotelian approach to the technique in his Topics. During the thirteenth century, a number of treatises “On the Modes of Opposing and Responding” were written. (Cf. De Rijk 1980, Pérez-Ilzarbe 2011). These treatises discuss and develop techniques of winning in a disputation, or in other words ways in which the opponent can force or trick the respondent into granting the opposite of the thesis under dispute, or ways in which the respondent can avoid such contradictions. These treatises form an interesting parallel to the obligations technique, but even there the core feature of obligations – discussing an obviously false thesis – is not to be found.

Aristotle discussed various times (e.g., Prior Analytics and Metaphysics) what may happen in reasoning that starts with an impossible hypothesis, and these discussions have to be taken into account as a second aspect in which obligational disputations have roots in Aristotle’s works. When reasoning from an impossible hypothesis one is not to worry about truth but about what follows logically. This is one of the central technical issues in obligational disputations. Discussions concerning an impossible hypothesis have a long history that can be traced all the way from Aristotle to the Latin medieval period in which obligational disputations properly so called were developed. And it can also be pointed out that at the earliest stages of the Latin medieval development of obligational technique, assuming an impossibility (positio impossibilis) was one, or perhaps even the standard kind of obligation to be considered. (See Martin 1993; 1997; 2007; Kukkonen 2002; 2005.)

Judging from texts known to modern scholars, the obligational technique seems to have achieved a structured format during the thirteenth century, perhaps already in its first half. The oldest currently known dedicated treatises on the obligational technique seem to be a pair of anonymous treatises edited by L. M. de Rijk as The Emmeran Treatise on False Positio and The Emmeran Treatise on Impossible Positio. (De Rijk 1974.) De Rijk dated the treatises in his edition to the early thirteenth century, and there seems to be no reason to doubt this rough date. The rules of the technique are in these treatises almost the same as in Walter Burley’s Treatise on Obligations, which might be taken as the standard bearing treatise, written around 1302 (Green 1963; Kretzmann and Stump 1988). In terms of historical development, the obligational technique belongs to what is often called logica moderna, which built on Aristotelian logic but took clear distance from the Aristotelian texts themselves.

3. Walter Burley’s standard theory

According to Walter Burley’s presentation of the obligational theory in the species of positio, the respondent faces a sequence of propositions that he must either grant or deny, one by one. The sequence starts with a positum that is normally a false sentence which the respondent has to grant. Then the following propositions are evaluated in accordance with what Burley calls the essential rules of obligations. Three of these rules can be found from practically all medieval discussions of the technique. According to them, the positum must be granted if it is put forward, anything following from the positum must be granted, and anything incompatible with the positum must be denied. (Cf. Green 1963, Kretzmann and Stump 1988. Modern discussions of Burley’s rules can be found in e.g., Ashworth 1981; Keffer 2001; Spade 1982; Spade and Stump 1983; Stump 1985; Yrjönsuuri 1994 and 2001.)

In Burley’s formulations the core rules are as follows:

Everything that is posited and put forward in the form of the positum during the time of the positio must be granted.
Everything that follows from the positum must be granted.
Everything incompatible with the positum must be denied.

Already these rules show that the technique (in Burley’s version) is aiming at consistency in the answers. He seems to have this insight in mind when he gives later in the treatise a “useful rule” that “all responses must be directed to the same instant”, as if implying that any description of one instant of time needs to be consistent.

The above three basic rules are not sufficient, as they cover only what follows from the positum alone or is incompatible with it alone. An important part of the obligational technique is to understand all propositions put forward in an obligational disputation as either relevant (pertinens) or irrelevant (impertinens). A proposition that follows or is incompatible, is relevant, and others are irrelevant. Relevant propositions are to be answered according to their logical status, or in other words according to rules 2. and 3. On how to answer irrelevant propositions, Burley gives the following rule:

If it is irrelevant, it must be responded to on the basis of its own quality.

As Burley carefully explains, “its own quality” means what we take its truth value to be. Thus, a proposition known to be true must be granted, and one known to be false must be denied. Answering with doubt is also possible, according to Burley.

The rule concerning irrelevant propositions is generally accepted by all medieval authors writing on obligations, but in importantly different exact versions. We will come back to some of these versions in the following, but first we must make clear about Burley’s version. He puts special attention to the following question: a proposition is relevant if it follows or is incompatible, but follows from exactly what, or is incompatible with exactly what? As Burley sees it, this relevance must be determined on the basis of all answers that have been given in the disputation so far. On the first step immediately after the positio, relevance is based on following from the positum, or being incompatible with it. But suppose the respondent must evaluate some salient irrelevant proposition on the first step. Then this answer must be taken into account in determining whether a later proposition follows or is incompatible in the disputation. That is, the respondent must take care not only that he does not deny his positum but that all his answers remain consistent as a set.

Burley formulated these ideas as further clarifications of rules 2. and 3., but let us here give them new numbers:

Everything that follows from the positum either together with an already granted proposition (or propositions), or together with the opposite of a proposition (or the opposites of propositions) already correctly denied and known to be such, must be granted.
Everything that is incompatible with the positum together with an already granted proposition (or propositions), or together with the opposite of a proposition (or the opposites of propositions) already correctly denied and known to be such, must be denied.

A crucial effect of these rules is that at every step where an irrelevant proposition is answered, the class of relevant propositions expands. Burley makes this explicit through a “useful rule” that “one must pay special attention to the order [of the propositions]”. Something that is irrelevant at the first step might not be so anymore later in the disputation.

Now, consider the following disputation as an example:

Positum You are in Rome. Accepted as possible.
Proposition 1 You are not in Rome or you are a bishop Granted, true and irrelevant (rule 4).
Proposition 2 You are a bishop. Granted, follows (rule 5).

Disputation D1

According to Burley’s approach, proposition 1 has to be evaluated as irrelevant, because it does not follow from the positum alone, and because of the first disjunct it is taken to be true even if the respondent is not a bishop (apologies to any reader actually in Rome). It must therefore be granted. However, this answer makes the other disjunct relevant, because the first disjunct happens to be the negation of the positum. Thus, Proposition 2 must be granted. Indeed, by suitable selection of propositions, almost anything at all may have to be granted at the later steps of a disputation with a false positum. Burley gives a useful rule to make this clear: “when a false contingent proposition is posited, one can prove any false proposition that is compossible with it.” (Kretzmann and Stump 1988, 391.)

Burley uses the word “compossible” (compossibile). It is important to notice that at the time Burley was writing, the concept of consistency was not a standard part of technical logical language. He and his contemporaries did not speak about consistent sets of sentences, because they did not have the vocabulary. This seems like a simple reason why Burley never says directly and explicitly that all answers must stick to consistency. Instead, it seems more probable that building the concept was a part of the development in the obligational technique.

In any case, the above example and the principle that almost anything may have to be granted are not problematic in Burley’s eyes. This reflects a clear-eyed understanding that obligational disputations were not about what is true and what is not, they were about logical relationships between sentences.

4. Revisions of the rules

Walter Burley’s rules of obligational disputations can be called the standard approach, but they were also challenged in the fourteenth century discussions. All these challenges may be taken to be directed at understanding in what sense the respondent must avoid contradicting himself in an obligational disputation.

Time and modality. When discussing modalities in his Ordinatio (I, d. 38, 2), John Duns Scotus rejects a principle which he calls an obligational rule, namely that with a false positio one must “deny the present instant”. And in fact, Walter Burley (writing roughly at the same time) mentions this as a valid, useful rule. The reasoning behind the rule is the necessity of the present. For example, suppose “you are running” is the false positum when you are in fact standing in a university hall and participating in an obligational disputation. Now, if one considers the possibility that you are running, this possibility must according to Burley be referred to some other time, because of the necessity of the present. You cannot be running now since you are standing now, but afterwards you can of course run. (Kretzmann and Stump 1988, 394.)

Duns Scotus denied the necessity of the present and thought that it need not be incoherent to consider actually false propositions as possible at the present instant. That you are standing does not exclude that you are running is a logical possibility, it only excludes actual running. This kind of thinking has been found to reflect a major change in how alethic modalities are conceived. After Scotus, many thinkers thought of modalities as related to conceivability and logic, and not so much as based on being in someone’s power, or true at some time or other. That is, the possibility of a proposition became taken to be an issue unrelated to the flow of time.

This change is visible in obligations treatises. When Burley mentions denying the present instant as a useful rule, he takes up a topic that is found in the earlier treatises, but in fact not often in later treatises. It looks as if Scotus’ rejection of the rule became accepted.

Counterfactual thinking. Richard Kilvington comments on obligations in his Sophismata (S47; Kretzmann & Kretzmann 1990a; 1990b). In his view, it should not be possible to force the respondent to grant any falsities whatsoever, and the order in which propositions are put forward ought not to have an effect on their evaluation. As Kilvington sees it, the respondent should grant only those falsities which would be true if the positum were true. Kilvington gives the following example (S47, (q); Kretzmann & Kretzmann 1990b, 127–8):

Positum You are in Rome. Accepted as possible.
Proposition 1 ‘You are in Rome’ and ‘you are a bishop’ are similar in truth value. Denied, since you are not a bishop.
Proposition 2 You are a bishop. Denied, does not follow.

Disputation D2

Assuming that the respondent is not in Rome or a bishop both of the propositions mentioned in Proposition 1 are false. According Burley’s rules, Proposition 1 would have to be granted as irrelevant and true. But after having granted Proposition 1, it may appear that Proposition 2 follows and must be granted. According to Kilvington, that should not be so. Indeed, he goes directly on to generally denying Burley’s useful rule that anything false that is compossible with the positum may have to be granted. By Kilvington’s comparison, the respondent is bound or obligated by the positum “you are in Rome” to answer as he would if he were in Rome. Thus, he ought not to grant “you are a bishop” unless he is a bishop.

When concluding his discussion of the example, Kilvington describes Proposition 1 as one “that is true now and that would not be true in virtue of its being in fact as is signified by the positum” (S47, (cc); Kretzmann & Kretzmann 1990b, 131). Kilvington is thus inviting the respondent to think counterfactually when defending a false positum, and as he continues, he applies this to how one ought to answer when evaluating a sophisma. One ought to grant what would be true and deny what would be false, given the positum.

An anonymous treatise De arte obligatoria probably from the 1330s (edited and translated from a Merton College manuscript in Kretzmann & Stump 1985) seems to develop a central aspect of Kilvington’s suggestion into a complete set of rules for obligational disputations. Just like Kilvington, the anonymous author thought that in an obligational disputation the order of the propositions ought not influence the answers. The core change to Burley’s rules is that rules 5. and 6. above are revised so that instead of referring to earlier answers, they must refer to propositions which would be true if the positum was true. Thus, a proposition must be granted as sequentially relevant, if it follows from the positum together with a proposition that would be true if the positum were true. Similarly, it has to denied as incompatibly relevant if it is incompatible with the positum together with a proposition that would be true if the positum were true. The result is that all answers must be given “in accordance with how it is possible for things to be”, or “on the basis of the facts then”, as the anonymous author puts it.

This approach was not followed in later theories of obligationes. It may be that obligations were thought of as concerned with relations between propositions rather than building a description of a possible situation that could be imagined. The anonymous author’s approach requires the respondent to imagine what the situation would be like if the positum were true and give evaluations on the basis of that situation. Thus, the evaluations would not be based on the logical relations between the various propositions of the disputation itself. If obligational disputations were conceived as a tool for examining logical relations between propositions, such counterfactual thinking may not be the best way to proceed.

Accepting contradictions. There is also another direction into which Kilvington’s comments can be developed. In another comment on the example D2 above, Kilvington says that the respondent could grant Proposition 1 and deny Proposition 2 (S47, (bb); Kretzmann & Kretzmann 1990b, 131). His point is that when the propositions ‘you are in Rome’ and ‘you are a bishop’ are claimed to be similar in truth value, they are mentioned rather than used. Given that the meanings of these strings of words is not logically necessary, it might be that Proposition 1 (claiming that the two mentioned propositions are similar in truth value) has nothing to do with the respondent being in Rome or being a bishop. Thus, Proposition 2 does not follow from the positum and Proposition 1 together.

This approach is even stronger in a related discussion where Kilvington rejects what is nowadays called Tarskian biconditionals, or the equivalence between a proposition and the claim that the proposition is true. Logically, inferring that you are in Rome from the claim that the sentence ‘you are in Rome’ is true is valid only if ‘you are in Rome’ means that you are in Rome. (S47, (t); Kretzmann & Kretzmann 1990b, 128.)

It seems that in his treatise on obligationes, Roger Swyneshed developed his rules for obligational disputations with an approach like this (the text is edited in Spade 1977). Especially interesting in this respect is his discussion on impositio, or the kind of obligational disputation where a new meaning is given to some linguistic entity. According to Swyneshed, even if the respondent were obligated by the impositio that ‘you are a donkey’ means that God exists, the respondent must deny being a donkey. The proposition “‘you are a donkey’ is true” must however be granted. According to Swyneshed’s principle, “because of an impositio of some proposition the answer to be given to it is not to be changed” (Spade 1977, 254). It seems thus that the impositio influences only situations where the proposition at issue is mentioned rather than used.

Recent scholarship has found Swyneshed’s rules for positio more puzzling (see e.g., Spade 1982; Stump 1981; Yrjönsuuri 1994 and 2001). They are very clear in terms of how to answer according to them, but it seems very problematic to give a sensible interpretation to the set of evaluations to be given according to them. Swyneshed simply rejects Burley’s rules 5 and 6. Just like Kilvington and the above-mentioned anonymous author of De arte obligatoria, Swyneshed does not allow the order of the propositions to have any effect on the answers. However, he does not allow counterfactual considerations either, but rather thinks that the respondent must rely on logical relations between the propositions in giving the evaluations.

As Swyneshed recognizes, his rules may lead the respondent into granting triads or larger sets of propositions containing contradictions. In his formulation, “the conclusion must be granted that three incompatible propositions must be granted, and four, and so on” (Spade 1977, 274). The sequence of propositions in D1 above is an example of this. The respondent cannot according to Swyneshed rely on Burley’s rule 5 to grant Proposition 2. Instead, the respondent should grant a disjunction but deny both of its parts. Also, it may happen that a conjunction must be denied despite granting both of its parts. These structural combinations are explicitly accepted by Swyneshed (Spade 1977, 257).

It must be kept in mind that in each case of granting a contradictory set by Swyneshed’s rules, at least one evaluation is given on the basis of one proposition being relevant, and at least one other answer on the basis of that proposition being irrelevant. Thus, if the evaluations of irrelevant propositions were not allowed to be mixed with evaluations of relevant ones, these contradictions would not arise. However, it seems that this is not how Swyneshed thought about the rules, since he explicitly allows the contradictions without discussing the idea of two domains of interpretation.

In the context of obligations, Swyneshed does not say that it would be acceptable to grant or deny a contradictory pair of propositions in the same disputation: he discusses contradictory triads, not pairs. However, in his discussion on the Liar’s paradox, he goes as far as explicitly accepting that in some cases both contradictories are false (cf. Read 2020). This shows that Swyneshed’s understanding of what contradictions are and how they behave in logic is somewhat outside the logical mainstream. Thus, it may be that further study may shed more light on how exactly he thought about allowing contradictions in obligational evaluations of sets of propositions.

Historically, it seems that counterfactual thinking as an approach to obligations was mainly rejected, but Swyneshed’s approach garnered some following. Both of these approaches appear to take issue with Burley’s principle that the order of propositions has crucial significance in how they are to be evaluated. Since Swyneshed’s way of rejecting this principle found some followers, this fact may signal that his approach was taken to be closer to what really is at issue in obligations as a genre of logic. However, generally speaking Burley’s approach became the mainstream towards the end of the fourteenth century. Perhaps, taking the order of propositions into account was taken to be less problematic than Swyneshed’s acceptance of contradictory triads.

5. Winning the game

If we look at obligational disputations from the modern logical point of view, it may appear hard to understand how the sequence of answers should be understood. One tempting alternative would be to think that the idea would be to describe a counterfactual situation. As pointed out above, this may be what Kilvington and the anonymous author were aiming at. (See also Spade 1982, 1992, and 1993.) However, the mainstream of medieval authors writing on obligations did not accept their approach.

The mainstream understanding of the current research into the obligations treatises seems to emphasize in different ways that according to the standard approach (exemplified here by Burley’s rules) the set of all answers will be consistent. Thus, it may seem reasonable to understand obligational disputations as a kind of consistency maintenance game. Given that in modern logic the concept of a possible world is often understood in terms of what a potentially infinite consistent set of sentences describes, the sequence of answers in an obligational disputation can perhaps be interpreted as an expanding description of a possible world.

The problem with this interpretation is that it does not fit Swyneshed’s rules, which were accepted by some authors as a viable alternative to Burley’s approach. As the rules stand, the set of all answers cannot be understood as a description of a possible world, because it need not be consistent. The set of answers to relevant propositions is consistent even according to Swyneshed’s rules, but understanding that set as describing a possible world runs into the difficulty that that set does not expand from the logical closure of the positum, and thus it does not describe any possible world more fully than the positum alone.

A crucial feature of the Socratic elenchus is that the answerer is led to deny what has already been granted. Avoiding it to happen that the respondent denies the positum is a central objective in an obligational disputation, and Burley’s rules appear to require that this objective is achieved through a consistent sequence of answers. Swyneshed allows contradictory triads. In other words, the set of answers may become inconsistent but the respondent is not allowed to grant any “contradictory incompatible with the positum” (Spade 1977, 274). It appears that even in Swyneshed’s case a crucial interest is to explicate logical relations between the propositions put forward by the opponent, and especially as they relate to the positum. As a general description of what obligational disputations were about, consistency may not be exactly the right word. Perhaps it would be more exact to describe obligations as aiming at a dynamic understanding of logical relations within a set of propositions.

The square of opposition was an important tool in Aristotelian logic for understanding contradiction and other relations between pairs of assertoric predicative propositions formed with the same categorematic terms. As has been recognized, John Buridan and other logicians expanded this theory to the octagon of opposition to cover also modal propositions. Obligational disputations can be understood as an expansion into another direction. An obligational disputation abstracts from the predication as the standard form of proposition and turns from the binary logical relations into examining logical relations within a dynamically constructed sequence of propositions. (Cf. especially Dutilh Novaes 2005; 2007; 2011; Dutilh Novaes and Uckelman 2016; Strobino 2011; Uckelman 2013; Yrjönsuuri 2000; 2015.)

In his discussion of obligationes from the very end of the fourteenth century, Paul of Venice compares obligations with another genre of logic, saying that “the matter of obligations is only the matter of consequences in a more subtle style” (Paul of Venice in Ashworth 1988, 32). One aspect of what Paul of Venice means by this statement is presumably that both obligations and consequences are concerned with non-syllogistic logic. To this extent, this description of the theory of obligationes seems correct even from the modern vantage point. However, it does not seem quite right to think that an obligational disputation would try to spell out the logical relation between an antecedent and a consequent, or even a set of premises and a conclusion. The logical relations considered in an obligational disputation are not distinctively binary. It seems that they are often approached as logical relations becoming explicit only in a dynamic sequence of three or more propositions.


Primary Literature

  • Anonymous (early 13th century), “The Emmeran treatise on false Positio”. Edited in De Rijk 1974, 103–117. Translation in Yrjönsuuri 2001, 199–215.
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  • Eland, Robert, “Obligationes”. Edited in Spade 1980, 46–60.
  • John of Holland, “Obligationes”. Edited in Bos 1985, 87–121.
  • John of Wesel, “Quaestiones super obligationibus”. Edited in Spade 1996, 10–22.
  • Kilvington, Richard, Sophismata. Edited in Kretzmann & Kretzmann 1990a. Translation in Kretzmann & Kretzmann 1990b.
  • Lavenham, Richard, “Obligationes”. Edited in Spade 1978, 226–241.
  • Martinus Anglicus, “De obligationibus”. Edited and translated to German in Schupp 1993.
  • Nicholas of Paris (?), “Obligationes”. Edited in Braakhuis 1998, 169–233.
  • Paul of Pergula, Logica and Tractatus de Sensu Composito et Diviso. Edited in Brown 1961.
  • Paul of Venice, “Tractatus de obligationibus”. Edited and translated in Ashworth 1988.
  • Swyneshed, Roger, “Obligationes”. Edited in Spade 1977, 249–285.
  • Tarteys, John, “Obligationes”. Edited in Ashworth 1992.
  • William of Ockham, “Obligationes”. Edited in Boehner, Gál, and Brown 1974 (ch. III-3, 38–45).
  • William of Sherwood, “Tractatus de obligationibus”. Edited in Green 1963.

Modern Editions and Translations

  • Ashworth, E. Jennifer (ed. and trans.), 1988. Logica Magna: Secunda Pars. Tractatus de obligationibus (= Part II, Fascicule 8.) (Paul of Venice). Oxford: Oxford University Press for the British Academy. (“The British Academy: Classical and Medieval Logic Texts,” vol. 5.)
  • –––, 1992. “The Obligationes of John Tarteys: Edition and Introduction,” Documenti e Studi sulla Tradizione Filosofica Medievale, 3: 653–703.
  • Bos, E. P. (ed.), 1985. Four Tracts on Logic (John of Holland), Nijmegen: Ingenium.
  • Braakhuis, H.A.G., 1998. “Obligations in Early Thirteenth Century Paris: The Obligationes of Nicholas of Paris (?) (Ms. Paris, 11.412),” Vivarium, 36: 152–233.
  • Brown, M.A. (ed.), 1961, Logica and Tractatus de Sensu Composito et Diviso (Paul of Pergula), St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute.
  • De Rijk, Lambert M., 1974. “Some Thirteenth Century Tracts on the Game of Obligation. I,” Vivarium, 12: 94–123.
  • –––, 1975. “Some Thirteenth Century Tracts on the Game of Obligation. II,” Vivarium, 13: 22–54.
  • –––, 1976. “Some Thirteenth Century Tracts on the Game of Obligation. III,” Vivarium, 14: 26–42.
  • –––, 1980. Die mittelalterlichen Tractate De modo opponendi et respondendi. Einleitung und Ausgabe der einschlägigen Texte. (Beiträge zur Geschichte der Philosophie und Theologie des Mittelalters, Neue Folge, 17.) Münster: Aschendorff.
  • Green, Romuald, 1963. “An Introduction to the Logical Treatise De obligationibus, with Critical Texts of William of Sherwood [?] and Walter Burley,” 2 vols. Doctoral dissertation. Katholieke Universiteit Leuven. A revised version of this essential but unpublished dissertation has been widely circulated in manuscript form under the title The Logical Treatise ‘De obligationibus’: An Introduction with Critical Texts of William of Sherwood and Walter Burley.
  • Green-Pedersen, N.J. and J. Pinbord (eds.), 1976. Questiones super librum Topicorum, (Boethius of Dacia), Corpus Danicorum Medii Aevi, 6, Copenhagen: Gad.
  • Kretzmann, Norman and Barbara Ensign Kretzmann (eds.), 1990a. The Sophismata of Richard Kilvington, Oxford: Oxford University Press. (“Auctores Britannici Medii Aevi,” vol. 12.) Latin edition. Translated in Kretzmann & Kretzmann 1990b.
  • ––– (eds. and trans.), 1990b. The Sophismata of Richard Kilvington, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press; this is a translation of Kilvington 1990a, with commentary.
  • Kretzmann, Norman, and Eleonore Stump, 1985. “The Anonymous De arte obligatoria in Merton College MS. 306,” in E. P. Bos (ed.), Medieval Semantics and Metaphysics: Studies Dedicated to L. M. de Rijk, Ph.D., Professor of Ancient and Mediaeval Philosophy at the University of Leiden on the Occasion of His 60th Birthday, Nijmegen: Ingenium, pp. 239–80. (“Artistarium,” Supplementa, vol. 2.)
  • ––– (eds.), 1988. The Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical Texts, volume 1: Logic and the Philosophy of Language, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Pozzi, L., 1990. La coerenza logica nella teoria medievale delle obbligazioni. Con l’edizione del trattato ‘Obligationes’ di Guglielmo Buser. Parma: Zara.
  • Schupp, F. 1993. Martinus Anglicus De obligationibus, Textkritisch herausgegeben, übersetzt, eingeleitet und kommentiert von Franz Schupp. Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag.
  • Spade, Paul Vincent, 1977. “Roger Swyneshed’s Obligationes: Edition and Comments,” Archives d’histoire doctrinale et littéraire du moyen âge, 44: 243–85. Reprinted with the same pagination in Spade 1988, item XVI.
  • –––, 1978. “Richard Lavenham’s Obligationes: Edition and Comments,” Rivista critica di storia della filosofia, 33: 225–42.
  • –––, 1980. “Robert Fland’s Obligationes: An Edition,” Mediaeval Studies, 42: 41–60.
  • Spade, P. V. and Wilson, G., 1995. Richard Brinkley’s Obligationes. A Late Fourteenth Century Treatise on the Logic of Disputation. Aschendorff, Münster.
  • Boehner, Philotheus, Gedeon Gál and Stephen Brown (eds.), 1974, Summa logicae (William of Ockham), St. Bonaventure, Ny: The Franciscan Institute. (“Opera philosophica,” vol. 1.)
  • Yrjönsuuri, Mikko, 2001. Medieval Formal Logic: Consequences, Obligations and Insolubles (New Synthese Historical Library, 49), Dordrecht: Kluwer.

Secondary Literature

  • Ashworth, E. J., 1981. “The Problem of Relevance and Order in Obligational Disputations: Some Late Fourteenth Century Views,” Medioevo, 7: 175–193.
  • Dutilh Novaes, C., 2005. “Medieval Obligationes as Logical Games of Consistency Maintenance,” Synthese, 145(3): 371–395.
  • –––, 2007. Formalizing Medieval Logical Theories: Suppositio, Consequentiae and Obligationes (Logic, Epistemology, and the Unity of Science: Volume 7), Dordrecht: Springer.
  • –––, 2011. “Medieval Obligationes as a Theory of Discursive Commitment Management,” Vivarium, 49: 240–257.
  • Dutilh Novaes, Catarina, and Uckelman, Sara, 2016. “Obligationes”, in Catarina Dutilh Novaes and Stephen Read (eds.), Cambridge Companion to Medieval Logic, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 370–395.
  • Green-Pedersen, Niels Jørgen, 1984. The Tradition of Topics in the Middle Ages. The Commentaries on Aristotle’s and Boethius’ ‘Topics’, München: Philosophia Verlag.
  • Keffer, Hajo, 2001. De obligationibus: Rekonstruktion einer spätmittelalterlichen Disputationstheorie, Leiden: Brill
  • Kukkonen, Taneli, 2002. “Alternatives to Alternatives: Approaches to Aristotle’s Arguments per impossibile,” Vivarium, 40: 137–173.
  • –––, 2005. “The Impossible, insofar as it is possible: Ibn Rushd and Buridan on Logic and Natural Theology,” in D. Perler & U. Rudolph (eds.), Logik und Theologie: Das Organon im Arabischen und im Lateinischen Mittelalter, Leiden: Brill, pp. 447–467.
  • Martin, Christopher J., 1993. “Obligations and Liars,” in S. Read (ed.), Sophisms in Mediaeval Logic and Grammar: Acts of the Ninth European Symposium for Medieval Logic and Semantics, held at St Andrews, June 1990 (Nijhoff International Philosophy Series: Volume 48), Dordrecht: Kluwer, pp. 357–81; revised version in Martin 1999.
  • –––, 1997. “Impossible Positio as the Foundation of Metaphysics or, Logic on the Scotist Plan?” in Constantino Marmo (ed.), Vestigia, Imagines, Verba: Semiotics in Medieval Theological Texts (XIIIth–XIVth Century), Turnhout: Brepols, pp. 255–77; revised version in Martin 1999.
  • –––, 1999. Theories of Inference and Entailment in the Middle Ages (Volume I), Ph.D. dissertation, Princeton University (UMI #9948627); includes revised versions of Martin 1993 and 1997.
  • –––, 2007. “Disputing about Disputing: The Medieval Procedure of Impossible Position and the Debate over the Nature of Logic and the Foundations of Metaphysics” in M. Dascal, H. Chang (eds.), Traditions of Controversy, Amsterdam: John Benjamins, pp. 151–164.
  • Pérez-Ilzarbe, Paloma, 2011. “Disputation and Logic in the Medieval Treatises De Modo Opponendi et Respondendi,” Vivarium, 49: 127–149.
  • Read, Stephen, 2020. “Swyneshed, Paradox and the Rule of Contradictory Pairs,” Logica Universalis, 14: 27–50
  • Robinson, Richard, 1953. Plato’s Earlier Dialectic, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Spade, Paul Vincent, 1982. “Three Theories of Obligationes: Burley, Kilvington and Swyneshed on Counterfactual Reasoning,” History and Philosophy of Logic, 3: 1–32; reprinted with the same pagination in Spade 1988, item XVII.
  • –––, 1988. Lies, Language and Logic in the Late Middle Ages, London: Variorum Reprints.
  • –––, 1992. “If Obligationes Were Counterfactuals,” Philosophical Topics, 20: 171–88.
  • –––, 1993. “Opposing and Responding: A New Look at Positio,” Medioevo: Rivista di storia della filosofia medievale, 19: 233–70.
  • –––, 1994–97. “The Logic of ‘Sit verum’ in Richard Brinkley and William of Ockham,” Franciscan Studies, 54: 227–50.
  • Spade, Paul Vincent, and Stump, Eleonore, 1983. “Walter Burley and the Obligationes Attributed to William of Sherwood,” History and Philosophy of Logic, 4: 9–26.
  • Strobino, Riccardo, 2011. “Contexts of Utterance and Evaluation in Peter of Mantua’s Obligationes,” Vivarium, 49(1–3): 275–299.
  • Stump, Eleonore, 1981. “Rober Swyneshed’s Theory of Obligations,” Medioevo: Rivista di storia della filosofia medievale, 7: 135–74; reprinted in Stump [1989], pp. 215–49.
  • –––, 1982. “Obligations: From the Beginning to the Early Fourteenth Century,” in N. Kretzmann, et al. (eds.) 1982 (Part A, Chap. 16), pp. 315–34.
  • –––, 1985. “The Logic of Disputation in Walter Burley’s Treatise on Obligations,” Synthese, 63: 335–74; reprinted under the title “Walter Burley on Obligations” in Stump 1989, pp. 195–213.
  • –––, 1989. Dialectic and Its Place in the Development of Medieval Logic, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Uckelman, Sara, 2013. “Medieval Disputationes de obligationibus as Formal Dialogue Systems,” Argumentation, 27(2): 143–166.
  • –––, 2015. “Sit Verum Obligationes and Counterfactual Reasoning,” Vivarium, 53(1): 90–113.
  • Uckelman, S. L., Maat, J., and Rybalko, K., 2008. “The Art of Doubting in Obligationes Parisienses,” available at Uckelman, Maat, & Rybalko 2008 available online.
  • Yrjönsuuri, Mikko, 1994. Obligationes: 14th Century Logic of Disputational Duties (Acta Philosophica Fennica, 55), Helsinki: Societas Philosophica Fennica.
  • –––, 1998. “The Compossibility of Impossibilities and Ars obligatoria,” History and Philosophy of Logic, 19: 235–48.
  • –––, 2000. “Disputations, Obligations and Logical Coherence,” Theoria, 66: 205–23.
  • –––, 2009. “Commitment to Consistency,” in Sintonen (ed.), The Socratic Tradition: Questioning as Philosophy and as Method (Texts in Philosophy: Volume 10), London: College Publications.
  • –––, 2015. “Obligations and Conditionals,” Vivarium, 53(2–4): 322–335

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