Notes to Philippa Foot

1. The arguments in “Moral Beliefs” have a noticeable affinity with Wittgenstein’s Private Language argument as well as his arguments about pain. See Wittgenstein 1953 [2009: §243–307].

2. For an extended discussion of Foot’s early views on the rationality of morality, see Lawrence 1995.

3. She states that her early views falter over the question of justice because one must be ready, out of justice, to go against one’s own interests (VV xv). Yet as Lawrence points out in “The Rationality of Morality” (1995: 109–110), Foot’s early views took account of this fact and mounted a defense of justice in terms of its general contribution to our self-interest, rather than its contribution in each and every case. She never argues that this sort of defense is inappropriate, only that she realized that she need not provide such a defense.

4. Hence, though Michael Smith takes himself to be arguing against Foot in claiming that normative reason claims cannot all be hypothetical imperatives, Foot in fact agrees with this claim (Smith 1994: 174).

5. Given Foot’s views on Rescue II, she clearly endorses a much stronger weighting in favor of negative rights such that it is not permissible to kill one person to save five.

6. I am here drawing on Julia Annas’ distinction between “the circumstances of a life” and the “living of a life” (see Annas 2011: 92).

7. Thomas Aquinas advocates a more detailed division among the acquired virtues, with ‘virtues of the will’ covering justice and its subsidiary virtues, while temperance and fortitude the virtues of the sensitive appetite, specifically the concupiscible and irascible appetites respectively. See Summa Theologiae I–II, Q60. Foot takes ‘virtues of the will’ broadly, covering virtues that are concerned with choice.

8. Portions of this section were published previously; see Hacker-Wright 2009 and see also 2012, 2013a.

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John Hacker-Wright <>

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