Notes to Obligations to Oneself

1. Guyer (2002, 79, fn.5) argues that Kant ultimately endorses a duty to oneself to promote one’s own happiness; Kahn (2018) argues that Kant does not endorse such a duty, but could and should have. (Kant’s doubts stem from his assumption that we are “unavoidably” self-loving, plus his belief that such love leaves no room for duty (MM 6:386, 451).) My citations of Kant will follow the standard Akademie pagination; I will use the translations featured in the Cambridge Editions of Practical Philosophy (1996) and Lectures on Ethics (1997).

2. Kant also invokes the legal maxim that a willing party is never wronged—volenti non fit iniuria—in an argument for why only the united will of the people can pass laws (MM 6:314; see also MM 6:422). Here Kant echoes Rousseau’s (2014, 174) discussion in Chapter 7 of On the Social Contract, which argues that a citizen can owe duties to the sovereign even though it is a “maxim of civil right that no one is bound to commitments toward himself.” Rousseau reasons that, though each citizen is part of the sovereign, they are not the whole sovereign—and indeed the sovereign cannot owe obligations to itself.

3. There are other versions of the “paradox” worth noting. Some say rights against oneself entail an absurd license to sue ourselves (Singer 1958, 202; Steiner 2013, 240, fn. 21), or to make claims against oneself (Pogge 2008, 62). Others see rights against oneself as obviously impossible (e.g. Kamm 2007, 235, 241). There is also a peculiar passage in which Kant says that one cannot owe a duty to oneself on pain of being “active” and “passive” with respect to the same relation (MM 6:417). Kant’s solution is to say, first, that there must be duties to oneself or there would be “no duties whatsoever” (MM 6:417); and second, that there is a kind of psychic schism in the human mind: a duty to oneself really consists of one part of the mind binding the other (MM 6:418). (“Our legislative reason (Wille) issues its law as an imperative to our faculty of choice (Willkür),” as Denis (1997, 334) approvingly puts it.) But one might wonder what is so spooky about being passive and active at once. The ability to pinch yourself doesn’t imply two selves—a pincher and a pinched. Nor do you need a split personality to love yourself, drive yourself to the store, or see yourself in a mirror. (For more skepticism of the “two self” view, see Allen 2013, 852; for a more sympathetic take, see Schaab 2021, 187.)

4. Schofield (2019) elsewhere extends this view to duties at a time, drawing on Christine Korsgaard’s (1996, 101) idea that an agent may occupy several “practical identities” at a single moment, like that of being a philosopher, or of being a citizen of a certain country; Schofield explains how these various identities might lead to a case where, from one perspective, one could issue a demand that cannot be released from another perspective. For critical discussion, see Schaab (2021, 183–85).

5. For other notable views, see for example Archer 2016b; Benn 2017; Dorsey 2013; Horgan and Timmons 2010; Portmore 2019.

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