Notes to Prediction versus Accommodation

1. Citing this passage, Achinstein (1994: 163; 2001: Ch.10) argues that predictivism’s appearance of plausibility is illusory, and can be explained away by citing other factors, such as the selection procedure used to generate the evidence. Howson articulates a similar ‘Keynesian dissolution’ of predictivism, cf. Section 7 below.

2. Mish, Fred (ed.), 1998, Merriam-Webster’s Collegiate Dictionary, tenth edition, Springfield, MA: Merriam-Webster, Inc.

3. Thomason 1992 is a detailed and skeptical assessment of Lakatosian heuristics, employing Zahar’s conception of novelty, applied to the Copernican research programme.

4. Worrall represents his subsequent account of predictivism, described in Section 6.5 below, as a development of the heuristic notion he sketched in these early papers.

5. Using concepts to be explained in the next section, Gardner thus endorses a strong predictivism with respect to heuristic novelty and a weak predictivism with respect to knowledge-based novelty (and by implication temporal novelty), as knowledge-based novelty (and thus temporal novelty) is conclusive evidence of heuristic novelty.

6. Leplin’s (1997) conception of novelty (cf. Section 8 below) includes the Uniqueness condition—which is an instance of such a comparative conception of novelty. Harker (2010) deploys such a comparative conception of novelty in his articulation of an argument for selective scientific realism.

7. Maher clarifies that his intended notion of novelty is heuristic (1993: 329).

8. A somewhat similar theory of predictivism is provided in Kahn, Landsberg and Stockman (1990) which argues that predictive success confirms that a scientist is ‘talented’ and thus more likely to endorse a good theory.

9. Thus recall Zahar’s ‘ad hoc3’ which

is obtained from its predecessor through a modification of the auxiliary hypotheses which does not accord with the spirit of the heuristic of the programme. (1973: 101)

10. In a somewhat similar vein Barnes (1996b, 2008: Ch. 5) studies the diminishing impact of predictive success when large numbers of predictions are made.

11. ‘Retrograde motion’ refers to the observed relative position of the planets against the fixed stars—a planet’s motion (observed over a sequence of nights) relative to the stars will periodically cease, reverse direction, and then resume its original direction.

12. Barnes (2008: Ch. 2) argues for a similar claim—compare also Lipton’s distinction between ‘assessed support’ and ‘actual support’ (cf. Section 6.2).

13. This is what Schindler (2014: 67) calls ‘symptomatic predictivism’.

14. Howson (1984: 249) offers a similar example equating h with Newtonian gravitational theory, h′ with General Relativity, e a description of Mercury’s solar orbit, and \(h(a_0)\) with an adjusted version of Newtonian gravitational theory which includes a postulated solar oblateness which is fixed to explain e. The claim again is that h′ independently predicts e while h merely accommodates it—the result is that h is better confirmed by e than \(h(a_0)\).

15. Likewise, Schlesinger (1987) roundly rejects temporal and heuristic predictivism, but it seems clear that it is the strong versions of predictivism he is rejecting.

16. For a summary of some of Brush’s research see Brush 1994.

17. Much literature on this topic discusses the relevance of ‘predictive success’ or ‘empirical success’ to inferences of theory truth without stipulating or emphasizing a special role for novel success—in this section the focus is on literature that emphasizes a critical role for novelty.

18. It has been noted that the ultimate argument commits the base rate fallacy if it appeals to empirical success (including novel success) as an argument for theory truth in the absence of information about the frequency at which true theories are proposed among the totality of proposed theories (Magnus & Callender 2004). For discussion see Dicken 2013; Menke 2014; Henderson 2017; and Dawid & Hartman 2017.

19. Kitcher 1993: Ch. 5 contains a similar argument regarding nineteenth century optical theory but does not specifically emphasize the role of novel success. For critical discussion of relevant issues see Chang 2003; Stanford 2006; Harker 2010; and Leconte 2017.

Copyright © 2018 by
Eric Christian Barnes <>

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