Divine Providence

First published Wed Aug 1, 2001; substantive revision Wed Jan 25, 2017

Traditional theism holds that God is the creator of heaven and earth, and that all that occurs in the universe takes place under Divine Providence — that is, under God’s sovereign guidance and control. According to believers, God governs creation as a loving father, working all things for good. Moreover, it is said, God is an absolutely perfect being. He is, first of all, omniscient or all-knowing: he knows of all truths that they are true, and of all falsehoods that they are false, whether they pertain to past, present or future. And God’s knowledge does not change. Nothing is learned or forgotten with him; what he knows, he knows from eternity and infallibly. Second, God is omnipotent or all-powerful: anything that is logically possible, he can do. Finally, God is perfectly good: in all circumstances he acts for the best, intending the best possible outcome. Given these suppositions, our initial expectation would be that all of creation, animate and inanimate, is ordained to perfect good: that as creator God pitches his efforts, which none can resist, toward accomplishing the greatest good imaginable, and hence that the world in which we find ourselves is, as Leibniz put it, the best of all possible worlds. But alas, the evidence is otherwise. The world may contain much good, but it is also a place of suffering, destruction, and death. Life is brief, and afflicted with sorrows of every kind—as often as not with no discernible purpose at all, much less a good one. And it ends for each of us in personal destruction—in death, which trumps all worldly hopes, and conceals impenetrably any experience that may lie beyond. Nor are these mere human hardships. Every living thing dies, all that is beautiful perishes, everything nature builds is destroyed. Indeed, on one scientific account of the end of things not an atom, not a photon will escape the cauldron of the universe’s final collapse. And that is not all. In human affairs there is the additional evil of sin: the willful wrongdoing of which we all are at times victims and at other times perpetrators. How can all of this be, if God’s nature is as tradition postulates?

1. Logical Consistency and Inductive Evidence

What is described above is the problem of evil. Because evil poses the most difficult problems for traditional views of divine providence, this discussion will be organized around the theme of evil. In its classical formulation, the problem of evil is a problem of logical consistency. The opponent of theism alleges that a triad of properties traditionally held to belong to God’s nature — omniscience, omnipotence and omnibenevolence — are not jointly consistent with the existence of evil in the world. An omniscient God, we must assume, would have knowledge of the evil in the world. An omnibenevolent God would desire to halt or prevent it, and an omnipotent God should be able to do so. Yet evil is rife. It must be, then, that God lacks at least one of the triad of attributes, and perhaps all of them. Perhaps as creator he is somewhat in the dark as to what evils may occur, and once they appear it is too late to forestall them. On the other hand, it may be that evil is endemic — built into the structure of any world, so that even God is powerless to prevent it. Or, maybe he just doesn’t care, and has long since turned his attention to projects more interesting than nurturing our feeble destinies. Whatever the reason, the argument runs, he is not the God of Abraham, of Jesus, and of Mohammed. Their God simply would not permit wanton wrongdoing, nor would he allow the suffering and duress under which all creation labors. So while the presence of evil in the world does not serve to prove there is no God at all, it does show there is no God of the kind adumbrated in religious tradition.

The logical problem of evil may be countered with a logical rejoinder. The fact is that the three perfections described above are not by themselves sufficient to exclude the existence of evil in creation. To get that result we have to add a crucial premise to the argument put forth by opponents of theism: that there can be no justification for evil, no good reason why a God with the attributes in question would create a world that contained it. But why suppose this is so? Perhaps there is some good or goods that are possible only in a world that contains or at least permits evil, and without which creation would be vastly inferior to what it is. If that were true, then an all-good and all-loving God would not shrink from creating a world that contained the evil necessary for that good or goods to be achieved.[1] So there is no final inconsistency here, and the theist may wish to conclude on that basis that the problem of evil is resolved. But not yet. For the opponent may concede that the presence of evil in the world does not entail that there is no God of the kind religious tradition postulates. Still, he may hold, it gives us good inductive reason for thinking there is no such God. The pervasiveness and profundity of the evil that occurs, the fact that it so often falls upon the innocent and helpless, and the simple fact that we can see no good coming from most of it are more than enough reason, according to this argument, for any rational person to reject the God of tradition. What good could possibly justify the Holocaust, or wholesale destruction of civilian populations in war? Or, lest the numbers submerge the agony, consider just a single case of innocent suffering, posed by William Rowe: a fawn burned horribly in a forest fire somewhere removed from any human awareness, doomed to days of lingering suffering before inevitable death (1979, 337). We are unable to discern any good coming from this single instance of evil, and the same could doubtless be said for millions of others. What more reason could a rational person demand for rejecting the God of our fathers?

This so-called inductive or evidential argument from evil may be met with a response similar to the one directed against the logical argument, for the fact is that it too involves assumptions which, when brought to light, seem questionable. It assumes that for each instance of evil that occurs, we humans will be able to detect any good toward which it might be directed, and that we will be able to tell whether the good is achieved, whether it was worth the evil sustained in reaching it, and whether it could better have been achieved without the attendant evil. Again, however, why assume any of this is so? It is not obvious, in the first place, that goods and evils are commensurable in the way this argument seems to suppose—that is, that we are able to grade goods and evils on a common scale, and then measure the value of the good against the bad (Swinburne 1998, ch. 13). But even if we could do this, an all-powerful, all-knowing and all-loving God could easily have aims exceeding any we have ever imagined. How they are achieved at all, much less the role sin and suffering may play in their achievement, could in principle escape us utterly (Howard-Snyder 1996). If so, then we would still be in no position to make the kinds of determinations about the role evil plays in the world, and how dispensable it may be, that the evidential argument presupposes. Still less should we expect to be able to make such determinations in every case, which is what the argument demands. As with the logical problem of evil, then, the theist may greet the experiential problem with a stand-pat position. Neither argument goes through unless we make assumptions we have no reason to make, and which when brought to light seem positively implausible.

Still, evil is troubling, and anyone troubled by it is likely to be left unsatisfied by the stand-pat response. For one thing, the argument cuts both ways. If we are unable to discern God’s purposes then just as he may turn out to be a far better being than our experience would indicate, so also he may turn out to be far worse: a positively evil or incompetent God, undeserving even of regard, let alone worship. Moreover, this response seems out of keeping with the spirit of the Western religious tradition. That tradition is at home with the concept of mystery: it speaks often of aspects of God and his relationship to the world that outreach us, in that our intellects are not finally able to grasp them. But seldom if ever does the tradition treat mystery as totally impenetrable. Just the opposite: the whole point of the theological enterprise is to enable the believer to understand, however imperfectly, the nature of God and the plan of salvation. It is hard to see how this aim can be achieved if a phenomenon as central as evil must be held to escape all comprehension, nor is there any special reason to expect such a thing. Rather, it is in keeping with the hope of the believer that there should be available some glimpse of the good accomplished through the presence of sin and suffering in the world, even if in the actual struggle with them one’s best ally is faith. If this is correct, then the theist should not limit his options to the negative. Beyond pointing out the shortcomings of the opponent’s arguments, he can and should try to offer a positive theodicy — that is, an account of the role evil plays in the world, and a justification for its presence. Such an effort is likely, of course, to end up incomplete. In particular, the theist may be unable in many cases to point to a good to which some evil that occurs is indispensable. But he may want to be able to offer a general justification for the presence of evil, and to describe some good or goods which but for the occurrence of evil could not be achieved. The question is whether he can do so without compromising divine perfection.

2. The Free Will Defense

It may be possible to minimize God’s involvement in the evil of the universe. That is the aim of what is perhaps the most prominent strategy employed in recent theodicy, which is based on the concept of free will, and its importance in the plan of creation. The free will defense begins by distinguishing two kinds of evil. Moral evil is evil that occurs through rational action — that is, through wrongful exercises of will on the part of rational beings. Natural evil, by contrast, is owing entirely to the operation of natural causes. To see how this distinction works, we need to realize that moral evil can itself be divided into several categories. First come exercises of will that are sinful in themselves, and these are of two kinds. They include wrongful acts of intention formation, as when one maliciously decides to kill another, and the volitional activity through which we execute wrong intentions — e.g., the effort of will aimed at carrying out the intention to murder. The moral wrong of these exercises of will is intrinsic to them. They are sinful in themselves, and would be so even if, through some fortuitous circumstance, the attempt to kill went awry, and the intended victim was not harmed at all. Suppose, however, that the action succeeds, as it does in most instances of wrongful willing. If so, further evil will occur — in the present case, the death of the victim. Now if the victim had died entirely as a result of natural causes, his death would have counted as a natural evil. In this case, however, it counts as a kind of moral evil, for while its occurrence requires the cooperation of natural causes, those causes are set in motion by the killer’s volitional activity. Harm and suffering that are caused by wrongful willing count as extrinsic moral evil, in that they are caused by acts of will that are morally evil in themselves, or intrinsically.

The significance and pervasiveness of extrinsic moral evil is easy to underestimate, because a lot of the suffering and hardship that belongs in this category tends to masquerade as merely part of the human condition, and hence as natural evil. But it is not so. Many of the hardships that befall humankind — disease, ignorance, poverty and the like — owe their existence at least in part to wrongful willing. The poverty of some is owing to the greed of others; suffering and deprivation may occur because of institutionalized racial and ethnic hatred, or because leaders use their positions to advance their own power and prosperity at the expense of their citizenry, or simply because the cost of defense against foreign enemies brings economic hardship to a nation or some of its members. In other cases the cause is sheer laziness, or the fact that time and talent that might have been devoted to good are instead consumed by selfish ends. Who can estimate how much of suffering and disease, of poverty and ignorance, or of the threat posed by natural disasters would by now have been conquered were not so much of our energy and resources diverted either to the pursuit of wrongful goals, or to guarding ourselves against those who do pursue them, and mending as well as we can the harm they cause? If human wills were not so often misdirected, human life would be transformed, and the struggles against those evils that seem to us no one’s fault much further advanced. A great deal, then, of what we are likely to view as natural evil actually falls under the heading of extrinsic moral evil.

That all of sin and so much of suffering counts as moral evil is advantageous to free will theodicy, for according to the free will defense moral evil is not to be blamed upon God. It is entirely our fault — that is, entirely the fault of rational beings who employ their wills to pursue evil. This is because we have free will, which is to be understood here in what is known as the libertarian sense. We exercise libertarian freedom in forming or executing an intention only if our deciding or willing is not the product of deterministic causation — that is, provided there is no set of conditions independent of our exercise of will which, together with scientific law, make it certain that we shall decide or will as we do. Independent conditions — our motives and beliefs, for example — may incline us toward one or another intention or action. But they cannot guarantee it, because what we decide and what we strive to achieve is finally up to us. Were it not so, we could not be held accountable for our actions. We would be no more responsible than someone who acted out of a psychological compulsion such as kleptomania, or who was a victim of addiction, hypnosis or the like.

Given the nature of libertarian freedom, then, our actions are up to us, in that they are not brought about by independent events. And because this is so, according to free will theodicy, moral evil is entirely our fault. God is not to be blamed for it, because it owes its existence to our wills, not to his (Plantinga 1974, 30). God is, of course, responsible for the risk he takes in creating a world that contains beings with free will. But proponents of the free will defense can point to two reasons that could justify God in populating the universe with such creatures. First, they are an enhancement to creation. Creatures with free will are sources of spontaneity in the world, able to choose for themselves the principles by which their conduct will be guided. As such, they display the kind of liberty we take God himself to have, and so are made in the image of their creator (Swinburne 1998, 106). Second, God endows us with this power because he desires creatures who will accept him freely, who will love and obey him not because they are programmed to do so, but as a matter of spontaneous choice. That we should come to love God in this way is far more satisfactory than that we should be driven to accept him. As in strictly human affairs, forced affection is a pale substitute for love voluntarily bestowed. But, the argument goes, God cannot endow us with free will without running the risk that some of us, at least, will turn against him, and use our freedom to seek evil ends. True, such ends are usually not achieved unless nature, which is God’s creation, cooperates. The bullet could not find its mark or the poison be effective unless the relevant natural laws stayed in place. In principle, then, God could allow us free choice and yet prevent any choice that is evil from having its intended outcome. But freedom would be a sham if an evil will could never have its way, and the locus of sin lies not in the consequences of evil willing but in the willing itself. Moreover, even though the harm we cause through our actions requires God’s cooperation, it too would not occur but for our choosing and willing as we do. The price of freedom, then, is moral evil. But moral evil is to be laid at our doorstep, not God’s, for it is we who choose it. God merely permits our choices and makes them efficacious. In this he is justified, first because of the good of there being free creatures in the universe, and second because some, and perhaps many or even all, of these creatures will come to enjoy God’s eternal friendship, by choosing freely to love and serve him.

The free will defense does not, in most formulations, attempt a complete solution to the problem of evil. It deals only with moral evil, and although we have seen that this category covers more than might at first be supposed, it certainly does not appear that all of the sorrows and failures of the world can be gathered under it. Even if the free will defense succeeds then, there will remain a residuum of natural evil to be addressed. It may, however, be questioned whether the defense succeeds even in the limited project it undertakes. One criticism of it raises a question about the relation between creaturely freedom and God’s activity as creator. J. L. Mackie has argued that if God is truly all-powerful, he ought to have been able to create creatures who possessed free will, but who never did wrong (1955, 209). If that were possible, then we would have had a universe free of moral evil, even though it contained creatures with free will. Perhaps the sinful populace that presently inhabits the world would have lost out on such a scenario: maybe God would have had to create an entirely different crowd. Still, moral evil would have been banished, and the condition of the world doubtless vastly improved. But could God have exerted such control over creation? Proponents of the free will defense have tended to think not. In order for God to provide creatures with meaningful freedom, they argue, God must relinquish control over how that freedom is exercised. Were it not so, libertarian freedom would be destroyed: our decisions and actions would not finally be up to us, but would instead be manipulated by God (Plantinga 1974, 41–42; Flint 1998, 84–90). Even if they were exempt from natural causation, they would still be determined by God’s will, and so would be unfree. Indeed, the argument runs, it would be logically impossible for God to create creatures possessed of libertarian freedom, and at the same time have the operations of their will fall under his creative fiat. Now it is not usually considered a failure of omnipotence for God to be unable to do what is logically impossible. We need not, therefore, relinquish the claim that God is all-powerful. Rather, the theist concludes, Mackie is simply mistaken in thinking such a God could create free creatures with a guarantee that they would never sin.

It should be pointed out that in giving this response, proponents of the free will defense are making an important assumption about the relationship between God’s will as creator and ours as creatures — namely, that God’s will operates in the same way natural causes do. That is, his fiat as creator counts as an independent condition or event, which causes the occurrence of what he wills in just the way natural causes produce their effects. So if, as creator, God wills that I decide to attend a concert this evening, then my decision to do so is causally determined, just as it would be had I been driven to it by an insatiable desire for Beethoven. Otherwise, we would not have a violation of the criterion for libertarian free will given earlier. Now we shall eventually see that this model of the relation between God’s will and the world is at best unlikely, but let us suppose for now that the theist’s answer to Mackie’s complaint stands. Is the free will defense then successful? Again, it seems not, for the antitheist can still raise two complaints, and these amount to two challenges that any theory of providence which desires to avail itself of the free will defense must overcome.

First, he may argue, even if the free will defense does not violate God’s omnipotence, it still violates his sovereignty. If God were fully sovereign over the universe his rule would be complete. All that occurs would be under his direct control, down to the smallest detail. According to the free will defense, however, this is not so. Rather, as we have just seen, proponents of this kind of theodicy insist that some of what goes on in the world is not under God’s control, but under that of his creatures. To be sure, God need not have created free beings, and when they engage in sinful willing he can always thwart their ends by manipulating natural causes. But he cannot stop them from sinning (or, for that matter, from willing well), for both of these lie with the will itself. So in creating free creatures God relinquishes part of his sovereignty over the universe (Mackie 1955, 209–10; Flint 1998, 84–85). Furthermore, unless God regularly interferes with his creatures achieving their own objectives—that is, unless he deprives them of a meaningful and efficacious freedom—his own objectives in creating the universe are likely to be thwarted. However great a good it may be to have in the universe creatures who exercise libertatian freedom, this would seem a high and unseemly price for an otherwise sovereign God to pay for their existence.

Second, the antitheist may argue, the free will defense violates divine omniscience. For if I possess libertarian freedom, then whether I decide to go to the concert tonight is neither under God’s direct control nor controlled by natural causes. And if that is the case then God has no way of knowing what I will decide. Like anyone, he can make a lucky guess: he may believe devoutly that I will decide to attend the concert, and that may turn out to be correct. But lucky guesses do not count as knowledge. Knowledge requires reasons, and God can have no satisfactory reason for his belief, if by “satisfactory” we understand what the infallible omniscience usually attributed to him would require — namely, a reason that guarantees correctness. Rather, like any observer, God must wait to learn what my decision will be in order to be sure of it. But then throughout the time prior to my act, God is not omniscient. There is a truth about the future that he does not know. Thus, the antitheist may conclude, the free will defense is in fact a failure. It exonerates God from direct responsibility for sin, but it does so only by surrendering part of God’s sovereignty, and by making him fail, as creator, to be omniscient.

3. God’s Knowledge of the Future and Open Theism

It is fair to say that philosophers responding to these difficulties have been more concerned to preserve God’s omniscience than his sovereignty. Perhaps this is in part because philosophy is itself a matter of pursuing knowledge, so that philosophers are led to value omniscience more highly. Were we generals, say, or politicians, our priorities might be quite the opposite. In any case, most discussions of the seeming conflict between creaturely freedom and divine perfection have concentrated on the task of reconciling as far as possible the assertion that we have free will with the claim that God is all-knowing. One especially important way of doing so is to hold that God’s position with respect to time is such that unlike us, he does not have to wait for the future to unfold in order to know its contents. Such was the view of Boethius, who held that God exists entirely outside of time, in a kind of eternal present to which all that occurs in time is equally accessible (Consolation, Bk. V, pr. 6). Thus, God is able in a single act of awareness to comprehend all of history, the past and future as well as the present, just as though they were now occurring. Many philosophers have followed Boethius in this, holding that God is in no way a temporal being, but is rather the creator of time, with complete and equal access to all of its contents.[2] And it may well appear that on such a view God’s omniscience is restored, in that he has immediate cognitive access to everything that will ever occur. Moreover, there is no conflict with libertarian freedom, since on this account God’s knowledge of our future decisions and actions is not really foreknowledge. Rather, the vantage point from which God knows our decisions and actions is completely external to time. This makes all talk about “when” God knows about our actions pointless. He simply knows them, in a unified, timeless and unchanging act of comprehension that comprises all that ever was or will be.

There are criticisms of the idea that God is timeless (Wolterstorff 1982). But even if the Boethian position is correct on this score, the usefulness of this means of reconciling divine omniscience and human freedom is highly questionable. The difficulty is that in order for God to exercise full providence over the world, he needs to know as creator how the decisions and actions of creatures with libertarian freedom will go. It is hard to see how that is possible on the Boethian view, for even if God is outside of time, his activity as creator is still ontologically prior to the activities of free creatures on this account, whereas his knowledge of those activities is posterior to them. Thus, it seems impossible that God’s creative will could be guided by his knowledge of our actions, even if, from his timeless perspective, such knowledge is finally available to him. If this is correct, then even the Boethian God runs an immense risk in creating the world. He can only hope that we will use our freedom justly and wisely, perhaps making some allowance for the possibility that we will not, but otherwise simply trusting in the outcome. So although God’s omniscience may be restored by placing him outside of time, he is in no way empowered by it. (Whether the Boethian God’s simple foreknowledge grants any providential advantage at all is a matter of dispute, but undeniably the Boethian God must run significant risks in creating the world. For an entry into the debate, see Hunt 2009, Hasker 2009, and Zimmerman 2012.)

It may be questioned, furthermore, whether this view of things really is consistent with the claim that God is timeless. The Boethian picture appears to call for a kind of transition, wherein God first creates free creatures in ignorance of what their actions will be and then learns about those actions by observation. But if that is so then there appears to be change in God, in which case he would have to be a temporal being after all. Now perhaps there is some way around this problem: maybe as creator God somehow operates in isolation from certain parts of his knowledge, while having access to all of it in his role as knower — and yet remains timeless in both capacities. Still, it is not satisfying that God should be limited in this way. His activity as creator ought to be completely unhampered. Moreover, the bifurcation in God’s thinking called for by this adjustment only reinforces the difficulty of treating creaturely decisions and actions as falling under divine providence. As creator, on this account, God really does not know what kind of world he is creating: how evil it will be, whence the evil will arise, and how to anticipate it in detail in the plan of creation.

One may be tempted at this point simply to throw in the towel, to give up the endeavor to reconcile libertarian freedom with divine sovereignty and omniscience. If so, we may still insist on libertarian freedom for creatures. But if we are convinced this is incompatible with holding that God is omniscient, and that everything that takes place in the created world falls under his complete governance, then these claims will go by the board. On this type of theory, commonly called the “Open” view or Open Theism, God is a temporal being who, like us, must await the actions of free creatures in order to know with certainty what they will be. And much that occurs, most especially sinful decisions and willings, will not be of his choosing. Not that he is completely in the dark: God can still have probabilistic knowledge of how his creatures will act, and he can contrive to place them in circumstances designed to elicit if possible whatever behavior will achieve the most good. And of course he still has the power to motivate and punish, so creatures may be guided toward right paths. Accordingly, God is still able to exercise a sort of general providence over the world, guiding it in the direction of his objectives as creator, or at least something approximating them (Rhoda 2010a). But his providence can never be, as is sometimes said, “meticulous.” Rather, on this scenario God’s aims as creator can only be achieved — assuming they will be achieved at all — by taking risks. Inevitably, creaturely free will makes for a setting of uncertainty, and only within that setting can God attempt to bring creation to a happy outcome. Yet he proceeds, and his doing so is a measure of his love for us.(See Hasker 1989 and Pinnock et. al. 1994.)

Such a position may appeal to philosophers who find the God of perfect being theology too remote and mysterious to equate with the God of scripture. But this viewpoint faces serious problems. Some are relatively specific. For example, it is hard to see how, if even God does not know what they will be, the actions of free creatures could be the subject of prophecy. Yet they often are, in scripture (Flint 1998, 100–02). Also, there will no doubt be many cases where multiple free actions impinge on some outcome God desires. When that is so, the probabilities of those actions need to be multiplied to determine God’s assurance of the outcome, which as a result could be minuscule (Flint 1998, 104). But the biggest difficulty is that this view places God’s fate as creator almost completely in the hands of his creatures. No matter how concerned and loving he may be, or how powerfully he attempts to win us over, we are on this view out of God’s control. There is always the chance, therefore, that his plans as creator will be utterly dashed, that his overtures to us will be rejected — even to the point, one supposes, of our all being lost — that we will use our freedom and advancing knowledge to wreak ever greater horror, and that creation will turn out to be a disaster. Willingness to take chances may be laudable in some cases, but surely this level of risk is irresponsible. Moreover, it is completely out of keeping with both scripture and tradition, both of which portray God as above the fray of the world, unperturbed by its mishaps, and governing its course with complete power and assurance. On the Open view, divine governance is a hit or miss affair, in which we can only wait to see whether a somewhat poorly informed God will manage to bootstrap his way to his objectives. Surely, opponents argue, this gives away too much of the traditional notion of providence.

One tactic for preserving omniscience even while accepting the basic open theist view just described is to hold that God cannot be faulted for not knowing in advance how we will exercise our freedom, since until we do there is simply nothing to know. According to views of this kind, not all propositions about the future have a truth value. Some do, of course: it is a necessary truth that 2 + 2 = 4, and this proposition has as much bearing on the future as it does on the present and past. Similarly, a proposition concerning the future may have a truth value when its truth is causally determined. Consider, for example, the proposition that the sun will rise tomorrow. Most likely, it is true. True or false, however, this proposition’s truth value is fixed by causes already in place, causes that determine either that the sun will rise tomorrow or that it will not. But now consider the claim that I will decide an hour from now to attend a concert this evening. If I have free will, there are no conditions presently in place that determine whether I will so decide. This being the case, according to the present view, the proposition that I will decide in an hour to attend the concert is neither true nor false. It has no truth value at all, nor does any other proposition that describes a future free decision or action. But then, the argument runs, it is not a mark against his omniscience that in creating us, God does not know how we will exercise our freedom. It is logically impossible to know of a proposition that it is true or that it is false if it is neither. And inability to know what logically cannot be known does not harm God’s omniscience, any more than inability to do what logically cannot be done harms his omnipotence (Swinburne 1993, 180–81). A distinct but related view is that all future contingents are in fact false, because there is nothing in the future to make them true, and so the fact that God does not know ahead of time which of them becomes true is not an epistemic failure on his part (see Todd 2016).

If correct, this view would indeed reconcile divine omniscience and creaturely freedom, leaving only the problem of sovereignty to be addressed. But there are telling arguments against it. Propositions that venture to predict future free decisions and actions do appear to have truth values, and some of them appear to be true. One indication of this is that we believe and disbelieve such propositions, and what is it to believe a proposition but to believe it is true, or to disbelieve it but to believe it is false? Nor does it seem possible to worm our way out of this. Let p be the proposition that I will decide to attend a concert this evening. It might be protested that for someone to believe I will so decide is only to believe p will become true at the appointed time — i.e., at the time of my decision. But that does not solve the problem, for to believe this is simply to believe another future-tensed proposition — namely, “p will become true” — which is just as dependent on my decision for its truth as is p. Similarly, it will not do to claim that to believe p is not to believe it is true but only that it is likely or probable. For to hold these beliefs is just to hold, respectively, that it is likely that p is true, or probable that it is true. In short, there seems no avoiding the fact that to believe p is to be committed to its truth, pure and simple. Moreover, anyone thus committed would, if I later decide to attend the concert, be justified in saying they had been right about what I would decide, that their earlier belief had been correct. And again, what is it for a belief to be right or correct except for it to be true? (For a related argument, see Pruss 2010, to which Rhoda 2010b replies.)

In any case, the concern remains that open theism leaves the traditional strong view of divine providence in tatters in favor of a risk-taking God. A better solution would be preferable, if one can be had.

4. Middle Knowledge

A possible way to reconcile libertarian views of freedom with a strong view of divine providence was posed by the sixteenth-century Spanish Jesuit, Luis de Molina (1588).[3] According to Molina, God is able to know as creator how any exercise of creaturely freedom will go. That is, God knows, for any creature he might create, how that creature will behave in whatever circumstances he might be placed. God is able to know this, moreover, even though the creatures in question will, if created, enjoy libertarian freedom. This kind of knowledge, which Molina called middle knowledge,[4] is comprised in what we may call subjunctives of freedom. Consider, for example, the situation in which I will find myself later today, when I deliberate about whether to attend the concert tonight. It is possible to formulate two subjunctive conditional propositions about that situation. The first states that if ever I were placed in the circumstances (call them C) that will then obtain, I would decide (freely) to attend the concert; the second states that in those circumstances, I would not so decide. Let these be symbolized as C > p and C > ~p, respectively. Both C > p and C > ~p count as subjunctives of freedom, and since we are imagining that I will be placed in C later today, it is plausible to think that one or the other of them is true. Let us suppose it is C > p. According to defenders of middle knowledge, God knows prior to any creative act on his part that C > p is true; hence he knows this prior to my existence, and prior to any act of mine. We need not take the “prior” here as temporal, if we hold that God exists outside of time. The idea, rather, is that the truth of C > p is logically or ontologically prior to any creative decision on God’s part, and to any doing of mine, in that its truth is fixed independently of these matters. Further, God is able to know that C > p is true independently of any decision of his, and without appealing to any actual decision on my part as evidence. Finally, God is armed with true subjunctives of freedom for every other set of circumstances in which I might ever have been placed, and the same for every other free individual he has the option of creating, whether he actually chooses to create the creature or not. In effect, then, middle knowledge gives God advance notice of every free decision or action that would ever occur, on the part of any creature he might create (Flint 1998, 37–41).

Assuming it is a legitimate notion, middle knowledge does much to restore God’s providence in creating free creatures. Once armed with information about how such a creature would decide and act in the various circumstances in which he might be placed, God has the option of not creating the creature, or of creating him in whatever circumstances are called for by the subjunctives of freedom God wishes to be realized in the actual world. Now of course the circumstances in which one creature is placed may depend in part on how others choose to exercise their freedom. But the willings of those others can in turn be providentially arranged, since they too fall under middle knowledge. In principle, then, nothing need occur in the actual world that does not have God’s prior recognition and consent, at least. There may, of course, be much that does not go as God would prefer. It is important to realize that middle knowledge does not restore complete sovereignty to God. If C > p is true, then there is no way for God to create me in circumstances C and have me do anything but decide to go to the concert. The best he can do is alter my circumstances to fit some true subjunctive of freedom that has another outcome. And the same goes for the subjunctives of freedom that hold of all other creatures God might create. This means there is quite a range of worlds which, though logically possible, are not feasible for God, in that they are beyond his reach as creator (Flint 1998, 71). From God’s point of view, free creatures will behave as they will behave, and that is that. Still, God can know in advance of creation what worlds are feasible, and can plan accordingly, which is a vast improvement over the Boethian view. The position as regards omniscience is also improved. There is still a kind of transition called for — this time commencing from a point at which God merely contemplates the possibilities of how things might go with creation, to a point at which, having decided what creatures and circumstances will in fact populate the world, he knows how things will go. Again, however, it might be possible to work out a way in which the transition can be understood non-temporally. And the Molinist position offers a further advantage over that of Boethius, in that now God’s knowledge about how exercises of creaturely freedom will actually go will be guaranteed simply by his decision as to what creatures and circumstances he will create, rather than awaiting the actual decisions and actions of free beings. This diminishes God’s passivity; it enables him to know as creator how the history of creation will unfold.[5]

But is middle knowledge a legitimate notion? Many have thought not. One serious objection against it is that there does not appear to be any way God could come by such knowledge. Knowledge, as we have seen, is not merely a matter of conceiving a proposition and correctly believing it to be true. It requires justification: one must have good reasons for believing. But what justification could God have for believing the propositions that are supposed to constitute middle knowledge? The truth of subjunctives of freedom cannot be discerned a priori, for they are contingent. It is not a necessary truth that if placed in circumstances C, I will decide to attend the concert tonight. Nor can we allow that God might learn the truth of C > p from my actual behavior — that is, by observing that I actually do, in circumstances C, decide to attend the concert. For God could not make observations like this without also finding out what creative decisions he is actually going to make, which would destroy the whole purpose of middle knowledge. Instead of being guided in his creative choices by knowing what decisions creatures would make if they were created, God would be presented from the beginning with a fait accompli — with the reality that he was going to create certain creatures, and they were going to behave in certain ways. For God’s options as creator to remain truly open, middle knowledge must have some other justification. Furthermore, it seems clear that observation of the actual behavior of creatures could not possibly inform God of the truth of those subjunctives of freedom that delineate the behavior of creatures he will not choose to create, for in their case there is no pertinent reality to consult. Yet Molinism wishes to allow for the possibility of such creatures. It is apparent, then, that neither conceptual resources nor resources founded in the concrete world will enable God to know in advance of his decisions as creator which counterfactuals of freedom are true. If there is a third resource, no one has said what it is. Thus, while God may firmly believe certain subjunctives of freedom, there appears to be no justification available to him that would allow such beliefs to constitute middle knowledge.[6]

Note that the above objection is not based on the claim some have made, that subjunctives of freedom lack truth values, or that their truth is not properly grounded (R.M. Adams 1977; Hasker 1989). That may indeed be a problem for some subjunctives of freedom, but it is not a problem for C > p. On the usual understanding, a subjunctive of freedom counts as true provided that, among worlds in which its antecedent is satisfied, there is at least one in which the consequent is satisfied as well, and which is more similar to our world than any in which the consequent is not satisfied. Now no world can be as similar to the actual world as that world is to itself, and we are assuming that C and p are true in the actual world. Accordingly, C > p must be true as well. The only way to avoid this outcome is to deny that propositions like p — that is, propositions which describe future free decisions in the actual world — have truth values, and we have already seen that this will not do. So C > p is perfectly well grounded. The problem is only that it is not grounded in the way it needs to be to serve as middle knowledge. It is not grounded independently of God’s or my free decisions. In light of this, we can only conclude that the Molinist effort to reconcile creaturely freedom with God’s omniscience and sovereignty as creator fails. We have yet to see how God can know as creator what decisions and actions his creatures will engage in, while at the same time upholding the idea that those decisions and actions are manifestations of libertarian freedom.

5. An Epistemic Alternative

It is commonly supposed that Molinism represents the only middle ground between, on the one hand, a risk-taking God of the sort envisioned by both open theism and simple foreknowledge views (like the Boethian view described above) according to which whatever foreknowledge God does have is not of much (or any) providential use, and, on the other hand, full-blown theological determinism. It has been suggested recently (in Kvanvig 2011, chapter 8), however, that there may be space for views other than Molinism in the area between those two extremes. Molinist “middle knowledge” is knowledge of subjunctive conditionals (“were Jeff to be put in circumstances C, he would do X”), which God then employs to guide his decisions as to what circumstances to actualize. But there are a number of other sorts of conditionals that might be of use to God in his decision-making. One is a particular type of indicative conditional, an epistemic conditional: “if Booth didn’t kill Lincoln, someone else did.” This is a different sort of conditional than the subjunctive, for it is true while the corresponding subjunctive (“if Booth hadn’t killed Lincoln, someone else would have”) is false. An epistemic conditional is true when knowing the antecedent puts one in a position to know the consequent, such that one’s belief in the consequent (on the basis of the antecedent) will count as knowledge so long as the consequent is true and the evidence is undefeated (by contrary evidence one has or by external pieces of information that result in a Gettier situation).

If Molinist subjunctive conditionals are replaced by these epistemic conditionals, a different, “epistemic” theory of creation and providence may be generated. God reasons suppositionally: suppose I do X, what am I in a position to know would result? He uses his knowledge of the epistemic conditionals to infer what he can, and then supposes further actions on his part, inferring further information. Importantly, some of these conditionals will describe human free decisions, for even on libertarian views of the will it is still possible sometimes to know what someone will freely do on the basis of other information about them. Sometimes God will come to a point where he cannot infer anything further because there just isn’t enough information, but sometimes he will be able to generate a complete history of the world in this manner, a complete plan or story of the world. Such complete plans or stories are the possible worlds that he will be able to ensure actually come about (by actualizing all the states of affairs he had supposed throughout the reasoning process); they are the feasible worlds on this account of providence. So, like Molinism, there are possible worlds that God cannot bring about, but (also like Molinism) he has quite a bit more control over the ones he can bring about than is allowed by open theism. The limitations on God are subtly different on this view than on Molinism. On Molinism the limitations are the simple facts about what free beings would do in any given situation, while on the epistemic account the limitations are the availability of evidence with respect to what free beings will do in any given situation.

Perhaps the greatest strength of the epistemic account is that it may avoid the central problem of Molinism: the question of how the conditionals in question can be grounded, and grounded in such a way that God can know them independently of his decision to create. If epistemic principles are necessary truths, then God can know a host of epistemic conditionals simply on the basis of his knowledge of necessary truths. One problem with the epistemic account is simply the question of whether there really are sufficient true epistemic conditionals for God to come to know enough about what free beings will do with their freedom to generate a whole history of the world. Perhaps the profoundest problem for this view, however, is the question of the infallibility of divine foreknowledge. It is a key feature of the view that the reasoning from antecedent to consequent licensed by the epistemic conditionals is the sort involved in ordinary judgments of knowledge, and so is defeasible (subject to overturning by further information) and fallible. But surely God’s knowledge cannot be defeasible and fallible. Kvanvig’s solution to this problem is to argue that once the divine course of suppositional reasoning reaches completion and describes a full possible world, it transforms from fallible and defeasible to infallible and indefeasible precisely because of its completeness; there are no further pieces of information that God could learn which would undermine the reasoning (an internal defeater) or put God into a Gettier situation (an external defeater). But it is hard to intuitively reconcile Kvanvig’s solution here with the reality that all of this reasoning is merely suppositional and each step on its own is fallible; couldn’t it turn out to be mistaken at some point once the suppositions are made reality and the divine fallible reasoning collides with what actually happens? (See Kvanvig 2011 and Hasker 2016 for discussion of these objections.)

6. The Traditional Solution

If the views considered thus far all fail, theists have no choice but to place the decisions and willings of rational creatures under God’s creative authority. Only by so doing is it possible to restore to him complete control over the course of events in the world, and only in this way can he know as creator what world he is creating, and so be omniscient. If all of our decisions and actions occur by God’s creative decree, then all possible worlds are made feasible for him. He can create as he wishes, with full assurance as to the outcome. And he can know how things will go, in particular how we will decide and act, simply by knowing his own intentions as to what our decisions and actions will be. Clearly, there are respects in which this approach is to be preferred. From the perspective of piety, the versions of the free will defense we have seen so far are all troublesome: they seem to place our concern for ourselves above our regard for God, by maximizing our options at the expense of his. One can readily anticipate the response that if complete sovereignty for God and libertarian freedom for his creatures cannot both be had, then the devout (not to say Godfearing) philosopher would be well served to endorse the former, that anything less is not just out of keeping with the mainstream of theological tradition, but actually borders on blasphemy. Yet we have seen that free creatures are of greater value than the unfree, if only because their greater likeness to God makes them a desirable enhancement to creation. The question, then, is whether placing our decisions and actions under God’s creative fiat leaves in place anything of creaturely freedom, or of the free will defense.

It may seem obvious that neither can survive: that once the operations of creaturely wills are subordinated to God’s will, libertarian freedom disappears, and with it any hope of absolving God of moral evil. But at least where freedom is concerned, traditional theology asserts the opposite. Augustine, for example, held that God moves our wills, working in us both to will and to do of his good pleasure, as scripture says (Phil. 2:13). Yet he insists that this does not diminish our freedom, for if it did we would not be told in the same passage to work out our salvation in fear and trembling (On Grace and Free Will, 750). Similarly, Thomas Aquinas maintains that all of our doings, even those in which we sin, are on a par with the rest of creation in having God as their first cause. Only the defect of those actions which is their sinfulness derives from us. Sin, he says, is like limping, in which the defective motion arises from the crookedness of the limb, rather than the power of locomotion that impels it (Summa Theologica I-II, Q. 79, Art 2). Like Augustine, moreover, Aquinas sees no conflict between God’s activity as creator and ours as free creatures. On the contrary: he holds that God’s activity as first cause is actually the cause of our freedom, since he moves us in accordance with our voluntary nature (Summa Theologica I-II, Q. 18, Art 1, ad 3). What to make of these suggestions is, however, less than clear. In Augustine’s case it may be argued that his later writings abandon any earlier flirtation with libertarian ideas, so that the notion of freedom endorsed in the passage referrred to above is in fact a version of what today is known as compatibilism (Baker 2003). With Aquinas, however, the situation is less clear (Stump 2003, ch. 9). Much turns on how it might be possible for God to move us in a way that is truly consistent with our voluntary nature, where “voluntary is taken to signify libertarian freedom”. And it has to be said that Aquinas offers little by way of explanation. There is, however, an interesting suggestion in the Summa Contra Gentiles, where Thomas maintains that if the will were moved by an external principle as agent, the movement would be violent, and then proceeds to the conclusion that God alone is able to move the creaturely will as agent without violence, since he alone is the cause and sustainer of its being, and thus is able to move it from within (Book III, Ch. 88).

There are two things that may be said in favor of this suggestion here (see also McCann 1995 and 2005, Shanley 1998, and Grant 2010 and 2017). The first concerns libertarian free agency itself, which is often portrayed as a power by which we cause, or confer existence upon, our own actions. Such a view would not accord with Aquinas’s claim that only God can move the creaturely will in this way, and in fact it is hard to see how this portrayal of agency can be right. If I confer existence on my decision to attend the concert tonight, I must do so either through some act separate from the decision, or as an aspect of the decision itself. If it is through a separate act, the problem of freedom simply shifts its location. We have to be convinced that this act in turn receives its existence from me, and we appear headed for a vicious regress. But neither does it seem possible for me to confer existence on my act of deciding as an aspect of the act itself. For prior to the act’s appearance there is nothing to do the conferring, and once it appears, the conferral is no longer needed. So whatever agency and voluntariness consist in, it does not appear to be an ability to confer existence on our own actions. That is important, because it means that unless we can find a way to ground libertarian freedom in the creative activity of God, the decisions and actions in which it is manifested are likely to have no cause, no accounting whatever — a situation few philosophers are likely to find satisfying, and which hardly puts me in control of my act of deciding.[7]

A second important consideration has to do with the relationship between God’s creative will and the things he creates. We are prone to think of this as an event-causal relation, in which God issues a kind of command, and the command in turn produces the mandated effect. Applied to our example, this would mean that God creatively wills that I decide to attend the concert, and his willing then causes me to decide. And of course this sounds exactly like what Aquinas describes as the violent operation of an external principle. On this scenario my deciding is passive, and hence involuntary, because God’s creative fiat is an event independent of my decision, which by acting upon me robs me of my autonomy. I am reduced to a puppet manipulated by God, rather than a free agent. Clearly, however, this scenario does not reflect the way Aquinas thinks creation works, and on that score there is reason to think Aquinas is right. For consider again the causal relation alleged to obtain between God’s willing and mine. Whatever we take this to consist in, it must exist contingently, for causal connections are not necessary beings. But then this supposed causal connection must also be created by God, and if that occurs through another process of command and causation, we would be facing another regress. The only way out is to hold that God directly creates the causal nexus — which is to say that in its creation, the nexus itself, not some command, is the first manifestation of God’s creative activity. But if God’s creative will can be directly efficacious in this task, then it can also be so in his creation of us and our actions. There is, then, no need for a nexus to explain the efficacy of God’s creative will, nor is there any causal distance whatever between God and either us or our behavior. Rather, we and all that we do have our being in God, and the first manifestation of his creative activity regarding our decisions and actions is nothing short of the acts themselves. This is why it may be misleading to call this traditional view by its common name, “theological determinism,” because the sort of determination involved in God’s providential ordering of creation is very different than ordinary causal determination within the created order.

A useful analogy that may be drawn here is to the relationship between the author of a story, and the characters within it. The author does not enter into the story herself, nor does she act upon the characters in such a way as to force them to do the things they do. Rather, she creates them in their doings, so that they are able to behave freely in the world of the novel. On the traditional account, God’s relation to his creatures is similar. As creator, he is the “first cause” of us and of our actions, but his causality works in such a way that we are not acted upon, and so are able to exercise our wills freely in deciding and acting. If this is correct, then as Aquinas at least seems to suggest, God’s creative activity does not violate libertarian freedom, for it does not count as an independent determining condition of creaturely decision and action. On the contrary: assuming God’s own will is free, there is no event in heaven or earth that is independent of my deciding to attend the concert tonight, and which causes my decision. God’s creative activity does not act upon me or render me passive in any way, for it consists solely in God’s freely giving himself over to being the ground of being for me and all that I do. Accordingly, I can still display libertarian freedom. My decision is a spontaneous display of creaturely agency, free in the libertarian sense because it does not occur through event causality, and because in it I am fully and intentionally committed both to deciding and to deciding exactly as I do. There are no further legitimate requirements for libertarian freedom. There is, of course, something that cannot happen on this view: it is not possible for God’s activity as creator to be devoted to my deciding to attend the concert, and yet that I should forebear to decide at all, or decide to do something else. But that is not because if I were to try it, I would find myself in a losing battle with God’s efficacious will. It is because there is no manifestation of that will regarding my decision short of the decision itself. The impossibility that God’s will as creator and mine as creature should diverge suggests trouble because we can view what goes on either from God’s perspective or from mine. That suggests two events, and a potential conflict between them. Properly interpreted, however, the traditional view appears to call for only one event, and as far as it is concerned, all the impossibility comes to is that I cannot at once both make a decision and not make it. To be incapable of the logically impossible is not a failure of freedom, libertarian or otherwise.

So far it has been argued that theological determinism, by virtue of the nature of the determination involved (which may yield the result that it is even misleading to describe it as determination at all), may well be compatible with a basically libertarian view of free will. An alternative for proponents of theological determinism is to accept a classically compatibilist view of free will, according to which freedom is compatible even with determination by causal factors within the created order, so long as those causal factors are of the right sort. The most famous proponent of such a view is Jonathan Edwards, and such views are common in the contemporary free will literature. This discussion will proceed by focusing on the libertarian view of the will, but many of the same approaches can be taken by the compatibilist as well.

7. Authorship of Sin

The traditional view is enigmatic, and a lot more would need to be said to make it convincing. But if an account along these lines can be made to work, creaturely freedom is indeed reconcilable with divine sovereignty and omniscience. Our destinies are entirely subordinate to God’s creative will; he exercises full control in all that we do, notwithstanding the fact that our deeds are fully voluntary, and we have every reason to expect that all that takes place in the world will reflect the providence of a perfectly loving father. As for omniscience, here too there is no difficulty. God knows about our decisions and actions simply by knowing his own intentions, for he wills that they occur. Nor is his will exercised from the fastidious distance preferred by Molinists, in which God creates us knowing what we will do, but has no hand in our actually doing it. Rather, God is as much the cause of our sinful actions as of our virtuous ones, or of any other event.

Yet, Augustine and Aquinas would both insist, he remains perfectly good and absolutely holy, a being deserving of our complete reverence and absolute devotion. How might such a thing be possible? Does not the traditional view entail that God is the author of sin in some objectionable way? This objection must be carefully distinguished from the ordinary axiological problem of evil: the question of whether God has sufficiently good reason to allow the evil and suffering which exist. The author of sin objection says that the traditional view involves God too intimately in evil even if he has sufficiently good reason for allowing it.

Part of the answer lies in the fact that even if my act of deciding to go to the concert tonight has its existence grounded in God’s creatively willing that I so decide, it is still I who act, still I who decide. God’s willing that I decide as I do does not make my decision God’s. Indeed, if it did, if my decision were predicated of God rather than me, his will would fail to achieve its object. But it is not possible for God’s will to be frustrated, as long as what he wills is consistent. So regardless of what we may think of the traditional view’s contention that divine sovereignty and creaturely freedom are fully compatible, that view does not take the operations of our will, or the actions founded upon them, away from us. They remain our own. Consequently, any sin they involve remains ours also. Thus, if I decide sinfully to go to the concert tonight — if, say, I am neglecting duties I know should take priority — the sin is mine, not God’s. If he is to be faulted, it must be for some other reason. It should be noted, moreover, that God’s position in this respect is not much different from what it is on the Molinist account. True, that view takes certain things out of God’s hands. Whether I would decide to go to the concert in the circumstances in which I will find myself tonight is not, according to Molinism, up to God. But it is up to him whether I shall be created in those circumstances, and indeed whether I shall exist at all. On both views, God knowingly and willingly creates a world in which rational creatures sin. The difference is that on the traditional view God does have complete control: he can create any possible world, and he is as much involved as creator in those acts in which we sin as he is in any others.

This is not a complete answer to the author of sin charge, simply because the author of sin objection is not one objection at all but a family of objections. It has as many different versions as there are objectionable relations to sin that the traditional view might be thought to entail God bears. It might be argued that the traditional view entails that God is the cause of sin, or that God intends sin, or that God desires that sin occur, or that God fails to love the damned. Each of these charges must be treated individually (for a variety of responses, see the collected essays in Alexander and Johnson 2016). Here it may suffice to point out that with respect to each individual charge it is not obvious both that theological determinism entails that God bears the property and that God’s bearing the property would be incompatible with divine perfection. For instance, as the above author-storyteller model makes clear, theological determinism does not entail that God causes evil in the same way that created agents cause evil, and if the traditional privation theory of evil is true, then theological determinism does not entail that God causes evil at all. Nor it is clear that, on the correct view of creation, theological determinism entails that God intends any evil at all; perhaps God selects the possible world he wishes to create all at once, so to speak, intending only the good aspects of creation and merely foreseeing (as an unintended side effect) all the evil that is caught up with it (White 2016). God may even love the damned and decide to decree their damnation, if there is a sufficiently great good that cannot be brought about without it; a general may, consistent with perfect love, order his son (a captain in his army, whom he loves) to a certain death in defense of a city in order to prevent the greater tragedy of the city’s sacking (Johnson 2016). The question is whether there is such a great good; and this is the ordinary, axiological problem of evil.

8. Moral Evil and Defeasibility

If the author of sin objection does not succeed in defeating the traditional view, then what is left is the question of whether God has sufficiently good reason for decreeing the evil that exists. The standard free will defense, which works only by diminishing God’s authority and circumscribing his providence, is not available to the theological determinist. Can the theist’s response to the argument from evil survive the loss of the standard free will defense?

Another free will defense may yet be available (McCann 2005). (For other attempts to modify a variety of free will defenses so as to make them compatible with theological determinism, see Byerly (forthcoming) and Almeida 2017.) It must be remembered that even though the actions of free creatures do not escape providence, such creatures are still an enhancement to creation, in that their nature reflects more closely what we suppose to be God’s own nature. As such, free creatures are more suited to the kind of fellowship with God that believers understand to be their ultimate destiny. It may be, however, that the achievement of that destiny inevitably involves sin. In part, this is because to have free will is to have a nature that is incomplete, in the sense that what we are never fully determines what we shall do. Rather, we have to complete our own nature, by establishing an identity for ourselves — that is, by adopting the patterns of behavior and long term objectives that define our lives. And it may be that in so doing we inevitably find ourselves in rebellion against God, simply because as free beings we are apt to assume we can establish our destiny in a way that escapes providence — that is, entirely by our own choice — and so make that enterprise instead of obedience to God our first priority. Second, it has to be remembered that true friendship is always voluntary. If God only exacts devotion from us, we are reduced to being his subjects. To be friends with him requires a meaningful and responsible decision on our part to accept the offer of friendship he presents to us. But a responsible choice in God’s favor requires that we understand the alternative — which is to be at enmity with him. And there is good reason to think such an understanding requires that we sin. Guilt, remorse, a sense of defilement, and the hopeless desolation of being cut off from God cannot be understood in the abstract, because if they are only understood abstractly they are not ours. Only through experience can we understand what it means to be in rebellion against God, and we gain that experience by sinning. By turning away from God we realize what it means to be alone, and we learn that however successful they may be, our own projects cannot satisfy us. Only then are we in a position to choose responsibly to accept God’s offer of fellowship. Finally, we must remember the simple fact that if we are to experience a transition that ends in our being united to God, that transition can only begin from a place where we are separated from him. It is plausible to think, however, that there is no morally neutral ground here: that unless we are within the circle of God’s love, we must be outside it, and that once we choose voluntarily to stand alone, we are already in an attitude of hostility toward God. In short, if we are to come to God as voluntary agents, it may well be that we can only approach him from a position of sinfulness.

If this is correct, there is a great good that God, as a loving creator, is able blamelessly to will for us, but which in its exercise inevitably leads us into blameworthiness. That good is our autonomy — the thing that makes us most like God, and is the sole means by which we are able to reach friendship with him, but which can be responsibly exercised to enter that friendship only if first employed in a conceit of rebellion, wherein we learn our limitations, and come to appreciate the emptiness of a life based on subjective independence. Only thus are we able to reach a position of moral autonomy from which an authentic choice to enter into fellowship with God is possible. Thus, freedom is indeed crucial to moral evil: the implications of libertarian agency are such that its purpose in God’s plan could not be achieved without the occurrence of sin. Unlike the standard free will defense, however, this approach does not endanger God’s sovereignty or omniscience. As creator, he is fully involved in those acts in which we sin, for they can occur only through his will. But he incurs no blame for them, for they are our acts, not his, and although they place us in rebellion against him, they do not put God in rebellion against himself. Indeed, no individual can be in rebellion against his own will. So if the essence of sin is rebellion against the will of God, then even though God is the first cause of those acts in which we sin, it is not possible that he himself sin in their occurrence. It is worth noting, too, that the present view makes it possible to explain what, on the standard free will defense, can only be a mystery — namely, that although all of us possess libertarian freedom, and so have the option of serving God, still all humans sin. The reason for this is not that God suffers a terrible run of bad luck in a grand lottery of his own institution. Rather, it is because only by passing through sin that the saved are able to achieve their destiny. By creating us in our sinfulness, God assures that each individual will develop an authentic moral identity, and, if the theistic tradition concerning divine justice is correct, prepares each for the eternal recompense appropriate to his character.

An objection may be raised at this point. It is not a part of our religious tradition that all are saved. St. Paul, for example, seems clearly to have believed that some, the elect, are destined from the beginning for salvation, and others not (Rom. 9:10–24), and the same appears true of Jesus himself (Matt. 26:24, Luke 10:20). And it is part of standard theology that, after death, the saved are joined to God in the beatific vision, a state of eternal and indescribable joy. The lost fare far worse. They are condemned to the bitter and devastating frustration of permanent separation from their creator, and on many accounts to a lot of other miseries as well. Now on the present view, God is as much involved in the rebellion of the reprobate as in the conversion of the saved. And one may well wonder what could justify this. Why should a loving God create creatures destined for damnation?

Many have found the idea that some creatures are destined for final reprobation troubling, if not downright incompatible with divine omnibenevolence (M.M. Adams 1993). One option here is to reject the concept of reprobation, opting instead for one or another form of universalism — the view that in the end all are saved, or at least that salvation is never completely foreclosed to anyone. Perhaps in the end the will of those who would reject God is simply overwhelmed, so that they have no choice but to accept him. Alternatively, it may be that those who would reject God’s friendship are never able to do so with finality, so that the opportunity for salvation is always available to them even if they never opt for it. But universalist views face the twin challenges of apparent unorthodoxy and of seeming to trivialize earthly moral existence, which most religions treat as of paramount importance.

For those who find universalism unacceptable the problem is to find adequate justification for the idea that some may be irretrievably lost. Here it should be pointed out that whatever the sufferings of the lost may be, theologians have always agreed that the greatest evil they sustain is final and irremediable separation from God. Nothing could be worse than to be cut off from the love and friendship of a father whose power extends to every detail of the universe, and who invites us to a share in his very life. But if this is the greatest evil of damnation, then no one who ends that way is treated unfairly, for this separation is precisely what one chooses by insisting on a life of rebellion rather than seeking reconciliation with God. Indeed, having once created beings destined to be lost, it is hard to see how a loving God could do anything but honor their choice in the matter (Kvanvig 1993, ch. 4). What is troubling, rather, is that he should create such beings at all, much less will their performance of the very actions through which they reject him. It may be argued, however, that even here God’s love is at work. He cannot, of course, directly intend the rebellion of sinners, nor the destruction of the finally unrepentant. But the lost are full participants in securing their tragic destiny; and while a life ruined by final rebellion is morally indefensible, it is still morally meaningful. Through their actions, the lost carve out for themselves a character which, though not upright, represents a real option for a free creature. Thus, the argument runs, to the extent that moral autonomy is a good it can be willed for a creature by God even when it takes this form. Furthermore, it is claimed, it is a mistake to think that God is not lovingly involved in the lives of the reprobate, or that he would have been more loving had he not created them. On the contrary: what is meaningless is to suppose that God would have shown greater love toward the lost by omitting them from creation. What is not there cannot be loved. Equally, it is meaningless to think the lost would be better off had they not existed.[8] What does not exist is neither well nor poorly off, nor anywhere in between; and it is as good for the reprobate to have life, the opportunity for salvation, and an autonomous choice as to whether to accept it, as it is for the saved. What is not good for them is the use they make of the opportunity, in choosing to be without God. But that is fully their decision, and its consequences are fully earned.

If the sort of view outlined above is correct, there is ample reason for God to create a universe in which there is moral evil, for only through the presence of moral evil is it possible for creatures like us to develop a legitimate moral identity, and make an informed and responsible choice to accept or reject God’s offer of friendship with us. It is important to see that on such a view, moral evil is not treated as a causal means to the good of our having friendship with God. If that were so, opponents could justly object that God could simply have created us in such friendship from the start, and the defense would fail. Rather, the good on which this kind of theodicy is based is a free and informed choice that can only be made from a position of sinfulness. Rather than constituting a causal means to our establishing our own stance toward God, sin is an indispensable part of the process — something without which a legitimate choice for or against God’s friendship is not just causally but conceptually impossible. But that is not all. In the case of those who choose in God’s favor, at least, moral evil is defeated in that it is bound up in a total state of affairs that counts as a far greater good, in which the evil is addressed and overcome. The very autonomy that the sinner once insisted upon is surrendered to God, thus becoming the foundation for a new understanding and a richer relationship, in which one is able to act as an informed and wholehearted participant in the divine enterprise of working good. Sin does not function as a causal means in this process, nor is it simply overbalanced by some other good with which it coexists. It encountered and overcome, through the providential operation of God, as manifested in creaturely freedom.

The idea that evil is defeasible was developed first by Roderick Chisholm (1968). It is an especially useful notion for theodicy, in that when evil is defeated, the usual objections to the presence of evil in the plan of providence are turned aside. If evil were only a means to good, and were simply outweighed by the goods to which it leads, antitheists could legitimately object that God could have created a better world simply by omitting the evil and creating those goods outright, or obtaining them through means that were not evil. By contrast, when evil is defeated it is caught up in a larger state of affairs that constitutes a far greater good, but not by containing components that might have occurred independent of the evil in question, and simply outweigh it. Rather, the evil is addressed within the larger state of affairs in such a way that it becomes integral to the good through which it is defeated. The defeat of evil is, moreover, an especially impressive sort of good. That Beethoven should have overcome the natural evil of his deafness to write the music he did, for example, strikes us as an amazing good — one far greater than what would have been accomplished had Beethoven written the same music (assuming that to have been possible) with good hearing. Similarly, that moral evil is overcome through the process by which sinners are brought into a right relationship with God may be considered a far greater good than would have been accomplished had he made us a community of spiritual lotus eaters, whose relationship to him, if any, was founded on no meaningful decision, but simply upon our never having had the experience that would make anything else possible. Indeed, given the moral vacuity of such an existence, it is not obvious that such creatures would even be fit for divine friendship, much less able to make the decision through which that relationship is brought to pass.

But of course the same does not occur in the case of any who might be lost. Their rebellion is permanent, and is not overcome through any action of theirs. The antitheist may wish to argue that in this case it is evil that triumphs over good. The character of the lost is permanently corrupted: any virtue that was theirs is turned to wrongdoing, and any hope that they might even achieve peace with God, much less be of useful service to him, comes to nothing. Thus, it might be claimed, the very existence of the reprobate stands as a gratuitous and unanswered defilement of creation, in which evil is victorious. Can the theist point to anything that might reverse this verdict? One possibility is that God himself could take action specifically aimed at defeating all moral evil. This, of course is the defining theme of Christian soteriology. In that tradition, all sin is defeated through the paramount manifestation of God’s love for the world, the redemptive suffering of Christ, which could not have occurred unless there were sin, and which makes possible God’s offer of salvation to humankind. Not all sinners may accept the offer, but God is reconciled to all, in the sense that the substitutionary atonement of Christ covers all wrongfulness. For the Christian believer this is a sine qua non: nothing but the sacrifice of a being who participates fully in the divine nature is sufficient to satisfy fully the demand of divine justice, and unless that demand is satisfied friendship between God and humankind is impossible. Thus the redemptive suffering of Christ is for Christians the ultimate act of mercy and compassion on God’s part toward all sinners, and the ultimate defeat of moral evil (see Plantinga 2004).

This kind of answer is, however, confined to a particular religious tradition. Is a more general solution possible? There are at least two lines of response the theist can take up at this point. First, he can argue that the moral evil wrought by unrepentant sinners is defeated through divine justice. Evildoers who refuse reconciliation with God receive a recompense addressed precisely to their offense: a permanent state of separation from the God they reject. The destruction this entails befits their situation, but it is also a destruction the wrongdoer chooses, and his choice is honored by God in the outcome. Thus, religious apologists argue, the fate of the reprobate is a manifestation not only of God’s love for them, but also of his justice. Without sin, it is held, much of God’s goodness could be displayed in the world, but his justice could not. Not that God does not forgive the unrepentant; he does, but his forgiveness is rejected, and that is what seals the sinner’s fate. So while the sinfulness of the unrepentant is not overcome through their accepting salvation, it is defeated through God’s justice in honoring their rebellion. This display of God’s character is what some have identified as “glory,” and so this is a version of the divine glory defense (see Johnson 2016; for another version of the divine glory defense, see Green 2016 and Hart 2016.) Secondly, there is the fact that the sinner’s deeds are visited upon others in the world, who must cope not only with the suffering and hardship that results, but also with the very fact of sin: with knowing they have been denied the dignity appropriate to rational beings, and instead made the object of malice. Here too, the theist might argue, it is possible for sin to be defeated, by being pointed out and corrected, and above all by being forgiven. In admonishing and forgiving those who sin toward us, we ally ourselves with God in the struggle against moral evil, by refusing to lapse into vengefulness and self-pity, and instead focusing ourselves, and if possible the sinner as well, on the higher things of God. This also is a good to which sin is integral, rather than constituting a mere causal means, and which makes the world far better than it would be if sin never occurred.

9. Suffering

The position outlined above depends heavily on the idea that in the plan of providence moral evil is defeated, rather than simply being outweighed by some good to which it is a means. The evil of sinful willing is overcome when autonomy that is wrongfully exercised is surrendered to God in repentance and conversion, or when the sinner is left to the just deserts of willing to be separated from God. It may fairly be argued, however, that the defeat here pertains primarily to intrinsic moral evil — that is, to sinful willing itself — rather than to the harm caused by it. Both conversion and reprobation may refute the sinful will, but they do not seem to alleviate or otherwise overcome the suffering caused by it. The idea of forgiveness may address the latter to some extent, but it is not entirely clear how. And even so, it may be claimed, much suffering is not, or at least not obviously, the result of wrongdoing. The pains and anxieties of daily living would doubtless be lessened if wrongful willing did not occur, but there would still be danger and disease, accidents, natural disasters, occasional deprivation, the sufferings of old age, and eventual death. Theodicy has to deal with these evils too, and as in the case of sin, it will not do to claim simply that they lead to some greater good that outweighs them. For as in the case of sin, the antitheist could then argue that God could as easily have created the world so that the resultant good would be achieved by means that did not involve suffering, or would simply appear without any means at all. How, then, might the theist respond here? Can the concept of defeasibility be developed so as to cover suffering as well as sin?

One indication that it can is the disdain we would have for a world in which there were no suffering or hardship to be faced, but instead only endless gratification. As usually formulated, the argument from evil is based on what appears to be a false presumption. It imagines that the ideal world for a loving and compassionate God to create must be what John Hick describes as a hedonistic paradise: a place devoted to human enjoyment, in which comfort and convenience are maximized, and pain and deprivation have little or no place (1966, 292–93). If not banished completely, they must be held to the minimum necessary to guarantee to God’s creatures the most pleasant existence possible. Now obviously, that is not the sort of world we have. The amount of suffering is immense — far more, certainly, than it would be if God’s aim were to maximize worldly joy. But the appropriate conclusion, the theist may argue, is not that the universe is not the creation of a provident God. For consider how we react to people whose lives have little to distinguish them except that they appear — perhaps deceptively — to be filled with enjoyment. There is a tendency, when we suffer one or another of life’s ills, to envy such people: to wish our own existence could be as theirs seems to be, rather than the painful drudgery of the moment. But the truth is that we seldom admire those who appear to have a life of ease, nor are we likely to consider that kind of life very well spent. What we admire are lives of courage and sacrifice: persons who overcome hardship, deprivation, or weakness to achieve some notable success; who stand, perhaps not even successfully, against some great evil; or who relinquish their own happiness to alleviate the suffering of others. How would such lives be possible if natural evil did not exist? (For a related view, see Swinburne 1978.)

Still less would we respect an entire world devoted to nothing but enjoyment. Imagine a society in which everyone has an electrode implanted in their brain, which, when a current is passed through it, causes intense euphoria, unmatched by any other pleasure. One simply needs to be attached to a power source, and the simple push of a button yields ecstasy. And that is all anyone cares about. Agriculture, commerce, government, and social institutions are organized toward but one goal: to maximize the time each person can spend plugged in, lost in self-stimulation. Individual lives are conducted with the same aim. Work is still necessary, but it is held to a minimum, and contact with fellow human beings has no purpose other than to keep things running smoothly, so that the pleasure of all can be maximized. Now if the antitheist ideal of creation were correct, this type of society ought to represent a high order of human existence — better by far than the world in which we presently find ourselves. In fact, however, it is beneath contempt, a level of existence so low as to be barely human. The enterprises we value most would shrivel to near nothingness in such a world: there would be no art or culture, no important public works, little technology and science — above all, no real human fellowship, no caring, no sacrifice (Hick 1966, 359–61). Perversely enough, in fact, all we have to add to a world like this is war, and we get a situation not at all unlike Hobbes’s state of nature, the very antithesis of anything we could value. Clearly, says the theist, we wish more for ourselves than this. A life without challenge is a life without interest.

If theism is correct on these matters, then a God interested in creating the best of worlds cannot have as his top priority the maximization of creaturely pleasure. Rather, a significant part of the enterprise of creation itself ought to be the confrontation and defeat of evil — an accomplishment far greater than merely guaranteeing the unperturbed pleasure of all. And if human beings are created in God’s image, and called to friendship with him, it is to be expected that they will have an important share in this enterprise. The central role in every human life of the struggle against evil bears this out. The battle is fought within each of us: the foremost challenge we face is that posed by our own sinfulness, which is overcome when we acknowledge that control of our destiny lies finally with God, and give up our false claim to ourselves. But for believers that is by no means the end of the matter. In the wake of repentance there should occur a gradual transformation of the individual, in which the damage wrought by sin is repaired, and the character traits appropriate for friendship with God are nourished. Remorse, anger and bitterness have to be replaced by gratitude, peace and hope; attitudes of failure must be supplanted by a sense of worth; rationalization has to give way to self-understanding. Above all, the believer has to develop such virtues as humility, patience, courage, and concern for others — to give up selfishness in favor of charity. Hick calls this process “soul-making” (1966, 289-97) In it, the individual is transformed into a being suited for full friendship with God, because through the achievement of virtue he is made over into God’s likeness. And much of the process takes place through our learning to deal with natural evil, with pain, sorrow and deprivation, in ourselves and others. By having to cope with our own suffering, we develop peace, humility, perseverance, and trust in God. We also learn sympathy for others who suffer, and by working to improve their lot we establish mercy and justice, in ourselves and in society. Indeed, much of human fellowship and solidarity is founded upon the support and comfort we lend to each other in times of need, and in the common enterprises by which we seek to secure ourselves and one another against the depredations of natural evil.

According to soul-making theodicy, then, by undergoing the soul-making process we develop the traits required for true friendship with God, in the only way that is suitable for humans. Some might object that God could have created virtuous people without their having to go through the troubles that afflict our present existence, that dispositions to good behavior need not be established through suffering (Mackie 1955, 205–06). Theists can respond, though, that this objection fails to grasp the nature of soul-making. Human virtues are not mere behavioral dispositions, of the kind found in the inanimate world. There are, no doubt, natural dispositions of patience, courage, kindness and the like — behavioral propensities we are born with, and that vary in strength from one individual to another. But these are not what we have in mind when we speak of moral virtue in the proper sense. True virtue has to be tested and refined. Someone with the virtue of patience must have tasted affliction and disappointment, and seen things through; the courageous person has to have endured danger and risk; the compassionate must have struggled with temptation, sorrow and hardship. The point of such experiences is not merely to strengthen our tendency to act rightly. Virtue is much more than an abiding behavioral propensity. It is a matter of practical wisdom. It requires that we know trial and suffering, and human weakness in the face of them, in the only way they truly can be known: through experience. Suffering, like sin, cannot be understood in the abstract. Only first hand awareness of the world’s pain enables us to comprehend fully the options for good and ill in the situations we face, to judge correctly what action is called for, and to perform it with an attitude of humble submission to God, and loving concern for others. In short, true virtue requires knowledge of good and evil — not just as they are manifested in our own struggle with sin, but as they are played out in the travail of the whole world. As we gain this knowledge, we become more suited for God’s friendship; indeed, the process of gaining it is the beginning of the friendship. For to address virtuously the hardships of life is not only to improve ourselves; it is to take up the role God has planned for us in the crucial creative enterprise of overcoming natural evil.

Soul-making, according to its defenders, is not possible except through the experience of suffering. Because this is so, and because a world in which humans are brought to spiritual maturity through this process is incomparably better than a hedonistic paradise, there is every reason to expect that a perfectly good and loving God would create a world in which there is suffering. Still, the opponent may object that this answer is at best incomplete. For, he will argue, not all of the suffering of the world enters into soul-making. Consider again the case that was mentioned earlier, of the fawn caught in a forest fire. By and large, the sufferings of lower animals pass without even being remarked by rational beings, and seem to serve no purpose whatever. Even among humans, intense suffering is often followed simply by death, and contributes to no apparent moral development. Or, it may simply be that a person dies suddenly. What end of soul-making does that serve? And in any case, the complaint continues, surely the sheer amount of natural evil that exists in the world is incommensurate with the purposes described. In much of human pain and hardship we see little or nothing of the heroic, but only misery. Virtue is a fine thing, but could not God have contrived to purchase it less expensively?

It is difficult for the theist to give a fully satisfying answer at this point. Perhaps the best strategy is to invoke again the concept of defeasibility. For a theodicy that emphasizes that notion, God’s full purpose in creating a world that includes pain and affliction includes more than the spiritual maturation of his creatures. Indeed, that effect is only concomitant to the objective that is first and foremost: that evil be defeated. We should expect, therefore, that evil will be found in the world to such a degree and in such variety as best to serve this overarching purpose. If anything less were so — if God, as creator, should shrink from some evil as too diabolical to be overcome, or too bitter to be endured — he would already have fled the field, and the battle would be lost before it had begun. But as to the actual degree and diversity of evil necessary for its defeat, that is very difficult for humans to judge. Our perspective on creation is vastly incomplete, and in any case we have no reason to expect to be privy to God’s purposes regarding each detail of creation — especially, as we are about to see, when it comes to suffering. Still, some helpful points are available to the theist.

First, as regards the claim that there is too much evil, or that much of it serves no purpose, it is not obvious that each instance of suffering must be defeated separately from all others, or in the experience of the individual who endures it.[9] The death of another can be as much a reminder to me of my finitude as my own impending death, sudden or lingering. The sufferings of others — even of lower animals — can be effective in arousing me to works of mercy and charity. Indeed, while particular acts of compassion must perforce be directed toward this or that specific instance of suffering, the attitude of compassion is not. Its object is all suffering, even suffering of which none but the sufferer will ever be specifically aware; and compassion can be awakened and reinforced by the very realization that much suffering goes unnoticed and unrequited. The same goes for other virtues. We may be prompted to greater efforts to secure justice in the world precisely because we know that much injustice is never redressed; we may seek to accomplish some difficult goal for which others suffered without success, and in whose memory we want to see it attained. One of the benefits of evil that seems unrequited, then, is that it elicits greater effort to deal with those ills we can address, and greater urgency to assist the forgotten. In this sense, at least, there is no such thing as suffering that serves no purpose.

A second important point concerns the way in which suffering is defeated in the process of soul-making. It is not simply that it is caught up in a larger process that is very good. That would be compatible with suffering merely being outweighed in the larger process, or with it serving only as a causal means to the achievement of virtue — neither of which is enough to secure its defeat. Rather, suffering is addressed in the process of soul-making and, as it were, refuted. To see how this occurs, we need to understand the nature of suffering. It is rarely a matter of sheer physical pain, and even when it is, we are often quite prepared to bear it. A distance runner might endure a lot of pain, or a student considerable hardship, in pursuit of their goals. Yet both might maintain an optimistic spirit, and even deny they were really suffering. True suffering occurs when reason is left groping, and hope is called into question. We suffer when pain seems too great to bear and to serve no commensurate end: when the loss of a loved one leaves us dazed, empty and alone; when hateful assaults leave us feeling wounded and violated; when we are distressed by disease, or the ravages of old age. Experiences like these tend to crowd all else out of our consciousness. They make us feel dismayed, vulnerable and incomplete; they make our projects appear trivial, our ambitions unreachable. Above all, the experience undermines our confidence in the essential goodness of the world, and our hope that all will be well. Indeed, what suffering does is to raise for each of us, in a way mere argument cannot, the problem of evil — and with it the inevitable temptation to sullenness, self-pity, and enmity toward whatever God there may be. But when we face the problem, and work through suffering, it is defeated. The defeat can manifest itself in many ways. Almost always, our capacity to endure future hardships, and to comfort others in theirs, is increased. We may come to see more accurately our place in the universe, to deepen our devotion to God, to resolve to assist in attacking the sources of suffering, in human wrongdoing as well as the vagaries of nature. In all of this, the theist may argue, natural evil is defeated: the very experience that threatens to overwhelm confidence in the good becomes the indispensable foundation for attitudes of character that serve to diminish its effects and aim at wiping it out. Above all, however, suffering is defeated in the simple fact that it is borne with good grace — that we refuse to submit to the temptation to descend into repining and bitterness, and resolve instead to continue in hope. Much of the heroism of those who suffer lies simply in this: that they strive to go on — something even a fawn can do.

The problem of suffering is not just an intellectual challenge, but a moral one as well. Evil calls for a certain reaction on our part, a reaction of striving, and it is defeated when that reaction occurs. It made be protested that this reaction is available only to believers, and hence that this approach to the problem of evil begs the question. That is not true. The theist is not required to produce a theodicy that will work even if there is no God, only one that will work if there is. And in any case, there seems to be no reason to think nonbelievers are precluded from participating in the defeat of evil. They can and do gain from suffering much as believers do — even to the point of reacting to it with hope in the final goodness of things, and with reverence for any source this goodness may have, whatever its nature. It does have to be admitted, of course, that particular instances of pain and misery do not always meet with a positive response in the sufferer. There may not be sufficient time, and when there is the individual may lack the intelligence or understanding to react in ways we would recognize. Where we do understand the reaction, there may be a mix between good and bad manifestations of character. And of course there are cases where natural evil is borne with anything but good will — with furious anger, or morose despair. Faced with this reality, the theist can only point out what was mentioned above, that the evils which befall some can and do work to encourage virtue in others, and this can occur by negative example also. If this seems insufficient, the theist can argue that in a world where each an every instance of evil was thoroughly and obviously defeated — so that a perfectly satisfying response to opponents of theism would always be available — an important dimension of evil would be missing. It is essential to the challenge of evil that it frequently appears gratuitous, that there seems to be too much of it, that as far as we can see, it often goes unaddressed.[10] Anything less could not bring out the best in us. And then we would be far less suited to God’s friendship, and this world would be far less than is needed for it to be a creation worthy of God: the best of all possible worlds.

10. Mystery

The last few sections outlined a variety of approaches to theodicy which are compatible with theological determinism; they represent attempts to explain why God might allow evil which do not rely on the traditional free will defense. Equally prominent in the tradition’s treatment of evil, however, is the theme of mystery: an unwillingness to identify with any surety why God would allow evil. That theme is prominent in scriptural treatments of evil, such as those found in Job and Ecclesiastes. Perhaps the most plausible way to interpret the tradition’s emphasis on mystery is as a combination of what philosophers now call skeptical theism and the Moore Switch.

Skeptical theism notes that the basis of the argument from evil is often, perhaps always, an inference from what is not seen, a “noseeum” inference: “I don’t see a reason God could have for allowing evil, so there isn’t one.” Sometimes inferences of that sort are good ones, as when I infer that there are no elephants in the classroom on the basis of the fact that I don’t see any. But often inferences of that sort are fallacious, as when I infer that there are no germs in the room on the basis of the fact that I don’t see any. The difference seems to be, roughly speaking, that I would expect to see any elephants if there were any, but I wouldn’t expect to see the germs. Which are God’s reasons most like, the elephants or the germs? Arguably, given the epistemic distance between God and man, his reasons would be more like the germs, and so the fact that we can’t identify a reason for God to allow evil doesn’t justify the inference that there is no such reason. Such, in outline, is the basic idea behind skeptical theism. (See Dougherty and McBrayer 2014 for debate over the view.)

The Moore Switch (Rowe 1979) is a related but different move. If one can know that God exists, and perhaps that Christianity or some other religion is true, on the basis of other evidence, and that evidence is sufficiently great so as to overwhelm the evidence against the existence of God provided by the existence of evil, then the problem of evil might become simply a puzzle to solve instead of a decisive reason against belief in God, even without a full explanation for evil. Particularly, if there exists a sort of direct perception of God or God’s works or properties of created things that directly imply the existence of God, then the evidence provided by such direct perception could overwhelm the evidence for the premises of an argument from evil against theism. The movement of Reformed epistemology has claimed to identify such direct perceptions or something analogous to such direct perceptions, and as such constitutes a distinct response to the problem of evil that still amounts to a kind of appeal to, or justification of, mystery with respect to God’s reasons for allowing evil (See Alston 1991 and Plantinga 2000).


The hallmark of the traditional free will defense is its fastidiousness: it seeks to distance God from as much evil as possible, so that his goodness will not be tainted by it. The God of the Judeo-Christian and Islamic traditions is not so fastidious. He is active in all our deeds, turning our hearts where he wills (Prov. 21:1), and working in us to will and to do as he pleases. Part of his purpose in this, the tradition holds, is that we be creatures with the moral authenticity that can only come with free will. The inevitable accompaniment, however, is that we sin. God does not will this for its own sake, but if God’s providence is complete he does will for us the independence that amounts to our rebellion, for it is indispensable to his purpose. The question the tradition faces is whether God’s providence can be complete here, whether he can have full sovereignty if we are truly free. The second focus of concern is the fact of suffering, which also falls under God’s will. According to theodicies that emphasize soul-making and defeasibility, this is not because God is malevolent, but so that we can share with him the knowledge that evil is creation’s enemy, and partake in the glory of its defeat. The scriptural God evinces no fear that he will be tainted by any of this, nor does he distance himself from evil in any way. On the contrary: even after Adam’s sin God remains fully engaged with humankind, sparing no effort to secure our rescue, and treating our suffering with healing concern and compassion. In the Christian tradition, he is even willing to send his son to bear our sorrows with us, and to be sacrificed so that we may again find acceptance with God in repentance. The fallenness of creation is not, then, an object of heavenly disdain, and for defenders of divine providence it is not cause for philosophical disappointment. Rather, they hold, the task of overcoming evil is central to the creative enterprise. We sin and suffer because God is out to defeat sin and suffering, and to see that all who are ordained to share in the victory do so. The theist is forced to admit, however, that we do not always understand in detail how this occurs, and some sort of appeal to mystery may in fact be necessary. In that respect, at least, any theodicy has to be incomplete.


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Hugh J. McCann
Daniel M. Johnson <djohnson2@shawnee.edu>

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