The Psychology of Normative Cognition

First published Tue Aug 25, 2020

From an early age, humans exhibit a tendency to identify, adopt, and enforce the norms of their local communities. Norms are the social rules that mark out what is appropriate, allowed, required, or forbidden in different situations for various community members. These rules are informal in the sense that although they are sometimes represented in formal laws, such as the rule governing which side of the road to drive on, they need not be explicitly codified to effectively influence behavior. There are rules that forbid theft or the breaking of promises, but also rules which govern how close it is appropriate to stand to someone while talking to them, or how loud one should talk during the conversation. Thus understood, norms regulate a wide range of activity. They exhibit cultural variability in their prescriptions and proscriptions, but the presence of norms in general appears to be culturally universal. Some norms exhibit characteristics that are often associated with morality, such as a rule that applies to everyone and prohibits causing unnecessary harm. Other norms apply only to certain people, such as those that delimit appropriate clothing for members of different genders, or those concerning the expectations and responsibilities ascribed to individuals who occupy positions of leadership. The norms that prevail in a community can be more or less fair, reasonable, or impartial, and can be subject to critique and change.

This entry provides an overview of interdisciplinary research into the psychological capacity for norm-guided cognition, motivation, and behavior. The notions of a norm and normativity occur in an enormous range of research that spans the humanities and behavioral sciences. Researchers primarily concerned with the psychology distinctive of norm-governed behavior take what can be called “cognitive-evolutionary” approaches to their subject matter. These approaches, common in the cognitive sciences, draw on a variety of resources and evidence to investigate different psychological capacities. This entry describes how these have been used to construct accounts of those cognitive and motivational features of minds that underpin the capacity to acquire, conform to, and enforce norms. It also describes how theories of the selective pressures and adaptive challenges prominent in recent human evolution have helped to inform and constrain theorizing about this psychological capacity, as well as how its features can influence the transmission and cultural evolution of norms.

By way of organization, the entry starts with basics and proceeds to add subsequent layers of intricacy and detail. Researchers taking cognitive-evolutionary approaches to norms come from a wide range of disciplines, and have formulated, explored, and debated positions on a large number of different issues. In order to present a comprehensible overview of these interconnected literatures, the entry starts by laying out main contours and central tenets, the key landmarks in the conceptual space common to different theories and claims. It goes on to provide a more detailed description of the kinds of theoretical resources that researchers have employed, and identifies important dimensions along which more specific accounts of the psychology of norms have varied. It then canvasses different sources of empirical evidence that have begun to illuminate other philosophically interesting features of the capacity for norms. Finally, it ends with a discussion of the relationship between norm cognition and morality, with a few illustrations drawn from recent debates in moral theory.

1. A Psychological Capacity Dedicated to Norms

Norms are the rules of a group of people that mark out what is appropriate, allowed, required, or forbidden for various members in different situations. They are typically manifest in common behavioral regularities that are kept in place by social sanctions. From an early age, humans see certain behaviors, contexts, and roles as governed by norms. Once a person adopts a norm, it functions both as a rule that guides behavior and as a standard against which behavior is evaluated. Moreover, individuals typically become motivated to enforce the norms they adopt, and so to participate in regulative practices such as punishment and the ascription of blame. Such practices in turn help stabilize the community’s social arrangements and the norms that structure them. Norms are often classified into kinds or subcategories, with common examples including moral, social, conventional, epistemic, aesthetic, and organizational norms. The correct or theoretically most useful way to distinguish and taxonomize kinds of norm is the subject of much debate, but one that will be set aside here (see O’Neill 2017 for a review, Kelly forthcoming for discussion). Rather, this section will sketch a general overview of the conceptual space common to cognitive-evolutionary work on the psychology of norms, and later sections will elaborate on its contents, locating different claims and specific theories within it.

An idea central to work on the psychology of norms is that human minds contain a norm system of some kind, a set of psychological mechanisms dedicated to handling information and producing behaviors relevant to norms. Such mechanisms feature in an explanatory strategy common throughout psychology (R. Cummins 2000). In this case, theorists appeal to different properties of the norm system to help account for different aspects of a complex capacity for norm-guided behavior—a capacity to “do” norms. This capacity is characterized by a broad but distinctive pattern of behavior: when faced with norm relevant stimuli, typically centered on other peoples’ actions or their own, along with other cues concerning the context of those actions and the roles of the actors, individuals exhibit a robust and multifaceted type of response that is centered on conformity and punishment. Taken together, the responses of individuals aggregate up to produce stabilizing group-level effects on patterns of collective social organization. The complexity and robustness of the individual capacity suggests the operation of dedicated psychological machinery—a norm system—which sensitizes humans to certain social stimuli (behavior, contexts, roles) and reliably produces the coordinated facets (physiologically, inferentially, behaviorally) of the characteristic response.

This picture raises the question of how it is that humans are able to spontaneously and reliably track norm-relevant features of their world, infer the rules which govern it, and bring those rules to bear on their own and others’ behavior. It also calls for a psychological answer, one that sheds light on what mediates the stimuli and the response. By analogy, an automobile is capable of acceleration—it reliably speeds up in response to the depression of the gas pedal—but one needs to “look under the hood” to see what sort of mechanisms are reliably translating that kind of input into that kind of output. Moving from the acceleration of a car to the norm-guided activity of a person, cognitive-evolutionary approaches posit and investigate the psychological machinery that is responsible for translating certain kinds of social inputs into the kind of behavioral outputs associated with norms. This strategy—of positing psychological mechanisms that mediate stimulus and response—is supported by a now familiar way of understanding the mind as an information processing system. The inputs under consideration are treated as information, which is routed and processed by a suite of psychological mechanisms and finally translated into behavioral outputs. Those focused on the psychology distinctive of normative cognition have posited the existence of this kind of dedicated package of mechanisms, and have investigated different possibilities about its nature.

To introduce a couple terms of art, accounts of psychological capacities often aspire to provide both a proximate explanation and an ultimate explanation. Where proximate explanations try to answer, “How does it work?”, ultimate explanations try to answer, “How did we come to be like this?” This distinction originates in biology (Mayr 1961; Ariew 2003), but is applicable to behavioral and psychological traits as well (Griffiths 2007). Central to proximate explanations in these latter contexts are the models of the psychological processes that underlie specific capacities. After identifying a relatively complex ability, that ability is explained in terms of the operation and interaction of a set of relatively simpler underlying component mechanisms. Thus, proximate explanations of norms aim to show how human individuals are psychologically capable of the rich array of activity associated with norm-guided behavior by identifying the component parts of the norm system and describing how they operate.

Ultimate explanations, on the other hand, aim to explain the likely origins of different traits. It is now common for the cognitive sciences to make extensive use of evolutionary theory, taking what is known about the environments and selective pressures faced by ancestral populations and using it to help inform hypotheses about minds (Barkow, Cosmides, & Tooby 1992). Central to many of the ultimate explanations proposed by researchers interested in the psychology of norms are the adaptive challenges raised by collective action and large-scale cooperation (Gintis, Bowles, et al. 2005; Boyd & Richerson 2005b; N. Henrich & J. Henrich 2007; Tomasello 2009). For the sake of clarity, it is helpful to remember that these two styles of explanation are analytically distinct, but that proximate and ultimate explanations for a given trait will ideally be complementary and mutually reinforcing. Thus, evolutionary accounts of norm cognition can inform and constrain proximate models, and vice versa.

The psychological focus of cognitive-evolutionary approaches to norms gives them a fairly clear research agenda. It is worth noting, however, that while questions about the nature of norms are relevant to a range of debates in philosophy (and beyond), work on the psychology of norms is not primarily driven by one particular philosophical tradition or debate. Rather, those focused on normative psychology are typically guided by a set of general issues concerning human nature: the structure and distinctive features of human minds, the pathways of human evolution that produced them, and the commonalities and differences between human minds and behaviors, on one hand, and those found in non-human species, on the other (Tomasello 1999; Richerson & Boyd 2005; Tooby & Cosmides 2005; J. Henrich 2015; Vincent Ring, & Andrews 2018). One upshot of this is that theorists draw on the full range of explanatory resources made available by contemporary cognitive science. Thus, these accounts of normative cognition are not constrained by folk-psychological explanations of behavior, and so are free to posit and appeal to psychological mechanisms, states, and processes that need not bear much resemblance to beliefs and desires, credences and preferences, conscious deliberation and explicit inference.

This entry is organized around research whose focal point is the psychology distinctive of normative cognition. However, any discussion of norms and norm-guided behavior will involve, tacitly or otherwise, some picture or other of agents and the characteristics that make them responsive to normative influence. Some begin with analytic formalizations of the kinds of agents and mental states assumed by common sense folk psychology, and use these formalizations, along with various refinements, to account for different norm related phenomena. These fall beyond the scope of this entry, but see especially Bicchieri, Muldoon, and Sontuoso (2018) for an overview of such approaches (also see Bicchieri 2006, 2016; Brennan et al. 2013; Conte, Andrighetto, & Campennì 2013; Hawkins, Goodman, & Goldstone 2019; cf. Morris et al. 2015). It is also worth noting that cognitive-evolutionary approaches are sometimes presented as importantly different from classic rational choice approaches to human decision and social behavior (Boyd & Richerson 2001; Henrich, Boyd, et al. 2001, 2005). Whether these are genuinely distinct alternatives remains unclear (Elster 1991, cf. Wendel 2001), but those who make the case typically point to a growing body of evidence that suggests humans rarely approximate the unboundedly rational, purely self-interested agents of classical economics (Gigerenzer & Selten 2001; Kahneman 2011, cf. Millgram 2019, Other Internet Resources). To illustrate, participants in one-time, anonymous cooperation games have been observed to routinely cooperate, even when they are made explicitly aware of their anonymity and the fact that they will play the game just once (Marwell & Ames 1981; see Thaler 1992 for a review). Those sympathetic to cognitive-evolutionary approaches to norms have an explanatory template for this kind of finding ready at hand, and will construe participants’ behavior as motivated by their norm systems and the pro-social norms that they have internalized.

With the expanded repertoire of psychological entities at their disposal, explanations that appeal to a psychological capacity dedicated to norms also appear well suited to capture the kinds of dissonance and dissociation that can occur between individuals’ attention, implicit categorization, and normative motivation, on the one hand, and their explicit beliefs and avowed principles, on the other. A person may, for example, explicitly endorse feminism and sincerely wish to extinguish the sexist norms and expectations he has about women, but nevertheless find himself monitoring the social world through the lens of those sexist norms, and experiencing recalcitrant motivation to enforce and comply with them (cf. work on implicit biases Brownstein & Saul 2016). In short, on this kind of picture different psychological systems that comprise an individual’s mind (perhaps the norm system and the practical reasoning system) can work independently from, and be at slight odds with, each other.

Several more specific features that appear distinctive of normative cognition have drawn considerable attention from psychological researchers. These include the propensities to acquire norms, to comply with norms, and to enforce norms. When a person is born into or otherwise enters a community, she needs to be able to identify and extract information about the broad assortment of norms that shape it, who different norms apply to and when, and what the consequences of breaking them are. She must be able to see some behaviors as normatively regulated, and then to infer what the governing rule is. Learning how to do this is sometimes supported by intentional pedagogical behavior by her mentors (Sterelny 2012), but need not be (Schmidt, Rakoczy, & Tomasello 2011). Gaining knowledge of the rules is not where it ends. Individuals rarely just observe such social activities, but rather come to competently participate in them. To do this, a person typically learns to behave in compliance with the norms she identifies as applying to herself; acquiring those norms results in their coming to guide her own conduct. Finally, prevalent norms and standards of conduct are collectively maintained by a community when its members enforce them, punishing those who fail to follow the rules. Enforcement and punishment are broad categories, and can include correcting, withholding cooperation, communicating disapproval through body language or explicit criticism, ostracizing or gossiping about norm violators, or even physical violence. Thus, individuals become responsive to norms and the social pressure by which they are enforced, and motivated to apply social pressure to others who transgress.

Further questions arise about each of these propensities. One cluster of questions concerns the details of acquisition: what sort of perceivable cues are salient to the norm system, prompting a person to perceive a behavior, context, or role as normatively governed? And once a norm is identified, what causes a person to internalize it? Perhaps the merely statistical fact that most people behave the same way suffices in some cases, while in others a sanctioning response may be required to activate the acquisition process. A second family of issues concerns motivation: is norm-guided behavior typically driven by intrinsic or instrumental motivation? People may comply with a norm for its own sake, simply because it is felt to be the right thing to do. They may also, however, obey a norm merely in order to avoid punishment and blame. Some behaviors may be driven by both kinds of motivation. Similar and perhaps more puzzling questions arise about the psychological roots of people’s motivation to punish others who violate norms. A third family of questions can be framed in terms of innateness: to what degree are the mechanisms responsible for norm cognition innately specified or culturally acquired? Aside from the mechanisms, is any of the content—any of the norms themselves—innately specified?

Cognitive-evolutionary approaches to norms treat these as empirical questions, and thus see value in, and aspire to be sensitive to, a wide range of evidence. Before looking more closely at some of that evidence however, it will be useful to be familiar with the types of theoretical tools researchers typically use to generate and interpret it.

1.1 Background: Evolution and Ultimate Considerations

A working hypothesis of cognitive-evolutionary approaches is that the psychological mechanisms underlying norm cognition are evolved adaptations to important selection pressures in human evolutionary history (Richerson & Boyd 2005; Sripada & Stich 2007, Tomasello 2009; Chudek & Henrich 2011; Kelly & Davis 2018, cf. Cosmides & Tooby 1992). Even if a detailed proximate account were already available, other questions could be asked about the provenance of the norm system: how—that is, due to which evolutionary factors—did human minds come to be equipped with these psychological mechanisms? To what adaptive problem or problems was normative cognition a solution? What selection pressures were primarily responsible for the evolution of a norm system, and what phylogenetic trajectory did that evolution take? A brief summary of the types of answers currently on offer to these questions provides useful context for the discussion of proximate explanations that follows.

A fairly uncontroversial background tenet of the received view is that humans are extraordinarily social animals, and that our hypertrophied abilities to learn from and cooperate with each other are key to what set us apart from our closest primate ancestors and other hominid species. A crucial difference is thought to be that human capacities to imitate and learn from each other became powerful enough to sustain cumulative culture (Tomasello 1999; J. Henrich & McElreath 2003, Laland 2017). Culture is understood as information that is transmitted between individuals and groups via behavior, rather than processes like genetic transmission (Ramsey 2013). Beliefs, preferences, norms, skills, techniques, information-containing artifacts, etc., are passed from individual to individual, and thus across populations and between generations, mainly by social learning (Mathew & Perreault 2015). For example, development of the set of techniques and skills associated with throwing spears, or the knowledge and tools enabling the controlled use of fire, have been tied to increases in opportunities for social learning provided by expanding social networks and more complex forms of social activity (Thieme 1997; Gowlett 2006). Culture is cumulative in the sense that the body of information in the cultural repository does not remain static, but can itself grow larger and more complex. Grass huts evolve into wood-frame houses, then brick buildings, and eventually skyscrapers. Tribal leaders evolve into kings, then emperors, then prime ministers. Simple sets of norms evolve into more complicated informal institutions, then byzantine formalized legal codes. As each generation adds its own new innovations, discoveries, and improvements, functional sophistication is accumulated in cultural traits in much the same way as it is accumulated in genetic traits.

This general evolutionary outlook gives reason to think that as human groups increased in size, they also grew in their capacity to carry more culture and produce more cultural innovations (Kline & Boyd 2010; J. Henrich 2015: chapter 12), though the causal relationship between population size and cultural complexity remains controversial (Fogarty & Creanza 2017, cf. Vaesen et al. 2016). As cultural innovations continued to accumulate, they allowed humans to more significantly control and reshape the environments in which they lived. Such transformations also reshaped the environments inhabited by subsequent generations, thus shifting the contours of the physical, social, and informational niches in which they evolved. Such changes, in turn, created a range of new selection pressures, many of which favored bodies, brains, and minds better equipped for sociality and cultural inheritance. Researchers continue to develop and debate the merits of different conceptual tools with which to conceive of this kind of evolutionary dynamic (Tomasello 1999; Laland, Odling-Smee, & Feldman 2001; Laland, Odling-Smee, & Myles 2010; Sterelny 2003, 2012; Richerson & Boyd 2005; Tennie, Call, & Tomasello 2009; Boyd, Richerson, & Henrich 2011, J. Henrich 2015; Boyd 2017).

Humans are able to inhabit a wide range of environments, and socially transmitted information—as opposed to innately specified and biologically transmitted information—is particularly useful in the face of ecological and social variation (Richerson & Boyd 2013). Information about which plants in various environments are edible and which are toxic has straightforward adaptive advantage. Information about what kinds of norms prevail in various social environments is also important, and knowing it allows individuals to smoothly participate in their community and coordinate with other members in an array of collective activities that ranges from producing food and raising children to responding to threats and dealing with outsiders (Chudek & Henrich 2011). While different types of cultural variants can be useful in different ways, not all socially transmittable information is equally valuable, and individuals are not indiscriminate social learners. Theorists posit that human minds evolved to contain a number of social learning biases or heuristics that help facilitate more selective learning. These influence which, of the many cultural variants to which an individual is exposed, she will actually adopt for herself. Two heuristics appear to be particularly important in amplifying the advantages of a system of cultural inheritance. One is a conformity bias, which prompts individuals to adopt those cultural variants that have been adopted by most others in their community (Muthukrishna, Morgan, & Henrich 2016), and another is a prestige bias, which sensitizes individuals to hierarchy and status, prompting them to model their behavior on those who have achieved success and high social rank (J. Henrich & Gil-White 2001; Cheng et al. 2012; Maner 2017). In addition to these two, researchers have posited other learning biases that can influence norm acquisition, including one that makes information about norms easier to remember than other, non-normative information about behavior (O’Gorman, Wilson, & Miller 2008).

Culture looms increasingly large in evolutionary explanations of human ultrasociality, i.e., our species’ ability to cooperate on a remarkably large scale (Tomasello 2009, 2016; Richerson 2013; though see Hagen & Hammerstein 2006; Burnham & Johnson 2005 for alternative views, and Sterelny, Calcott, & Fraser 2013 for broader context on the evolution of cooperation). An increasingly prominent idea is that explaining the full range of behaviors involved in human sociality will require some appeal not just to culture in general, but to culturally transmitted norms and institutions in particular (Mathew, Boyd, & van Veelen 2013). Some have taken the significance and complexity of the adaptive challenges posed by large-scale cooperation to have implications for human psychology, arguing from these grounds that human minds have a capacity specific to norms (Chudek, Zhao, & Henrich 2013), which may have evolved in tandem with our capacities for language (Lamm 2014). Others argue further that cultural group selection, generated by various forms of competition between cultural groups like communities, tribes, clans, and even nations, has contributed to the spread of more effective cooperative norms (Turchin 2018; Richerson, Baldini, et al. 2016, though see Krasnow et al. 2015). On such views, these kinds of selective pressures further remodeled human social psychology, supplementing more evolutionarily ancient social instincts to form what have been called tribal social instincts (Richerson & Boyd 2001; Boyd & Richerson 2008; Richerson & Henrich 2012). This family of evolutionarily recent “instincts” is posited as including a capacity for norms, but also other psychological features thought to refine norm-guided behavior in various ways, including sensitivities to markers of tribal membership and the boundaries between ethnic groups (McElreath, Boyd, & Richerson 2003) and social emotions like guilt, pride, and loyalty.

1.2 Psychology and Proximate Explanations: Theoretical Tools and Dimensions

The theoretical toolkit common in the cognitive and behavioral sciences affords several key dimensions along which different theorists stake out and explore more specific positions about normative psychology. Capacities like the one for norms are understood as complex in the sense that they are subserved by a number of simpler, interrelated processes and subsystems. Such complex systems are usefully analyzed by reference to those simpler ones that comprise them. When used in psychology, this general method of analyzing complex systems by appeal to the character and interactions of their component parts often takes the form of what has been called homuncular functionalism (Lycan 1990), where it is paired with the metaphysical doctrine of functionalism about the mind. This, briefly stated, is the view that mental states and processes are functional states, identified by the characteristic role they play in the psychological system of which they are a part (Putnam 1963, 1967; Fodor 1968; Levin 2004 [2018]). Dennett, an early proponent of homuncular functionalism, urged psychologists to follow a method parallel to that used in artificial intelligence research:

The AI researcher starts with an intentionally characterized problem (e.g., how can I get a computer to understand questions of English?), breaks it down into sub-problems that are also intentionally characterized (e.g., how do I get the computer to recognize questions, distinguish subjects from predicates, ignore irrelevant parsing?) and then breaks these problems down further until he reaches problem or task descriptions that are obviously mechanistic. (Dennett 1978: 80)

An important step in any explanation is delineating the target phenomena itself. In cognitive science, this step often takes the form of characterizing a capacity via task analysis, which amounts to identifying and distinguishing the tasks or functions that are performed in exercising the relevant capacity. For example, some tasks currently thought to be central to the functioning of a norm system include those mentioned above: acquisition, compliance, and enforcement. Another step is concerned with modeling the psychological mechanisms responsible for carrying out those tasks: the typical algorithms and patterns of information processing that perform those functions. The final step in completing a full account of a capacity would be an explanation of how those mechanisms and algorithms are implemented and thus realized in the person’s physical, chemical, and biological structures (see Marr 1982 for the classical discussion of these different levels of explanation).

While experimental and other behavioral evidence can help to more directly characterize a capacity and identify its associated tasks, many theoretically important issues have to do with determining what kind of psychological mechanisms should be posited to account for them. Theorists defending different views might hypothesize different mechanisms that underpin a particular capacity, or give different accounts of how a mechanism performs its function. They can also agree or disagree about how the relevant mechanisms are organized, developing different accounts of their proprietary algorithms, and the types of causal and informational links each bears to each other and to other elements of a person’s overall psychological economy (perceptual systems, short term memory, action production systems, etc.).

Within this conceptual space there are number of prominent dimensions along which accounts might vary. The following list of such dimensions is not exhaustive, but it gives a sense of some of the most significant ones. The psychological mechanisms posited by different proximate accounts of a norm system can differ with respect to

  1. Whether and to what extent they are fast, automatic, intuitive, non-conscious, or otherwise fit the description of “type 1” cognition, or are slow, controlled, effortful, conscious, or otherwise fit the description of “type 2” cognition
  2. Whether and to what extent they bear the markings of modularity, i.e., are cognitively impenetrable, informationally encapsulated, domain specific, etc.
  3. Whether and to what extent they require or are subject to voluntary control
  4. Whether and to what extent mechanisms and their content are universal aspects of human psychological nature, or instead exhibit variation across habitats and cultures
  5. Whether and to what extent the mechanisms and their content are innate, genetic adaptations, or are instead socially learned and culturally transmitted
  6. Whether and to what extent the motivation associated with the mechanisms is intrinsic or instrumental

The first dimension concerns a distinction between type 1 and type 2 cognitive processes made by dual processing and dual systems theories (see Frankish 2010 for a review, Cushman, Young, & Greene 2010). Type 1 processes are typically characterized as “fast and frugal,” intuitive, heuristic processes which deliver “rough-and-ready” responses (Gigerenzer et al. 2000). These processes take place automatically and unconsciously and are prone to error, but they make up in speed and resource-efficiency what they lack in precision. Type 2 processes, by contrast, are typically characterized as slower, rule-based, analytical processes which require more concentration and cognitive effort, take place consciously, and deliver more precise responses.

The second dimension concerns the view that the mind is, to some degree, made up of modules: psychological mechanisms that are informationally encapsulated, fairly autonomous, automatic, and domain-specific (Fodor 1983; Carruthers 2006; Robbins 2009 [2017]). Modules are informationally encapsulated in the sense that they are insensitive to information present in the mind but not contained within the mechanism itself, leaving their internal processes unaffected by, for example, what the person reflectively believes or prefers. A related property is cognitive impenetrability. This captures the fact that the information and processes inside a module are themselves inaccessible to central systems, such as those involved in introspection or deliberation. Although it is often possible to consciously consider the output of a modular mechanism, the endogenous processes responsible for producing that output will remain opaque to direct introspection (Carruthers 2011).

Turning to the third dimension, it should be clear how commitments along the first two dimensions could support different views about the extent to which normatively governed expectations and behavior require or are susceptible to voluntary control. If the processes subserving the capacity for norms are to some degree automatic and unconscious, and are insensitive to changes a person makes to her explicit beliefs, judgments, or volitions, those processes would be able to affect her behavior without the need of any guidance from her will, and could help produce behaviors and judgments that oppose it. Research on implicit bias may provide useful resources for thinking about the relationship between normative cognition and voluntary control. Recent work sheds light on what kind of intervention strategies are effective (Lai et al. 2014; Devine et al. 2012), and suggests that deliberate cognitive effort and voluntary control can, under certain conditions, override the influence of implicit and automatic cognition. Turning to normative cognition, research suggests that self-control may be required to violate a norm one has internalized, such as the norm against breaking promises (Baumgartner et al. 2009), but the details remain unclear (Peach, Yoshida, & Zanna 2011; Yoshida et al. 2012; also see Kelly forthcoming for discussion of differences between internalized and avowed norms).

The fourth and fifth dimensions are where the traditional nature/nurture debate plays out with respect to norms and normative psychology. It is part of the standard account of modules that they are innate in the sense that they will develop in more or less the same way in normal humans, irrespective of cultural setting. Advocates of so-called Evolutionary Psychology, one especially visible way of applying evolutionary thought to human behavior, have embraced the idea of modules, even arguing that human minds are “massively modular”, i.e., composed exhaustively or almost entirely of modular psychological mechanisms (Barkow, Cosmides, & Tooby 1992; Samuels 1998; Carruthers 2006). On such a view, normative psychology will also be modular in many respects. One way to develop this idea would be to make the case that all human cultures are structured by some set of norms or another, suggesting the presence of modular cognition. The ways in which norms differ from one group to the next might then be explained by appeal to an evoked culture model (Tooby & Cosmides 1992, though see Sperber 1996 for a different account of the relationship between modular cognition and culture). According to this model, the norm-guided behaviors found across cultures would be construed as innately constrained, rooted in endogenous mental form and content of the “cognitive adaptations for social exchange” common to all human minds. Normative variation, then, would be explained by appeal to the fact that different groups live in different circumstances, and variation in the external conditions they face evokes different subsets of the set of all norms and norm-governed behaviors made possible by the norm system. Such a view has been suggested but not yet fully worked out (though see Buchanan & Powell 2018). An alternative family of views puts the ideas of innateness and domain-specificity to different uses (Fessler & Machery 2012). These, which have been more developed for normative psychology, depict humans as having an innate capacity dedicated to acquiring and performing norms, but whose underlying mechanisms contain little if any innately specified content. No particular norms would be innate on such a view; rather, the capacity (perhaps together with some set of learning biases) guides acquisition in its specific domain, and thus equips individuals to easily internalize whatever norms are present in her local social environment (Boyd & Richerson 2005a; Sripada & Stich 2007; Chudek & Henrich 2011; Kelly & Davis 2018).

A general alternative to these kinds of nativist, modular views has recently been developed in more detail. It holds that psychological mechanisms bearing many characteristics of type 1 processes might be learned cognitive gadgets rather than innate cognitive instincts or modules. On this account, a complex capacity—for, say, reading and writing or playing chess—is still underpinned by a number of relatively integrated psychological mechanisms and routinized processes, but these mechanisms themselves (as opposed to merely the content they process) are fashioned and bundled together by cultural evolution. These packages of skills, once available in the group’s cultural repertoire, can then be acquired by individuals via domain general learning processes (Heyes 2018). The idea of a cognitive gadget provides a promising new theoretical option for psychology in general. Its advocates have not yet systematically addressed the question of whether it best captures the capacity for norms, however (though see Sterelny 2012 chapter 7 for a discussion that anticipates this line of thought).

Others interested in moral cognition more generally—which outstrips work on norm-guided behavior to include work on the psychology of altruism, well-being, character and virtue, moral emotions, intentional versus unintentional action, and so forth—have sought to develop an analogy between Chomskyan theories of language acquisition and use, on one hand, and the acquisition and application of moral rules, on the other (Mikhail 2007, 2011; Dwyer, Huebner, & Hauser 2010; Hauser, Young, & Cushman 2008; Roedder & Harman 2010). This approach is generally nativist, positing a universal moral competence that guides learning specifically in the domain of morality, and contains enough innately specified structure to account for the putative poverty of moral stimulus that children face when attempting to learn the norms that prevail in their local environment (see Laurence & Margolis 2001 for discussion of poverty of the stimulus arguments in cognitive science). Some advocates also suggest that in addition to information specifying the structure of the mechanisms dedicated to acquiring and processing moral norms, a few particular norms themselves may also be included as part of the innate moral capacity, perhaps norms against incest or intentionally causing harm (e.g., Mikhail 2007, 2011). Others have criticized this view (Prinz 2008; Sterelny 2012), but only recently has a more detailed positive account of rule acquisition begun to be developed. Central to this newly emerging empiricist alternative is the idea that individuals are rational rule learners, but they rely on domain general learning strategies to acquire norms from their social environment, rather than on an innately specified, domain specific moral competence (Gaus & Nichols 2017; Ayars & Nichols 2017, 2020; Nichols forthcoming.)

The sixth and final dimension concerns motivation. Especially in light of the roles that punishment and reward play in the stabilization of group-level patterns of behavior, an initially plausible idea is that normative motivation is instrumental (for discussion see Fehr & Falk 2002). On such views, an individual conforms to a norm in order to receive some benefit, or to avoid reprimand, or because she wants to behave in the way she thinks others expect her to behave. Such motivation would be instrumental in the sense that people obey norms merely as a means to some further end that more fundamentally drives them; in counterfactual terms, remove the external reward, punishment, or social expectation, and the individual’s norm compliant behavior will disappear along with it. Those who explore this kind of account have recently emphasized the role of psychological states like conditional preferences, together with 2nd order social beliefs, i.e., people’s beliefs about other people’s expectations, and people’s beliefs about other people’s beliefs about what should be done (see Bicchieri, Muldoon, & Sontuoso 2018 for discussion of such a family views).

Other accounts construe normative motivation as intrinsic (Kelly & Davis 2018; Nichols forthcoming, especially chapter 10). On such a view, once a norm is acquired and internalized, it typically becomes infused with some kind of non-instrumental motivation. People will be motivated to comply with and enforce a such rule for its own sake, and experience an impetus to do so that is independent of external circumstances or the perceived likelihood that they will receive social sanctions even if they flout the norm. Intrinsic motivation does not imply unconditional behavioral conformity, of course. For example, a person may feel the intrinsic pull of a norm that prescribes leaving a 20% tip, but still choose to override it and instead act out of material self-interest, stiffing the waiter. This second family of accounts raises a broader set of questions about the psychological nature of normative motivation, and if and how it might be special. Is normative motivation best treated as a primitive, its own sui generis psychological category? Or is it better construed as being generated by more familiar psychological elements like desires, emotions, drives, or other types of conative states, posited on independent grounds, that are recruited to work in conjunction with normative psychology? (see Kelly 2020 for discussion)

An early and influential account of the psychology of norms given by Sripada and Stich (2007) illustrates how these kinds of theoretical pieces might be put together. The preliminary model posits two innate mechanisms, a norm acquisition mechanism and a norm execution mechanism. The functions or tasks of the norm acquisition mechanism are

  1. to identify behavioral cues indicating the existence of a norm
  2. to infer the content of that norm, and finally
  3. to pass information about that content on to a norm execution mechanism

The tasks of the norm execution mechanism, on the other hand, are

  1. to encode and store those norms passed along to it by the acquisition system in a norm database, which may have some proprietary processes for reasoning about the contents represented therein
  2. to detect cues in the immediate environment that indicate if any of those norms apply to the situation, and if so to whom
  3. to generate motivation to comply with those norms that apply to oneself,
  4. to generate motivation to punish those who violate norms that apply to them

Sripada and Stich provide an initial pictorial representation:

a diagram: link to extended description below

Figure: Sripada & Stich 2007: 290, figure redrawn. [An extended description of the figure is in the supplement.]

The acquisition and execution mechanisms themselves are posited as innate, but are highly sensitive to the local social setting in which an individual develops. As described above, this bifurcation into innate psychological architecture, on the one hand, and socially learned normative content, on the other, is taken to explain why the presence of norms is culturally universal, whereas the behaviors, roles, and social arrangements governed by those norms exhibit variation. In addition, the model depicts the operation of many components of the norm system as “automatic and involuntary” (Sripada & Stich 2007: 290), but takes no stand on particular processes or more granular characteristics associated with modularity or dual processing. Finally, the model is designed to accommodate evidence suggesting that when a norm is acquired and represented in the database it thereby gains a distinctive kind of motivational profile. Specifically, this profile construes normative motivation as

  1. intrinsically as opposed to instrumentally motivating
  2. both self- and other-oriented
  3. potentially powerful

On this account, normative motivation has the third property in the sense that in some cases it is capable of overpowering even fairly compelling motivations that pull in conflicting directions; extreme examples include suicide bombers overriding their instincts for self-preservation, or other fanatics who expend significant resources to enforce their favored norms on others. The self- and other-directedness of normative motivation captures the idea that the norm system produces motivation to keep one’s own behavior in compliance with a norm as well as motivation to enforce it by punishing others who violate it.

Finally, the model depicts normative motivation as intrinsic in the usual sense that people comply with norms as ultimate ends, or for their own sake. Sripada and Stich suggest that intrinsic motivation helps explain a property of norms they call “independent normativity”. This marks the fact that norms can exert reliable influence on people’s behavior even when those norms are not written down or formally articulated in any formal institution, and thus not enforced via any official mechanisms of punishment and reward (also see Davidson & Kelly 2020). They also discuss motivation and independent normativity in terms of an “internalization hypothesis” drawn from sociology and anthropology, and suggest that the idea of internalization can be interpreted in terms of their model. On this story, a person has internalized a norm when it has been acquired by and represented in her norm database. The internalization hypothesis can then be construed as a claim that internalized norms are intrinsically motivating for the simple reason that it is a fundamental psychological feature of normative psychology that once a norm has been acquired, delivered to, and represented in a person’s norm database, the norm system automatically confers this distinctive motivational profile on the norm. Being accompanied by self- and other-directed intrinsic motivation is part of the functional role a rule comes to occupy once it is represented in the database of a person’s norm system—when it is “internalized”—in something analogous to the way that being accompanied by avoidance motivation and contamination sensitivity is part of the functional role a cue comes to occupy once it is represented in a person’s disgust system (Kelly 2011; also see Gavrilets & Richerson 2017 for a computational model exploring the evolution of norm internalization and the kinds of selective forces that may have given normative psychology this intriguing characteristic).

2. Empirical Research

The explanatory strategies and theoretical toolkit of the cognitive sciences have been used to guide and account for an enormous range of empirical work. Cognitive-evolutionary approaches to normative psychology are likewise interdisciplinary, and aspire to accommodate empirical research done on norms by anthropologists, sociologists, behavioral economists, and developmental, comparative, and other kinds of psychologists. This section provides a sampling of the sorts of findings that have been marshalled to illuminate interesting aspects of norm-guided behavior and support different claims about normative cognition.

2.1 Sociology, Anthropology, and Cultural Psychology

As noted above, the ethnographic record indicates that all cultures are structured by norms—rules that guide behavior and standards by which it is evaluated (Brown 1991). Evidence also suggests that norms are fairly evolutionarily ancient, as there is little indication that the capacity for norms spread from society to society in the recent past. Anthropologists also have shown that norms governing, e.g., food sharing, marriage practices, kinship networks, communal rituals, etc., regulate the practices of extant hunter-gatherers and relatively culturally isolated groups, which would be unlikely if norms were a recent innovation (see J. Henrich 2015 for a review). Much attention, however, has been given to the ways in which the prevailing sets of norms vary between cultures (House, Kanngiesser, et al. 2020; cf. Hofstede 1980, 2001) and the manner in which packages of norms develop and change over time within particular cultures (Gaus 2016, Schulz et al. 2019; cf. Inglehart 1997; Bednar et al. 2010).

For example, one line of evidence from comparative ethnography looks at cooperative behavior, and reveals variation between groups even in the kinds of activities, relationships, and contexts that are governed by norms. Some groups “cooperate only in warfare and fishing, while others, just downstream, cooperate only in housebuilding and communal rituals” (Chudek, Zhao, & Henrich 2013: 426). That behavioral variations like these can persist even in the face of the same ecological context (i.e., “just downstream”) suggests that they are due to differences in norms and other socially transmitted elements of culture, rather than responses more directly evoked by the physical environment (also see N. Henrich & J. Henrich 2007).

It is a platitude that different individual norms, identified by the context in which they apply, their scope and content, and the specific behaviors they prescribe and proscribe, are present in different cultures. Systematic empirical work has also recently investigated the prominence of different normative themes across cultures. Familiar examples include the different families of norms that mark cultures of honor versus cultures of shame, especially those that that govern violence and its aftermath (Nisbett & Cohen 1996; Uskal et al. 2019), or the different kinds of norms found in societies that prize individualistic values versus those dominated by more collectivist ones, especially norms that delimit the scope of personal choice (McAuliffe et al. 2003; Nisbett 2004; Ross 2012, Hagger Rentzelas, & Chatzisarantis 2014; J. Henrich forthcoming, also see J. Henrich, Heine, & Norenzayan 2010 for discussion of methodological issues). Other researchers have distinguished still other themes, for instance identifying the kinds of values and “purity” norms that predominate in a community governed by what they call an ethics of divinity, in comparison to those prevalent in communities that are governed by an ethics of autonomy or an ethics of community (Shweder et al. 1997; Rozin et al. 1999; this line of thought has been further developed in the influential Moral Foundations Theory, Haidt 2012; Graham et al. 2013). Theorists also use these kinds of empirical findings to help assess claims about norm psychology, shedding light on those features of individual normative cognition that are more rigid and universal versus those that are more culturally malleable, and on how such psychological features might make various patterns of group-level variation more or less likely (O’Neill & Machery 2018).

A recent and intriguing contribution along these lines is Gelfand and colleagues’ investigation of patterns in the tightness and looseness of different cultures’ norms. This work looks at differences in the general overall “strength” of norms within and across cultures: how many norms there are, how tolerant members of a culture tend to be of deviations from normatively prescribed behavior, and how severely they punish violations (Gelfand, Nishii, & Raver 2006; Gelfand, Raver, et al. 2011; Gelfand, Harrington, & Jackson 2017). Tighter cultures have more numerous and exacting standards, with members who are less tolerant of slight deviancies and prone to impose more severe sanctions. Cultures whose members are more lenient and accepting of wiggle room around a norm, and who are less extreme in their enforcement, fall more towards the loose end of this spectrum. Gelfand and colleagues explore the manifestations of tightness and looseness not just at the level of cultures but also across a number of other levels of description, from the communal and historical down to the behavioral, cognitive, and neural (Gelfand 2018). A central claim of this account is that a culture’s orientation towards norms—whether the norm systems of its members tend to be calibrated more tightly or more loosely—reflects the severity of the challenges faced in its past and present:

[t]he evolution of norm strength is adaptive to features of ecological environments and, in turn, is afforded by a suite of adaptive psychological processes. (Gelfand, Harrington, & Jackson 2017: 802, our italics)

A group whose ecology is characterized by things like frequent natural disasters, disease, territorial invasion, or resource scarcity is likely to possess a more comprehensive and exacting system of norms and to take a stricter stance towards its norms, in part because more efficiently coordinated social action is required to overcome more severe threats. Groups faced with less extreme ecological stressors have less dire need for tightly coordinated social action, and so can afford to have weaker norms and more tolerance for deviation.

2.2 Behavioral Economics

Behavioral economics began by focusing on how real people make actual economic decisions, and on explaining the type of information processing that leads them to fall short of ideal economic rationality (Kahneman 2011). In the last few decades, many behavioral economists have also begun to investigate cross cultural variation in economic behavior, and to interpret findings in terms of the different norms of, e.g., fairness, equity, and cooperation adopted by their participants (e.g., Lesorogol 2007). Much of this evidence comes from patterns in how people from different cultures perform in economic games (J. Henrich, Boyd, et al. 2001, 2005). Such variation, for example, has been found in ultimatum game experiments, in which two participants bargain about how to divide a non-trivial sum of money. The first participant makes a proposal for how to divide the sum between the two, which is offered as an ultimatum to the other. The second participant can either accept or reject the offer. If she accepts, then both participants receive the respective amounts specified by the proposal; if she rejects it, however, neither participant receives anything. If they were ideal economic agents, then the first participant, acting from self-interest, would offer the lowest possible non-zero amount to the second participant, who would accept it because something is better than nothing. This result is quite rare in humans, however (though it is more common, intriguingly, in chimpanzees; see Jensen, Call, & Tomasello 2007). Actual people do not just diverge from it, but diverge from it in different ways. Several experiments found that cultural factors affect how people tend to play the game, and that variability in norms and conceptions of fairness can help explain different patterns in the offers participants make and are willing to accept (Roth et al. 1991; though see Oosterbeek, Sloof & van de Kuilen 2004 for discussion of difficulties in interpreting such results). Other experiments use a wider range of games to gather evidence of similar patterns of cultural variation in economic behavior (see J. Henrich, Boyd, et al. 2004 for a collection of such work).

Another family of findings that is puzzling from the point of view of classical economic rationality shows that individuals will routinely punish others even at a cost to themselves (Fehr & Gachter 2002; J. Henrich, McElreath, et al. 2006). Evidence suggests that this propensity to punish is influenced by norms and other cultural factors as well (Bone, McAuliffe, & Raihani 2016). For example, in public goods games participants are given a non-trivial sum of money and must decide if and how much to contribute to a common pool over the course of several rounds. How much each investment pays off depends on how much everyone collectively contributes that round, so each participant’s decisions should factor in the behavior of every other participant. In some versions, participants can also spend their money to punish others, based on knowledge of the contributions they have made. Results indicate that some participants are willing to incur a cost to themselves to sanction low contributors, but also to punish high contributors, a surprising phenomenon called anti-social punishment. Participants from different cultures exhibit different patterns in their willingness to punish others, including in their enthusiasm for anti-social punishment (Herrman, Thöni, and Gächter 2008). Another noteworthy aspect of punitive behavior revealed by behavioral economic experiments is that humans are willing to punish even when they are mere bystanders to the incident that they are responding to. In such cases of third-party punishment, an individual enforces a norm despite the fact that she is neither the offender who commits the violation and becomes the target of the punishment, nor the offended who was wronged or the victim affected by the transgression (Fehr & Fischbacher 2004; though see Bone, Silva, & Raihani 2014).

More broadly, the general psychological propensity for punishment illuminated by this kind of empirical work has been claimed by researchers to emerge early in humans (Schmidt & Tomasello 2012; McAuliffe, Jordan, & Richerson 2015). Some have argued that it is crucial to a host of features of human social life, including the group-level stabilization of norms (Boyd & Richerson 1992) and the capacity to sustain cooperation on large scales (Price, Cosmides, & Tooby 2002; Mathew & Boyd 2011; Mathew, Boyd, & van Veelen 2013). Others have used such results to support inferences about the character of normative psychology, including the nature of normative motivation. For instance, Chudek and Henrich summarize several neuroeconomic studies (Fehr & Camerer 2007; Tabibnia, Satpute, & Lieberman 2008; and de Quervain et al. 2004) that investigate economic behavior using the methods and technology of neuroscience (i.e., fMRI) by pointing out that

both cooperating and punishing in locally normative ways activates the brain’s rewards or reward anticipation circuits in the same manner as does obtaining a direct cash payment. (Chudek & Henrich 2011: 224)

2.3 Developmental and Comparative Psychology

An impressive range of evidence suggests that humans are natural-born norm learners. The developmental trajectory of norm-guided cognition in humans appears to exhibit robust similarities across cultures, with children beginning to participate in normative behavior around the same early age (see House et al. 2013 and Tomasello 2019 for context). Between three and five years of age children exhibit knowledge of different kinds of normative rules (Turiel 1983; Smetana 1993; Nucci 2001), and at as early as three years of age they are able to perform competently in deontic reasoning tasks (R. Cummins 1996; Beller 2010). They also enforce norms, both when they believe the transgressive behavior was freely chosen (Josephs et al. 2016) but also when they understand that it was unintentional (Samland et al. 2016) at least in some circumstances (cf. Chernyak & Sobel 2016; also see Barrett et al. 2016 and Curtin et al. forthcoming for evidence and discussion of cross cultural variation in people’s sensitivity to the mental states of norm violators). Moreover, children are alert to how other people respond to transgressions, showing more positive feelings towards those who enforce a norm violation than toward those who leave violations uncorrected (Vaish et al. 2016).

Perhaps most striking is the ease and rapidity with which children acquire norms. Preschoolers have been found to learn norms quickly (Rakoczy, Warneken, & Tomasello 2008), even without explicit instruction (Schmidt, Rakoczy, & Tomasello 2011), although learning is facilitated when norms are modeled by adults (Rakoczy, Haman, et al. 2010). Children’s enthusiasm for rules—their “promiscuous normativity” (Schmidt, Butler, et al. 2016)—even appears to outstrip being sensitive to common norm-governed behavior in their social environment. Evidence suggests that sometimes a single observation of an action is sufficient for children to infer the existence of a norm, and that left to their own devices they will spontaneously create their own norms and teach them to others (Göckeritz, Schmidt, & Tomasello 2014).

That said, behaviors that are perceived to be normal in a community are particularly salient to individuals’ norm psychology. Children are also normatively promiscuous in that they appear prone to false positives in the course of acquisition, seeing behavior as norm-guided even when it is merely common, and inferring the presence of normative rules when there are none. One series of studies found that when participants (children and adults from both the United States and China) detected or were told that a type of behavior was common among a group of people, they came to negatively evaluate group members who behaved in a non-conforming way (Roberts et al. 2018; Roberts, Ho, & Gelman 2019). Researchers have investigated this feature of norm acquisition from different angles, and have labeled it with various names, including the “descriptive-to-prescriptive tendency” (Roberts, Gelman, & Ho 2017) the “common is moral heuristic” (Lindström et al. 2017), and the “injunctive inference hypothesis” (Davis, Hennes, & Raymond 2018, discussing, e.g., Schultz et al. 2007). Since the evidence suggests that human normative cognition invites an easy inference from the “is” of a perceived pattern of common behavior to the “ought” of a norm (Tworek & Cimpian 2016), philosophers may be tempted to think of this as a “naturalistic fallacy bias”.

Another line of research suggests that key to understanding the roots of human normativity is the fact that human children are overimitators. They are not just spontaneous, intuitive, and excellent imitators, but they also tend to copy all of the elements in the sequence of a model’s behavior, even when they recognize some of those elements are superfluous to the task at hand (Lyons, Young, & Keil 2007; Kenward, Karlsson, & Persson 2011; Keupp, Behne, & Rakoczy 2013; Nielsen, Kapitány, & Elkins 2014, cf. Heyes 2018: chapter 6). Children attend to the specific manner in which an action is carried out rather than merely to the goal it is aimed at, and conform to the full script even if they see that the goal can be achieved in some more direct way. Moreover, children monitor others to see if they are doing likewise, and enforce overimitation on their peers by criticizing those who fail to perform the entire sequence of steps (Kenward 2012; Rakoczy & Schmidt 2013). Overimitation can lead to the unnecessary expenditure of energy on these extraneous behaviors, but the trait may be an adaptation nevertheless. According to this argument, the costs of what look like individual “mistakes” are ultimately outweighed by the communal benefits generated by a population whose individual capacities for transmitting norms and other cultural variants are more insistent in this way, erring on the side of too much imitation rather than too little (J. Henrich 2015: chapter 7). Whatever it was initially selected for, researchers have suggested that the psychological machinery responsible for overimitation makes important contributions to normative cognition. Evidence indicates that this machinery generates strong (perhaps intrinsic) social motivation aimed at behavioral conformity with others. When working in conjunction with a norm system, this source of motivation may also help facilitate performance of the key task of keeping an individual’s behavior compliant, inducing her to conform not just to behaviors she is observing but to those norms she has internalized (Hoehl et al. 2019 for overview).

Overimitation is also noteworthy because it may be distinctively human. For example, although chimpanzees imitate the way conspecifics instrumentally manipulate their environment to achieve a goal, they will copy the behavior only selectively, skipping steps which they recognize as unnecessary (Whiten et al. 2009, also see Clay & Tennie 2018 for similar results with bonobos). Evidence suggests that learning in human children is comparatively more attuned to peer influence in other ways as well. Once chimpanzees and orangutans have figured out how to solve a problem, they are conservative, sticking to whatever solution they learn first. Humans, in contrast, will often switch to a new solution that is demonstrated by peers, sometimes even switching to less effective strategies under peer influence (Haun, Rekers, & Tomasello 2014).

However, other researchers have recently contested the claim that overimitation is strictly absent in non-humans (Andrews 2017). This is one front of a much larger debate over which features of human psychology are unique to our species, and which are shared with others. Recent work relevant to norms has focused on whether and to what extent species other than humans have the capacities to sustain cumulative culture (Dean et al. 2014), with plausible cases being made that the basic psychological wherewithal is present not just in some great apes but also in songbirds (Whiten 2019) as well as whales and dolphins (Whitehead & Rendell 2015). Another area of focus has been on aspects of moral cognition, where much illuminating work has explored the continuities between humans and other animals (de Waal 2006; Andrews & Monsó forthcoming). Much of this is relevant to, but does not directly address, the question of whether a psychological capacity dedicated to norms is distinctively human, or which of its component mechanisms might be present in rudimentary form in other animals. Some have suggested that the propensity to punish, and especially the tendency for third party sanctioning of norm violations, is not found in other species (Riedl et al. 2012; Prooijen 2018, though see Suchak et al. 2016). Others point to humans’ exceptional ability to cooperate and their resulting ecological dominance, suggesting it provides indirect evidence for the uniqueness of our capacities for culturally transmitted norms (J. Henrich 2015; Boyd 2017). Not all are convinced, arguing that animals like elephants (Ross 2019) and chimpanzees (von Rohr et al. 2011) exhibit socially sophisticated behaviors best explained by the presence of psychological precursors to core components of the human norm system. Important preliminary progress has been made on this cluster of questions concerning non-human normativity (Vincent, Ring, & Andrews 2018; Andrews 2020; Fitzpatrick forthcoming), but much conceptual and empirical work remains to be done.

3. Norm Cognition and Morality

Norms are relevant to areas of research across philosophy, the humanities, and the behavioral sciences, and the kinds of cognitive-evolutionary accounts of norm psychology described here have the potential to inform and enrich many of them. The most immediate implications would seem to fall within the domain of moral theory. However, the relationship of norms and norm psychology to morality and moral psychology is not straightforward, and is itself a subject of debate (Machery 2012). The quest to delimit the boundaries of the moral domain, and to distinguish the genuinely moral from non-moral norms, has a long history, but has yet to produce a view that is widely accepted (Stich 2018). For example, some researchers argue that there are proximate psychological differences that can be used to distinguish a set of moral rules from others (conventional rules, etiquette rules, pragmatic rules). According to one prominent account rooted in developmental psychology, moral rules are marked by the fact that individuals judge them to hold generally rather than only locally, and to apply independently of the pronouncement of any authority figure, and to govern matters concerning harm, welfare, justice, and rights (Turiel 1983; Nucci 2001). Some have drawn inspiration from the sentimentalist tradition in moral theory to build on this account, explaining the features posited as distinctive of moral rules by appeal to their connection to emotions like anger or disgust (Nichols 2004; cf. Haidt 2001). Others have contested the initial characterization of moral norms, marshalling arguments and evidence that it is not psychologically universal, but is rather parochial to certain cultures (Kelly et al. 2007; Kelly & Stich 2007, also see Berniūnas, Dranseika, & Sousa, 2016; Berniūnas, Silius, & Dranseika, 2020; cf. Kumar 2015; Heath 2017).

Shifting focus from proximate to ultimate considerations seems to add little clarity. While some theorists hold that our species possesses an evolved psychological system dedicated specifically to morality (Joyce 2007; Mameli 2013; Stanford 2018; cf. Kitcher 2011), others remain skeptical. They argue instead that the evidence better supports the view that humans have an evolved psychological system dedicated to norms in general, but there is nothing about the mechanisms that underlie it, the adaptive pressures that selected for it, or the norms that it can come to contain that would support a distinction between moral norms and non-moral norms (Machery & Mallon 2010; Davis & Kelly 2018; Stich forthcoming). On this view, rather, the human norm system evolved to be able to deal with, and can still acquire and internalize, a wide range of norms, including epistemic norms, linguistic norms, sartorial norms, religious norms, etiquette norms, and norms that might be classified by a contemporary westerner as moral. Indeed, the claim has been taken to support a historicist view of morality itself, according to which the practice of distinguishing some subset of norms and normative judgments as moral, and thus as possessing special status or authority, is a culturally parochial and relatively recent historical invention (Machery 2018).

That said, several debates with broadly moral subject matter have already begun drawing on empirically inspired accounts of norm psychology. For example, philosophical discussions of the moral questions raised by implicit social biases have recently assumed the shape of venerable and long-standing debates between individualists and structuralists (Beeghly & Holroyd 2020, also see Brownstein 2015 [2019]). A central issue has been whether behaviors are best explained and injustices best addressed by focusing attention on individual agents and their implicit biases and other psychological characteristics, on the one hand, or on features of the institutions and social structures that those agents inhabit, on the other (Haslanger 2015). This has inspired attempts to develop an interactionist account that can combine the virtues of both approaches (Madva 2016; Soon 2020). Several of these have put norms center stage (Ayala-López 2018), and drawn on empirical research on norm psychology to show how norms serve as a connective tissue that weaves individuals and soft social structures together (Davidson & Kelly 2020).

Cultural variation in norms and persistent disputes over right and wrong have been thought to have significant implications for metaethics as well. The “argument from disagreement” (Loeb 1998) holds that if dispute over the permissibility of some activity or practice persists even after reasoning errors and non-moral factual disagreements have been resolved, such intractable disagreement would militate against moral realism (Mackie 1977). Empirically establishing the existence of persistent disagreement is difficult (Doris & Plakias 2008), but the character of the norm system and its influence on judgment may speak to whether or not it is likely. Consider two individuals from different cultures, who have internalized divergent families of norms (individualistic and collectivist, honor based and shame based, divinity and autonomy, tight and loose, etc.) Such individuals are likely to disagree about the permissibility of a range of activities and practices, such as what counts as a fair division of resources, or whether people should get to choose who they marry, or what is and is not an appropriate way to respond to an insult. This disagreement may very well endure even in the face of agreement about the non-moral facts of the matter, and even when neither side of the dispute is being partial or making any reasoning errors. Such persistent disagreement may be explainable by appeal to differences in the individual’s respective norm systems, and to the different norms each has internalized from his or her culture (Machery et al. 2005). Empirical details of the operational principles of normative cognition—especially knowing whether and the extent to which it is informationally encapsulated, cognitively impenetrable, or otherwise recalcitrant and insensitive to other psychological processes—can help assess the plausibility of this argument.

A final set of debates to which the details of norm psychology are becoming increasingly relevant are those concerning the nature and explanation of moral progress. Recent progress is understood to have largely come in the form of expansions of the moral circle, the spread of inclusive norms, and the demoralization of invalid ones (Singer 1981; Buchanan & Powell 2018; cf. Sauer 2019.) Much attention has focused on understanding changes in the distribution of norms that occur as the result of reasoning about norms (Campbell & Kumar 2012), but important steps towards moral progress may also occur as the result of myopic, though not fully blind, processes of cultural evolution (cf. Kling 2016; Brownstein & Kelly 2019). A more detailed empirical understanding of the relationship of internalized norms to rationalization, critical reasoning, and explicit argumentation (Summers 2017; Mercier & Sperber 2017), along with a clearer view of the other psychological and social factors that influence norms and the dynamics of their transmission, will help further illuminate these important philosophical debates.


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