Shared Agency

First published Mon Dec 13, 2010; substantive revision Mon May 1, 2017

Sometimes individuals act together, and sometimes they act independently of one another. It’s a distinction that matters. You are likely to make more headway in a difficult task working with others; and even if little progress is made, there’s at least the comfort and solidarity that comes with a collective undertaking. Or, to take a very different perspective, the realization (or delusion) that the many bits of rudeness one has been suffering of late are part of a concerted effort can be of significance in identifying what one is up against: the accumulation of grievances (no doubt well catalogued) is seen, not as an unfortunate coincidence of affronts stemming from various quarters, but as itself a product of a unified exercise of agency. A paranoid conspiracy theorist is not usually to be taken seriously. But he does get right that it certainly would be awful, for example, if everyone were out to get him and were working together to do so.

Shared agency also has important normative implications. Institutions or laws established by everyone acting together have a status different from those that are, for example, imposed on a people by the dictates of one. And the nature of justification, be it epistemic or practical, might depend on whether it figures in the context of a shared enterprise. No wonder, then, that shared activity and intention is of interest for a variety of disciplines, including politics, social science, economics, ethics, law, epistemology (especially testimony and social epistemology), and psychology.

But what is it to act together? The question has received sustained discussion in contemporary philosophy of action. Central concerns have been to explicate the distinctive features of shared agency, and to investigate the possibility and scope of reduction: can shared agency be understood in terms of the resources available to us from the study of individual agency? This entry will focus on some issues most closely related to the philosophy of action. See the entry on collective intentionality for a broader discussion.

1. The traditional ontological problem and the Intention Thesis

Agency is sometimes exercised in concert, as when we walk together, several individuals undertake painting a house, or a football team executes a pass play.[1] It is hardly controversial that there really is a phenomenon falling under labels such as shared activity, and joint or collective action. What is disputed is how to understand it. One way to approach the issues here is to ask what distinguishes actions of individuals that together constitute shared activity from those that amount to a mere aggregation of individual acts. What is left over when we subtract what each of us did from what we did together?[2]

Consider a case discussed by Searle (1990, 402). A number of individuals are scattered about in a park. Suddenly it starts to rain, and each runs to a centrally located shelter. Although there may be some coordination (people tend not to collide into one another), running to the shelter is not, in the relevant sense, something that we do together. Now imagine another scenario with the same individuals executing the same movements but as members of a dance troop performing a site-specific piece in that park. In both cases, there is no difference in the collection or “summation” of individual behavior: A is running to the shelter, and B is running to the shelter, etc. But the dancers are engaged in collective action, whereas the storm panicked picnickers are not.

Searle suggests that what distinguishes the two cases is not the outward behavior, but something “internal”. He hints that in the collective case, the outward behavior—everyone running to and converging on the shelter—is not a matter of coincidence.[3] It is, rather, explained as something aimed at by the participants. This suggests that the internal difference is a matter of intention. And, indeed, Searle sees it this way. In both cases, a participant has an intention expressed by “I am running to the shelter”. But in the collective case this intention somehow derives from and is dependent upon an intention that necessarily adverts to the others, one that might be expressed as “We are running to the shelter” (or perhaps “We are performing the part of the piece where….”). It is this “we-intention” that distinguishes shared or collective activity from a mere summation or heap of individual acts.

Perhaps it’s premature to conclude, as Searle does, that there has to be an “internal” difference here. While most theorists treat intention as a psychological attitude (e.g. Davidson 1978, Harman 1976, Bratman 1986), some work on intention influenced by Anscombe and Wittgenstein (such as Wilson 1989 and Thompson 2008) understands intention fundamentally in terms of intentional action (see the entry on intention for discussion). It remains to be seen how Anscombian approaches to shared agency will develop, though some forays into this territory are to be found in Stoutland 1997 and Laurence 2010.

Another reservation with invoking intention at this point stems from consideration of unintentional collective action. Appealing to intention as Searle does would seem to preclude what some see as a real possibility: that there are φ-ings done jointly in some robust sense, but which are not intended under any description. One possible example would be our jointly bringing about some severe environmental damage. This might come about as a side effect of each of us pursuing our own projects. No subject intends the severe environmental damage, under any description: no single individual has enough of an impact to intend anything that would count as severe environmental damage, and as a collective the polluters seem not to be sufficiently integrated to count as a subject of intention. Whether this really amounts to a counterexample will depend on whether our damaging the environment was joint, a genuine exercise of shared agency. For discussion see Ludwig 2007; 2016, 182, and Chant 2007.

Setting aside these reservations, we can ask how the attitude of intention should be understood if it is to serve as a distinctive mark of joint action. One approach is to think of it as an attitude of a peculiar, supra-individual entity.[4] The intention whose content is expressed by We are running to the shelter is, on this view, an attitude had by whatever entity is denoted by the ‘we’. On this view whenever people act together, they constitute a group that, in a non-figurative sense, intends. This entails that groups can be genuine agents and subjects of intentional attitudes.

Searle (1990, 406) rules this out of court, understandably and perhaps dogmatically reluctant to embrace a view that leads to a profusion of supra-individual intentional subjects, group minds, or corporate persons whenever individuals act together. Such ontological profligacy is prompted in part by a straightforward interpretation of the language we use to describe joint action, with the plural subject term understood simply as a referring expression. Ludwig 2016 suggests instead that we think of the subject term as involving implicit restricted quantification over members of the group. This proposal, combined with a Davidsonian event analysis of action descriptions, provides resources for an alternative rendering of the underlying logical form of action descriptions, one that does not encourage the supra-individual view. What would be required instead is that there be some one event for which there is more than one agent.[5]

There is reason, moreover, to think that a strategy appealing to supra-individual entities as subjects of intentional states is misplaced if the social phenomenon in question is shared activity. It’s not at all obvious that an individual who is a constituent of a supra-individual entity is necessarily committed to what it is up to. For example, consider the U.S., which would on such a view count as supra-individual entity. The U.S. increases research funding in physics in order to win the space race with the U.S.S.R. I’m a graduate student benefitting from the additional funding, and I do research in rocket and satellite technology, and teach physics and engineering to undergraduates; indeed, I wouldn’t have gone into the area had it not been for the funding opportunities. I am in the relevant sense a constituent of the larger entity - in this case the U.S. - but I have no concern with the space race. I’m just doing my job, advancing my career, hoping to raise a family and be able to pay the mortgage, etc.; I frankly couldn’t care less about larger geopolitical issues, which are presumably the concern of the supra-individual entity that is the U.S. In contrast, a participant in shared activity arguably is committed to the collective endeavor and its aims - at least in the sense of commitment to an end implicated in any instance of intention or intentional action. So, while we haven’t ruled out that there are supra-individual agents (see below for more discussion), it’s not clear that we need to be committed to them in order to understand shared activity.

If shared activity does indeed involve commitment on the part of the individual participants, then it seems that some intention-like element of each individual’s psychology must realize or reflect the we-intention that is the mark of shared activity.[6] The Intention Thesis attributes to each individual participant in shared activity an intention pertaining to that activity. This participatory intention accounts for each individual’s participatory commitment to the activity, and it serves to distinguish one’s action when it is done with others from action done on one’s own. [7]

Some of the discussion of the current literature on shared activity can be understood as a debate about the nature of this participatory intention and how instances of it in different individuals must be related to one another so that the individuals could be said to act together, and share an intention (presumably the intention expressed with the aforementioned we-locution).

Participatory intentions might, for example, be understood as an instance of an ordinary intention, familiar from the study of individual agency; if we-intentions are identified with, or built out of these participatory intentions, we would thus be offered the prospect of a reductive account of this we-intention in terms of ordinary individual intentions. Tuomela and Miller 1988 defend such a view. Take an individual who is a member of a group. According to Tuomela and Miller, this individual has a participatory intention with respect to X if she intends to do her part in X, believes conditions for success of X obtain, and believes that there is mutual belief amongst members of the group that conditions for success obtain.[8] (Other work in this general vein include Bratman 1992, MacMahon 2001, 2005, S. Miller 2001. Tuomela’s later work is rather different, as will be noted below.)

As a counterexample to the reductive account, Searle imagines each member of a business school graduating class, versed in Adam Smith’s theory of the invisible hand, intending to pursue his selfish interests and thereby intending to do his part in helping humanity. Such an intention, even supplemented with the sort of beliefs that Tuomela and Miller require, intuitively doesn’t count as the sort of intention one has when acting with others, and it is implausible to think that these graduates go on to act collectively. And yet it seems to satisfy Tuomela and Miller’s analysis.[9] Searle’s diagnosis of the problem is that reductive approaches don’t guarantee the element of cooperation that is essential to shared activity and necessarily reflected in the attitudes of the participant (1990, 406). And one cannot respond by inserting the cooperative element into the content of the intention, so that what the agent intends is to do her part in shared activity. That would in effect presuppose the notion for which we’re seeking an account (1990, 405).[10]

Searle, in contrast to Tuomela and Miller, insists that the individual’s participatory intention (what he calls a collective intention) is primitive. The aforementioned “we-intention” turns out, for Searle, just to be an individual’s participatory intention. But though it is an attitude or state of an individual, it is a fundamentally different kind of intention, and not the sort of intention that figures in individual action. It should be mentioned that this is a view with similarities to those held by Sellars and later Tuomela.[11]

Searle’s version of the intention thesis also involves a rejection of anti-individualism in the philosophy of mind (see the entry on externalism about mental content). In particular, whether an individual has this primitively collective participatory intention is independent of what may be going on in the minds of others, or whether there even are any others around her. Thinking to help you with your stalled car, I might have the collective intention expressed as we are pushing the car. And this is so, even if you’re just stretching your calves before a run and not trying to move the car, and even if I’m just hallucinating and there is no one around.[12]

2. Interrelatedness of participatory intentions

Be that as it may, whether one is sharing an intention and acting with others will depend, of course, on there being other agents with whom one is appropriately related. Suppose that each of several individuals has a participatory intention. How must they be related in order for those individuals to count as sharing an intention? Recall that for Searle, the participatory intention is primitively collective and expressed, for example, as We will do A. Given this, one thing Searle presumably would require for the sharing of intentions is the co-extensiveness of the we-element instanced in the intentions across the several individuals. But this is not sufficient. No intention is shared if yours is for us to go to the beach this afternoon, whereas mine has us doing something incompatible, like working all day in the library. Even if our intentions coincide on the action and the plural subject in question, if there is no agreement on how to go about it, or if we each fail even to accord any significant status to the other’s intentions, there would be no intention or action shared in this instance. So, more needs to be said about the interrelations of the participatory intentions if they are to account for the coordination and cooperativeness we find in shared or joint activity. Searle is silent on the matter; for what more to say, we need to turn elsewhere.[13]

In an influential series of papers, Bratman has developed a reductive account of shared activity and shared intention.[14] He understands a shared intention to be an interpersonal structure of related intentions that serves to coordinate action and planning, as well as structure bargaining between participants.[15] The individually held intentions that constitute this structure—what we’ve been calling participatory intentions—are instances of a familiar sort of individual intention that figures in the planning and the coordination of one’s activities over time. When these individual intentions concern something that is done by more than one person, taking the form I intend that we J, they accord with Bratman’s version of the Intention Thesis, and the core of his proposals about shared intention and action. But Bratman imposes further conditions, and these serve to relate these participatory intentions in distinctive ways.

One important condition concerns the meshing of sub-plans (Bratman 1992, 331ff). On Bratman’s view, an intention is distinctive in how it leads to planning about necessary means and facilitative steps that lead to its satisfaction. Now, suppose each of us has the intention to paint the house together (or, as Bratman would have it, the intention that we paint the house), but my plan is to paint it green all over, whereas yours is to paint it purple all over. It seems that we don’t share the intention to paint the house. So Bratman introduces the condition that each participant intends that the subplans that follow upon the participatory intentions of each individual mesh—that is, are mutually satisfiable and coherent—in order for the individuals to count as sharing an intention.[16]

We wouldn’t exhibit the right sort of cooperative attitude for shared activity and intention if the mesh of our sub-plans were accidental and we were not at all disposed to make them consistent if they were to become incompatible. That’s why Bratman requires the intention to mesh subplans.[17] There is, moreover, a normative element to the meshing, as emphasized by Roth 2003. Participants are subject to some sort of rational requirement[18] such that they in a sense ought to mesh their plans: the plans of the other participants serve as a normative constraint on one’s own plans. And there is no reason to restrict this status to the plans, and not extend it to the intentions that generate them. Thus, shared activity exhibits what Roth calls practical intersubjectivity. In effect, each participant treats the other’s intentions and plans much in the way that he or she treats her own: as rational constraints on further intention and planning.

Bratman (especially in his 2014 book, but see also his 2009c, 2009b, 1992) defends a reductive account of this normative requirement, explaining this interpersonal normative constraint in terms of the norms of commitment governing individual intention, such as those of consistency and means-end coherence. Your intentions and plans pertaining to our J-ing have an authority for me because of what might be called a bridge intention to mesh my J-related plans and intentions with yours. Bratman expresses the bridge intention in terms of the condition requiring each participant to have the intention to act in accordance with and because of the others’ intentions and plans (as well as his or her own). Bratman’s idea is that, given my bridge intention, the norms of consistency and coherence governing my individual intentions will be recruited to require that I form my plans and intentions with an eye toward consistency and coherence with your plans and intentions. Roth 2003 sympathizes with these interpersonal normative requirements of consistency and coherence as a condition for shared intention and action, but resists the reductive bridge intention account of it.

The demand that subplans must mesh might inspire the view that super-ordinate intentions, or the reasons each participant in shared activity A has for taking part, might also be subject to a similar requirement. This is suggested, for example, in Korsgaard’s talk of the sharing of reasons:

…if personal interaction is to be possible, we must reason together, and this means that I must treat your reasons…as reasons, that is, as considerations that have normative force for me as well as you, and therefore as public reasons. (Korsgaard 2009, 192)

In a similar vein, Tuomela requires that the “we-mode” intention at the core of his more recent theory necessarily involves group reasons shared by all participants. See his 2007; 13, 47, 98.

But it seems possible that individuals might engage in shared activity (and have the corresponding intention) even when they have different and incompatible reasons for doing so. For example, representatives from rival parties might engage in the legislative process that leads to the passage of laws, even when each is motivated by considerations that the other finds unacceptable.[19] Still, it is plausible to think that there must be some constraints on the sort of individual motive or reason a participant has to engage in shared activity. If my motive for engaging in shared activity is overly manipulative or undermining of fellow participants (e.g. doing something with A in order better to control him/her), the status of the activity or intention as shared might be compromised.[20]

A further way in which participatory intentions of different individuals are related stems from how they might be formed, modified, or set aside. For example, Gilbert holds that shared activity gets started only when each individual openly expresses a readiness to be jointly committed in a certain way with others.[21] She adds that rescinding or significantly modifying the resulting intention, as well as releasing any individual from participation, would also require concurrence on everyone’s part. It’s not clear that Gilbert herself would want to talk of this “concurrence condition” in terms of relating intention or intention-like attitudes in different participants. But, given that whether I concur with how you propose to modify your intentions will depend in part on my intentions, it is natural to take Gilbert’s conditions as imposing dynamic constraints on how the participatory intentions of different individual are related to one another. Of course, Gilbert’s conditions might be too strong. For example, the concurrence criterion does not permit one to withdraw unilaterally from shared activity.[22] Some may find this implausible. But relaxing Gilbert’s conditions would naturally result in another perhaps weaker set of dynamic constraints, and not in their complete absence. For example, recall that intentions are defeasible: they can be revised or dropped if changing circumstances warrant it. Now, we might imagine that each participant in shared activity might have the authority unilaterally to revise or defeat the intention in light of those changing circumstances, whereupon other participants would have to abide by the change unless, of course, they think that some mistake has been made (Roth 2004).

Most of the views canvassed here emphasize as a condition for shared activity fairly robust forms of integration between participants. Before continuing in this vein, it bears mention that the focus on the participants and how they are related might lead us to neglect other important conditions for shared activity. Epstein 2015 argues that the metaphysical grounds for some forms of shared activity, such as that involved in some cases of group action, involve a variety of conditions that are not themselves relations between members of the group, but often can determine how those members are related. These might include historical conditions that determine the structure and membership criteria for the group. Or, the grounds might include external conditions such as the actions of some designated individual (such as a sergeant at arms) not a part of the collective body but who for example must convene a meeting in order that the members of the body may collectively take some action.

3. How is the structure of interrelated intentions established?

So shared activity is distinguished from a mere aggregation of individual acts by a structure of appropriately related participatory intentions across different individuals. It is a structure that has a distinctive normative significance for those individuals, with an impact most immediately on each individual’s intention-based practical reasoning.[23]

It is natural to think that this structure of intentions is brought about by individuals involved in shared activity, presumably when each forms the participatory intention that is his or her contribution to the structure. But recall that participatory intentions are meant to capture the sense in which each individual is committed to what everyone is doing together, and not merely to what he or she is doing. Thus, Searle says of an instance of shared activity that “I’m pushing only as a part of our pushing.” This suggests that what is intended is the entirety of the activity, something reflected in Bratman’s intentions of the form I intend that we J.[24]

But as Velleman has shown, given the standard understanding of intentions, it’s not clear that one can intend the entire activity; or if one can, it would seem incompatible with the activity being shared.[25] Intending is something I do to settle a deliberative issue: weighing several options, I decide on A-ing, and thereby intend to A. This suggests the Settling Condition[26] that I can only intend what I take to be up to me to decide or settle. It is a violation of a rational requirement to intend something I don’t think I can settle, and thus regard my ensuing plans and actions as likely coming to grief. Applying the point to collective action, to say that I intend for us to be dining together presumes that whether we’re dining together is something for me to settle. But the idea behind shared activity and intention is precisely that it’s not entirely up to me what we do. You have a say in the matter; at the very least what you do should be up to you (see also Schmid 2008). Our problem, then, is that shared activity would seem both to demand and to disallow one and the same intention on the part of each participant.[27]

Several responses have emerged to this problem. Velleman develops a solution that invokes interdependent conditional intentions.[28] Each individual conditionally settles what the group will do, where the condition is that each of the others has a similar commitment and intends likewise. Thus, I intend to J, on condition that you intend likewise. Some have worried that when intentions are interdependent in this way it’s not entirely clear that they settle anything at all, and hence, whether anyone is appropriately committed to our J-ing. If each intention is conditioned on the other, it’s just as reasonable to refrain from acting as it is to engage in it. For discussion, see Roth 2004, 373–80; Bacharach 2006, 137ff. Gilbert 2002, while addressing Robins 2002 and a precursor of Roth 2004 disavows the interdependent conditional view attributed to her by Velleman, Roth, and Robins. See also Gilbert 2003, 2009. Velleman himself is sensitive to something like this worry (1997a, 39) and it shapes how he formulates the content of the conditional intention.[29]

Bratman (1997) has suggested that what an individual intends can extend beyond what he can settle himself, so long as he can reasonably predict that the relevant other parties will act appropriately. Flagrantly disregarding sound medical advice, I can have the categorical intention to work on my tan at the beach this afternoon, so long as I can reasonably predict that it’ll be sunny. Likewise, when I reasonably believe that you have or will have the appropriate intentions, I can then intend that we J. One might wonder whether taking this sort of predictive attitude with respect to the intentions and actions of fellow participants is consistent with sharing an intention and acting with them. On the other hand, it’s not obvious that the prediction of an action entails that it is or must be regarded as involuntary or otherwise problematic. If so, the predictive attitude toward others very well may be compatible with acting with them, and might account for how our J-ing might be the object of my intention.[30]

Another suggestion is that a participant intends not the entirety of the activity, but only his or her part in it. Such an intention is more modest in that it does not purport to settle what other people do. An account of shared activity in terms of such intentions (e.g. Tuomela & Miller 1998, Kutz 2000) does not entail the authority or control over others that would be difficult to reconcile with the activity being shared. But this modest intention involves a commitment only to one’s part in our J-ing and doesn’t seem to account for a participatory commitment to our J-ing as a whole. To see why not, consider the case of walking together from Gilbert 1990. We might describe my part as walking at a certain pace. But intending to do that is entirely compatible with undermining my partner’s contribution, for example by tripping him. Suppose instead that we avail ourselves of some robust conception of part, so that each participant intends to do his part in shared activity, as such. This would appear to rule out attempts to undermine a partner’s contribution. But what exactly is this intention? It seems to presuppose an understanding of the concept of shared activity, which is the notion we’re trying to elucidate.[31]

Maybe this criticism is too quick. Perhaps there remains a way to characterize the intention to do one’s part that doesn’t presuppose the notion of shared activity. One approach appeals to “team reasoning”, a distinctive form of strategic practical reasoning. This view of reasoning was developed to address certain difficulties standard game theory has in accounting for the rationality of selecting more cooperative options in strategic scenarios such as the Prisoner’s Dilemma and Hi-Lo. The idea is that we get intuitively more rational outcomes with individuals each approaching the situation asking him- or herself not what’s best for me given what others do?, but what is best for us or the group as a whole?[32] The participatory intention is characterized in terms of the distinctive reasoning that leads to its formation, rather than in terms of some more intrinsic feature of the intention or its content. It remains to be seen whether intending one’s part, so understood, can account for the participatory commitment distinctive of shared activity.[33]

The issue of how to establish the interpersonal structure of participatory intention is a central problem for the theory of shared agency, and remains an area of active research interest. For further views, see Gilbert 2009 (some discussion of which is below), Korsgaard’s interpretation of Kant in her 2009, 189ff, and Roth 2004, whose conception of intentions allows him to appeal to an interpersonal mechanism similar in some respects to that of commands.

4. Mutual obligations

Gilbert has long held that participants in shared activity are obligated to do their part in it. Take her well-known example of walking together, starring Jack and Sue. When Jack does something that’s not compatible with walking together, e.g. walking so fast that Sue cannot keep up, Sue is entitled to rebuke Jack. This suggests to Gilbert that it is essential to shared activity (and intention) that each participant has an obligation to do his or her part in the activity (or in carrying out the intention). For example,

The existence of this entitlement [Sue’s entitlement to rebuke] suggests that Jack has, in effect, an obligation to notice and to act (an obligation Sue has also). (Gilbert 1990, 180–1 (1996, 184))[34]

Gilbert has used this mutual obligation criterion to criticize reductive accounts of shared activity in terms of “personal intentions” (1990, 180ff; 2008,499), such as that defended by Bratman. Bratman 1997 acknowledges that mutual obligations are typically associated with the sharing of intentions, but insists that they are not essential. He argues that when present, the obligations are explained in terms of a moral principle that one should live up to the expectations about one’s actions that one has intentionally created in others. This principle, articulated by Scanlon in the context of a discussion about promising, does generally apply to situations where individuals act together and share intentions. (Scanlon’s Principle F is in his 1998, 304. For recent discussion of Scanlon and promising that bears on shared activity, see Shiffrin 2008. For another reductivist response to Gilbert see MacMahon 2005, 299ff. For more recent discussion of mutual obligation, see Roth 2004, Alonso 2009.)

Suppose, however, that we have individuals engaged in an endeavor they know to be immoral, such as that of a pillager and a lazy plunderer raiding a village. The inadmissibility of the action undermines the pillager’s entitlement to hold the plunderer accountable for slacking off in his search for loot. There could not be an obligation to do one’s part in this activity (Bratman, 1999, 132–6). For Bratman, this shows that there can be shared activity without these obligations. Gilbert responds that it only shows that the obligations in question are special, “of a different kind” (2009, 178) than the sort of obligation familiar from discussion of moral philosophy. She goes so far as to say that the obligations to do one’s part are present, even when one’s partners in shared activity have coerced one into joining them.

Gilbert’s later statements become more explicit about the directed nature of these non-moral obligations (Gilbert 1997, 75–6). The obligation relates Jack with Sue in a way in which Jack and a non-participant are not related (Gilbert 2009; 2008, 497; this connects with recent discussion of “bipolar normativity”; see Darwall 2006, Thompson 2004, and Wallace 2013). To mark the directed nature of the normative relation, and in a way that does not suggest as strongly that they are moral in nature, we might speak of contralateral commitments (Roth 2004). Thus, Jack has a contralateral commitment-to-Sue to walk in a way that is compatible with their walking together.

Gilbert attempts to articulate the sense of directedness in terms of ownership: Jack’s contralateral commitment to Sue to walk at the appropriate pace entails that Sue is owed, and in a sense owns, the relevant performance on Jack’s part (Gilbert 2008, 497). This would presumably explain why Sue and not anyone else can release Jack from fulfilling the obligation/commitment, by giving up her claim on Jack’s action. One might, in a related vein, try to articulate the directed nature of the commitment in terms of promising.[35] If we understand Jack’s obligation as the result of something like a promise to Sue, we can see not only that Jack has a commitment, but that Sue is in a special position such that she can, for example, release him from fulfilling it. One drawback, at least for Gilbert, of appealing either to ownership or promising to articulate the notion of directed obligation or contralateral commitment is that it is not clear that this would allow for these commitments to be as insulated from moral considerations as Gilbert seems to think they are (e.g. in the response to Bratman above). A further question is whether ownership or promising fully captures all that there is to the contralateral or directed nature of the commitment. These strategies might explain why Sue is in a special position to release Jack from his commitment. But one might wonder whether there are other aspects of her special standing with respect to Jack that are left unaddressed.[36] Furthermore, it might be that certain aspects of promising - in particular the directedness of the obligation - might in some way depend on shared agency or aspects thereof. See Gilbert 2011 and Roth 2016.

While the notion of ownership or claim rights is meant to be suggestive of the sort of mutual obligations/contralateral commitments she has in mind, the central explanatory concept deployed by Gilbert is that of joint commitment, which she takes to be primitive.[37] A concern here is whether joint commitment provides anything like a philosophical account or explanation of mutual obligations, or whether it merely re-describes them. We get some idea of what Gilbert has in mind by contrasting it with personal commitment associated with individual intention or decision (2009, 180). Whereas one can on one’s own take on and rescind the sort of commitment associated with individual intention and decision, joint commitment can only be formed through a process whereby everyone expresses their readiness, and it can only be rescinded when all parties concur. This raises the issue of the previous section, of how exactly the joint commitment comes into force. Even if everyone expresses a readiness to A together, it doesn’t follow that we all take the plunge and actually undertake it. A further worry Gilbert herself has voiced is whether any condition requiring expression might limit the applicability of her view in giving a more general account of political obligation, something she aims to do (e.g., in her 2006). Gilbert’s view has also been charged with circularity; it would seem that the expression of readiness needed to establish joint commitment would itself be an instance of shared activity and thus presuppose joint commitment. For discussion, see Tuomela 1992, Tollefsen 2002, and Schmid 2014.

Understood as a kind of obligation, Gilbert’s insight about a distinctive normative relation holding between participants in shared agency risks rejection. Many find obligation, and especially the no-unilateral withdrawal condition, to be too strong. Gilbert’s general idea might find wider acceptance if we talk instead of commitment that allows for unilateral withdrawal.[38] Finally, Stroud (2010) has suggested a normative condition in some respects even weaker. Stroud holds that participants in shared activity have a prerogative—a moral permission—that can override or mitigate moral obligations had to non-participants (such as that of beneficence). It remains to be seen to what extent this might address the intuitions that motivated Gilbert’s original and important insight.

5. The discursive dilemma and group minds

It was suggested earlier (in Section 1) that thinking of a group as itself an agent and a subject of intentional states was not a good model or account of central forms of shared intention and activity. But that’s not to say that it’s never appropriate to talk this way. Indeed, Rovane, Pettit and others have argued that some groups can be genuine subjects of intentional attitudes, and can have minds of their own. This would amount to a different way in which individuals can act together, and raises interesting questions about how a group’s intentions must be related to an individual’s in practical reasoning.

Pettit starts with the assumption that a rational integration of a collective is a sign of its mentality (2003, 181). He says,

… it is reasonable, even compulsory, to think of the integrated collectivity as an intentional subject…The basis for this claim is that the integrated collectivity, as characterized, is going to display all the functional marks of an intentional subject…Within relevant domains it will generally act in a manner that is rationalized by independently discernible representations and goals; and within relevant domains it will generally form and unform those representations in a manner that is rationalized by the evidence that we take to be at its disposal. (Pettit 2003, 182; see also Rovane 1998, 131–2 for a related line of thought.)

The group mind hypothesis thus seems to explain or account for the rationality exhibited by the group, both in what it does and what it represents. This explanatory role, if indispensable, would give us a reason for admitting into our ontology groups with genuine minds of their own. The point might be put in traditional Quinean terms: if a regimentation in first order logic of our best empirical theory quantifies over such groups, then such groups exist. But this sort of explanatory commitment needn’t be quite as explicitly quantificational as Quine would have it, and Pettit himself never mentions Quine. The ontological commitment might be more implied in the content of our theory than a matter of logical form.

Another question to raise, if only to set aside on this occasion, is whether the only sort of indispensability that can support the group mind hypothesis is of the theoretical/explanatory sort. One might, for example, consider whether the Rovane/Pettit line of thought could be run with the assumption that the indispensability of such groups is practical in nature, perhaps a condition for a sort of agency that individuals can and do exercise (Roth 2014a, 140–141; Pettit 2015, 1642).

But is the group mind hypothesis explanatorily indispensable? If the rational behavior, representation, speech, etc. can easily be explained (or explained away) without invoking group minds, then the presumption of mindedness is defeated. Thus, if we discover of what appears to be a subject that its behavior was entirely controlled by or explicable in terms of the attitudes and behavior of some other (or others), then one would no longer have reason to think the subject in question as minded. For example, if the rational behavior of a group is explained wholly in terms of the individual members, then we are not tempted to think that the group itself is genuinely minded (Watkins 1957). Or, if there is a very tight fit between judgments and attitudes of the group on the one hand, and members on the other – for example if ascriptions of attitudes to a group just is a summary of ascriptions to its individual members (Quinton 1975–6) – then there is no reason to think of the group as having a mind of its own.

Pettit’s recent arguments address this worry. He has suggested that some group decision procedures are such that past group judgments rationally constrain subsequent decisions, judgments, and intentions. When such “premise-driven” procedures are followed, a group not only displays a rational unity indicative of mindedness, but does so in such a way that it might arrive at a judgment that a minority—perhaps even none—of the individual members personally hold.

Pettit draws on the literature on judgment aggregation (E.g. Kornhauser and Sager, 1986; List & Pettit, 2002). Here’s a version of the sort of case Pettit has in mind: several colleagues (A, B, and C) heading to the APA convention in Chicago have to decide whether to take the El (train) from the airport. An affirmative judgment regarding each of the following considerations or “premises” is necessary for the decision/conclusion to get on board: whether the train is safe enough, whether it’s quick enough, and whether it’s scenic enough (e.g. whether it’s okay that they’ll miss out on a view of the lake). Let us also suppose, given appropriate background assumptions, that the satisfaction of these conditions amounts to a conclusive reason to take the train. Finally, suppose the group arrives at judgments regarding the premises by majority vote as follows:

Safe enough? Quick enough? Scenic enough? Get on board?
A Yes No Yes No
B No Yes Yes No
C Yes Yes No No
Group Yes Yes Yes YesNo

If the group decides on the conclusion by a majority vote on what each individual personally thinks s/he ought to do, it will decide against taking the train (this is the “no” in the upper triangle of the lower right box). But this conclusion would be hard to square with the group judgments concerning the three premises of the argument. Whereas, if the group adopts the premise driven procedure, where the conclusion is determined not by a vote but by group’s views regarding the premises, then the group’s conclusion is rational (this is the “yes” in the lower triangle of the lower right box).

Such a conclusion, however, is not obviously explicable in terms of the personal conclusions of the members, each of whom concludes the opposite. Thus, suppose (as Pettit does) that there are groups that do in fact adopt the premise-driven procedure. Then, the rationality of the group’s conclusion suggests that the group has a mind. Moreover, the discontinuity between individual and group level attitudes concerning the conclusion is such that the presumption of mindedness is not defeated. This suggests to Pettit that, at least in some cases, groups can have minds of their own, and be genuine intentional subjects.

One worry with this argument concerns how the premise-driven decision procedure is implemented. If it’s simply implemented by virtue of the intentions of each individual to establish and maintain rationality at the group level, then there appears to be an alternative to the group mind hypothesis. That the group appears to have a mind of its own in examples such as this would then be an artifact of the restricted focus of the example, which said nothing about how a policy of rationality at the collective level is maintained. Once we broaden our perspective to recognize that each individual aims to maintain rationality at the collective level, it’s no longer clear that there is such a gap or discontinuity between the intentionality at the level of the individuals and of the group. Thus, there would be no warrant for talk of group minds.[39] Of course, this criticism makes strong assumptions about how to explain any rationality that might be exhibited at the group level, assumptions that are open to challenge.

For some, taking seriously the idea that a group has a mind of its own involves more than an empiricist commitment to the explanation of phenomena. That is, a group mind is not merely a convenient posit adopted from within the third person perspective of the intentional stance for the purposes of explanation and prediction (Dennett 1987). A mind has a point of view, and if sufficiently sophisticated, is a subject of commitment and obligation. In developing ideas of Searle and Tuomela in a new direction, Schmid (2014) argues that such a group mind would require a distinctive form of plural self-awareness on the part of each of the members of the group. He suggests that such groups do exist, and explores ways in which plural self-awareness is and is not analogous to the self-awareness each of us as individuals exhibit.


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I would like to thank Michael Bratman for helpful comments on a draft.

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