August Wilhelm von Schlegel
August W. Schlegel (Sept. 5, 1767, Hanover – May 12, 1845, Bonn) was a German essayist, critic, translator, philosopher, and poet. Although the philosophical dimension and profundity of his writings remain underrated, he is considered to be one of the founders of the German Romantic Movement—which he conceived of as a European movement—as well as one of the most prominent disseminators of its philosophical foundational ideas, not only in Germany but also abroad and, most notably, in Britain.
Schlegel had an outstanding knowledge of art, history, literature, architecture, anthropology, and foreign languages, which made him a decisive figure in the early development of comparative literature (cf. Craig 2000: 864) and modern linguistics, and with the creation of the journal Indische Bibliothek, he inaugurated the domain of Sanskrit studies in Germany. He also wrote poetry and drama; but he is mostly known for his critical writings and his brilliant translations into German of Shakespeare, which are still used today.
- 1. Life and Work
- 2. A.W. Schlegel’s Influence in German and European Romanticism: The Athenaeum and the Lectures
- 3. Philosophy of Art
- 4. Philosophy of Language
- 5. Translation Theory
- 6. The Role of the Critic and Schlegel’s Romantic Nationalism
- 7. A.W. Schlegel: A Thinker of Difference
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1. Life and Work
1.1 Some Biographical Notes on A.W. Schlegel
August Wilhelm Schlegel was son of Johanna Christiane Erdmuthe Schlegel (née Hübsh) and Johann Adolf Schlegel, who was a Lutheran clergyman and poet. He was born in September of 1767, in Hanover. He initiated his studies at the University of Göttingen in 1786, first in theology and later in classical philology and aesthetics. It is also in Göttingen that he first met Wilhelm von Humboldt and Caroline Michaelis (Caroline Böhmer after 1784), an intellectual and scholar who encouraged him and also participated in his Shakespeare translations. His youngest brother, Friedrich Schlegel, joined him in 1790. During this period, he was influenced by some of his lecturers, such as Heyne, Bürger, and Eschenburg, and the works of authors such as Johann Gottfried Herder (cf. Ewton 1972 and Hölter 2010: 16–18). August Schlegel finished his studies in 1791 and moved to Amsterdam where he worked until 1795 as a private teacher of Willem Ferdinand Mogge Muilman. In 1796 he moved to Jena to work as a literary critic. His brother Friedrich also followed him to Jena, and they both joined important artists and philosophers such as Novalis, Ludwig Tieck, Dorothea Schlözer, and F.W.J. Schelling, thus forming the ‘heart’ of the so called Jena Romantik. In this same year, he married the widow Caroline Böhmer, whose role in A.W. Schlegel’s translations of Shakespeare as well as other writings attributed solely to him (such as the dialogue Die Gemälde, first published in the Athenaeum in 1799) was much more important than has been acknowledged. In fact, as Ernst Behler claims, Caroline “had a decisive influence upon the formulation of early Romantic theory” (Behler 1993: 40).
In 1798, tired of the publishing difficulties endured within the existing literary journals, A.W. Schlegel and his brother Friedrich Schlegel founded the famous periodical Athenaeum. They were both the editors and the main writers of this journal, which would offer an alternative to mainstream classicist approaches in literary criticism and which was soon to become one of the main outlets of the German Early Romantic Movement. The Athenaeum was devoted primarily to literary criticism with a philological and historical perspective, and a large section of it featured the review of contemporary literature. It contained critical essays, fragments, letters, announcements, and dialogues and appeared twice a year in the period between 1798 and 1800. Most importantly, though, the Athenaeum became the “leading publication of the early Romantics” (Behler 1993: 36).
In that same year, 1798, A.W. Schlegel started giving Lectures at the University of Jena. He also continued his translation of the works of Shakespeare (1797–1810), but on the whole his new involvement with the university meant that his presence in the Athenaeum would suffer, as did his marriage (Paulin 2016: 126). In 1801 Schlegel moved alone to Berlin, where he also lectured on literature and art at the University. Both his Jena (1798–1799) and his Berlin Lectures (1801–1804) were highly didactic while at the same time interspersed with important philosophical insights. So, as well as providing a comprehensive vision of the history of European literature, poetry, and mythology, Schlegel presented a new critical and philosophical (i.e., systematic) approach to art and its history. Some of these lectures were published in literary journals, until 1884 when they were posthumously collected as Vorlesungen über philosophische Kunstlehere (Lectures on Philosophical Art Education) and Vorlesungen über schöne Literatur und Kunst (Lectures on Fine Art and Literature) respectively. Four years later, in Vienna, Schlegel delivered another series of lectures elaborating upon some of the ideas he had developed in his previous work. A literal transcription of these lectures was published between 1809 and 1811 as Vorlesungen über dramatische Kunst und Literatur (A Course of Lectures on Dramatic Art and Literature). A more extended version of his Course of Lectures was published in an 1816 edition: by that time, they had already been translated into English, French, Dutch, and Italian and had obtained a wide circulation. Later Schlegel shows awareness of the fact that he was read “not only from Cadiz to St. Petersburg, but in North America as well and even as far as Asia” (Paulin 2016: 561). Indeed, the successful circulation of his Vienna Lectures facilitated the dissemination of the fundamental ideas underlying the Romantic Movement throughout Europe, and helped to solidify Schlegel’s influence and reputation as a critic.
After his divorce from Caroline Michaelis, who left him for his friend the philosopher F.W.J. Schelling, Schlegel became Mme. de Staël’s constant companion on her travels in Germany, Italy, France, and Sweden until her death in 1817. He also was tutor of her children. In August 1818 he married Sophie Paulus in Heidelberg, but they only remained together for a few weeks. Sophie never accompanied him to Bonn, where Schlegel was appointed Professor of Literature and Art History and lectured until 1844, a year before his death.
Alongside his academic work, A.W. Schlegel was a remarkably talented translator; he translated over 16 Shakespearean plays, five plays by Calderón de la Barca, and selected pieces by Dante, Petrarch, Giovanni Boccaccio, Miguel de Cervantes, Torquato Tasso, and Luís de Camões, published in 1804 as Blumensträusse italiänischer, spanischer, und portugiesischer Poesie, (Bouquets of Italian, Spanish, and Portuguese Poetry). He also made the first complete translation of the Bhagavadgītā from Sanskrit into Latin, which helped to promote and popularize the book in Germany (cf. Adluri and Bagche 2014: 33f.).
A.W. Schlegel can rightly be regarded as one of the first and most significant founders of Indology in Western Europe. Apart from his translations of Sanskrit texts, and the publishing the scholarly journal Indische Bibliothek (1820–1830), he set up a Sanskrit printing press with which he provided the first printed editions of the Bhagavadgītā (1823) and Rāmāyana (1829) in continental Europe.
1.2 A.W. Schlegel’s Writings and Their Reception
An anthology of some of A.W. Schlegel’s critical essays, selected by the author himself, was published in Berlin in 1828. Despite his opposition to the publication of the rest of his essays, A.W. Schlegel’s ‘collected works’ were edited by E. Böcking and published in 16 volumes between 1846 and 1848 (the collection is not complete). Since then, there has been no standard, critical edition of his works. A critical edition of his Vienna lectures was edited by E. Behler in 1989 (the edition of his complete lectures is still in progress), and (some of his) his letters were edited by J. Körner and published in 1930. All in all, the situation of A.W. Schlegel’s texts leaves much to be desired.
Especially during the Athenaeum period, Schlegel’s writings are witty, original, and sagacious in both form and content (e.g., Die Sprachen, Die Gemälde). After this period, i.e., once he started lecturing at the University, his style seems to lose its boldness and wit, gaining perhaps in depth and erudition. Some scholars suggest that these two developments are not unconnected (cf. Paulin 2016: 126). Thus, while stressing their formal perfection, critics of his literary writings (Gedichte, 1800; Ion, 1803; Poetische Werke, 1811) tend to justify his lack of success as a poet. It is as if A.W. Schlegel was not able to follow the aesthetics standards that he himself had developed theoretically. Other scholars, however, consider his play Ion a great success. But, on the whole, Heinrich Heine’s view that both Friedrich and August Wilhelm Schlegel “were critics and interpreters rather than poets” (Heine  1985: 2) seems to be widely accepted (cf. Craig 2000: 863; Ziolkowski 2016: 270), even by those who are critical towards Heine’s extremely negative and sarcastic outbursts against the Schlegels.
By contrast, Schlegel’s lectures as well as his translations (some of which are still used today) were very successful and influential. It was indeed A.W. Schlegel’s lectures, with their particular view of world literature as an organic whole, that were to influence many authors. F.W.J. Schelling (the most Romantic of the German idealist philosophers) and G.W. Hegel, for instance, used Schlegel’s Jena lectures as a basis for the elaboration of their Lectures on the Philosophy of Art (1802–1804) and Lectures on Aesthetics (1818) respectively. But A.W. Schlegel’s influence was not restricted to Germany alone. His lectures, having been translated into many languages and successfully promoted by authors such as Mme de Staël (Grundmann 2005: 40), were also extremely influential abroad—S.T. Coleridge being perhaps the most notable example (cf. Helmholtz-Phelan 1907). In the preface to his critical essays (Kritische Schriften, Berlin, 1828), Schlegel explains how many of the ‘revolutionary’ ideas he had formerly defended in his essays and lectures had been internalized and normalized by those very critics who had once rejected them with contempt. A.W. Schlegel’s response to this was modest: he said, he had just been able to foresee the coming shift of taste and evaluative parameters in the understanding and the interpretation of works of art (KS: I, vi).
Some critics have argued that, as a literary critic, A.W. Schlegel is more empirical and less philosophical than his brother Friedrich (cf. Welleck 1955: 72–73). And it has even been questioned whether A.W. Schlegel is the genuine creator of the ideas laid out in his writings and lectures (Heine  1985: 47). Yet, however convincing the distinction between ‘having created’ the ideas as opposed to merely ‘having disseminated’ them may seem, this claim is quite disputable. Schlegel’s philosophical analyses of art and the artist were undoubtedly inspired by his reading of and/or encounters with Herder, Kant, Fichte, Goethe, Schiller, and Schelling among others, but he developed his own poetology. A.W. Schlegel’s lectures had a unique dialectic character (Schlegel himself suggest that his lectures are to be understood as a dialogue), combining high theoretical standards with an appealing, empirical approach, thus offering “one of the first narratives of the historical and philosophical interrelation of all art forms” (Franzel 2014: 351). In the development and presentation of his theoretical position, he was indeed less speculative than other German philosophers (such as Hegel). But as Walter Benjamin notes, this is the result of a conscious decision to make room for a more critical approach, which renders Schlegel’s position surprisingly modern (Benjamin  1996: 118). In a mixture of pride and censure, Schlegel frequently notes how German authors are more speculative than practical (LDA: 16 and 440). Moreover, his aesthetical essays can be seen as a comment on and criticism of those more speculative Germanic approaches in which the particular work of art and the artist seem to be relegated to a secondary level and are treated like the piece of a theoretical ‘whole’. Die Gemälde, a dialogue on painting as well as a fictive visit through the gallery of Dresden (cf. Penzel 2007: 77ff.) that he co-wrote with Caroline Michaelis, is a good example of this, precisely for the attentive way in which it approaches and engages with the individual paintings (Paulin 2016: 160). Overall, though, A.W. Schlegel’s writings are prolific, but remain somewhat unfocused and repetitive. As Schlegel himself had often regretted, by taking too many different topics into consideration, his work lost the intensity of its philosophical and critical insights.
Although Schlegel’s lectures were “avidly devoured by intellectuals from all of the European countries” (Engel and Lehmann 2004: 84) and in spite of what could be regarded as quite a success during his lifetime—Schlegel himself was proud to have been read “from Cadiz to Edinburgh, Stockholm and St. Petersburg” (Schirmer 1986: 233) –, the works of A.W. Schlegel have suffered from an arguably unfair and prejudiced neglect. A first full-scale biography was only published in 2016 (!). In this biography, Roger Paulin argues that Schlegel’s reputation “never quite recovered from Heine’s devastating attack in Die Romantische Schule of 1835” (Paulin 2016: 3). “Apart from the Vienna Lectures and the Shakespeare translations”, he writes, “it is Heine’s attack that remains in the general consciousness”, so that in the end the image that pervades is one of “decline, déchéance, decrepitude, impotence” (Paulin 2016: 542). Nonetheless, the recent rising number of dissertations, articles, and even monographies (such as Paulin’s) dedicated to different aspects A.W. Schlegel’s writings, seem to suggest that there is a slow but steady change of attitude towards his work.
2. A.W. Schlegel’s Influence in German and European Romanticism: The Athenaeum and the Lectures
Despite the emphasis the ‘Romantics’ laid on the individual artist, the figure of the genius, originality, and individuality in general (cf. Schulte-Sasse  1988: 136–137), the conceptualization of the Romantic Movement itself needs to be understood essentially as a collective process. And yet, as problematic as it may be to ascribe the original conception of the romantic aesthetical and philosophical precepts to one author alone, A.W. Schlegel’s influence in the conceptualization as well as the dissemination of some of the most characteristic and informing principles of German Romanticism—including the term ‘Romantic’ (romantisch) itself (cf. Ferber 2005)—is by no means trivial. Indeed, if the periodical Athenaeum (which A.W. Schlegel co-edited and co-created with his brother Friedrich) was to become the ‘organ’ of the Romantic Movement, it is undisputable that A.W. Schlegel’s popular lectures in Jena (1798), Berlin (1801–1804), and Vienna (1808–1812) “disseminated the aesthetics of German Romanticism across Europe” (Engel and Lehmann 2004: 84).
The Romantic Movement emerged, on the one hand, as a reaction against Classicist and Neoclassicist aesthetical ideals (largely based on mimesis and representation, Behler 1993: ix), and on the other, as a critique from the somewhat blind faith in reason set up by the Enlightenment and which had proved to be unsatisfactory. Until the creation of the Athenaeum, A.W. Schlegel had published some of his writings in Friedrich Schiller’s periodical Die Horen (which was to Weimar Classicism what the Athenaeum would be to German Romanticism). Both he and his brother, Friedrich, however soon realized that their particular aesthetic views, philosophical insights, and literary criticisms (which they shared or thought to share with a number of authors such as Novalis, Tieck, Fichte, and Schleiermacher) needed a new, adequate space to be published without constraints. The Athenaeum was created with precisely this view in mind and was to provide an alternative space that was open to new aesthetic ideas. And although it was conceived as a collective work with an intended and welcomed diversity of positions, styles, and literary forms (letters, aphorisms, dialogues, literary criticism, etc.), their main idea was that they would publish only those pieces that they could consider as “their own” (A: I, iv). In effect: there were two editors, several writers, and a diversity of opinions, but one unifying principle (A: I, vi). The Athenaeum thus became the hotbed for powerful, original and philosophically revolutionary ideas and insights about poetry, literature, and art in general (cf. Paulin 2016: 118).
But, in order for these ideas to have the transformative effect that the German Romantic movement actually had within and beyond Germany, they needed to be not only systematized and organized into a more tangible unit, but also disseminated to broader audiences. This is precisely the role that A.W. Schlegel’s lectures played (cf. Franzel 2014). As Jochen Schulte-Sasse, argues: Schlegel’s Berlin Vorlesungen über schöhne Kunst und Literatur (‘Lectures on Fine Arts and Literature’), which he gave between 1801 and 1804, “have to be seen as a programmatic attempt to explain early Romantic theories of art in a relatively ‘popular’ and accessible form” (Schulte-Sasse  1988: 136). Indeed, the last series of these lectures (1803–1804) were dedicated entirely to the ‘History of Romantic Literature’. These Berlin lectures, however, were not published until 1884 (and to my knowledge never translated into English), but Schlegel made an effort to circulate them; for instance he sent them to Schelling, who then used them for his own Jena lectures on art. To be sure, Schlegel’s later Vienna lectures, which were translated into several languages and rapidly disseminated across Europe, were largely based on his Berlin lectures.
Throughout his lectures and essays, A.W. Schlegel praised the plays of Shakespeare and Calderón to the detriment of French Neoclassical theatre. This criticism was not arbitrary, but was part of a systematic and organic comprehension of art and art history. However, his harsh attack on classical rules considered ‘sacred’ by French critics predisposed the latter to react with hostility (especially to the publication of the polemical Comparaison entre la Phèdre de Racine et celle d’Euripide, in 1807), whilst being favored by English reviewers. In fact, the rediscovery of Shakespeare’s greatness in the 19th century was due, not only to Schlegel’s translations, but most importantly to his special approach to Shakespearean theatre: instead of comparing Shakespeare to ancient Tragedy, as if it were a bad copy, Schlegel claimed it should be analyzed on the grounds of constituting a necessary and historical difference. This difference—the difference between the ancients and the modern—was the cornerstone of Schlegel’s critique and set the basis for his theoretical use of the concept Romantic, which became the key-concept in his comprehension and reevaluation of modernity.
In effect, most commentators credit A.W. Schlegel for having given the word ‘romantic’ a systematic significance and affirmative tone from the very beginning (Furst 1969: 84). In contrast with other literary critics who used the term in contradictory and erratic ways (or avoided it altogether, such as Schelling, even if he based his aesthetics on the difference between the Ancient and the Modern), Schlegel believed it was important to transmit a clear-cut understanding of the term and “to elevate it again to its true signification” (LDA: 441). Indeed, his purpose was to foster a solid movement that should become the symbol of modernity and Germany as well as Europe, as he clearly indicates in the introduction to his Berlin lectures:
I say, I hope to fully dispel the doubt that still arises here and there as to whether there really is a romantic, i.e., specifically modern art: an art that does not follow the model of the Ancient and is nevertheless appreciated as fulfilling the highest principles […], a perfectly achieved art; in other words, I hope to dispel the doubt that there is a poetry that is not merely nationally and temporarily interesting, but universal and eternal. (VLK: III, 7)
Although subject to scholarly debate (Esterhammer 2002a: 153), Schlegel’s profound influence on English Romanticism through Coleridge is widely accepted. Some authors even claim that Coleridge found in Schlegel’s lectures the lucidity and sharpness regarding some of the main romantic principles and criticisms that he had lacked until his encounter with the Vorlesungen über dramatische Kunst (Helmholtz-Phelan 1907: 361). Schlegel’s writings made Shakespeare one of the most universally known and revered authors, not only in Germany arguably in England too. In the end, however, Schlegel was quite pessimistic about the actual influence he had had in his time, and lamented that his efforts had fallen so far short of his desire to inspire an artistic movement and define an epoch.
3. Philosophy of Art
3.1 Art and Nature
Art is not a mere ‘imitation’ or ‘representation’ of nature; art is the product of a creative force. This sentence, crystallizing one of the fundamental ideas of German Romantic aesthetics, constitutes the core of one of A.W. Schlegel’s most well-known Berlin lectures. It was published in the Viennese journal, Prometheus in 1808 and re-collected in his Kritische Schriften (1828) as Über das Verhältniss der schönen Kunst zur Natur; Über Täuschung und Wahrscheinlichkeit; Über Manier und Stil (On the Relationship of Art to Nature; On Illusion and Probability; On Style and Manner). The importance of this essay lies not only in this thesis (an idea that we also find in other texts of that period, such as Schelling’s 1807 essay Über das Verhältniß der bildenden Künsten zu der Natur (On the Relationship of Visual Arts to Nature), but rather in the way Schlegel developed his argument.
In this text, Schlegel argues in favor of a Modern (i.e., Romantic) art theory, in opposition to the representationalist and mimetic doctrines that go back to Aristotle’s Poetics and conceive the work of the artist as that of a craftsman copying the beauty of nature (Abrams 1953: 48). But his critique of the classicist formula ‘art imitates nature’ was accompanied by a careful analysis of the different meanings the term ‘nature’ had come to assume within aesthetic discourses. This philological and historical approach is distinctive of Schlegel’s writings and lends intelligibility and clarity to the texts without eroding their philosophical sharpness. Undoubtedly, the Romantic notion of art goes hand in hand with a reevaluation of the concept of nature. Similar to other authors who also were inspired by Spinoza’s distinction between natura naturans and natura naturata, Schlegel argues that, from a philosophical point of view, everything participates in an ongoing process of creation, whereas, from an empirical point of view, natural things are conceived as if they were dead, fixed and independent from the whole. This means that, in its purest and philosophical sense, nature is not perceptible in the same way the worldly objects are. However, unlike Schelling with his ‘intellectual intuition’ or intellektuelle Anschauung, Schlegel did not develop an elaborate theory to give account of this different form of perception; he succinctly argued that the comprehension of nature’s true essence is more like a presentiment (ahnen) or an aesthetic contemplation, than like scientific knowledge. In order to realize this ‘Romantic’ notion of nature, one needs to comprehend or rather feel oneself as an organic whole. One needs to achieve self-awareness and to recognize oneself as forming part of a larger unity. This resort to a non-theoretical or non-discursive plane as an essential constituent of human knowledge was also important in Schlegel’s philosophy of language, which he already expounded in his Letters on Poetry, Meter and Language (Briefe über Poesie, Sylbenmaß und Sprache) in 1795.
In any case, the philosophical or Romantic notion of nature as an unfathomable unity and creative force that cannot be seen nor touched, and which is obviously a direct response to some of the many questions raised by Kant’s three Critiques, is not to be understood as a mere intellection, an empty chimera: Nature is the productive force pulsing in all living beings. For Schlegel, nature is organic in the sense that it is an organized and organizing principle, granting intelligence to the totality of existing beings. It is a creative force that produces independent living things, the life of which does not need any external mechanism to keep its autonomy, for it only depends on its inner, natural power to live (as is the case with Leibniz’ vis activa). At this point Schlegel mentions the astrological doctrines that claim that even the tiniest atom is a mirror of the universe. The idea of Nature mirroring itself in each and every living organism is characteristic both of German Idealism and German Romanticism. The difference between human beings and other animals, plants, or mineral structures is that, (1) human beings are able to understand the fact that they, as an organism, mirror Nature’s organic structure; and furthermore, (2) that they are capable of reproducing nature’s creativity through art, as well as reflecting upon this fact. This reasoning induced Schlegel to define human genius and his/her poetical creativity as a whole (i.e., art and language) as the capability of producing a world within a world (Müller-Vollmer 2000 : 317); a definition which is most tangible in dramatic literature.
Schlegel’s criticism of the physicalists’ conception of nature is surely the result of a very specific aesthetic and philosophical perspective. But this particular viewpoint enabled him to reinterpret and give a new meaning to the old and criticized formula ‘art imitates nature’. Indeed, once we conceive of nature as an organic whole, constantly becoming and transforming itself, then the sentence is quite different and seems to capture not only the true essence of (Romantic) art, but also its most fundamental principle. It is in this sense that Schlegel polemically will say that “art should imitate nature” (SW: III, 306). The deficiency of the formula does not lie in the idea itself, but in the meaning we give to its components. In a very precise sense, art imitates nature, because in his or her creativity, the genuine artist (i.e., the Romantic artist) also seeks to produce an organic whole and thereby embody an eternal truth. For Schlegel, it is only through art and through everything that art signifies, that man is capable of attaining that seemingly lost unity.
3.2 Romantic Art and the Longing for a Lost Unity
To be sure, if art is seen as the embodiment of an eternal truth, of absolute beauty, this implies that art is not Beauty itself. This is also why, according to Schlegel, each work of art is the expression of a certain longing, a craving for the recreation of that very unity experienced through the “spiritual feeling or intuition (geistige Anschauung) of Nature” (SW: III, 307). For Schlegel, it is only through art and through everything that art signifies, that man is capable of attaining (even if not absolutely) such a wholeness, i.e., to recover what is felt as a ‘lost’ unity. The idea of longing or Sehnsucht is indeed essential in Schlegel’s account of Romanticism and must be understood in relation to the difference between ancient and modern art, which also was the structuring principle and, in a sense, constituted the real object of Schlegel’s analysis in his Lectures on Dramatic Art. This opposition may be summarized as follows: whereas ancient poetry is plastic, sensual, harmonious, and, overall, a poetry of enjoyment of the present; modern poetry is a poetry of desire and longing (Sehnsucht), hovering between the idealizations of a remote past and an unknown future (LDA: 9). According to Schlegel, these differences encompass every sphere of reality and every form of art, and are on the whole the result of a historical event, namely the establishment of Christianity.
As F.W.J. Schelling had done in his Lectures on the Philosophy of Art of 1803, what Schlegel emphasizes about the transition from paganism to Christianity is that it involved the realization of an insurmountable breach between subject and object, between the I and the World, i.e., between consciousness and nature. Christianity, he argues, awakened the consciousness of the internal rupture or fundamental discord between the finite and the infinite which, in Schlegel’s analysis, is constitutive of modernity. In other words, for Schlegel, modernity arises from the painful realization of an insurmountable fissure, and the subsequent insight that real happiness can never be attained, i.e., “that no external object can ever entirely fill our souls; and that every mortal enjoyment is but a fleeting and momentary deception” (LDA: 9). As a result, in Schlegel’s view, to understand modern and especially Romantic literature means to understand art as the eternal longing for the reconciliation of this fissure between the subject and the universe, the finite and the infinite or the divine. Both the realization of the insurmountable fissure as well as the longing for its reconciliation are part of a particular way of experiencing nature, the self, and the infinite.
In their attempts at finding alternative ways of understanding reason and its relation to life, art and feelings, the Romantics also tried to recuperate or rediscover elements from what had been regarded as the irrational and mythical spirit of the Middle Ages. Schlegel uses the term ‘Romantic’ to denote the very specific historical and stylistic discrepancy between German and Modern art, on the one hand, and Ancient and Classicist art, on the other. Schlegel argued that German culture, which he defined as having a natural inclination toward the Romantic (LDA: 439), was indebted to all the cultures which preceded it. But he specifically laid the roots of the so-called ‘Romantic spirit’ in chivalry, i.e., in the union of the heroism of the northern conquerors with the humanistic principles of Christianity. Schlegel associated chivalry and the Middle Ages in general with a certain form of purity that manifests itself (1) in a more spiritual understanding of love and female worth, to the extent that one could talk of a fusion between the metaphysical longing for the infinite (or God) and the erotic longing for a woman; and (2) in a ‘heroic’ morality. It is a morality “that never calculated consequences, but consecrated unconditionally certain principles of action” (LDA: 8). On the other hand, though, Schlegel’s genealogy of the ‘romantic’ would be incomprehensible without paying attention to his openness to and interest in other cultures and languages. Thus, the ‘Romantic spirit’ is also found in the works of Shakespeare, and sought in the spirit of romance cultures and languages, which, for Schlegel, are the result of a fusion between Latin and Teutonic languages, in a similar way as German Romanticism “is the fruit of the union of the peculiarities of the North with fragments of antiquity” (LDA: 5).
3.3 The Poetical and the Critique of Art
For Schlegel, in the same way as nature—the true experience of nature— cannot be reduced to its mere physical or external manifestations, both the work of art and the experience it evokes are more than just the simple perception or the analysis of its forms. Thus, he argues, the true work of art, in order to endure the shifting modes and fashions of time, must have something more profound than just a beautiful form, in the same way a flower needs its roots and cannot survive long without them. For Schlegel, as for Schelling or Novalis, the attempt to understand the work of art as the result of the conscious decisions of the artist alone would be misleading, because there is always an unconscious element in every artistic creation. The work of art is a result of both conscious and unconscious forces. In other words, the artist’s intention is, to a great extent, irrelevant for the artistic product, and hence, cannot play a major role in the evaluation of the work itself. In his Lectures on Dramatic Art, Schlegel defines genius as someone being capable of the “almost unconscious choice of the highest degree of excellence” (LDA: 5), and in an Athenaeum fragment he claimed that “it is a distinguishable mark of poetical genius to know a great deal more than he knows he knows” (SW: VIII, 15). This does not mean that any sign of an ‘unconscious’ choice in the production of art is a sign of genius; what is characteristic about the great artist is that his/her ‘unconscious’ choices seem attributable to a higher, divine and conscious force. The extent to which the artist is capable of transcending his/her more or less involuntary particularities, i.e., the extent to which his/her choices seem to derive from an unconscious ability to select always the highest degree of excellence, determines the difference between style and mannerism. When the work of art appears as if all its elements had been consciously chosen by a power above and beyond the artist, it has style; when the artist has not transcended his/her individuality, then s/he is categorized as mannerist (SW: III, 309–312).
The essence of a work of art, the principle that all real works of art have in common and what makes them more than a mere accumulation of particular elements, is what Schlegel called the ‘poetical’. Consequently, the ability to grasp whatever is truly poetical in a specific work of art set the basis for his methodological procedure in his art criticism. For Schlegel, a criterion for evaluating a work of art is its capacity to extend itself “beyond the limits of reality into the region of a creative fancy” (LDA: 107–108). On the other hand, the poetical aspect of a work of art depends on its capacity to mirror and to present (darstellen) eternally true ideas (LDA: 18). But, as in many aesthetic texts from this period, it is not always obvious which ‘ideas’ the work of art must seek to mirror. It seems these ‘ideas’ should be understood in a Platonic sense, as they generally refer to great values or great ideals such as beauty, greatness, and goodness.
However, and partly due to his reluctance to consider the artist’s intentionality as being decisive in the comprehension of the work of art (which in some way prefigures the late Romantic ideal of l’art pour l’art), Schlegel did not underline a necessary moral purpose in aesthetic objects. And yet, for Schlegel, this did not imply that the contemplation and understanding of art should lose its moral aura. Quite to the contrary, for Schlegel, art has the power to elevate us above our ordinary encounters with the world, above the sorrows and daily troubles of life. This is why he argued that the purpose of art could not be a mere imitation or reduplication of the world as it is, because in this case, apart from the fact that music, dance, architecture, and so many other art forms become totally inexplicable, the best works of art would be the ones that deceive the most, in the sense that the viewer would find himself prevented from contemplating the work of art as a work of art. Clearly, if the purpose of art were to replicate nature (understood as an object rather than a subject) the aesthetic objects would evoke no particular interest beyond mere ornamentation. But, for Schlegel, both the contemplation/critique and the production of art should be seen as the result of creative activity.
In accordance with these theoretical assumptions, Schlegel was very negative about naturalistic neo-classicist tendencies in art. He praised wholeness and poetical unity as well as originality in a work of art. For Schlegel, similarly as for Baumgarten, the magic of a work of art is that it creates and hence brings us into a different world, with all its own internal coherence. It is in this sense that a work of art is organic and complete. The purpose of a work of art should therefore not be to reflect the real world with naturalism, but rather to create its own world, which could never be a question of applying a set of rules and principles to a particular matter (paintings, words, marble), such as classicist aesthetics seemed to suggest. The search for naturalism and plausibility, in an attempt at producing the most true and real representation of reality, makes art lose its greatness, beauty, and wonder.
In his Lectures on Dramatic Art, Schlegel praised the use of masks in theatrical representations as well as those performers who managed to create an emotional distance between themselves, the audience and the role they were playing. Once more, art is not about deceiving or hiding, but about the production or the creation of a world within a world. This also explains Schlegel’s admiration of Old Comedy, because in this case the spectator is constantly forced to remain aware of the experience in which s/he is partaking, namely the experience of the difference between reality and illusion. A similar reconsideration of comedy was also the basis for other contemporary authors in Schlegel’s circle, such as Ludwig Tieck with his version of the 17th century fairy tale Der gestiefelte Kater (Puss in Boots). Schlegel stresses that, in contrast to tragedy (where the author needs to remain invisible to guarantee the integrity of his/her fictional world); in comedy, the gap between the different levels of reality and illusion, or rather, the very disintegration of the unity of the story becomes the center of the play. As Schlegel puts it, in Old Comedy: “the whole production was one entire jest within itself” (LDA: 108). In Aristophanes’ plays, the chorus, which regularly interrupts the course of the play to address the audience with reference to the story (parabisis), the author and the people from the audience alike, virtually destroys all the elements and characteristics of tragedy: its seriousness as well as its harmonious unity is systematically parodied. Not only the scenes, not only the poetry, but also the tragic composition, the music, acting, and dancing, were object of a hilarious distortion. For Schlegel, this did not mean that comedy should be understood as a derivative of tragedy; on the contrary, he affirms it to be “a species of poetry as independent and original as tragedy itself” (LDA: 108). In fact, A.W. Schlegel’s characterization of the distinction between the character of Old Comedy and Greek tragedy would become a central reference in literary criticism.
Among all the different artistic manifestations, Schlegel considered dramatic poetry to be “the most entertaining of all diversions” (LDA: 12). The fundamental reason for dramatic poetry’s being so engaging, as Schlegel points out, lies in the mimicry that is always involved in theatrical representations. Schlegel maintained that all works of art, and in particular, all theatrical representations, are expression of the idiosyncrasies of the country where they are produced. And although he succinctly suggested that the existence of a theatrical tradition may be seen as a symbol of a special intellectual and political environment, he also indicated that the enjoyment of mimicry per se is somehow constitutive of human beings (Flaherty 1994: 195). For Schlegel, children’s delight in imitating their relatives is also expressive of man’s basic psychological predisposition to mimicry (LDA: 18); a disposition without which man would not be able to enter the linguistic, let alone the poetical and creative phases of his development (SW: VII, 117). Dramatic poetry, he argued, is the representation of an “important” action, namely an action that has been purged of the petty and unnecessary details of real life; it is the performance of a morally and intellectually exemplary action through dialogue. Schlegel’s placing of dramatic poetry in the highest rank amongst the arts hardly makes his position unique. What does render him quite distinctive, rather, is the argument he gives, namely that it produces the maximum enjoyment. This certainly contrasts with Schiller’s moralizing views. Schlegel was very aware of the necessity for a play to be interesting and exciting for the audience: the greatness of a play has to do with the way in which it creates a certain tension or conflict that involves the audience. But, what makes dramatic poetry different from a mere pantomime, what really elevates it above other human activities is, once again, its poetical element, i.e., its capacity to mirror an idea or eternal truth. Ultimately, this is also what determines the difference between tragedy and comedy. The tragic tone is given through a sincere melancholy, a longing for and accepting of a “destiny soaring above this earthly life”, whereas the main characteristic of comedy is its “forgetfulness of all discouraging considerations” (LDA: 24). For Schlegel, the aim of tragedy is not “to purify the passions by pity and terror” (LDA: 43), as Aristotle had said, but to elevate us “to the most dignified view of humanity” (LDA: 112). In fact, Schlegel’s analysis of Greek tragedy and his sharp rejection of Aristotle’s theory of tragedy were extremely influential.
In his Lectures on Dramatic Art Schlegel was very critical towards the present state of German theatre (LDA: 438). However, apart from Shakespeare, Calderón with their ironic way of mixing the tragic with the comic (LDA: 175), and the ancient Greek, Schlegel also praised Lessing, Schiller, and Goethe for having “redeemed the German theatre from its long continued mediocrity” (LDA: 424).
4. Philosophy of Language
In his Letters on Poetry… from 1795, addressed to a fictional Amalie, Schlegel discusses the origins of language; a theme, to which he would later return in his Jena and Berlin lectures. Schlegel was thus resuming an old philosophical debate which had formed two opposite hypotheses (Behler 2002: 124–128). The two basic and mutually exclusive positions maintained, on the one hand, as Schlegel portrays them, that human language must have originated as a transcription, representation, or imitation of external objects; and, on the other, that in its origin language must have been purely sensual, i.e., a mere form of expression of emotions through sounds. Thus, either directly or indirectly, Schlegel was referring to authors such as Condillac, Hemsterhuys, Karl Phillip Moritz, August Ferdinand Bernhardi, Fichte, Herder, and Rousseau. However, in contrast to Herder (and even his own brother Friedrich) for whom the debate about the origin of language was primarily a debate about whether its origin was natural or divine, for Schlegel, the real question at stake was the extent to which the nature of language could be reduced to and explained in pure rationalistic terms. Furthermore, in these letters Schlegel implicitly questions the possibility of attaining absolute knowledge solely through theory, i.e., attending only to a scientific rationale that necessarily excludes more metaphorical and intuitive approaches, which attempt to understand and grasp things “under the mysterious light of twilight” (SW: VII, 110). For Schlegel, in any case, the real problem lay in the assumed exclusivity of both alternatives (cf. Behler 2000: 126).
Schlegel’s decision to present his position in an epistolary form, mixing different styles of argumentation, is an almost necessary consequence of his approach to the debate: a lively debate, which he aimed to dissolve by reconciling both perspectives but without negating any of them. In a way, these letters are a clear example of the fusion between content and form. In fact, Schlegel actually modified his last Letter after having received a commentary, through a missive, from Friedrich Schiller (Behler 2002: 126). For Schlegel, the only plausible theory on the origin of language had to take into account both its irrational elements (i.e., the purely emotional, imaginative, sensual, and most radically communicative aspects of language) and its rational characteristic (i.e., a system of signs based on convention), while admitting that on the whole, the origin of language remains as secret and inexplicable as the origin of humanity itself (SW: VII, 111). In brief: for Schlegel, as for Novalis or Schleiermacher, language could not be reduced to a mere system of signs and any account of the origin of language had to be able to integrate the two apparently opposite aspects of it.
For Schlegel, language, in its most elementary conception, constitutes the basic means of communication of immediate feelings, and therefore represents a dimension that is also present in other animals. Children learn to move their tongues, Schlegel notes, even before they learn to use their feet (SW: VII, 117). But in human language, this communicative capability is also the tool that enables man to surpass a pure naturalistic or animalistic sphere. Indeed, for Schlegel, as for Herder, language is the quintessence of human beings. Language, on the one hand, represents our rupture with nature, but, on the other, it constitutes our first and most fundamental contact with the world: (1) it is the true condition of possibility of our orientation in the world; and (2) it provides us with the unique opportunity of communicating with other people and of developing subjectivity. Moreover, for Schlegel, the world as such only makes sense through or within language. It is through language that we tear ourselves away from nature and constitute ourselves as a subject. Language is what takes us beyond ourselves; it is the “magical power” that leaves room for the incorporeal, unphysical in us (SW: VII, 139).
Schlegel accepts the idea that, in its beginning, language was probably a direct expression of feelings and emotions through sounds. The origin of language, he argues, must have been very close to the cry of animals and the singing of birds, an idea that he reinforces through the fact that we all began to use our voices by screaming (SW: VII, 115). But to this basic point, Schlegel also adds the idea of rhythm. In his letters, he suggests that the rhythmic character of language is as old as poetry, and moreover, as old as human life. The oldest or the first language, he argues, must have been indivisible from tones, rhythms, music, and dance. Poetry, or rather rhythm, he affirms, is thus essential to language itself. Indeed, it would be impossible to eliminate rhythm from language (SW: VII, 108). In other words, Schlegel claims that, in its origin, language was poetry (SW: VII, 104). Most important, though, is that Schlegel “does not limit the realm of sensuality and feeling to an early stage in the formation of language” (Behler 2000: 81). For Schlegel, this more sensual aspect of language is always present: however civilized a people may be, they cannot avoid using different tones and rhythms to express themselves (SW: VII, 115). Each utterance, each sentence is spoken with a certain rhythm, each word also carries the way in which it is said, the way in which it refers to the world, and all these elements constitute an aspect of language, for they help to establish the ultimate meaning of the words. This, as Schlegel points out, becomes most obvious once we realize that, in order to comprehend the emotions that are being transmitted through a particular speech, one does not need to understand the words literally (SW: VII, 114).
Thus, for Schlegel, language not only was poetry in its origin: language is essentially poetry. Or as he would later claim in his Berlin lectures: “language is an ongoing becoming and continually changing, never ending poem of human kind” (VLK: I, 388). Thus, the nature of language should be understood, not as a more or less automatic response to the necessities the world imposes upon us, but as a creative, poetical ability. For Schlegel, the characterization of language as poetry is the only way a theory of language could give account of language’s inherent spontaneity and creativity. In a certain way, Schlegel was reinterpreting Herder through Fichte, emphasizing Fichte’s idea of man’s self-possession and his relation to the world as an active and not a passive one. This also explains the importance Schlegel gave to the role of the poet (and to the literature translator) in the development of the language of a nation. For Schlegel, as for Wilhelm von Humboldt, the task of the poet and also that of the translator is to broaden the signifying and expressive capacity of a language. The poet, Schlegel says in his 1796 text The Works of Homer by Voss, is the force that renders language alive, which nevertheless does not mean that s/he may introduce any kind of changes: language’s malleability also has its grammatical and philological limits (KS: I, 75–76 and 116–117).
In his philosophical account of the fact that language is constantly changing and moving from lower to higher stages, Schlegel operates with two very different ways of approaching language, which, at the same time, reveal the co-existence of two opposite but equally constitutive forces in the development of a language: the artist’s language-shaping efforts and the grammarian’s judicial function (SW: VII, 117). In this way, Schlegel is somehow anticipating Saussure’s extremely influential distinction between langue and parole. For Schlegel, as for Saussure or Deleuze, the tension between language as an ordered and stable whole, and language as the subject of a more or less arbitrary, free and creative development, is what makes language something alive.
In a similar way, Schlegel affirms that our encounters with the world are always poetical, in the sense that they are not be merely receptive, but also creative. Reality exists through language, or, in other words, we always relate to the world metaphorically. This also means that there cannot be an ‘absolute’ (i.e., an absolutely true) way of referring to the external world, for we do not see the world as it is, but always in relation to ourselves. Schlegel’s theory of language is thus intrinsically connected to his theory of mythology. Both in his Jena and in his Berlin lectures, Schlegel stressed the fact the experience of an existing totality has a mythological basis without which the experience itself would be impossible (Behler 1992: 77–78). Once again, Schlegel stressed the idea that mythology is not merely a phase of human rationality, but is part of our being in the world. It is a structural principle of human intellectual activity, the purest rational activity being a mythological one: be it in art, sciences, or in our daily activities, we always relate to the world metaphorically.
In his letters, Schlegel claims that language is the “most wonderful creation of human being’s poetical talent”, because it is through language that human nature is able to reflect upon itself (SW: VII, 104). Thus, Schlegel’s theory of language is at the same time a theory of the origin of poetry, which also explains his predilection for poetry among all the different artistic manifestations. Thanks to this comprehension of the poetical nature of language, Schlegel can explain poetry as the highest and freest of all arts, because it creates its own objects. Indeed, if language is defined as poetry, then poetry itself becomes “poetry in poetry” (Behler 1992: 125). The only difference between language and poetry, he argued, is that the poet is aware of his/her poetical creativity: s/he consciously decides to create a dream; whereas in ordinary speech, the subject is unaware of his/her poetical and imaginative activity (VLK: I, 275). In this way, Schlegel was anticipating some of Nietzsche’s most interesting theses in On Truth and Lie in an Extra-Moral Sense and The Birth of Tragedy
5. Translation Theory
Although Schlegel himself denied that he had developed a translation theory (IB: I, 256), many of his texts are devoted to the analysis of existing translations (such as Voss’s and Bürger’s translations of Homer) as well as to the commentary on his own work as translator. Schlegel was almost certainly influenced by the work of Johann Gottfried von Herder, but his decision to avoid the elaboration of a systematic translation theory can be interpreted as the result of a very precise theoretical position, namely that each text requires a different procedure for its translation. As he affirmed in the commentary to his Bhagavad-Gita translation, it all depends on the relation between the two languages (IB: I, 256). In other words, for Schlegel, a translation theory as such is uninteresting unless it involves the exposition of the actual work undertaken with the texts, i.e., with the original text as well as with all the existing translations. Consequently, Schlegel’s commentary and his suggestions concerning Voss’s translation of Homer are accompanied by a very detailed analysis of the Greek text together with a comparative study of Voss’s and Bürger’s versions. Likewise, in his Über die Bhagavad-Gita, Schlegel analyzes all the different ways in which a particular word (such as ‘yoga’ or ‘dharma’) has been translated, creating thus a history of the translation. And although his commentaries appear as a work in progress, they show a very precise and carefully conceived methodology which was mostly valuable for other translators and translation theorists. Very much as a critique and response to Voss, Schlegel’s translations need to be understood as an example of the so called “paradigm shift” (cf. Robinson 1991 and Bernofsky 1997) that was taking place within translation theories.
For Schlegel, a good translation is not necessarily a literal translation; the translator must be able to translate the spirit of the text. He must follow the letter, but he must also be able to “capture some of the innumerable, indescribable marvels that do not reside in the letter, but float above it like a breath of spirit!” (SW: VII, 39). Thus, in an 1838 letter to Herrn Reimen, Schlegel explains that the aim of a translator should be to “provide those who have no access to the original with as pure and uninterrupted appreciation of the work as possible” (SW: VII, 287). Anticipating Humboldt’s distinction between the ‘foreign’ (das Fremde) and ‘strangeness’ (die Fremdheit)—which he introduced in the preface of his translation of the Agamemnon from 1816 –, Schlegel also emphasizes that all translations should avoid converting foreign texts into strange texts (Berman 1992a: 154). As he had said in his Works of Homer by Voss, in order to translate a text from a different culture, the translator needs to maintain the text’s naturalness; s/he cannot convert it into something strange, there is no necessity in violating the language, in inventing a new language (SW: VII, 116). Indeed, what Schlegel reproached in Voss’s translation of Homer was precisely “to have created a much too ‘strange’ pidgin of Greek and German” (Berman 1992a: 154). On the other hand, though, as a translator and art-critic Schlegel was also concerned with enabling the assimilation and comprehension of otherness, and criticized strongly the way in which - especially French translations - tended to paraphrase passages from foreign texts in order to make them seem more French (KS: I, 75–76, cf. Berman 1992a: 36). Moreover, Schlegel believed that German culture and language (as opposed to other languages) provided much better conditions for good translations, i.e., translations that were able to assimilate a certain foreignization, without becoming too ‘strange’.
Although many of Schlegel’s remarks may seem self-evident and elementary to translators today, they did not appear so at the time. In fact they are the result of a very precise way of understanding language. Schlegel’s translation theories are very much connected to his philosophy of language. It is within his explanatory observations about the difficulty of translating Sanskrit terms that we find a philosophical theory about the genealogy of abstract significance. All abstract concepts, he argues, are the result of a progressive growing apart between an original sensual denotation and its future abstract meanings (IB: II, 248–258). Therefore, the translator needs to make a decision between (a) finding a more or less neutral term in his own language that has a similar meaning to the original, sensual meaning (in this case he needs to explain the particular use of this word); and (b) using all the meanings that the original word has been attached to. The problem in the latter case is that one meaning does not relate to the other, and, what is worse, the translation loses the cohesion between all the different meanings, so the reader is not always able to know in which way these different meanings are bound.
Schlegel describes the task of the translator as a voluntary and embarrassing slavery (IB: II, 254). It is never gratifying, because the more he tries to make the best translation, the more he realizes how impossible his task is:
I have come to the conviction that translation is, though freely chosen, nevertheless a laborious bondage, an art without substance, a thankless craft; thankless not just because the best translation is never esteemed as equal to an original, but also because the translator, the more he gains insight, must feel even more the inevitable imperfection of his work. (IB: II, 255)
In effect, Heine, criticized Schlegel’s translations for “polishing his words ever so sweetly and fastidiously” (Heine  1985: 25), Voss argued that Schlegel’s Shakespeare “was not Shakespeare but Schlegel” (quoted in Larson 1989, 124) and there is an ongoing debate as to the extent to which Schlegel romanticizes Shakespeare (Bernofsky 1997: 180f.). And yet, there also seems to be a consensus regarding the fact that his translations into German of the works of Shakespeare are still and by far the best.
6. The Role of the Critic and Schlegel’s Romantic Nationalism
6.1 Between Enlightenment and Romanticism
The Romantic vision of the great artist as an exceptional individual, an unrepeatable genius, creator of his own rules, of his own style, leaves the figure of the philosopher and essayist in a rather difficult position. The art critic has a very different task from that of the artist. As a critic, Schlegel conceives his activity as an educational and moral one, something which he definitely does not demand from the artist. “Art needs the discourse of art history for its artistry to become visible” (Schulte-Sasse  1988: 137). Certainly, in order to appreciate correctly the work of the artist, in order to avoid being dazed by superficialities, the art critic also has to have an inner feeling, a certain genius. But his task is not to create, but to comprehend and to educate the public in their taste, to enable them to value the new, modern artistic productions with a profound understanding of their significance. For,
what ennobles human nature [is] to recognize and respect whatever is beautiful and grand under those external modifications which are necessary to their existence, and which sometimes even seem to disguise them. There is no monopoly of poetry for certain ages and nations. (LDA: 2)
Throughout Schlegel’s entire work the Romantic ideals are in fact embedded in an enlightenment project.
Thus in the 1809 preface to the publication of his Lectures on Dramatic Art, Schlegel argued that his main purpose was not so much to transmit an indifferent account of the history of dramatic poetry, but most importantly to “develop those ideas which ought to guide us in our estimate” (LDA: vii). His objective was to liberate his listeners and readers from what he calls a “despotism in taste” (LDA: 2), that is, to release them, both from their provincial prejudices towards unknown cultures and from the new tendencies developing in German literature. He wanted to prepare the German public for a (future) German Romantic theatre.
In a similar fashion, Schlegel argued that in order to appreciate art productions from past cultures and remote nations, an acquaintance not only with the actual work of art is indispensable, but also with its historical and cultural background: it is imperative to understand the peculiarities of their culture and history as a whole. The profound comprehension of History is the basis for any comprehension of art and languages, which necessarily bears a direct relationship with the historical conditions circumscribing it (KS: I, x). As a consequence, Schlegel introduced in all of his lectures historical, social, and cultural observations; because for him, the aim of the critic is, primarily, to reconcile the division between theory and experience, i.e., between a philosophical and a historical approach. Such was the balance Schlegel sought to achieve in his lectures between what would be a purely theoretical comprehension of tragedy and the consideration of the theatre as such, with all the historical, architectural and cultural characteristics that conditioned the actual performance of the play.
The critic of art and history needs to be a connoisseur in the strictest sense of the word, for he must be able to explain the actual state of humanity from its most remote past. He needs to distance himself sufficiently from his own time in order to be able to understand and judge it. The true critic must have a “universality of mind” so that he may leave aside his “personal predilections” (LDA: 5). Schlegel conceived his lectures as a true critique, and many years later, he still considered that this is what made his approach in his Lectures on Dramatic Art and Literature unique (KS: I, xiii).
In the preface to the publication of his critical writings from 1828, Schlegel explains that the difficulty of his task as an art critic lies not so much in the critique or the judgment itself, or in the laying out of the proper argument in demonstration of his views, as in finding, i.e., creating the right concepts with which to express the effect and the impressions generated by a specific work of art (KS: I, xii). The genius of the critic is that he is able to use the word ‘romantic’ in such a way that it may express the essence of an epoch. And, although Schlegel did not believe he actually had a big influence on the German public, by 1828 he did remark that a shift of taste had taken place in Europe, a shift that showed how the Romantic ideals had in fact widely pervaded European audiences.
6.2 Nationalism versus Cosmopolitanism
Through his translations and essays A.W. Schlegel intended to make foreign literary traditions and literary works accessible to the German public, but he also thought that the opposite was necessary. That is, Schlegel understood that his task as an art critic was also to defend and disseminate German culture, within Germany and throughout Europe. Indeed, Schlegel’s preoccupation with the historical and cultural diversities had two different, even opposite, consequences. On the one hand it made Schlegel’s approach to different cultures and their artistic production much more tolerant, because he was aware of the fact that one needs to immerse oneself in their culture in order to grasp the universal or poetical nature of the particular work of art and avoid a provincial attitude. In fact, Schlegel liked to think of himself as a citizen of the world. But, on the other hand, it led him to harbor a certain nationalistic sentiment, which he projected both abroad and to the German literati. So, as well as restoring German culture (many of his writings can be regarded as a manifesto of German Romanticism and German philosophy), he also encouraged his fellow countrymen, in a highly patriotic tone, to become deeply national and historical and to depict “what Germans of olden times were and what they should become again”, lest they should lose their “unity as Germans” (LDA: 441). Schlegel believed that for the true potential of Romantic literature to be realized in Germany, Germans needed to regain an interest in the great events of their history and in their identity as an independent nation (Carlson 1994: 143).
In his late essay Abriß von den Europäischen Verhältnissen der Deutschen Literatur (1825), written for an English audience, he repeats an idea he had also defended in his Lectures on Dramatic Art, namely that German literature was young because of the historical evolution of the German language, and not because of its qualities (LDA: 421, SW: VIII, 207). Schlegel fervently defended German authors (such as Klopstock, Lessing, Winkelmann, Wieland, Goethe, or Herder) as well as German philosophers, from the English accusations of being abstract and obscure (SW: VIII, 212). He also claimed that Germans were the most cosmopolitan and intellectual leaders of European culture, and that Germany had reached its maturity, its autonomy, and hence its freedom (SW: VIII, 214). This is why, for Schlegel, Germany had a central role in the development of European culture: in the recuperation of the Roman and Greek cultures, which were the very foundations of Europe. The evidence of this ‘superiority’ would lie in the development of natural sciences, philosophy, and the critical interpretation of classical texts (SW: VII, 214–217). In short, A.W. Schlegel’s concern became more and more a problem of national identity (Schmelling 1994: 35–36). But, at the same time, these assertions must be seen against the background of his statements from earlier texts, such as the Wettstreit der Sprachen (The Contest of Languages) from 1798, in which Schlegel develops his idea of a “cosmopolitan literature” (Albrecht 2005: 307) and seems to criticize and make fun of all forms of nationalism. As Andrea Albrecht argues, Schlegel’s engagement with translations, investigation, and dissemination of European and non-European literature, must be seen as a sign and proof of his cosmopolitanism. In the third part of his Berlin lectures from 1803, Schlegel expresses his desire that all different nationalities be united. But, again, this desire to transcend national boarders seems to go hand in hand with the necessity of establishing Germany as the new “center for the human spirit” (quoted in Albrecht 2005: 308, my translation), the rationale behind this being, that “universality, cosmopolitanism, is the real German characteristic” (VLK: III, 36). Undoubtedly, Schlegel’s cosmopolitanism is uncannily mixed up with a strange form of blind, romantic nationalism.
After the disastrous consequences of German nationalism during the 20th century, and the fact that
it is also a common view that “political romanticism”, in its regard for organic community, was a precursor to Nazism, (Black 1964: 32)
such ‘romantic’ nationalistic statements are not received without a certain apprehension. However, without trying to solve the ambivalent character of the Romantic political program, it is important to note how these very statements show that Schlegel was not an impartial critic. He too was in some way trapped in what he called the Romantic spirit, despite his efforts to contemplate art, history, and society from a neutral perspective. In explaining the spirit of the Romantic, Schlegel himself is being very romantic. The very division he made between the ancient and the modern, as well as his views of Shakespeare, Aristophanes, or the Greeks as a people who were
conscious of no wants, and aspired at no higher perfection than that which they could actually attain by the exercise of their own faculties, (LDA: 9)
were inevitably influenced by his own time.
7. A.W. Schlegel: A Thinker of Difference
A.W. Schlegel’s writings show a great preoccupation and interest in the perspective of the ‘other’: women, children, and, above all, other cultures. He constantly reminds the reader about the necessity, in critical thought, of creating a link between theory and practical experience or historical knowledge. This enables him to defend the idea that two totally different works of art can be great and admirable, not only in spite of their differences, but because of them. It was indeed this affirmation of difference that enabled him to use the notion ‘Romantic’ in the way that he did. In fact, although Schlegel’s Lectures on Dramatic Art can be seen as a plea for modern or Romantic poetry and culture in general (“the feeling of the moderns is, upon the whole, more intense, their fancy more incorporeal, and their thoughts more contemplative”, LDA: 9), in contrast to other authors, he is always very careful not to judge modern works of art according to their similarities or dissimilarities with ancient ones. It was not by chance that Schlegel should be the first to introduce the idea of a comparative literature.
The emphasis on the opposition between ancient and modern art, and its parallel to the antagonism between Christianity and Greek pagan mythology, are recurring assumptions in 19th century aesthetics. But Schlegel’s aim is not to conceptualize a particular canon of beauty, but much more, as a means of elevating oneself above all partial views, to find an approach that may enable the comprehension and enjoyment of the different ways in which art is manifested throughout history. Thus, Schlegel is taking to its highest point the 19th century idealist principle according to which art is the “power of creating what is beautiful and representing (darstellen) it to the human eye and ear” (LDA: 3) as well as the idea that “poetry, as the fervid expression of our whole being, must assume a new and peculiar form in different ages” (LDA: 29).
The experience of difference also becomes an important element in his critique of art. Schlegel clearly positions himself against modern critics, who consider the mixture of reality and imitation “destructive of theatrical illusion” (LDA: 34). Although not always explicit in his writings, Schlegel constantly stresses the idea that in the contemplation of a work of art, the spectator must still perceive the craftedness of the whole; i.e., the difference between reality and illusion. This is a fundamental element of his criticism of naturalism and his defense of the use of verse and masks in theatre. What is more interesting, though, is that the constant awareness of the difference between reality and illusion (for instance through irony) also shows the fundamental fragility of difference itself in a much more compelling way than a rigorous classicist work of art does. Reality is also an illusion; it also is the result of creative forces, such as language is.
In this specific sense, Schlegel could be understood as a thinker of difference in a much more radical way than other philosophers of his time. Although Schlegel’s writings have not been considered as philosophical as those of other 19th century German philosophers, his approach to art and its history, and his reflections on language and cultural differences are much closer to what is sometimes called a postmodern comprehension of aesthetics than that of his contemporaries. Indeed, in his characteristically unpresumptuous style, Schlegel anticipates philosophers such as Nietzsche, Blumenberg, or Deleuze.
Works by A.W. Schlegel
The abbreviations used for references to, or quotations of, A.W. Schlegel are indicated below, at the beginning of the bibliography entries for the cited editions. All translation from German are mine.
- 1846–1848, Sämtliche Werke [SW], edited by Eduard Böcking, 16 vols., Leipzig: Weidmann; reprinted in 1971–72, Hildesheim: Neudruck Verlag Olms. Includes his works written in French (Œuvres, in 3 volumes, 1848) and in Latin (Opuscula, quae Schlegelius latine scripta reliquit, 1848).
- 1962–1974, Kritische Schriften und Briefe, edited by Edgar Lohner, Stuttgart: W. Kohlhammer.
- 1989–in progress, Kritische Ausgabe der Vorlesungen, 6 vol., edited by Ernst Behler and Frank Jolles, Paderborn, Munich: F. Schöningh.
- 1800, Gedichte, Tübingen: Cotta.
- 1803, Ion, Ein Schauspiel, Hamburg: Perthes.
- 1811, Poetische Werke, 2 vols., Heidelberg: Mohr & Zimmer.
- 1798–1800, Athenaeum [A], 3 vols., (Co-editor with Friedrich Schlegel), Berlin: Vieweg (vol. 1), Berlin: Frölich (vols. 2 and 3); reprinted in 1989, Dortmund: Harenberg.
- 1801, Charakteristiken und Kritiken, with Friedrich Schlegel, 2 vols., Königsberg: Nicolovius.
- 1807, Comparaison entre la Phèdre de Racine et celle d’Euripide, Paris : Tourneisen Fils ; reedited with slight modifications in 1842, Essais littéraires et historiques, Bonn: Edouard Weber, pp. 85 ff).
- 1809–11, Über dramatische Kunst und Literatur. Vorlesungen, 3 vols., Heidelberg: Mohr & Zimmer.
- 1813, Sur le système continental et sur les rapports avec la Suède, Hamburg.
- 1816, Der deutsche Mann und der Patriot im Streit, Philadelphia: Spottvogel (i.e., Reutlingen: Mäken).
- 1820–30, Indische Bibliothek [IB], 3 vols., Bonn: Weber.
- 1828, Kritische Schriften [KS], 2 vols., Berlin: Reimer.
- 1832, Réflexions sur l’étude des Langues Asiatiques suivies d’une lettre à M. Horace, Hayman Wilson, Bonn: Edouard Weber.
- 1842, Essais littéraires et historiques, Bonn: Edouard Weber.
- 1884 (posthumous), Vorlesungen über schöne Literatur und Kunst [VLK], edited by Jakob Minor, 3 vols., Heilbronn: Henningen; reprinted in 1968, Nendeln; Liechtenstein: Kraus.
- 1913 (posthumous), Geschichte der deutschen Sprache und Poesie, (Lectures delivered at Bonn University between 1818–1819, edited by J. Körner, Berlin: Behr.
- Rendorps, Joachim, 1793, Joachim Rendorps geheime Nachrichten zur Aufklärung der Vorfälle während des letzten Kriegs zwischen England und Holland, Leipzig: Heinsius.
- William Shakespeare, 1797–1810, Shakespeare’s Dramatische Werke, with Caroline Schlegel, Ludwig and Dorothea Tieck, 9 vols., Berlin: Unger.
- Horace Walpole, 1800, Historische, literarische und unterhaltende Schriften, Leipzig: Hartknoch.
- Calderón de la Barca, 1803–1809, Spanisches Theater, 2 vols., Berlin: Hitzig.
- assorted, 1804, Blumensträuße italienischer, spanischer und portugiesischer Poesie, Berlin: Realschulbuchhandlung.
- Albertine Necker de Saussure, 1820, Über den Charackter und die Schriften der Frau von Staël, Paris, London and Strasburg: Treuttel und Würtz.
- anonymous, 1823, Bhagavad-Gita, Bonn: Weber.
- anonymous, 1829–46, Ramayana, 4 vols, Bonn: Weber.
- 1922, August Wilhelm Schlegels Briefwechsel mit seinen Heidelberger Verlegern, edited by Erich Jenisch, Heidelber: Winter.
- 1930, Briefe von und an August Wilhelm Schlegel, edited by Josef Körner, Zürich, Leipzig, Vienna: Amalthea.
- 1936–37 and 1958, Kriesenjahre der Frühromantik. Briefen aus dem Schlegelkreis, edited by Josef Körner, Vienna, Leipzig: Rohrer and Berne: Francke.
- 1972, Ludwig Tieck und die Brüder Schlegel. Briefe, edited by Edgar Lohner, Munich: Winkler.
- 2012, Der Briefwechsel zwischen August Wilhelm von Schlegel und seiner Bonner Haushälterin Maria Löbel, Historisch-kritische Ausgabe, edited by Ralf G. Czapla and Franca V. Schwankweiler, Bonn: Bernstein.
- 2013, Founders of Western Indology. August Wilhelm Schlegel and Henry Thomas Colebrooke in Correspondance 1820–1837, edited by Rosane Rocher and Ludo Rocher, Wiesbaden: Harrassowitz.
- 2015, Der Briefwechsel zwischen Christian Friedrich Tieck und August Wilhelm Schlegel in den Jahren 1804 bis 1811, edited by Cornelia Bögel, Dresden: Thelem.
- 1813, The Continental System, and its relations with Sweden, London: J.J. Stockdale; anonymous translation.
- 1815, A Course of Lectures on Dramatic Art and Literature [LDA], translated by John Black and A.J.W. Morrison, London: George Bell and Sons; reprinted in 1846, London: H.G. Bohn; revised edition in 1894, reprinted in 1973, New York: AMS Press and 2004, Whitefish, MT: Kessinger.
- 1944 (1833), A.W. Schlegel’s Lectures on German literature from Gottsched to Goethe, Oxford: B. Blackwell (notes taken by George Toynbee).
Selected Secondary Literature
- Abrams, Meyer Howard, 1953, The Mirror and the Lamp: Romantic Theory and the Critical Tradition, London: Oxford University Press.
- Adluri, Vishwa and Joydeep Bagche, 2014, The Nay Science: A History of German Indology, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199931347.001.0001
- Atkinson, Margaret Edith, 1958, August Wilhelm Schlegel as a Translator of Shakespeare; a Comparison of Three Plays with the Original, Oxford: B. Blackwell.
- Behler, Ernst, 1993, German Romantic Literary Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 2000, “On Truth and Lie in an Aesthetical Sense”, in Revenge of the Aesthetic: The Place of Literature Theory Today, Michael P. Clark (ed.), Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press, pp. 76–93.
- –––, 2002, “Lyric Poetry in the Early Romantic Theory of the Schlegel Brothers”, in Esterhammer 2002b: 115–141.
- Benjamin, Walter,  1996, “The Concept of Criticism in German Romanticism”, Ph.D. thesis, printed in Walter Benjamin. Selected Writings, volume 1, 1913–1926, trans. by D. Lachtermann, H. Eiland and I. Balfour; M. Bullock, Michael W. Jennings (eds.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, pp. 116–201.
- Berman, Antoine, 1992a, The Experience of the Foreign: Culture and Translation in Romantic Germany, Albany: State University of New York Press.
- –––,  1992b, “A.W. Schlegel, The Will to Translate Everything”, in The Experience of the Foreign: Culture and Translation in Romantic Germany (L’épreuve de l'étranger), trans. S. Heyvaert, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, pp. 129–141.
- Bernofsky, Susan, 1997, “Schleiermacher’s Translation Theory and Varieties of Foreignization. August Wilhelm Schlegel vs. Johann Heinrich Voss”, The Translator, 3(2): 175–192. doi:10.1080/13556509.1997.10798997
- Billings, Joshua, 2013, “‘An Alien Body’? Choral Autonomy around 1800”, in Billings, Budelmann, & Macintosh 2013: 133–151. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199670574.003.0009
- Billings, Joshua, Felix Budelmann, and Fiona Macintosh (eds.), 2013, Choruses, Ancient and Modern, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199670574.001.0001
- Black, John D., 1964, “The Education of Desire. Romanticizing Cultural Studies”, in his, The Politics of Enchantment: Romanticism, Media, and Cultural Studies, Waterloo: Wilfrid Laurier University Press, pp. 15–37.
- Carlson, Marvin, 1994, “Nationalism and the Romantic Drama in Europe”, in Gillespie 1994: 139–153.
- Craig, Charlotte M., 2000, “August Wilhelm Schlegel 1767–1845”, in Encyclopedia of German Literature, M. Konzett (ed.), Chicago and London: Fitzroy Dearborn Publishers, pp. 863–865.
- Dunbar, Zachary, 2013, “‘How do we solve a Problem like the Chorus?’ Hammerstein’s Allegro and the Reception of the Greek Chorus on Broadway”, in Billings, Budelmann, & Macintosh 2013: 243–260. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199670574.003.0015
- Engel, Manfred and Jürgen Lehmann, 2004, “The Aesthetics of German Idealism and Its Reception in European Romanticism”, in Nonfictional Romantic Prose: Expanding Boarders (Comparative History of Literatures in European Languages), S.P. Steven, N. Virgil (eds.) in collaboration with G. Gillespie, Amsterdam and Philadelphia: John Benjamins Publishing Company, pp. 69–95.
- Esterhammer, Angela, 2002a, “The Critic”, in The Cambridge Companion to Coleridge, (Cambridge Companions to Literature), Lucy Newly (ed.), Cambridge, England: Cambridge University Press, pp. 142–155. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521650712.010
- ––– (ed.), 2002b, Romantic Poetry, Amsterdam: John Benjamin’s Pub. Co.
- Ewton, Ralph W., 1972, The Literary Theories of August Wilhelm Schlegel, The Hague: Mouton.
- Ferber, Michael (ed.), 2005, A Companion to European Romanticism, Malden and Oxford: Blackwell. doi:10.1111/b.9781405110396.2005.x
- Franzel, Sean, 2014, “Romantic Encyclopedics and the Lecture Form: Schelling, A.W. Schlegel, A. von Humboldt”, European Romantic Review, 25(3): 347–356. doi:10.1080/10509585.2014.899762
- Furst, Lilian R., 1969 [1976, 1982], Romanticism, London: Cambridge University Press.
- Flaherty, Gloria, 1994, “Empathy and Distance. German Romantic Theories of Acting Reconsidered”, in Gillespie 1994: 181–209.
- Gillespie, Gerald (ed.), 1994, Romantic Drama, Philadelphia and Amsterdam: John Benjamin’s Publishing Co.
- Goldhill, Simon, 2013, “The Greek Chorus: Our German Eyes”, in Billings, Budelmann, & Macintosh 2013: 35–52. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199670574.003.0003
- Grundmann, Heike, 2005, “Shakespeare and European Romanticism”, in Ferber 2005: 29–48. doi:10.1111/b.9781405110396.2005.00004.x
- Heine, Heinrich, 1833, “The Romantic School”, in Heinrich Heine 1797–1856: The Romantic School and Other Essays (The German Library, 33), trans. by Robert C. Holub, Jost Hermand and Volkmar Sander (eds.), New York: Continuum, 1985, pp. 1–128.
- Helmholtz-Phelan, Anna Augusta von, 1907, The Indebtedness of Samuel Taylor Coleridge to August Wilhelm von Schlegel, Thesis (doctoral), Madison: University of Wisconsin (Philology and literature series).
- Lacoue-Labarthe Philippe and Jean-Luc Nancy,  1988, The Literary Absolute: the Theory of Literature in German Romanticism (L’absolu littéraire : théorie de la littérature du romantisme allemand), trans. by Philip Barnard and Cheryl Lester, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
- Lefevere, André, 1977, Translating Literature: The German Tradition from Luther to Rosenzweig, Assen and Amsterdam: Van Gorcum (especially pp. 46–57).
- Müller-Vollmer, Kurt, 2000 , “Transcendentalist Writings. Transfers, Inscriptions, Transformations”, in The Internationality of National Literature in Either America: Transfer and Transformation, A. Paul Frank and Kurt Mueller-Vollmer (eds.), Göttingen: Wallstein Verlag, pp. 295–319.
- Neubauer, John, 2002, “Organicist Poetics as Romantic Heritage?”, in Esterhammer 2002b: 491–508.
- Paulin, Roger, 2016, The Life of August Wilhelm Schlegel, Cosmopolitan of Art and Poetry, Cambridge: Open Book Publishers.
- Plug, Jan, 2004, “Romanticism and the Invention of Literature”, in Idealism without Absolutes: Philosophy and Romantic Culture, Tilottama Rajan and Arkady Plotnitsky (ed.), New York: State University of New York Press, pp. 15–39.
- Robinson, Douglas, 1991, The Translator’s Turn, Baltimore and London: John Hopkins University Press.
- Sauer, Thomas G., 1981, A.W. Schlegel’s Shakespearean Criticism in England, 1811–1846, Bonn: Bouvier Verlag H. Grundmann.
- Schmelling, Manfred, 1994, “‘Theatre in the Theatre’ and ‘World Theatre’: Play Thematics and the Breakthrough of Romantic Drama”, in Gillespie 1994: 35–59.
- Schulte-Sasse, Jochen,  1988, “The Concept of Literary Criticism in German Romanticism, 1795–1810”, in A History of German Literary Criticism, 1730–1980 (Geschichte der deutschen Literaturkritik (1730-1980)), Peter Uwe Hohendahl (ed.), Lincoln and London: University of Nebraska Press, pp. 99–177.
- Welleck, René, 1955, “August Wilhelm Schlegel”, in A History of Modern Criticism: 1750–1950, vol. II, New Haven: Yale University Press, pp. 36–73.
- Ziolkowski, Theodore, 2016, “Ruminations on Ruins: Classical versus Romantic”, The German Quarterly, 89(3): 265–281. doi:10.1111/gequ.12000
- Albrecht, Andrea, 2005, Kosmopolitismus. Weltbürgerdiskurse in Literatur, Philosophie und Publizistik um 1800, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter (especially pp. 306–311).
- Alt, Carl, 1904, Schiller und die Brüder Schlegel, Weimar: Böhlau.
- Becker, Claudia, 1998, “Naturgeschichte der Kunst”, August Wilhelm Schlegels ästhetischer Ansatz im Schnittpunkt zwischen Aufklärung, Klassik und Frühromantik, Munich: Fink.
- Behler, Ernst, 1983, Die Zeitschriften der Brüder Schlegel. Ein Beitrag zur Geschichte der deutschen Romantik, Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft.
- –––, 1992, Frühromantik, Berlin and New York: Walter de Gruyter.
- Bernays, Michael, 1865, “Der Schlegel-Tieck Shakespeare”, in Jahrbuch der Deutschen Shakespeare-Gesellschaft I, 396–405.
- –––, 1891, “Vorrede und Nachwort zum neuen Abdruck des Schlegel-Tieckschen Shakespeare”, Preussische Jahrbücher, 68(3): 524–69.
- –––, 1872, Zur Entstehungsgeschichte des Schlegelschen Shakespeare, Leipzig: Hirzel.
- Besenbeck, Alfred, 1930, Kunstanschauung und Kunstlehre August Wilhelm Schlegels, Berlin: E. Ebering.
- Brentano, Bernard von, 1986, August Wilhelm Schlegel. Geschichte eines romantischen Geistes, Frankfurt a.M.: Insel.
- Byun, Hak-Su, 1994, Hermeneutische und ästhetische Erfahrung des Fremden. August Wilhelm Schlegel, Munich: Iudicium.
- Gipper, Helmut and Peter Schmitter, 1979, Sprachwissenschaft und Sprachphilosophie im Zeitalter der Romantik. Ein Beitrag zur Historiographie der Linguistik, Tübingen: Gunter Narr.
- Grosse-Brockhoff, Annelen, 1981, Das Konzept des Klassischen bei Friedrich und August Wilhelm Schlegel, Köln: In Kommission bei Böhlau.
- Holmes, Susanne, 2005, Synthesis der Vielheit die Begründung der Gattungstheorie bei August Wilhelm Schlegel, Paderborn: Schöningh.
- Hölter, Achim, 2010, “August Wilhelm Schlegels Göttinger Mentoren”, in Der Europäer August Wilhelm Schlegel. Romantischer Kulturtransfer—romantische Wissenswelten, York-Gothart Mix and Jochen Strobel (eds.), Berlin and New York: Walter de Gruyter, pp. 13–29.
- Jagenlauf, Franz, 1934, August Wilhelm von Schlegel und die Lehre vom Verstehen, Leipzig: M. Fischer.
- Körner, Josef, 1924, Romantiker und Klassiker. Die Brüder Schlegel in ihrer Beziehung zu Schiller u. Goethe, Berlin: Askanischer Verlag.
- Larson, Kenneth E., 1989, “Pro und contra Schlegel. Die zwei gegensätzlichen Blankversübersetzungen des King Lear von Heinrich Voss (1806 und 1819) ”, in Deutsche Shakespeare-Gesellschaft West Jahrbuch: pp. 113–33.
- Masiakowska, Dorota, 2002, Vielfalt und Einheit im Europabild August Wilhelm Schlegels, Frankfurt a.M.: Lang.
- Mix, York-Gothart and Jochen Strobel (eds.), 2010, Der Europäer August Wilhelm Schlegel. Romantischer Kulturtransfer—romantische Wissenswelten, Berlin and New York: Walter de Gruyter.
- Nagavajara, Chetana, 1966, August Wilhelm Schlegel in Frankreich. Sein Anteil an die französischen Literaturkritik 1807–1835, Tübingen: Niemeyer.
- Paulini, Hilde Marianne, 1985, August Wilhelm Schlegel und die Vergleichende Literaturwissenschaft, Frankfurt a.M.: P. Lang.
- Penzel, Joachim, 2007, Der Betrachter ist im Text, Berlin: Lit Verlag.
- Reavis, Silke Agnes, 1978, August Wilhelm Schlegels Auffassung der Tragödie im Zusammenhang mit seiner Poetik und ästhetischen Theorien seiner Zeit, Bern: P. Lang.
- Schenk-Lenzen, Ulrike, 1991, Das ungleiche Verhältnis von Kunst und Kritik. zur Literaturkritik August Wilhelm Schlegels, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.
- Schirmer, Ruth, 1986, August Wilhelm Schlegel und seine Zeit: ein Bonner Leben, Bonn: Bouvier.
- Schwartz, Wilhelm, 1914, August Wilhelm Schlegels Verhältnis zur spanischen und portugiesischen Literatur, Halle: M. Niemeyer.
- Strobel, Jochen, 2010, “Der Romantiker als homo academicus. August Wilhelm Schlegel in der Wissenschaft”, in Jahrbuch des Freien Deutschen Hochstifts, pp. 298–338.
- Wulf, Erich, 1913, August Wilhelm Schlegel als Lyriker, Berlin: Ebering.
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