Models of Higher-Order Probability

A model of higher-order probability consists of $$W$$, a set of possible worlds, together with a function that assigns to each world $$w$$ a probability function $$\mu_w$$. Let’s assume that these probability functions are non-standard, that is, they may assign infinitesimal probabilities to some sets of worlds. Let $$[W]$$ be the partition of $$W$$ in terms of probabilistic agreement: worlds $$w$$ and $$w'$$ belong to the same cell of $$[W]$$ just in case they are assigned exactly the same probability function.

Let $$A$$ be a subset of $$[W]$$. The set-theoretic union of $$A$$, $$\bigcup A$$, is a proposition expressible entirely in terms of probabilities (that is, entirely in terms of Boolean combinations of $$\Rightarrow$$ conditionals). In the finite case, Miller’s principle states that, for all worlds $$w$$ and all propositions $$B$$ and $$C$$:

$$\mu_w (C / B \cap \bigcup A) = \Sigma_{w' \in \cup A}\, \mu_{w'}(C / B) \times \mu_w (\{w\})$$

The logic of extreme higher-order probabilities consists of Lewis’s $$VC$$ conditional logic, minus Strong Centering, and plus the following two axiom schemata, which I call Skyrms’s axioms (Koons 2000, Appendix B):

$$(p \Rightarrow(q \Rightarrow r)) \leftrightarrow((p \amp q) \Rightarrow r)$$

$$[(p \Rightarrow \neg(q \Rightarrow r)) \amp \neg((p \amp q) \Rightarrow \bot)] \leftrightarrow \neg((p \amp q) \Rightarrow r)$$

In both cases, “$$p$$” must be a Boolean combination of $$\Rightarrow$$-conditionals. The variables “$$q$$” and “$$r$$” may be replaced by any two formulas. The formula $$\neg((p \amp q) \Rightarrow \bot)$$ expresses the joint possibility of $$p$$ and $$q$$ (in the sense that they don’t defeasibly imply a logical absurdity, $$\bot)$$.