#### Supplement to Defeasible Reasoning

## Semantic Inheritance Networks

A path is a sequence of links in a graph \(G\), with the final node of
each link being the initial node of the next, where all the links, with
the possible exception of the last one, are positive. A
*generalized* path is a sequence of links that can contain
negative links anywhere, and more than one. Each path has both an
initial node and a final node. A path can be taken as representing an
assertion about an individual: that the individual corresponding to the
initial node belongs to the category corresponding to the final node.
The *degree* of a path is the length of the longest generalized
path connecting the path’s initial node to its final node.

Horty, Thomason, and Touretzky define the relation of
*support* between graphs (cognitive states) and paths
(assertions) by mathematical induction on the degree of the path.
Direct links (paths of length one) are always supported by the
graph.

- If \(\sigma\) is a positive path, \(x \rightarrow \sigma^1 \rightarrow u \rightarrow y\), then \(G\) supports \(\sigma\)
iff:
- \(G\) supports path \(x \rightarrow \sigma^1 \rightarrow u\).
- \(u \rightarrow y\) is a direct link in \(G\).
- The negative link \(x \notrightarrow y\) does not belong to \(G\).
- for all \(v, \tau\) such that \(G\) supports \(x \rightarrow \tau \rightarrow v\), with the negative link \(v \notrightarrow y\) in \(G\), there exist \(z, \tau^1 , \tau^2\) such that \(z \rightarrow y\) is in \(G\), and either \(z = x\), or \(G\) supports the path \(x \rightarrow \tau^1 \rightarrow z \rightarrow \tau^2 \rightarrow\) v.

- If \(\sigma\) is a negative path, \(x \rightarrow \sigma^1 \rightarrow u \notrightarrow y\), then \(G\) supports \(\sigma\) iff:
- \(G\) supports path \(x \rightarrow \sigma^1 \rightarrow u\).
- \(u \notrightarrow y\) is a direct negative link in \(G\).
- The positive link \(x \rightarrow y\) does not belong to \(G\).
- for all \(v, \tau\) such that \(G\) supports \(x \rightarrow \tau \rightarrow v\), with the positive link \(v \rightarrow y\) in \(G\), there exist \(z, \tau^1 , \tau^2\) such that \(z \notrightarrow y\) is in \(G\), and either \(z = x\), or \(G\) supports the path \(x \rightarrow \tau^1 \rightarrow z \rightarrow \tau^2 \rightarrow v\).

The definition ensures that each potentially conflicting path be preempted by a path with a specificity-based priority.