First published Mon Aug 5, 2002; substantive revision Tue Oct 23, 2018

Pyrrho was the starting-point for a philosophical movement known as Pyrrhonism that flourished beginning several centuries after his own time. This later Pyrrhonism was one of the two major traditions of sceptical thought in the Greco-Roman world (the other being located in Plato’s Academy during much of the Hellenistic period). Perhaps the central question about Pyrrho is whether or to what extent he himself was a sceptic in the later Pyrrhonist mold. The later Pyrrhonists claimed inspiration from him; and, as we shall see, there is undeniably some basis for this. But it does not follow that Pyrrho’s philosophy was identical to that of this later movement, or even that the later Pyrrhonists thought that it was identical; the claims of indebtedness that are expressed by or attributed to members of the later Pyrrhonist tradition are broad and general in character (and in Sextus Empiricus’ case notably cautious—see Outlines of Pyrrhonism 1.7), and do not in themselves point to any particular reconstruction of Pyrrho’s thought. It is necessary, therefore, to focus on the meager evidence bearing explicitly upon Pyrrho’s own ideas and attitudes. How we read this evidence will also, of course, affect our conception of Pyrrho’s relations with his own philosophical contemporaries and predecessors.

1. Life

Pyrrho appears to have lived from around 365–360 BCE until around 275–270 BCE (for the evidence see von Fritz (1963), 90). We have several reports of philosophers from whom he learned, the most significant (and the most reliable) of which concern his association with Anaxarchus of Abdera. Alongside Anaxarchus (and several other philosophers) he allegedly accompanied Alexander the Great on his expedition to India. We are told that in the course of this expedition he encountered some “naked wise men” (gumnosophistai); Diogenes Laertius (9.61) claims that his philosophy developed as a result of this meeting, but it is not clear what basis, if any, he has for this assertion. In any case, after his return to Greece Pyrrho did espouse a philosophy that attracted numerous followers, of whom the most important was Timon of Phlius. The travel writer Pausanias reports (6.24.5) seeing a statue of him in the marketplace in Pyrrho’s home town of Elis in the Peloponnese; Diogenes also reports (9.64) that he was made high priest, and that in his honor philosophers were made exempt from city taxation. While Pausanias’ report is easier to accept at face value than Diogenes’, both suggest that (at least locally) he achieved considerable celebrity. However, there is no good reason to believe that a Pyrrhonist ‘movement’ continued beyond his own immediate followers; it was not until the first century BCE that Pyrrhonism became the name of an ongoing philosophical tradition.

2. Ancient Sources and the Nature of the Evidence

With the exception of poetry allegedly written while on Alexander’s expedition (which, as far as we can tell, did not survive that expedition), Pyrrho wrote nothing; we are therefore obliged to try to reconstruct his philosophy from reports by others. Unfortunately the reports that we have are fragmentary and, in many cases, of doubtful reliability. Pyrrho’s follower Timon wrote numerous poems and prose works; but of these only fragments and in some cases second-hand reports survive. It is likely that much of what we hear about Pyrrho in later sources also derives indirectly from Timon, but it is frequently not possible to judge, in individual cases, whether or not this is so. Other difficulties concerning Timon’s evidence are, first, that he writes as a devotee rather than as a neutral reporter, and second, that the great majority of Timon’s fragments derive from a poem called Silloi (Lampoons), and consist of satirical thumbnail sketches of other philosophers rather than any kind of direct exposition of Pyrrho’s outlook. Nevertheless, Timon is clearly the most important and the most trustworthy source of information about Pyrrho. Of the evidence from Timon, one piece is especially important. This is a summary, by the Peripatetic Aristocles of Messene (late 1st c. BCE), of an account by Timon of Pyrrho’s most general philosophical attitudes; it is generally agreed that this passage must be the centerpiece of any interpretation of Pyrrho’s philosophy.

With the exception of a very few snippets of information, the only other source of evidence on Pyrrho that is close to contemporary is Antigonus of Carystus, a biographer of the mid-third century BCE. Diogenes Laertius, whose life of Pyrrho is our major source of biographical anecdotes, frequently cites Antigonus, and is probably indebted to him in many places even when he does not cite him; Antigonus is also mentioned by Aristocles, and is likely to be the origin of much or even most of the surviving biographical material on Pyrrho. But Antigonus needs to be handled even more carefully than Timon. He was not a philosopher, and there is no reason to think that he was capable of or particularly interested in comprehending philosophical nuances. Nor is it clear that accuracy was high on his list of priorities; on the contrary, what we know about him suggests that he was a purveyor of sensationalist gossip rather than a reliable historian. His account probably did contain genuine information about Pyrrho’s demeanor and activities; but it would certainly be unwise to take his anecdotes as a group on trust.

Cicero refers to Pyrrho about ten times, and Cicero is, in general, a responsible reporter of other people’s views. Unfortunately his information about Pyrrho appears to be very incomplete, and, as we shall see, the impression he conveys of him may very well be inaccurate. With one exception, he never mentions him except in conjunction with the famously non-orthodox Stoics Aristo and (sometimes) Herillus, and the remarks in question always concern the same one or two points in ethics; it looks as if his knowledge of Pyrrho derives almost entirely from a single source that conveyed little or nothing about Pyrrho individually, and nothing at all about any views of his in metaphysics or epistemology. In addition, a number of authors in later antiquity make isolated comments about Pyrrho. But since these comments postdate the rise of the later Pyrrhonist movement, there is often room for suspicion as to whether they reflect genuine information about Pyrrho himself, as opposed to the later philosophy that took his name.

The safest way to proceed, then, in attempting to interpret Pyrrho’s philosophy, is to begin with a detailed analysis of the summary of Timon in Aristocles; the remaining evidence should be interpreted, and assessed for its trustworthiness, as far as possible in light of what the Aristocles passage has to tell us about Pyrrho’s philosophy. This methodology has been challenged by Green (2017), who proposes a more holistic approach in which other pieces of evidence may be used to shed light on the Aristocles passage itself. Pursuing that method would be highly desirable, if it were possible. But it would require us to find other evidence that is both at least as historically reliable as, and clearer in purport than, the Aristocles passage; and it is highly doubtful whether any such evidence exists.

3. The Aristocles Passage

Whatever one’s view on this last point, there is no doubt that the interpretation of the Aristocles passage itself is fraught with controversy. Given the admitted centrality of this passage in any interpretation of Pyrrho, it follows that the character of Pyrrho’s thinking is, at its very core, a matter for sharp disagreement. The present survey will attempt to lay out the two main alternatives and explore the consequences of each. (Numerous other readings besides these two have been proposed; in particular, the interpretation of Svavarsson (2004) is an intriguing, though arguably unstable, hybrid of the two. But it is fair to say that these two are the ones that have commanded by far the most scholarly attention.)

A word, first, about the provenance and evidential value of the Aristocles passage. Several chapters from book 8 of Aristocles’ Peri philosophias (On Philosophy) appear in quotation in the Praeparatio evangelica of Eusebius, the fourth-century bishop of Caesarea. These chapters expound, and then attack from an Aristotelian perspective, a number of philosophies that impugn the reliability of one or other of our cognitive faculties. Among these Aristocles counts Pyrrhonism, as represented by Pyrrho himself and by the initiator of the later Pyrrhonist tradition, Aenesidemus; Aristocles speaks of Aenesidemus (first century BCE, q.v.), as recent, and is apparently not aware of any subsequent members of the Pyrrhonist tradition. The chapter on Pyrrhonism opens with a brief summary of the outlook of Pyrrho specifically, as reported by Timon (14.18.1–5).

This convoluted transmission might lead one to doubt how much authentic information can be extracted from the passage. But there is no reason, first, to doubt Eusebius’ explicit claim to be quoting Aristocles verbatim. Aristocles is not quoting Timon verbatim; some of the vocabulary in this passage is clearly reminiscent of Aristocles’ own vocabulary in other chapters. However, other terms in the passage are quite distinct both from Aristocles’ own normal usage and from any of the terminology familiar to us from later Pyrrhonism, yet were in use prior to Timon’s day; it seems easiest to account for these as authentic reproductions of Timon’s own language. In addition, the frequent mention of Timon either by name or by the word phêsi, ‘he says’, suggests that Aristocles is taking pains to reproduce the essentials of his account as faithfully as possible. And finally, Aristocles’ other chapters, where we are in a position to check his summaries against other evidence of the views being summarized, suggest that he is in general a reliable reporter of other people’s views, even views to which he himself is strongly opposed—or at least, that he is reliable when he has access to systematic written expositions of those views, as seems to be the case here. As for Timon’s reliability as a source for Pyrrho’s views, a word was said about this in the previous section; this passage stands out from most of the surviving record from Timon in that it appears to be based on a systematic account of the central points of Pyrrho’s outlook. Thus, while we clearly cannot be sure that every detail of the passage accurately reflects something that Pyrrho thought, all the indications are that the passage deserves to be taken seriously as evidence for Pyrrho’s philosophy.

Timon is reported as telling us that in order to be happy, one must pay attention to three connected questions: first, what are things like by nature? second, how should we be disposed towards things (given our answer to the first question)? and third, what will be the outcome for those who adopt the disposition recommended in the answer to the second question? And the passage then gives us Pyrrho’s and Timon’s answers to each of the three questions in order.

The answer to the question “what are things like by nature?” is given by a sequence of three epithets; things are said to be adiaphora and astathmêta and anepikrita. Taken by themselves, these epithets can be understood in two importantly different ways: they may be taken as characterizing how things are (by nature) in themselves, or they may be taken as commenting on human beings’ lack (by our nature) of cognitive access to things. Adiaphora is normally translated ‘indifferent’. But this might be taken as referring either to an intrinsic characteristic of things—namely that, in themselves and by nature, they possess no differentiating features — or to our natural inability to discern any such features. In the latter case ‘undifferentiable’ might be a more perspicuous translation. (Beckwith (2011) plausibly connects the focus on differentiating features, or the lack of them, with the Aristotelian notion of differentiae; on either of the readings to be explored, Aristotle’s picture of the world and of our ability to understand it would indeed be a prime example of the kind of view from which Pyrrho is anxious to distance himself.) Similarly, astathmêta might mean ‘unstable’ or ‘unbalanced’, describing an objective property of things; or it might mean ‘not subject to being placed on a balance’, and hence ‘unmeasurable’, which would again place the focus on our cognitive inabilities. And anepikrita might mean ‘indeterminate’, referring to an objective lack of any definite features, or ‘indeterminable’, pointing to an inability on our part to determine the features of things. The statement as a whole, then, is either answering the question “what are things like by nature?” by stating that things are, in their very nature, indefinite or indeterminate in various ways — the precise nature of the thesis would be a matter for further speculation—or by stating that we human beings are not in a position to pin down or determine the nature of things. Let us call these the metaphysical and the epistemological interpretations respectively.

It is clear that the metaphysical interpretation gives us a Pyrrho who is not in any recognizable sense a sceptic. Pyrrho, on this interpretation, is issuing a declaration about the nature of things in themselves—precisely what the later Pyrrhonists who called themselves sceptics were careful to avoid. On the epistemological interpretation, on the other hand, Pyrrho is very much closer to the tradition that took his name. There is still some distance between them. To say that we cannot determine the nature of things — as opposed to saying that we have so far failed to determine the natural features of things—is already a departure from the sceptical suspension of judgement promoted by Sextus Empiricus. And to put it, as on this reading Pyrrho does put it, by saying that things are indeterminable, is a further departure, in that it does attribute at least one feature to things in themselves — namely, being such that humans cannot determine them. Nevertheless, the epistemological interpretation clearly portrays Pyrrho as a forerunner—a naive and unsophisticated forerunner, perhaps — of later Pyrrhonist scepticism, whereas the metaphysical interpretation puts him in a substantially different light.

The natural way to try to choose between these two interpretations is to see which of them fits best with the logic of the passage as a whole. But here we encounter a further complication. The text of the phrase that follows the words we have just been discussing is subject to dispute. According to the manuscripts this phrase reads “for this reason (dia touto) neither our sensations nor our opinions tell the truth or lie”. Now, if this reading is correct, the thought expressed seems to favor the metaphysical interpretation; the idea is that, since things are in their real nature indeterminate, our sensations and opinions, which represent things as having certain determinate features, are neither true nor false. They are not true, since reality is not the way they present it as being; but they are not false either, since that too would require that reality have certain determinate features, namely features that are the negations of the ones that our sensations and opinions portray it as having. By contrast, it is quite unclear how the claim that the nature of things cannot be determined by us could be thought to license the inference “for this reason neither our sensations nor our opinions tell the truth or lie”. That claim would seem at most to license the very different inference that we cannot tell whether they tell the truth or lie.

But some scholars have suggested that the manuscripts are in error at this point, and that what the text should say is “on account of the fact that (dia to) neither our sensations nor our opinions tell the truth or lie”. The change is justified on linguistic grounds; it is alleged that the text in the manuscripts as they stand is not acceptable Greek. The considerations for and against this proposal are technical, and debate has yielded no consensus on this question. However, it is clear that if one does make this small alteration to the text, the direction of the inference is reversed; the point about our sensations and opinions now becomes a reason for the point about the nature of things, not an inference from it. And this, it has been argued, points towards the epistemological interpretation. The idea would then be that, since our sensations and opinions fail to be consistent deliverers of true reports (or, for that matter, false reports) about the world around us, there is no prospect of our being able to determine the nature of things.

This is the crux on which the decision between the two main lines of interpretation of Pyrrho’s philosophy turns. The remainder of the Aristocles passage, and indeed the remainder of the evidence on Pyrrho in general, can be read so as to fit with either the metaphysical or the epistemological reading of his answer to the question about the nature of things. The Aristocles passage continues with the answer to the second question, namely the question of the attitude we should adopt given the answer to the first question. We are told, first, that we should not trust our sensations and opinions, but should adopt an unopinionated attitude. On the epistemological reading, the significance of this is obvious. But on the metaphysical reading, too, we have already been told that our sensations and opinions are not true, which is presumably reason enough for us not to trust them; and the unopinionated attitude that is here recommended may be understood as one in which one refrains from positing any definite characteristics as inherent in the nature of things—given that their real nature is wholly indefinite. (To the objection that this thesis of indefiniteness is itself an opinion, it may be replied that doxa, ‘opinion’, is regularly used in earlier Greek philosophy, especially in Parmenides and Plato, to refer to those opinions—misguided opinions, in the view of these authors—that take on trust a view of the world as conforming more or less to the way it appears in ordinary experience. In this usage, the claim that reality is indefinite would not be a (mere) opinion, but would be a statement of the truth.)

The passage now introduces a certain form of speech that is supposed to reflect this unopinionated attitude. We are supposed to say “about each single thing that it no more is than is not or both is and is not or neither is nor is not”. There are a number of intricate questions about the exact relations between the various parts of this complicated utterance, and especially about the role and significance of the ‘both’ and ‘neither’ components. But it is clear that this too is susceptible of being read along the lines of either of the two interpretations introduced above. On the metaphysical interpretation, we are being asked to adopt a form of words that reflects the utter indefiniteness of the way things are; we should not say of anything that it is any particular way any more than that it is not that way (with ‘is’ being understood, as commonly in Greek philosophy, as shorthand for ‘is F’, where F stands for any arbitrary predicate). On the epistemological interpretation, we are being asked to use a manner of speaking that expresses our suspension of judgement about how things are. Sextus Empiricus specifically tells us that ‘no more’ (ou mallon) is a term used by the sceptics to express suspension of judgement, and its occurrence in the Aristocles passage can be taken as an early example of the same type of usage.

Finally, in answer to the third question, we are told that the result for those who adopt the unopinionated attitude just recommended is first aphasia and then ataraxia. Ataraxia, ‘freedom from worry’, is familiar to us from later Pyrrhonism; this is said by the later Pyrrhonists to be the result of the suspension of judgement that they claimed to be able to induce. The precise sense of aphasia is less clear. Beckwith (2011) actually argues that the transmitted text is erroneous, and that we should instead read apatheia, “lack of passion”. This is an attractive suggestion; apatheia is indeed a term used not infrequently of Pyrrho’s untroubled attitude (see section 5), whereas a reference to aphasia would be unparalleled in the other evidence on Pyrrho. However, the proposal is inevitably speculative, and aphasia is a term in use in later Pyrrhonism; it seems worth trying to elucidate it on the assumption that the transmitted text is correct. It might mean ‘non-assertion’, as in Sextus—that is, a refusal to commit oneself to definite alternatives; or it might mean, more literally, ‘speechlessness’, which could in turn be taken to be an initial reaction of stunned silence to the radical position with which one has been presented (an uncomfortable reaction that is subsequently replaced by ataraxia—the passage does say that aphasia comes first and ataraxia comes later). But the decision between these two ways of understanding the term is independent of the broader interpretive issues bearing upon the passage as a whole. For some form of ‘non-assertion’ is clearly licensed by either the metaphysical or the epistemological interpretation; and on either interpretation, the view proposed might indeed render someone (initially) uncomfortable to the point of ‘speechlessness’. The important point, though, is that ataraxia is the end result; and this links back to the introductory remark to the effect that the train of thought to be summarized has the effect of making one happy.

We have, then, two major possibilities. On the one hand, Pyrrho can be read as advancing a sweeping metaphysical thesis, that things are in their real nature indefinite or indeterminate, and encouraging us to embrace the consequences of that thesis by refusing to attribute any definite features to things (at least, as belonging to their real nature) and by refusing to accept at face value (again, as revelatory of the real nature of things) those myriad aspects of our ordinary experience that represent things as having certain definite features. Or, on the other hand, Pyrrho can be read as declaring that the nature of things is inaccessible to us, and encouraging us to withdraw our trust (and to speak in such a way as to express our withdrawal of trust) in ordinary experience as a guide to the nature of things. As noted earlier, the second, epistemological interpretation makes Pyrrho’s outlook a great deal closer to that of the later Pyrrhonists who took him as an inspiration. But that is not in itself any reason for favoring this interpretation over the other, metaphysical one. For on either interpretation Pyrrho is said to promise ataraxia, the later Pyrrhonists’ goal, and to promise it as a result of a certain kind of withdrawal of trust in the veracity of our everyday impressions of things; the connection between these two points aligns Pyrrho with the later Pyrrhonists, and sets him apart from every other Greek philosophical movement that preceded later Pyrrhonism. The fact that this later sceptical tradition took Pyrrho as an inspiration is therefore readily understandable whichever of the two interpretations is correct (or whichever they thought was correct). It is also true that, on the metaphysical interpretation of the passage, the grounds on which Pyrrho advanced his metaphysical thesis of indeterminacy are never specified; this too, like the precise character of the thesis itself, must be a matter for speculative reconstruction. But Aristocles only purports to be giving the key points of Timon’s summary; the lack of detail, though disappointing, would not be surprising.

4. Other Reports on Pyrrho’s General Approach

The other evidence bearing upon Pyrrho’s central philosophical attitudes does nothing to settle the dispute between these two possible interpretations of the Aristocles passage. A number of texts explicitly or implicitly represent Pyrrho’s outlook as essentially identical to the sceptical outlook of the later Pyrrhonists. However, all of these texts postdate the rise of later Pyrrhonism itself, and none of them contains anything like the level of detail of the Aristocles passage; there is no particular reason to suppose that any of them represents a genuine understanding of Pyrrho as distinct from the later Pyrrhonists. There are also a few texts that appear to offer a picture of Pyrrho’s thought that is congenial to the metaphysical interpretation. The most significant of these is a passage from near the beginning of Diogenes Laertius’ life of Pyrrho (9.61); Pyrrho, we are told, “said that nothing is either fine or ignoble or just or unjust; and similarly in all cases that nothing is the case in reality (mêden einai têi alêtheiai), but that human beings do everything by convention and habit; for each thing is no more this than that”. This looks as if it is attributing to Pyrrho a metaphysical thesis, and a thesis according to which things have no definite features; it does not seem to be portraying Pyrrho as an advocate of suspension of judgement. However, the passage is undoubtedly in some way confused. For immediately beforehand we are told that Pyrrho was the one who initiated the type of philosophy consisting of “inapprehensibility and suspension of judgement”; and the previously quoted passage is then cited as confirmation of this. This passage of Diogenes as a whole, then, fails to maintain any clear distinction between epistemological and metaphysical readings of Pyrrho’s thought, and cannot safely be used as evidence for either.

5. Reports on Pyrrho’s Demeanor and Lifestyle

Most of the remaining evidence about Pyrrho has to do with his practical attitudes and behavior. There are a number of biographical anecdotes, and there are a few fragments of Timon that purport to depict Pyrrho’s state of mind. Some of the biographical anecdotes are clearly polemical inventions. For example, Diogenes (9.62) reports Antigonus as saying that Pyrrho’s lack of trust in his senses led him to ignore precipices, oncoming wagons and dangerous dogs, and that his friends had to follow him around to protect him from these various everyday hazards. But he then reports the dissenting verdict of Aenesidemus, according to which Pyrrho was perfectly capable of conducting himself in a sensible manner. This reflects a longstanding ancient dispute as to whether it is possible to live if one radically abandons common-sense attitudes to the world (as, on either of the two major interpretations outlined above, Pyrrho in some sense did). Antigonus has transformed a hostile criticism of Pyrrho—that, if one really were to adopt the attitudes he recommends, one would be unable consistently to live as a sane human being — into an account of how Pyrrho actually did act; but there is no reason to take this seriously as biography. (It does, however, raise the question of what it means to mistrust the senses—as the Aristocles passage tells us, on either interpretation, that Pyrrho did—if this is to be consistent with self-preservation in one’s ordinary behavior; we shall return to this point at the end of this section.)

But there are many other anecdotes, preserved in Diogenes and elsewhere, that cannot be dismissed in this fashion. The dominant impression that they convey as a group is of an extraordinary impassivity or imperturbability; with rare exceptions (which he himself is portrayed as regretting), Pyrrho is depicted as maintaining his calm and untroubled attitude no matter what happens to him. This extends even to extreme physical pain—he is reported not to have flinched when subjected to the horrific techniques of ancient surgery—but it also encompasses dangers such as being on a ship in a storm. (This is not to say that he did not avoid such troubles if he could, as suggested by the apocryphal stories mentioned in the previous paragraph; it is just to say that he did not lose his composure in the face of life’s inevitable hardships.) There is another aspect to this untroubled attitude as well. In numerous anecdotes Pyrrho is shown as unconcerned with adhering to the normal conventions of society; he wanders off for days on end by himself, and he performs tasks that would normally be left to social inferiors, such as housework and even washing a pig. Here, too, the suggestion is that he does not care about things that ordinary people do care about — in this case, the disapproval of others. (The passage from Diogenes quoted in the previous section, according to which Pyrrho held “that human beings do everything by convention and habit” is not necessarily in conflict with this; by ‘human beings’ Pyrrho might have meant ordinary human beings, among whom he would not have included himself.)

The fragments of Timon also emphasize Pyrrho’s exceptional tranquillity, and add a further, more philosophical dimension to it. Several fragments suggest that this tranquillity results from his not engaging in theoretical inquiry like other philosophers, and with his not engaging in debate with those philosophers. Other thinkers are perturbed by their need to discover how the universe works, and their need to prevail in arguments with their rivals; Pyrrho is unconcerned about any of this.

Clearly it would be foolish to accept every detail of this composite account. Timon’s picture is no doubt idealized, and the biographical material surely includes a measure of embellishment. Collectively, however, these fragments and anecdotes add up to a highly consistent portrait; it does not seem overconfident to take this at least as reflecting an ideal towards which Pyrrho strived, and which he achieved to a sufficient degree to have attracted notice.

What connections can be drawn between this portrait of Pyrrho’s demeanor and the philosophy expounded in the Aristocles passage? What we have here, plainly, is a fuller specification of the ataraxia that the Aristocles passage promised as the outcome of the process of responding in the recommended way to the three questions. But why should this process be thought to yield ataraxia, and why should the outcome take the specific form suggested by the material discussed in this section? Now is a convenient point to address these questions (as we did not do in initially examining the Aristocles passage). We may distinguish the overall emotional tranquillity depicted in the biographical material and the particular tranquillity, derived from the avoidance of theoretical inquiry, that is emphasized in the fragments of Timon.

The most obvious explanation for the overall emotional tranquillity would seem to be along the following lines. If one adopts the position recommended in the answers to the Aristocles passage’s first two questions, one will not hold any definite beliefs, about any object or state of affairs, to the effect that the object or state of affairs really is good, or valuable, or worth seeking—or, on the other hand, bad or to be avoided. (This will be true on either the metaphysical or the epistemological interpretations of the Aristocles passage.) Hence one will attach far less importance to the attainment or the avoidance of any particular objects, or the occurrence or non-occurrence of any particular state of affairs, than one would if one thought that these things really did have some kind of positive or negative value; nothing will matter to one to anything like the same extent as it matters to most people. If this is on the right lines, then Pyrrho’s route to ataraxia closely resembles the one described in several places by Sextus Empiricus (PH 1.25–30, 3.235–8, M 11.110–67); the account I have given is in fact modeled after Sextus’ explanation of how suspension of judgement produces ataraxia. Indeed, it is difficult to see how else the process is to be reconstructed. One difference, however, between the practical attitudes of Pyrrho and Sextus is that Sextus attributes an important role to convention in the shaping of one’s behavior; more on this in a moment.

As for the avoidance of theoretical inquiry and debate, it is fair to assume that Pyrrho will have regarded such inquiry and debate as troublesome because it is necessarily fruitless and interminable. If the real nature of things is indeterminable by us, as the epistemological interpretation would have it, then to attempt to determine the nature of things, and to provide cogent grounds for the superiority of one’s own theories, is to attempt the impossible; such matters are simply beyond our grasp. But if, as the metaphysical interpretation would have it, the world is in its real nature indefinite, then one is also attempting the impossible, though for a different reason; one is attempting to determine a fixed character for things that inherently lack any fixed character. Of course, the thesis that reality is indefinite is itself a definite statement. But it follows from this statement that any attempt to establish fixed and definite characteristics for specific items in the universe is doomed to failure. And it seems to be this kind of theoretical inquiry that Timon represents Pyrrho as eschewing; as one fragment puts it (addressing Pyrrho), “you were not concerned to inquire what winds hold sway over Greece, from where everything comes and into what it passes” (Diogenes Laertius 9.65). On this reading, then, Pyrrho’s avoidance of inquiry and debate resembles the disdain for physical speculation that is apparent in some writings of Plato (the Phaedo for example); physical speculation is fruitless because the physical world is not susceptible to rational inquiry.

Here another difference may be discerned from the Pyrrhonism of Sextus Empiricus. For although Sextus certainly does not claim to have definite answers of his own concerning the nature of things, he has no qualms about engaging with his opponents in debate, or about pitting them against one another. Indeed, the Pyrrhonism of Sextus depends on a constant interplay of competing arguments on as many topics as possible. One’s suspension of judgement results from one’s experience of the ‘equal strength’ (isostheneia) of the competing considerations on all sides of a given issue; but this requires that one be regularly exposed to such competing considerations, and the works of Sextus are themselves bountiful sources for this. Sextus may agree with Pyrrho that such debates are interminable, but they have an important role in later Pyrrhonist practice nonetheless. Pyrrho’s own practice is quite different, because his ataraxia flows not from an ongoing practice of intellectual juggling, but from a conclusion about the nature of things, as reported in the Aristocles passage—either that it is indeterminable by us or that it is indefinite—that he has arrived at once and for all.

We have seen that Pyrrho was unconcerned, or aspired to be unconcerned, about things that most of us care about very deeply. But how does one make any decisions at all, if one adopts this kind of attitude? Unless we are to believe the stories of Pyrrho as a madman depending on his friends to rescue him from precipices and dogs, we are entitled to expect an answer to this question. There is some evidence to suggest that the answer proposed—if not by Pyrrho himself, then at least by Timon—was that one relies on the appearances. If this is correct, we have another link, at least at a general level, with the Pyrrhonism of Sextus, for whom appearances are what he calls the “criterion of action”. One difference, as mentioned earlier, is that Sextus lists laws and customs as one of the four main varieties of appearances that one may use to guide one’s behavior; on Sextus’ account, then, certain courses of action will appear to one as desirable or undesirable given that they are approved or disapproved of by the prevailing mores. But Pyrrho seems to have been thoroughly unconventional in some aspects of his behavior. It is impossible to say specifically what kinds of phenomena were included for him and Timon under the heading of ‘the appearances’ — or whether they had anything very precise in mind here. Nevertheless, it looks as if the early or proto-Pyrrhonist answer to the question of how one acts and makes decisions is that one does so in light of the way things appear to one. On the epistemological interpretation, this will amount to “in light of the characteristics that things seem to have (but, for all we know, may not really have)”; on the metaphysical interpretation, it will amount to “in light of the temporary and contingent characteristics that things manifest on any given occasion (but that are no part of how they really are, since how they really are is indefinite)”. In either case, the way in which one mistrusts sensations and common-sense opinions, as the Aristocles passage recommends, is not that one pays no attention to them in one’s everyday behavior; one mistrusts them simply in that one does not take them as a guide to the underlying nature of things.

6. “The Nature of the Divine and the Good”

There is one further, highly problematic fragment of Timon that seems to belong in the area of practical philosophy. This is a set of four lines of verse that make reference to “the nature of the divine and the good”. There is no consensus on how to translate these lines, and different translations yield very different consequences for interpretation. The first two lines can be rendered either

(A) “For I will say, as it appears to me to be,
A word of truth, having a correct standard:”
(B) “For I will say, as it is plain to me that it is,
A word of truth, having a correct standard:”

The second two lines can be rendered either

(C) “That the nature of the divine and the good is eternal,
From which a most even-tempered life for a man is derived.”
(D) “That the nature of the divine and the good is at any time
That from which life becomes most even-tempered for a man.”

There are numerous other disputes over the translation, but these alternatives put on display most of the central options for interpretation.

The lines are quoted by Sextus Empiricus (M 11.20); there is no further trace of them in the surviving record. The context in which Sextus introduces them shows that he is inclined to understand the first couplet according to reading (A) rather than reading( B); but he suggests that he is not sure about this. The speaker into whose mouth Timon put these lines is never identified, but it has generally been assumed to be Pyrrho.

If one understands the second couplet according to reading (C), then the speaker is apparently endorsing a position that attributes definite natures to things; and this appears flatly inconsistent with the Aristocles passage, on either the metaphysical or the epistemological reading. The tension is especially bad if one reads the first couplet according to reading (B), in which case the speaker is insisting that he is in possession of the truth. But even on reading (A), where the effect is to weaken the assertion to one about what appears to the speaker to be the case, the statement about “the nature of the divine and the good” seems strikingly out of keeping with the rest of what we hear about Pyrrho’s philosophy. It has been suggested that Pyrrho made an exception, in the case of the divine and the good, to his general prohibition on attributing definite natures to things; but it is hard to see the motivation for such a move, and this interpretation has not been generally accepted. It is true that Cicero speaks of Pyrrho as holding that virtue is the sole good, and that no distinctions of value are to be drawn among things other than virtue and vice. However, as was mentioned earlier, Cicero always attributes this view to Pyrrho alongside the unorthodox Stoic Aristo of Chios; he never gives any details about Pyrrho’s thinking specifically. We know from other sources that Aristo did hold this position; and, as we have seen, there is good reason to think that Pyrrho did refrain quite generally from attributing positive or negative value to ordinary objects of concern (things other than virtue and vice), which is one part of the position Cicero attributes to him and Aristo. So it looks as if Cicero has been misled (probably by the sketchiness of the information in his source) into thinking that Pyrrho agreed with Aristo in both parts of his position rather than in just one part. At any rate, Cicero cannot be regarded as offering any credible support for an interpretation of Pyrrho that has him believing in a natural good; again, this is just too discordant with the remainder of the evidence.

Reading (D) of Timon’s second couplet (which is due, with minor modifications, to Burnyeat (1980)) is intended to eliminate the troublesome reference to an eternal real nature. According to this interpretation, the phrase “the nature of the divine and the good” refers simply to a characteristic that is attributed to Pyrrho, and labeled by poetic hyperbole as ‘divine’, in another fragment of Timon, namely his extraordinary tranquillity; the couplet as a whole, then, is saying that tranquillity is the source of an even-tempered life. And if one combines this with the less dogmatic reading (A) of the first couplet, this yields a set of remarks that are not obviously in conflict with anything else in the record on Pyrrho.

The acceptability of the translation in reading (D) is not beyond question. There is also some question whether the claim that tranquillity is the source of an even-tempered life is anything more than vacuous. However, if one assumes that Pyrrho is the speaker of these lines, then this interpretation or something close to it seems to be the only way to rescue his thought (as reported by Timon) from inconsistency. Another possibility, an interpretatively less burdensome one, is to drop the assumption that Pyrrho is the speaker; in this case, there is no reason to assume that the thought expressed by the lines must be consistent with what we know of Pyrrho’s philosophy. But if one takes this option, one must devise an alternative explanation for why Timon would have written these lines—including some account of who else the speaker might be. This challenge has recently been taken up in Clayman (2010), chapter 2. Clayman argues that the speaker is Timon himself, and that the lines serve a programmatic function at the opening of the poem; in light of parallel passages in other early Hellenistic poetry, the reference to truth is understood as an allusion to poetic verisimilitude rather than to anything philosophically problematic. Finally, it has been suggested (in Svavarsson 2002) that muthon, rendered in both readings (A) and (B) by “word”, should rather be understood as “myth” in the sense of “fiction” (and “of truth” linked instead, as is linguistically quite possible, with “standard”). In this case, again, there is no difficulty in understanding the second couplet as expressing a dogmatic position; indeed, such a reading is only to be expected, since the position is being debunked, not advocated. Green (2017) has extended Svavarsson’s suggestion by proposing that “word of truth” and “correct standard” are to be understood sarcastically rather than at face value, making fun of other thinkers’ belief in these things (which would also render the thought less dogmatic; it would not simply be a declaration of falsehood). But whether the word muthos, all by itself, can carry this weight of significance—or whether, if that is what Timon had intended, he would not have chosen some less ambiguous means of expressing it—is open to question. It is fair to say that no resolution of these matters is in sight; the fragment continues to be regarded as one of the most intractable pieces of evidence in the corpus of material on Pyrrho and Timon.

7. Influences on Pyrrho

Many different philosophical antecedents have been claimed for Pyrrho. Since we know very little about which philosophical currents Pyrrho may have been acquainted with, such claims are bound to be in large measure speculative. There are, however, a couple of exceptions to this; as noted at the outset, Pyrrho was associated with Anaxarchus and was reported to have encountered some unnamed Indian thinkers. The little that we know of Anaxarchus seems to suggest that his philosophy had a good deal in common with Pyrrho’s. Diogenes Laertius (9.60) ascribes to him an attitude of apatheia and eukolia, ‘freedom from emotion’ and ‘contentedness’; as noted earlier, apatheia is used in some sources to describe Pyrrho’s attitude as well, and the combination of the two terms seems to describe something close to the state cultivated by Pyrrho. We also hear from Sextus Empiricus that Anaxarchus “likened existing things to stage-painting and took them to be similar to the things which strike us while asleep or insane” (M 7.88). This has often been taken as an early expression of a form of epistemological scepticism. But it may also be taken as an ontological comment on the insubstantiality of the world around us; it is things (as opposed to our impressions of things) that are assimilated to stage-sets and the contents of dreams and fantasies. Either way, the remark looks like an anticipation of Pyrrho’s position in the Aristocles passage; the first reading conforms to the epistemological interpretation of that passage, and the second to the metaphysical interpretation. It appears, then, that Pyrrho may have borrowed to a considerable extent from Anaxarchus. There is, however, no indication that Anaxarchus drew a connection between his view of the nature of things and his attitude of emotional contentment, such as we have seen that Pyrrho did.

We do not know the identity of the “naked wise men” whom Pyrrho met in India, or what they thought. There are reports of other meetings between Indian and Greek thinkers during Alexander’s expedition, and these tend to emphasize the Indians’ extraordinary impassivity and insensitivity to pain and hardship. It is not unlikely that Pyrrho, too, was impressed by traits of this kind. Though precedents for his ideal of ataraxia exist in earlier Greek philosophy as well, his reported ability to withstand surgery without flinching is exceptional in the Greek context (and quite distinct from anything in later Pyrrhonism); if we believe this story, it is tempting to explain it by way of some form of training from the Indians. Some scholars have sought to establish more detailed links between the thought of the Aristocles passage and various currents in ancient Indian philosophy; and Beckwith (2015) finds in Pyrrho an authentic representative of early Buddhism. But there is at least room for debate about how far these similarities really go. From an opposing perspective, some have suggested that the linguistic barriers would have ruled out an interchange of any great philosophical subtlety between the Indians and Pyrrho. But this may be overly pessimistic; the expedition lasted a number of years, and some people manage to learn new languages remarkably quickly.

Beyond these figures with attested connections to Pyrrho, it is plausible to suppose a certain influence on Pyrrho from Democritus. Pyrrho is reported to have had a special admiration for Democritus (Diogenes Laertius 9.67, citing Pyrrho’s associate Philo); Democritus is one of the few philosophers besides Pyrrho himself who seems to escape serious criticism in Timon’s Lampoons; and Anaxarchus belonged in the tradition of thinkers stemming from Democritus. The influence may have been mainly in the ethical area; Democritus, too, had an ethical ideal that is recognizably a forerunner to Pyrrho’s ataraxia. If one adopts the epistemological interpretation of Pyrrho’s philosophy, one may see an additional area of influence in Democritus’ sceptical pronouncements about the prospects for knowledge of the world around us.

Alternatively, if one interprets Pyrrho along metaphysical lines, one may be inclined to look to Plato and the Eleatics as possible influences. Timon’s verdicts on these figures in the Lampoons are at least partially favorable; and, as was hinted at earlier on, the dim view of sensibles that is suggested by a number of Plato’s dialogues—but also anticipated by the Eleatics—seems to have something in common with Pyrrho’s view of reality (on the metaphysical interpretation) as indeterminate. The difference, of course, is that Pyrrho does not suggest any higher level of reality such as Plato’s Forms or the Eleatic Being.

8. Pyrrho’s Influence

Pyrrho’s relation to the later Pyrrhonists has already been discussed. Given the importance of Pyrrhonism in earlier modern philosophy, Pyrrho’s indirect influence may be thought of as very considerable. But beyond his being adopted as a figurehead in later Pyrrhonism—itself never a widespread philosophical movement — Pyrrho seems to have had very little impact in the ancient world after his own lifetime. Both Cicero and Seneca refer to Pyrrho as a neglected figure without a following, and the surviving testimonia do not contradict this impression. It is possible that he had some influence on the form of scepticism adopted by Arcesilaus and other members of the Academy; the extent to which this is so is disputed and difficult to assess. It is also possible that the Epicureans, whose aim was also ataraxia, learned something from Pyrrho; there are indications of an association between Pyrrho and Nausiphanes, the teacher of Epicurus. But if so, the extent of the Epicureans’ borrowing was strictly limited. For them, ataraxia is to be attained by coming to understand that the universe consists of atoms and void; and the Epicureans’ attitude towards the senses was anything but one of mistrust.


Ancient Texts

  • Decleva Caizzi, F., 1981, Pirrone: Testimonianze, Naples: Bibliopolis. Complete collection of texts referring to Pyrrho, with Italian translation and commentary.
  • Long, A. A. and D. N. Sedley, 1987, The Hellenistic Philosophers, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press (2 vols), sections 1–3. Vol. 1 contains texts in English translation with philosophical commentary; vol. 2 contains original texts with philological commentary.

Secondary Literature

  • Beckwith, C., 2011, “Pyrrho’s Logic: A Re-examination of Aristocles’ Record of Timon’s Account”, Elenchos, 32: 287–327.
  • –––, 2015, Greek Buddha: Pyrrho’s Encounter with Early Buddhism in Central Asia, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Bett, R., 2000, Pyrrho, his Antecedents and his Legacy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2012, Review of Clayman (2010), Gnomon, 84: 107–12.
  • Brennan, T., 1998, “Pyrrho on the Criterion”, Ancient Philosophy, 18: 417–34.
  • Brunschwig, J., 1994, “Once again on Eusebius on Aristocles on Timon on Pyrrho”, in J. Brunschwig, Papers in Hellenistic Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press: 190–211.
  • Burnyeat, M., 1980, “Tranquillity without a Stop: Timon, Frag. 68”, Classical Quarterly (New Series), 30: 86–93.
  • Castagnoli, L., 2002, Review of Bett (2000), Ancient Philosophy, 22: 443–457.
  • Clayman, D., 2010, Timon of Phlius: Pyrrhonism into Poetry, Berlin/New York: Walter de Gruyter.
  • Green, J., 2017, “Was Pyrrho a Pyrrhonian?”, Apeiron, 50: 335–65.
  • Hankinson, J., 1995, The Sceptics, London: Routledge.
  • Perin, C., 2018. “Pyrrho and Timon,” in D. Machuca and B. Reed (eds.), Skepticism: From Antiquity to the Present, London/New York: Bloomsbury, 24–35.
  • Stopper, M., 1983, “Schizzi Pirroniani”, Phronesis, 28: 265–97.
  • Svavarsson, S., 2002, “Pyrrho’s Dogmatic Nature”, Classical Quarterly, 52(1): 248–256.
  • –––, 2004, “Pyrrho’s Undecidable Nature”, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 27: 249–295.
  • –––, 2010, “Pyrrho and Early Pyrrhonism”, in R. Bett (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Ancient Scepticism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 36–57.
  • von Fritz, K., 1963, “Pyrrhon”, in Paulys Realencyclopädie der Classischen Altertumswissenschaft, xxiv: 89–106.

Other Internet Resources

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