Philosophy of Sport

First published Tue Feb 4, 2020

While sport has been practised since pre-historic times, it is a relatively new subject of systematic philosophical enquiry. Indeed, the philosophy of sport as an academic sub-field dates back only to the 1970s. Yet, in this short time, it has grown into a vibrant area of philosophical research that promises both to deepen our understanding of sport and to inform sports practice. Recent controversies at the elite and professional level have highlighted the ethical dimensions of sport in particular. Lance Armstrong’s use of performance-enhancing drugs raised new issues in the ethics of cheating, middle-distance runner Caster Semenya has challenged prevailing rules around sex classification in sport, and Oscar Pistorius’s prosthesis has problematized the distinction between able-bodied and disabled sport. While philosophical analysis may help to achieve a deeper understanding of sport, such analysis may also illuminate problems of philosophy beyond sport, ranging from the nature of skill to the ethics of altruism.

This entry proceeds in three sections. Section 1 introduces the philosophy of sport with particular emphasis on the history of systematic philosophical thinking about sport. Section 2 examines the nature and value of sport, and it considers the main normative theories of sport developed in the literature. Section 3 addresses a cluster of topics that are central to the philosophy of sport, including: sportsmanship; cheating; performance enhancement; violent and dangerous sport; sex, gender, and race; fans and spectators; disability sport; and the aesthetics of sport.

1. Introduction

1.1 Background: Sport, Culture, and Philosophical Thinking

Human communities have engaged in sport for reasons as diverse as amusement, religious worship and political stability (Baker, 1988). Ancient Sumerians and Egyptians practised sport to prepare themselves for war. So too did ancient Greeks and Romans, for whom sport also had important religious and social signification. For instance, in Classical Greece, athletic contests (gymnikoi agones) provided an arena for the cultivation and demonstration of excellence (arete). This pursuit of excellence through sport played a major role in Hellenistic culture, where striving for perfection in body and mind served as one of the society’s principal unifying activities (Lunt & Dyreson, 2014). Likewise, in the Mayan civilization, ballgames served religious, social, and political purposes such as providing a common bond while downplaying differences and conflict arising from local diversity (Fox, 2012).

Philosophers have reflected on the nature of sport at least since Ancient Greece. Plato and Aristotle viewed sport as a key component of education and, by extension, human flourishing (Reid, 2011, 26–80). An educated Greek must find harmony between body and mind by, among other things, engaging in athletic contests. Reflection on the role sports play in human life and culture continued during Roman times and the medieval era. In Rome, sports were understood instrumentally as tools to train warriors. For instance, the fifth book of Virgil’s Aeneid is devoted to the celebration of contests of speed and strength with an emphasis on preparing Romans for war. In medieval times, despite losing relevance in the public sphere, sport played a significant role in Christian imagery (Reid, 2011, 81–106). For example, in City of God, Augustine (14.9) referred to the apostle Paul as ‘the athlete of Christ’. Thomas Aquinas, like Plato and Aristotle, advocated for the need to cultivate body and soul to flourish as human beings (Kretchmar et al., 2017, 93–120).

In early modernity, sport regained prominence in public life, not least on account of its potential to cultivate human excellence and promote the good life. Renaissance schoolmasters included sport in their curricula. Even Protestant thinkers, often thought to have been opposed to leisurely activities such as sports, embraced the practice of athletic activities for formative purposes (Reid, 2012). Martin Luther and John Milton advocated for the utilization of sport activities to educate individuals and train Christian soldiers (Overman, 2011). During the Enlightenment, drawing on the empiricists’ emphasis on the cultivation of bodily capacities to achieve accurate sensory data, Jean-Jacques Rousseau argued for the need to exercise and develop body and mind harmoniously (Andrieu, 2014). Rousseau’s pedagogical theory, along with several others, was implemented in the 19th-century Victorian England and Germany, where sports were valued as character-building activities. Inspired by these pedagogical philosophies, Baron Pierre de Coubertin founded the Olympic Movement, regarding Olympic sport as a ‘philosophy of life which places sport at the service of humanity’ (IOC 2019; see also McFee 2012; Parry 2006).

In contemporary society, sport plays a central role in the lives of countless players, coaches, officials, and spectators. The teaching of sport is part of national school curricula, sports news forms part of our national media, and sport has been deployed as a public policy measure to address everything from anti-social behaviour to obesity. However, despite the role sport has played throughout human history, the philosophy of sport as an academic sub-discipline did not develop until the middle of the 20th century. We recount some of the field’s history now.

1.2 History of the Philosophy of Sport

The philosophy of sport was pre-dated and inspired by the philosophy of play, most notably Johan Huizinga’s Homo Ludens (1938). However, sport is a distinctive type of play and not every instance of sport is an instance of play (Suits, 1988), so sport requires independent philosophical analysis. In the philosophy of sport literature, myriad characterizations and definitions of the nature and scope of the field have been proffered (Torres, 2014, 4–5). For Paul Weiss, the philosophy of sport provides an ‘examination of sport in terms of principles which are to be at once revelatory of the nature of sport and pertinent to other fields – indeed, to the whole of things and knowledge’ (Weiss, 1971, vii-viii). According to Robert G. Osterhoudt, first editor of the Journal of the Philosophy of Sport, this branch of Philosophy is committed ‘to the presentation of genuinely philosophical examinations, or reflective authentic examinations of the nature of sport … and systematic discussions of issues peculiar to sport until they are reduced to matters of a distinctly philosophical order’ (Osterhoudt, 1973, ix–xi).

R. Scott Kretchmar (1997) has suggested that, from the 1870s to the 1990s, the philosophy of sport evolved from being a sub-branch of the philosophy of education to being a field of study in its own right. During this time, the field went through three phases: the ‘eclectic’ phase, the ‘system-based’ phase and the ‘disciplinary’ phase. In the eclectic phase, also referred to as ‘philosophy-of-education period,’ philosophies of education laid the ground for the philosophical study of sport. Challenging the dominant intellectualist pedagogical tradition, philosophers such as William James, Edward L. Thorndike, and John Dewey emphasized the value of play, games, and sport in preparing human beings for achieving good lives. Physical educators Thomas D. Wood and Clark Hetherington, among others, built upon these philosophers to develop what was called ‘The New Physical Education,’ a pedagogical movement aimed at showing that physical education should become an integral part of overall human education. These educators, despite contributing little to philosophical discussion, helped to generate an era where physical education was required in most educational programs.

In the ‘system-based period,’ pedagogical concerns motivated the philosophical analysis of sport and physical exercise. However, the protagonists of this phase, such as Elwood Craig David and Earle Ziegler, relied on a method that placed greater weight on philosophical modes of analysis. They began by describing and comparing different philosophical systems, distilled them to the basic concepts and positions that related to physical education, and finished by drawing practical implications and pedagogical recommendations. Their emphasis on philosophical systems created a fertile ground for the development of the philosophy of sport. As William J. Morgan (2000, 205) notes, this shift in emphasis led to the progressive displacement of science and pedagogy as the main pillars of physical education curricula, and it facilitated a broader approach to the study of physical exercise and sport that gave pride of place to cultural and historical dimensions.

This evolution within physical education departments during the ‘disciplinary phase’ facilitated the emergence of the philosophy of sport as a discipline in its own right. The Philosophic Society for the Study of Sport (PSSS) was formed during the celebration of the 1972 Eastern Division conference of the American Philosophical Association (APA) in Boston; the organization’s name was changed to International Association for the Philosophy of Sport (IAPS) in 1999. The Society founded a scholarly journal, the Journal of the Philosophy of Sport (JPS), and established that the mission of the Society and the Journal was ‘to foster interchange and scholarship among those interested in the scholarly study of sport’ (Fraleigh 1983: 6). Weiss’ contribution to the formation of the discipline in its early stages was crucial. With the publication of Sport: A Philosophic Inquiry in 1969, Weiss, a philosopher of international repute, demonstrated that sport provided a fertile ground for philosophical inquiry. Along with Weiss, other pioneers of the philosophical analysis of sport were Eleanor Metheny (1952, 1965) and Howard S. Slusher (1967), who also helped to consolidate the nascent sub-discipline by publishing monographs in the philosophy of sport.

Early philosophy of sport divided along ‘analytic’ and ‘continental’ lines. Klaus V. Meier (1988), Bernard Suits (1977), and Frank McBride (1975, 1979) focused on the possibility of providing individually necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for something to be a ‘sport’. They drew on tools from analytical philosophy to analyse the use of the term ‘sport’ (in both plain and academic language) and to attempt to identify traits common to all sports. Early philosophers of sport also examined sport phenomenologically. R. Scott Kretchmar, Drew H. Hyland, and Robert G. Osterhoudt, among others, drew on the works of Eugene Fink, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Georg W. F. Hegel, Martin Heidegger, and Edmund Husserl to study the nature of sport by focusing on the lived experiences of those individuals engaged in it.

More recently, the philosophy of sport has transitioned into a ‘hermeneutic’ or ‘applied philosophy’ phase (Lopez Frias, 2017; McNamee, 2007). The field took a ‘practical’ turn in the 1990s. The work of Alasdair MacIntyre, especially his seminal work After Virtue (1984), played a key role in this shift among philosophers of sport towards normative issues. Drawing on MacIntyre’s concept of ‘social practice,’ philosophers of sport aimed to identify the intrinsic goods and excellences of sport in order to assess and critique sport and related ethical issues such as doping, cheating, and sportsmanship.

Classic debates concerning the nature of sport and the phenomenology of participants’ experience have not been abandoned, however. As we will show later (section 2.1), the debate on the nature of sport remains central. Indeed, the rise of electronic games (so-called ‘eSports’) has reignited discussion of the defining elements of sport and, more broadly, the contrast between traditional games and digital games (Conway, 2016). In particular, philosophers of sport have explored the question of whether eSports test physical skills (Van Hilvoorde, 2017; Holt, 2016), the implications of the institutionalization of eSport competitions (Hemphill, 2005; Parry, 2018), and moral engagement in digital gaming (Edgar, 2016).

Still more prominent is the phenomenology of sport. The rapid progression of computational science and neuroscience has had a profound influence in the philosophy of sport, encouraging exponential growth in publications concerning skill acquisition in sport (Ilundáin-Agurruza, 2016), the mind-body relationship (Gerber and Morgan, 1979), and sport experience (Breivik, 2014). The aesthetics of sport has also flourished in recent decades by focusing on two themes (Edgar, 2014): the nature and relevance of aesthetic qualities (e.g. beauty, ugliness, grace, and strength) to the experience of practising and watching sport (see also Kreft, 2012; Lacerda and Mumford, 2010; Lacerda, 2012) and the consideration of sport as an art and its relationship to art (see also Best, 1974, 1985; Elcombe, 2012; Gaffney, 2013). So, while still an emergent field, the philosophy of sport has progressed quickly in developing central methods and preoccupations.

2. What is Sport?

Philosophical theories of sport take descriptive or normative forms. Broadly speaking, descriptive theories attempt to provide an accurate account of sport’s central concepts, and normative theories attempt to provide an account of how sport should be. Normative theories of sport are broadly classified as either ‘externalist’ or ‘internalist.’ Externalist theories of sport understand sport as a reflection of larger social phenomena. Heavily influenced by Marxism and structuralism, externalist philosophers take the nature of sport to be determined by principles from other practices or the larger society. William J. Morgan (1994) identifies three types of externalist theories: ‘Commodification theory,’ ‘New Left theory,’ and ‘Hegemony theory.’ In Commodification theory, sport is understood as a commodity with use- and exchange-value. When sports are commodified, they are viewed not as having inherent characteristics worthy of protection, but solely according to the economic profit that they can generate (Sandel, 2012; Walsh and Giulianotti, 2007). The main proponents of the New Left theory theory are Bero Rigauer (1981), Jean-Marie Brohm (1978), Rob Beamish (1981), Richard Lipsky (1981), and Paul Hoch (1972). They understood sport materialistically by focusing on the role that sport plays in the genesis and reproduction of social history, mostly by exploring the connection between labor, economic infrastructure, and sport. Hegemony theories of sport attack the reductive and deterministic character of the New Left’s analyses of sport. Hegemony theorists such as Richard Gruenau (1983) and John Hargreaves (1986) explore the role that cultural practices and processes play in shaping the nature of sporting practices, while emphasizing the value of human agency.

Externalist accounts of sport tend to be regarded as deflationary because they deny, or overlook, that sport has independent value. They understand sport’s value solely in instrumental terms (Ryall, 2016). Internalist theories of sport do not analyse sport based on other social practices or historical processes. Rather, they aim to identify the distinctive values and purposes of sport that differentiate it from other social practices. Proponents of internalism acknowledge the influence on sport of other practices and the larger society, but internalists argue that sport is a practice with its own distinctive value and internal logic. Thus, the primary goal of internalism is to uncover the intrinsic normative principles of sport. A central task within the philosophy of sport has been to develop an adequate internalist normative theory of sport. At a minimum, such a theory should articulate sport’s non-instrumental value and it should provide guidance on appropriate standards of both conduct within sport, and sporting rules and practices themselves. Internalist views are typically classified into the following three categories: formalism, conventionalism, and broad internalism (or interpretivism). We examine each in turn now.

2.1 Formalism

Formalism conceives of sport as constituted solely by written rules: a sport is just the set of written rules that govern it. On this view, there is no need to look beyond the written rules to determine whether an activity is a sport (e.g. is tennis a sport?), whether an activity constitutes the playing of a certain sport (e.g. are they playing tennis or squash?), or whether a particular move is permitted within a specific sport (e.g. is kicking the ball permitted in tennis?).

Bernard Suits’ The Grasshopper: Games, Life and Utopia (1978 [2014]) is regarded as the seminal formalist text (Hurka, 2005)[1]. Suits attempts to refute Wittgenstein’s claim that, as a ‘family-resemblance’ concept, ‘game’ resists definition. On Wittgenstein’s view (1958, sect. 66–67), it is not possible to specify individually necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for something to constitute a game. Instead, games are endlessly varied, and, while some games may share features in common with some other games, there is no single element that is shared by all games. Contra Wittgenstein, Suits argues that there are four elements common to every game: goals, means, rules, and a certain attitude among the gameplayers.

Games are goal-directed activities. Every game has two distinct goals: a ‘lusory’ goal and a ‘pre-lusory’ goal. The pre-lusory goal is a specific state of affairs that game players try to bring about: placing the ball in the hole in golf, crossing the bar in the high jump, and crossing the line in the marathon. These can be achieved prior to the formation of a game. For example, I can place a golf ball in a hole even if no game of golf has begun, or I can jump over a bar even if no high jump competition is underway. The lusory goal is winning. This can be achieved only in the context of an organised game.

The second element of any game is the means. Every game restricts the methods that gameplayers are permitted to use to achieve the pre-lusory goal. Golfers are not allowed to drop the ball into the hole with their hands; high jumpers are not permitted to vault the bar using a trampoline, and marathon runners are forbidden from completing the race using a bicycle. The means permitted in games are always ‘inefficient’ for the achievement of the pre-lusory goal. For example, if the goal of boxing is to incapacitate one’s opponent for a count of ‘10’, it would be much more efficient to attack her with a baseball bat or to shoot her with a gun than having to punch her above the waist wearing gloves. If the goal of soccer is to put the ball into the goal, it would be much more efficient to kick, head, and carry the ball rather than only kicking and heading it. Means permitted within a game are the ‘lusory’ means, and those prohibited are the ‘illusory’ means.

The third element of a game is the (constitutive) rules. Rules provide a complete account of what means are permitted and not permitted within the game. They establish what means can be employed to achieve the pre-lusory goal of the game. These limitations on the permitted means make the game possible, for they erect (unnecessary) obstacles that participants attempt to overcome in the game. For instance, boxing rules disallow the use of weapons, such as knives or firearms. This ensures that the sport is a punching contest. The laws of soccer permit the use of any body part other than the arms so that the ball is played predominantly with the feet. In addition to constitutive rules, Suits argues, there are rules of skill, which establish how to play the game well. Such rules are rules of thumb that a coach may advise a player to follow to help her better execute the skills of the sport (e.g. keep your eye on the ball, follow through after impact, accelerate through the finish line).

The final element of gameplaying is attitudinal. Suits argues that, to play a game, one must have the ‘lusory attitude’. Players must commit themselves to playing in accordance with the rules that constitute the game just so that the game can take place. The type of motivation must be a particular kind (or at least must include motivation of a particular kind): players must respect the rules because they wish to play and they endorse the formalist view that breaking the rules necessarily ends the game. It is not sufficient to be motivated to respect the rules, for example, to ensure one’s good reputation or to compete for a ‘sportsmanship’ award. So, in the absence of the lusory attitude, it is quite possible, according to Suits, for a player to act in accordance with the rules without actually playing the game. The players accept the constitutive rules because, in the absence of such acceptance, no game is possible. On this view, if someone decided that she would break the rules whenever she could do so undetected, then, according to Suits, she is not really playing the game – even if no opportunity to break the rules undetected ever arose. She might appear to be playing the game, but, in the absence of an acceptance to bind herself to the constraints imposed by the constitutive rules, she would not count as really playing the game.

The four elements in Suits’ analysis of games culminate in the following definition:

To play a game is to attempt to achieve a specific state of affairs, using only means permitted by the rules, where the rules prohibit use of more efficient in favour of less efficient means, and where the rules are accepted just because they make possible such activity. (Suits, 1978 [2014, 43])

Suits also offers a shorthand definition: ‘playing a game is the voluntary attempt to overcome unnecessary obstacles’ (Suits, 1978 [2014, 43]). Suits’ account of games has attracted much critical attention. Principal among the objections raised are that games are not constituted by their constitutive rules only (D’Agostino, 1981; Russell, 1999) and that gameplaying does not require strict adherence to constitutive rules (i.e. some rule-breaking can be consistent with game-playing) (Lehman, 1981; Fraleigh, 2003).

Suits draws on his definition of games to provide a definition of sport. He defines sports as ‘games of physical skill’ (Suits, 1988, 2), incorporating the elements of his earlier definition of game and adding further elements that are distinctive to sport as compared to other types of games. In particular, a game becomes a sport by meeting the following criteria: ‘(1) that the game be a game of skill; (2) that the skill be physical; (3) that the game has a wide following; and (4) that the following achieve a certain level of stability’ (Suits, 1973 [2007]). Thus, the outcome of the game must be dependent on the exercise of physical skills. This is what differentiates sporting games from card games or chess, for example (see Kobiela, 2018 and Hale, 2008). In the latter, the way the body is moved is irrelevant, and what matters are the moves made (either with cards or pieces on the board). Indeed, such games can be played in non-physical spaces such as virtual reality and by non-human players such as computers. However, in soccer or boxing, the skillful control of the body is essential to the achievement of the goal of the game.

The third and fourth criteria in Suits’ definition demand that sports are widely followed institutionalized games. A sport is institutionalized when its norms and codified rules are established and enforced by formal associations or organizations. The institutionalization criterion is often employed in sociological and historical analyses of sport. For example, historian Allen Guttmann (1978) argues that bureaucratization and rationalization are defining components of modern sports. Sport philosophers, however, have remained skeptical about the possibility of defining sports as institutionalized games. For instance, Klaus V. Meier (1988) rejects the institutionalization criterion. For him, the institutionalization aspect is not a defining element of sport, but rather a contingent one that ‘adds color and significance to particular sports’ (Meier, 1988, 15). In his view, should soccer lack international following and institutions to establish and enforce the rules of the game, it would still be a sport.

In ‘Tricky Triad,’ Suits revises his original definition of sport from ‘The Elements of Sport’, redefining sports as

… competitive events involving a variety of physical (usually in combination with other) human skills, where the superior participant is judged to have exhibited those skills in a superior way. (Suits, 1988: 2)

In this definition, Suits narrows the scope of the concept of ‘game’ and distinguishes between two types of sports: ‘refereed games’ and ‘judged performances.’ That is to say, whereas in his earlier definition all sports are games, in his revised definition only some sports are games, other sports are performances. Soccer, basketball, tennis, and American football are games, while gymnastics, figure skating, and diving are performances. The key difference between the two, according to Suits, is that games have constitutive rules, whereas performances lack constitutive rules and have only rules of skill. Thus, for Suits, games consist in overcoming obstacles erected by the constitutive rules, whereas performances centre on the approximation of an ideal or perfect performance. For example, soccer players play the ball with their feet cooperatively as a team to put the ball into the opponent’s net. Using the feet, working as a team, and facing an opponent are the obstacles erected by the rules of soccer. For Suits, there is nothing like these in performances. Figure skaters do not attempt to overcome obstacles. Rather, they try to approach an ideal performance that manifests virtues such as power, grace, and imagination.

This revised definition sparked a classic debate in the philosophy of sport between Suits and Meier. The latter criticized Suits’ revised definition of sport and defended the original one. For Meier (1988), Suits’ original definition is correct because what Suits calls ‘performances’ also have constitutive rules. For example, gymnasts perform their acrobatics in a specific space, utilising certain equipment. Kretchmar agrees with Meier that both types of sports are games, but acknowledges that performances place more emphasis on aesthetic criteria, calling them ‘beautiful games’ (Kretchmar, 1989). Despite criticism, Suits’ definitions of games and sport serve as the point of departure for most contemporary philosophical theorising about sport, thereby making Suits the most influential figure in the discipline.

Turning to formalism more generally, adherents of this view take rules to be the normative cornerstone of a proper ethical analysis of sport. They define the rightness and wrongness of conduct within sport solely in terms of rule-following. Strict formalists contend that one cannot play the game and break the rules at the same time (i.e. the ‘logical incompatibility thesis’). If gameplaying requires adherence to the rules, then any rule violation – intentional or otherwise – marks an end to the game. Formalists oppose strategic fouling and doping because both practices involve breaking the rules (Moore, 2017a; Morgan, 1987; Pérez Triviño, 2014).

Formalist analyses of sport hold important similarities to debates within the philosophy of law about the nature of law. Indeed, the works of philosophers of law such as Ronald Dworkin and H. L. A. Hart, as well as philosophical analyses of rules such as those of Immanuel Kant and John R. Searle, have been influential within formalism (Kretchmar, 2001; Torres, 2000).

Formalism has been criticised as an inadequate normative theory of sport on account of its failure to recognise non-rule based norms in sport. As formalists do not recognise normative reasons internal to sport other than the rules themselves, they lack criteria to evaluate existing or proposed rules as well as criteria to evaluate actions not contemplated in the rulebook. Kretchmar attempts to salvage formalism from this criticism by drawing on both Suits and Searle. In Kretchmar’s view, critics of formalism overlook the fact that games and, a fortiori, constitutive rules are created to serve a function: to provide engaging, artificial problems. Games are made by humans for humans. Human biological nature is, in Searle’s terms, a ‘brute fact’ that gamewrights consider when creating the rules. They craft games that fit human capacities to present a ‘just right’ challenge (Kretchmar, 2015a). Otherwise, games would fail to perform their function. Kretchmar argues that Suits’ account already contains the resources necessary to discharge this evaluative function of an adequate normative theory of sport. Suits argues that when games set an extremely difficult or extremely easy obstacle, individuals lose interest in playing them (Kretchmar, 1975). Such games, then, fail to fulfil their goal of providing players with a worthy set of obstacles to overcome.

Another criticism that has been levelled against formalism is the apparently implausible implication of the logical incompatibility thesis that any game in which a rule is broken ends at the point at which the rule-breaking occurs. If rule-breaking is incompatible with gameplaying then any foul or accidental transgression of the rules would cause the game to end. For instance, a 100m sprint would cease when a runner makes a false start. A basketball game would terminate when a player commits a strategic foul to prevent an opponent from scoring in a fast break. A tennis match would end whenever a shot is hit out. Formalists have attempted to overcome this objection by distinguishing between ‘constitutive rules’ and ‘regulative rules’. The latter allow the game to be reinstated following a transgression of the rules by determining how the game is to be restarted (e.g. restarting the race, a free kick, a second serve) and how rule-breakers are to be penalized (e.g. disqualified from the race, a penalty kick awarded to the opposing team, the loss of a point). For Graham McFee (2004b), this constitutive rule/regulative rule distinction does not address the objection adequately, as it remains unclear when a rule is constitutive or regulative. For instance, an outfield player in soccer using her hands to stop a counterattack would be considered a strategic foul and, therefore, judged according to a regulative rule. However, if players constantly used their hands, the game would become either impossible (e.g. all players are eventually sent off) or a different game (e.g. rugby or handball). Thus, according to McFee, rules must be understood based on how participants use them in specific contexts. However, formalism does not provide the resources to make these contextual discriminations. What criteria should we use to evaluate the rules of a sport? When should we change the rules of a sport? Can we evaluate a purported need for rule change without appealing to some consideration other than the rules themselves?

2.2 Conventionalism

Conventionalism attempts to address the limitations of formalism by recognizing the normative significance of unwritten rules of the game. For conventionalists, rules do not exhaust the sources of normative reasons within sport. Conventionalists argue that rules (whether constitutive or regulative) cannot determine their own application and they fail to provide guidance for all possible eventualities in a game (e.g. situations that were not envisioned by the rule makers). In addition, a strictly rule-centric approach fails to account for the existence of unwritten norms that supplement the rules. Such norms exist independent of, and sometimes in conflict with, the formal rules.

Conventionalists argue that an adequate account of sport must appeal to collectively agreed-upon norms called ‘conventions.’ Fred D’Agostino, the pioneer of conventionalism, maintains that the conventions that operate within a game constitute the ‘ethos’ of the game. The ethos of a game is the ‘set of unofficial, implicit conventions which determine how the rules of a game are to be applied in concrete circumstances’ (D’Agostino, 1981, 15). Thus, from a conventionalist perspective, sports comprise both formal rules and conventions. For example, in soccer, convention dictates that the ball must be put out of play when any player requires medical attention. No written rule demands that players kick the ball out of play in such circumstances. However, any player who failed to do so would be subject to blame and rebuke. Conventionalism is better equipped than formalism to describe and understand how sports are actually practiced in specific contexts. For instance, despite playing the same game, amateur soccer players in a pick-up game and professional players in the World Cup final apply the rulebook differently (e.g. amateurs often suspend the offside rule, whereas the rule is crucial at the professional level). Likewise, the non-contact and travelling rules in basketball are applied differently depending on the context.

Critics acknowledge that conventionalism is a fruitful descriptive theory of sport, but point out that its normative implications are problematic (Ciomaga, 2013). For instance, much as formalism lacks the resources to distinguish good from bad rules, it has been objected that conventionalism too lacks ‘critical edge,’ for it fails to provide the resources necessary to distinguish good from bad conventions (Simon et al., 2015). That a convention in fact operates in a sport does not settle the question of whether it should operate. In short, conventionalists seem to take the status quo as normative. An implication of conventionalism would seem to be, then, that manifestly objectionable conventions (e.g. ‘never pass the ball to a black person’ or ‘spit at members of the opposing team whenever possible’) could be normative on a conventionalist scheme.

Drawing on David Lewis’ and Andrei Marmor’s work on conventions, conventionalists have attempted to address this objection by distinguishing ‘deep’ from ‘surface’ conventions (Morgan, 2012). This view is called ‘deep conventionalism’. Surface conventions are what Lewis called ‘coordinating’ conventions. Their main function is to help individuals to resolve recurrent, collective problems. For instance, Morgan argues that, when participating in a game, players may encounter situations that require collective decisionmaking related to the application of a specific rule or an event that disrupts the flow of the game. To solve these problems, participants harmonize their action by agreeing to uphold the same unwritten rules.

Deep conventions do not relate to problem solving and coordination. Rather, they are ‘normative responses to deep psychological and social needs for playing sports’ (Morgan, 2015, 39). Put differently, deep conventions shape sports into the various historical and social forms they have taken. For instance, the principles and ideals underlying the amateur view of sport, according to which participants engage in the game chiefly for the love of it, are deep conventions. Thus, a sport’s deep conventions determine the point of that sport and provide a rationale for playing the sport in a specific way by establishing what counts as normatively intelligible and justifiable within that sport. For example, amateur athletes often view sport as a perfective enterprise pursued for its own sake. They play sport for the love of the game not for instrumental benefit. The amateur’s emphasis on the intrinsic value of sport contrasts with the professional’s view of sport. For professionals, sport tends to be viewed as a serious, instrumental occupation, that is, a means to earn a living (Morgan, 2015, 40–41). Thus, amateurs and professionals evaluate differently practices such as training, doping, and strategising. While professionals embrace conduct that increases their chance of victory, amateurs are often more discerning, rejecting practices such as professional coaches and strategic fouling on the grounds that they are detrimental to the emphasis of the appreciation of the practice itself, not the instrumental goals achieved through it.

In response to critics of conventionalism, Morgan has argued that deep conventions provide evaluative criteria by which the moral standing of surface conventions can be assessed. However, it remains unclear whether Morgan responds satisfactorily to criticisms that have been leveled against deep conventionalism (Moore, 2018). How can deep conventions be distinguished from surface conventions? Does deep conventionalism only shift the ‘critical edge’ problem to the deep convention level? What resources does deep conventionalism provide to evaluate deep conventions?

2.3 Broad Internalism (Interpretivism)

In contrast both to formalists who see sport as constituted by rules only and conventionalists for whom sport is constituted by rules and conventions, broad internalists maintain that sport is constituted by rules, conventions, as well as underlying intrinsic principles (Russell, 1999; Simon et al., 2015). According to Robert L. Simon, one of the pioneers of this view, ‘broad internalism claims that in addition to the rules of various sports, there are underlying principles that might be embedded in overall theories or accounts of sport as a practice’ (Simon, 2000, 7). Intrinsic principles are key for broad internalists, as they provide the foundation for interpreting or understanding sport practices. Such principles are ‘presuppositions of sporting practice in the sense that they must be accepted if our sporting practice is to make sense or, perhaps, make the best sense’ (Simon et al., 2015, 32). Formalists and conventionalists fail to give due recognition to the idea that rules and conventions must be interpreted and applied so as to respect and promote normative principles that determine the point of the practice.

Ronald Dworkin’s interpretivist theory of law holds that law must be interpreted in accordance with principles (e.g. justice) without which legal practice would not make sense. Interpretivism heavily influenced Simon’s formulation of broad internalism. This is perhaps unsurprising as several broad internalists consider sport to constitute a type of legal system with its own jurisprudence (e.g. Russell. 2015). On Simon’s view, sport is interpreted by appealing to intrinsic principles, separate to rules and conventions, that define the logic of the practice. Justice and competitive excellence are examples of such principles. Without them, Simon’s argument continues, the sporting practice would not make sense. Drawing on different understandings of the intrinsic principles that underlie sport, three broad internalist approaches have been formulated: contractualism, the ‘respect for the integrity of the game’ account, and mutualism.

The contractualist approach holds that sports are made possible by an implicit social contract among participants. Agreement to partake in the practice and abide by a specific set of rules and conventions provides normative validity to the rules and conventions upheld during the game. For instance, Warren P. Fraleigh argues that sports are made possible not only by the rules, but also by the fact that players agree to follow them (Fraleigh, 1984). Inaugural events prior to sporting events symbolize such an implicit pact. In the Olympic Games, for example, countries parade with their respective national flags during the opening ceremony and, as in the Ancient Olympic Games (Miller, 2006), competitors swear an oath, agreeing to abide by the rules and the spirit of fair play.

The ‘respect for the integrity of the game’ approach was proposed by Robert Butcher and Angela Schneider (Butcher and Schneider, 1998). It focuses on identifying a game’s interest, that is, the interests of the game itself separate to the interest of players. These interests, so the argument goes, must be respected by all involved. The game is regarded as an intrinsically valuable entity which demands respect. To flesh out the idea that a game itself may have interests, Butcher and Schneider draw upon Kretchmar’s theory of sport as a contest aimed at comparing the participants’ performances and Alasdair MacIntyre’s notion of ‘social practice.’ Combining these views, Butcher and Schneider argue that a game is an activity in which participants test each other both to discover who is superior in that sport and to achieve certain goods and excellences internal to the practice. These goods and excellences are connected to the distinctive nature of sport and the participants’ experiences while engaged in them. For instance, the ability to kick a ball skillfully – to make a beautiful pass – is an intrinsic good of soccer.

The foundation of the mutualist view is the understanding of sporting competition as a ‘mutually acceptable quest for excellence through challenge’ (Simon et al., 2015: 47). Robert L. Simon, Cesar R. Torres, and Peter F. Hager have provided the most detailed account of this approach. They argue that mutualism is the philosophical theory that best conceives sport.

John S. Russell provides a similar account of sport, whereby

… rules should be interpreted in such a manner that the excellences embodied in achieving the lusory goal of the game are not undermined but are maintained and fostered. (Russell, 1999, 35)

For Russell, as for Simon, broad internalism ‘generate[s] a coherent and principled account of the point and purposes that underlie the game, attempting to show the game in its best light’ (Russell, 1999, 35).

By way of illustration, Russell (1999) recounts a baseball match from 1887 between Louisville and Brooklyn in which a Louisville player, Reddy Mack, who had just crossed home plate interfered with a Brooklyn catcher, preventing him from tagging another Louisville runner. While the interference was ongoing, another Louisville player crossed home plate. Crucially, at the time of the game, the rules prohibited only base runners from interfering with fielders. However, when Mack interfered with the Brooklyn fielder, he was no longer a runner, because he had crossed the home plate. So, the rules did not explicitly prohibit Mack from interfering with the fielder. If the umpire followed the rules strictly, then Mack’s interference should have been allowed, and the runner who followed Mack to home plate should not have been ruled out. However, as Russell notes, following the rules in this way would have invited further interference of fielders by non-base runners, so the game would likely have descended into a ‘nine-inning-long wrestling match’ (Russell, 1999: 28). To prevent such an outcome, the umpire read into existence a rule that prohibited non-base runners from interfering with fielders. So, he called out the runner who made it to home plate following Mack. This exercise of discretion was not subsequently overturned, and it precipitated a rule change to prohibit non-base runners from interfering with fielders. Indeed, it seemed necessary to depart from the rules to protect the nature of the sport. The umpire might be understood to have considered the purpose of the sport in deciding how he should rule on this incident. Baseball is a sport that tests excellence in running, batting, throwing and catching – but not wrestling. The umpire interpreted (and amended) the rules in light of the sport’s underlying purpose. In short, the umpire had to appeal to principles that underlie the rules and conventions to decide how the rules should be applied, and, in this case, to read a rule into existence. In inventing a rule to govern this situation which the rulemakers had likely never countenanced, the umpire protected the integrity of the game. For broad internalists, this example demonstrates the necessity of appeal to principles that precede the rules and conventions.

Broad internalist accounts closely connect sport to the pursuit of excellence, as they typically view the fundamental purpose of sporting competition to be the display of sporting excellence. The connection between competition and excellence allows mutualist philosophers to develop a critical-pedagogical view of sport’s competitive nature. This view challenges the strong emphasis placed on victory at the elite level. For Simon, when victory is overemphasized, sports are seen as ‘zero-sum’ games (Simon, 2014), that is, games where only the victor can benefit from participation.

On the mutualist view, sports are ‘non-zero-sum’ games. All players can benefit from participation, even those who lose. Through competition, players push each other to perform and improve. While only one player or team can win, all can benefit from competing, as competition can provide an avenue to more fully perfect one’s abilities. When sport is at its best, competitors struggle cooperatively for excellence. On this view, the intrinsic principles of sport do not revolve around the pursuit of victory, but the cultivation of excellence. Drawing on MacIntyre, mutualist philosophers argue that the goods more directly connected to victory are external to the practice, whereas those linked to excellence are internal (McFee, 2004a). Mutualism is an Aristotelian-inspired teleological account of sport, whereby the purpose of sport is understood to be the promotion of human flourishing. This view of sport resonates with that of the Olympic Movement and its founder Pierre de Coubertin (Loland, 1995).

Broad internalism has been criticised on three principal grounds: for failing to adequately acknowledge the importance of history to a proper normative account of sport; for its reliance on interpretive principles that are too vague to provide any practical guidance to decisionmaking in sport (Morgan, 2016); and for delivering an incomplete account of sport (Kretchmar, 2015b; Nguyen, 2017). Drawing on Thomas Nagel, Morgan argues that broad internalism provides a ‘view from nowhere’ notion of sport that fails to acknowledge the historical and social situatedness of sporting practices (Morgan, 2012). Kretchmar contends that broad internalism provides a restrictive view of sport built upon the value of work and excellence (Kretchmar, 2016). On this view, we should be pluralists, not monists, about the intrinsic value of sport. Excellence captures some of sport’s intrinsic value, but it is only a partial account. Paraphrasing Russell, mutualism shows sport in only one of its best lights.

3. Topics in the Philosophy of Sport

In this section, we explore the central philosophical problems that arise in sport and how they have been addressed in the literature. In particular, we chart the landscape of the following seven leading ethical problems: (a) sportsmanship; (b) cheating; (c) performance-enhancement; (d) dangerous and violent sport; (e) sex, gender, and race; (f) fans and spectators; (g) disability sport; and (h) sport aesthetics.

3.1 Sportsmanship

Sportsmanship is the quintessential sporting virtue. It has also been thought important to civic and cultural life beyond sport (Sabl, 2008). Nevertheless, the concept has received little philosophical attention. The literature on sportsmanship converges on the view that this virtue requires more than mere compliance with formal rules. However, there are two principal disputes in the literature: whether sportsmanship is a virtue at all levels of sport or just at the recreational level and whether sportsmanship is a unified concept or a cluster of distinct virtues.

The traditional point of departure in the sportsmanship debate is James W. Keating’s ‘Is Sportsmanship a Moral Category?’ (1965). On this account, there is a moral distinction between ‘sport’ (recreational sport) and ‘athletics’ (competitive sport). Standards of ethics appropriate to sport at the recreational level are not equivalent to those appropriate at the competitive level. Indeed, conduct appropriate to the recreational sport may be morally objectionable at the competitive level and vice versa. This moral discontinuity between recreational and competitive sport extends to sportsmanship. Specifically, as the goal of recreational sport is ‘pleasant diversion’, the essence of sportsmanship in that context is ‘generosity’ (Keating, 1965, 34). This requires the participant always to try to increase the enjoyability of the activity both for themselves and for other participants. In athletics, where the overriding goal is ‘honorable victory’, sportsmanship requires ‘fairness’. The type of fairness in question is formal fairness – ‘equality before the law’ (Keating, 1965, 34). An equal and impartial application of the rules, as dictated by formal fairness, purportedly helps to ensure that competition fulfills its purpose as a test of athletic excellence and that victory correctly tracks athletic superiority (Keating, 1965, 34).

Keating’s distinction between sport and athletics has been contested. Simon et al. (2015) have suggested that this distinction is too sharp. A given contest can contain elements of both sport and athletics. Moreover, sportsmanship requires more than, as Keating suggests, generosity to opponents or fidelity to the rules. Not only does sportsmanship require respect for the principles that underpin morally defensible competition, it also requires positive action to protect and promote these principles. Randolph Feezell (1986) offers an understanding of sportsmanship that seems to combine both, as sportsmanship is understood as the mean between excessive seriousness and excessive playfulness in sport.

Diana Abad (2010) argues that sportsmanship should not, as typically assumed, be treated as a unified concept. Instead, sportsmanship is constituted by four irreducible elements: fairness, equity, good form or honour, and the will to win. These elements are not only analytically distinct but also potentially incompatible. However, she argues that such conflict between these values can be resolved by striking an appropriate ‘balance’ between the conflicting elements.

3.2 Cheating

In contrast to sportsmanship, cheating represents, at least prima facie, the chief form of moral failure in sport.

Cheating has proved to be a notoriously difficult concept to define. A commonsense understanding of cheating as the ‘intentional violation of the rules to gain a competitive advantage’ is replete with difficulties (Green, 2006; Russell, 2017). For example, if cheating is necessarily a type of rule violation, what of the violation of conventions and other norms not captured by the formal rules? If cheating must be aimed at the attainment of competitive advantage, what of intentional rule-breaking that aims to rectify an earlier injustice (e.g. cheating or refereeing error) that advantaged one’s opponent?

Leaving aside definitional issues and turning to the moral status of cheating, moral objections to cheating typically rest on two principal arguments. The first invokes the logical incompatibility thesis – the idea that rule-breaking is not compatible with game playing, because game playing requires strict adherence to the rules (see sect. 2.1). This argument could justify a prohibition of only forms of cheating that involve rule-breaking: it could not ground an objection to cheating that involves the violation of conventions or broad internalist principles. The second argument relies on the idea that cheating is an attempt to gain an unfair advantage, that is, an advantage not permitted under the agreement between players or the set of norms by which players are expected to abide (Gert, 2004). Fairness-based objections may not ground a prohibition to ‘retaliatory’ or ‘compensatory’ cheating that is undertaken to re-establish fairness following an injustice that has placed a competitor at an unfair disadvantage (Kirkwood, 2012).

The moral impermissibility of cheating has been challenged from several directions. The case of cyclist Lance Armstrong has provided a focal point for some of this debate (Moore, 2017b; Pike and Cordell, forthcoming): is cheating wrong if one’s competitors (or at least a significant proportion of one’s competitors) are also cheating? That is, does one’s duty not to cheat cease if one’s competitors do not discharge their duty not to cheat? Here the problem of ethics in non-ideal theory (i.e. acting in conditions of only partial compliance with justice) arises in sport.

Oliver Leaman has argued that cheating can become part of the skill and strategy of a game, thereby adding to the game’s excitement and interest for both players and spectators. If cheating is accepted as part of the game such that all competitors recognize cheating as an option (whether or not they avail of that option), then concerns over equality and justice do not arise (Leaman, 1981) In these circumstances, according to Leaman, cheating would be morally permissible.

Hugh Upton (2011) has gone further to suggest not only that cheating may be morally permissible in certain circumstances but that one may be morally required to cheat. This moral requirement arises specifically in team sports where, from a duty of loyalty, a player may owe her teammates maximum effort to win the game subject only to the requirements of fair play that are routinely observed in the sport. To observe standards of fair play that are not usually observed in the sport may be ‘self-indulgent’, demonstrating an undue concern for one’s own ethical propriety at the expense of one’s teammates. On this view, the duty not to let down one’s teammates may imply a duty to cheat.

Finally, it is worth noting the related discussion of ‘gamesmanship’. This is a term used to denote conduct that falls short of cheating (as it does not violate the formal rules) but is morally dubious nonetheless. Such acts might include the intimidation of one’s opponent, the manipulation of officials, or the intentional disruption of an opponent’s preparations (e.g. coughing just as she is about to putt). Gamesmanship may add a test of one’s psychological robustness to the sporting contest, but this may diminish the contest as a test of athletic excellence (Howe, 2004). While such conduct is not formally proscribed, it speaks to a question that every athlete must ponder: what should I be prepared to do to win?

3.3 Performance Enhancement

Athletes have attempted to improve their performances by deploying a variety of different performance enhancers, ranging from pharmaceutical substances (e.g. anabolic steroids) to equipment (e.g. full-body 100% polyurethane swimsuits), with genetic manipulation seemingly just around the corner. Which, if any, performance-enhancing methods should be allowed in sport? Is there any good reason to restrict their use, or should athletes be free to use whatever methods they choose? This debate cuts to the very heart of questions regarding the purpose of sporting competition and what counts as excellent athletic performance (Møller, Hoberman, and Waddington, 2015).

The most widely discussed form of enhancement is the use of performance-enhancing drugs (i.e. ‘doping’). There are three sides in the doping debate: ‘pro-doping’, ‘anti-doping’, and ‘anti-anti-doping’ (McNamee 2008; Murray 2016: 128–133). Those who regard doping as a morally acceptable practice that should not be banned from sport are pro-doping. For them, the use of performance-enhancing methods or substances is justified because it aligns with the idea that a central purpose of sport is to strive to be better or, more broadly, it aligns with a natural human impulse to create tools to achieve our goals (Brown, 1980, 1984; Møller, 2009; Savulescu, Foddy, and Clayton, 2004). For instance, Savulescu et al. argue: ‘Far from being against the spirit of sport, biological manipulation embodies the human spirit – the capacity to improve ourselves on the basis of reason and judgment’ (Savulescu et al., 2004, 667). Pro-doping arguments typically rely on the claim that doping is morally equivalent to the use of other sports technology or medical interventions that are widely accepted in sport (e.g. cushioned running shoes, graphite tennis rackets, or Lasik eye surgery). If we are willing to allow their use, so the argument goes, then it would be irrational to preclude the use of performance-enhancing substances (Murray, 2018).

The anti-doping side argue that restriction on the use of performance-enhancing methods is justifiable. They typically appeal to any of the following arguments: (a) performance enhancement runs counter to the intrinsic nature of sport by undermining its central purpose – the cultivation and display of sporting excellence (Devine, 2011; Sandel, 2007); (b) performance enhancement compromises the fairness of competition by providing its users with an unfair advantage (Douglas, 2007; Loland, 2002); (c) performance enhancement exerts a negative and dangerous influence on society, especially young people, by spreading acceptance of drug use (Pound, 2006); (d) performance enhancement is intrinsically immoral as it is the expression of a morally corrupt character or violates a moral value (e.g. authenticity or naturalness) (Bonte and Tolleneer, 2013; Habermas, 2003; Sandel, 2009); and (e) performance enhancement is harmful to participants (Hølm, 2007; Kayser and Broers, 2015; Savulescu, 2015).

Finally, proponents of the anti-anti-doping view object morally to the practical implications of anti-doping regulations (especially with regard to policing the use of performance enhancing drugs). On this view, a ban on performance-enhancing drugs should not be imposed, even if justifiable in principle, because the implementation of such a ban would necessarily involve morally objectionable practices. Anti-anti-doping arguments criticise the fight against doping on the grounds that it costs too much (in both economic and moral terms) and secures insufficient benefit in terms of the promotion of compliance and the identification of non-compliance with anti-doping rules (Kayser et al., 2005, 2007). Advocates of this view may endorse principled objections to doping but believe that the institutional requirements for policing such a ban are not morally justifiable. Such an objection includes concerns that the institutional framework associated with anti-doping involves the violation of athletes’ rights (Tamburrini, 2013), that anti-doping policy too closely resembles a criminal justice system (Kornbeck, 2013), and that the normative assumptions that underpin anti-doping campaigns are morally problematic. Anti-anti-doping advocates propose alternative regulations that often involve the legalization of currently banned substances and methods (Pérez Triviño, 2013; Tamburrini, 2000b; Tamburrini and Tännsjö, 2005; Tännsjö, 2009) or the adoption of a harm-reduction approach (Kayser et al., 2005, 2007).

3.4 Violent and Dangerous Sport

Exposure to the risk of significant physical harm is intrinsic to participation in many sports. The category of ‘dangerous sport’ includes non-violent sports such as free solo rock-climbing and downhill skiing, collision sports such as American football and rugby union, and combat sports such as boxing and mixed martial arts. What is the value of dangerous sports, and how, if at all, should the state regulate such activities through public policy?

Russell argues that dangerous sports manifest distinctive forms of value (2005). Their value lies in the perfectionist ideal of ‘self-affirmation’, whereby we challenge and resist the ordinary bounds of our lives and attempt to extend those boundaries to surpass the apparent limits of our being (Russell, 2005). Russell further argues that these kinds of sports can be of particular practical benefit for children. Such activities place children in a context in which they must confront danger, thereby preparing the child for adulthood, as well as helping the child to discover and affirm aspects of her selfhood (Russell, 2007).

Others have suggested that, in their current form, collision sports such as American football and combat sports such as boxing should be banned by the state. Nicholas Dixon (2001) has argued on autonomy-based grounds that boxing which involves blows to the head should be banned, but boxing that limits the permissible target area to the area between the waist and the head should be permitted. Others have defended the status quo on the grounds that any attempt to criminalise boxing will lead to the sport moving underground where more harm may result (Warburton, 1998).

Pam Sailors (2015) has argued that American football, both at the professional and amateur levels, is morally objectionable, though she stops short of proposing its prohibition. She grounds this objection on harm to the players, the objectification of the players, and the harms done by players to non-players. Angelo Corlett (2019) has argued, more narrowly, that a prohibition of American football at the inter-collegiate level could be justified on account of the large healthcare and medical costs that must be borne by the general public arising from associated injuries. Mike McNamee and Francisco Javier Lopez Frias have called for caution regarding the proposed prohibition of American football and other collision sports that pose the risk of permanent brain injury. In particular, they critically analyze arguments for the elimination of such sports that draw on Mill’s consensual domination principle. These arguments equate the decision of playing football with that of selling oneself to slavery (consensual domination). According to Lopez Frias and McNamee (2017), human beings should be allowed to pursue the kind of lives that they have reasons to value, even if that involves consensual domination. For them, the nature of the goods people pursue in their lives might justify the sacrifice of future autonomy. Moreover, they challenge the idea that CTE-related injuries are morally equivalent to harms that arise from consensual domination. In a latter paper, Lopez Frias and McNamee propose that one possible solution to the debate over the reform or prohibition of such sports should have at its centre the concept of ‘social good’ (Lopez Frias and McNamee, 2019).

3.5 Sex, Gender, and Race

Sporting competition has traditionally been sex-segregated along the binary ‘male/female’ distinction, and challenges to the prevailing understandings of sex and gender have been heard within the sporting community since the 1960s. Two principal questions with regard to sex and gender arise in sport: is sex segregation in sporting competition morally justifiable? If so, in what category should trans and intersex athletes compete?

The starting point for the sex segregation debate is Jane English’s ‘Sex Equality in Sport’ (1978). English considers what equality of opportunity between the sexes requires in sport. She argues that a just society would incorporate a greater variety of sports than at present. Specifically, sports that reward ‘women’s distinctive abilities’ (English, 1978, 227) (e.g. flexibility, low centre of gravity) would be more numerous. On grounds of self-respect, women should enjoy roughly half of the ‘basic benefits’ of health and recreation. This includes the right to equal facilities. This would require significant re-ordering of how resources are distributed between the sexes within sport. Ultimately, however, English advocates a (qualified) retention of binary sex segregation in sport. The contours of this distinction have been challenged by intersex, trans, and non-gendered athletes who do not fit comfortably into either category. The question ‘Who is a sportswoman?’ (Camporesi, 2017) has never been more contested.

To police sex segregation in competition, sports authorities have adopted a variety of approaches to sex verification at different times since the 1930s. These have included visual tests, chromosome tests, and testosterone tests. The prevailing approach to the eligibility of trans women to compete in women’s events does not preclude those who are biologically male from competing in women’s sport, but it requires that their testosterone level remains below a certain threshold for a period prior to and continuously throughout their time competing in women’s competition (IOC, 2015). The requirement that trans, as well as intersex, women whose natural testosterone level is above the permitted threshold must undergo hormone treatment (i.e. androgen suppressive therapy) to bring their level below that threshold has been criticised as the unnecessary medicalisation of healthy athletes and a violation of the principle of beneficence in medical ethics. (Camporesi, 2016). Critics have suggested that athletes should not be required to meet certain physiological criteria to be eligible to compete in a particular gender category. Proposals sympathetic to this view have included that athletes should be allowed to compete in the gender category with which they identify (Davis and Edwards 2014); that trans women athletes should be allowed to compete in women’s sport but, to mitigate unfair advantage, should be subject to a handicap based on effective testosterone levels (Bianchi, 2017); and, finally, that eligibility should be determined by legally recognised gender (McKinnon and Conrad, forthcoming)

At the heart of this debate is whether trans women enjoy an unfair advantage over cis female athletes (i.e. athletes who were assigned the sex of female at birth and whose gender identity is female). Some have suggested that testosterone has not been proved to provide an advantage in competition (Camporesi, 2016) or that the advantage it provides, even if unfair, may be tolerably unfair (Devine, 2019). Moreover, no attempt is made to regulate other biological and genetic variations that provide a clear performance advantage. For example, there is no attempt to exclude or regulate athletes with Marfan syndrome. However, the long limbs and flexible joints associated with that condition provide a clear advantage for swimmers, basketball players, and volleyball players. It has been suggested that, if there is no morally relevant difference between advantages that result from sex and those that result from other biological and genetic variations, why should testosterone levels be regulated when other such variations relevant to sporting performance are not (Camporesi 2017; Camporesi and Maugeri 2016)?

A more fundamental challenge has been levelled at the very institution of sex segregation in sport. It has been proposed that the organisation of sport should be indifferent to an athlete’s sex, so men and women should compete with and against each other. On this view, rather than retaining sex segregation, which involves discrimination against women as well as complex questions concerning the proper categorization of intersex, trans, and non-gendered athletes, we should eliminate sex segregation altogether, and sport should either be open (not segregated at all) (Tamburrini, 2000a, ch. 6; Tännsjö, 2000) or segregated along dimensions other than sex such as weight, height, haemoglobin level, or testosterone level (Knox et al, 2019).

Aside from the sex segregation question, there has been much discussion of sport as a site of gender politics. The role that sport plays in the construction of gender (including gender hierarchies) was taken up in Iris Marion Young’s classic paper ‘Throwing Like a Girl’ (1980) which explores the modalities of feminine bodily existence for women in contemporary society. Young’s central claim is that such modalities of feminie movement, motility, and spatiality have as their source not anatomy or physiology but the particular situation of women, which is shaped by sexist oppression (Young, 1980). The framework developed by Young has inspired phenomenologies of female embodiment in particular sports such as surfing (Brennan, 2016) and climbing (Chisholm, 2008), which delineate the oppression of women within these sporting communities arising from prevailing sexist notions of the female body. Young has also argued that, as long as women’s bodies are understood as objects, they are excluded by the culture from sport. This cultural exclusion of women from sport, in turn, creates a masculine bias within sport, which precludes the exhibition of sport’s potential humanity (Young, 1979). There has also been discussion of whether the very nature of competiton – a central feature of sport – is masculinist and inherently incompatible with feminism (Davion, 1987).

Compared to the well-developed literature around sex and gender in sport, issues around race and sport have received surprisingly little attention in the philosophy of sport literature (with exceptions including disparate articles by Mosley, 2003; Lapchick, 2003; and Marqusee, 2003). However, recent political activism by American football star Colin Kaepernick to highlight systematic racism in the United States against African Americans has inspired philosophical work about race and sport, and the ethics of political activism by athletes (Brackett, 2017; Klein, 2017; Marston, 2017; Sailors, 2017; and Rorke and Copeland, 2017).

Several Foucauldian post-structuralists and existentialists have explored the connections between hegemonic racial power structures and sport (Early, 2007). For instance, writers such as Grant Farred (2018), Erin C. Tarver (2018), and Katrhryn E. Henne (2015), have explored themes around sports and white (and/or colonial) hegemonic interests. They have examined whether sport and the engagement of minorities in sport perpetuates and promotes white privilege and white interests (Henne, 2015). They have also critiqued the hegemonic forces purportedly used by the institutionalized and corporate structure of sport to discipline and exploit minorities, especially in professional sport and American college sport (Hawkins, 2001; Farred, 2018).

3.6 Fans and Spectators

What is the best way to watch sport? Is our fascination with and admiration of elite sportspeople morally defensible? The debate about the most valuable form of spectatorship has revolved around whether the ‘purist’ model of spectator is superior to the ‘partisan’ model. Purists derive aesthetic pleasure from good play. They appreciate a virtuoso performance irrespective of the performer, that is, irrespective of which team or athlete delivers it (Dixon, 2016). Purists have no allegiance to any particular team but appreciate feats of athletic excellence on their merits only. They appreciate good play, as one might appreciate a work of art without knowing or caring about the identity of the artist. For purists, a proper appreciation of the spectacle is paramount, and allegiance to a particular team threatens to undermine a proper appreciation of sport.

Chief among the criticisms of purism (Russell, 2012; Feezell, 2013; Mumford, 2011, 2012) is its neglect of partisanship. Partisans espouse the virtue of supporting a particular team, even when that team plays poorly. Loyalty is paramount to partisans, and they follow their team through good times and bad. Partisans typically support their favoured team zealously, and they cheer for their team’s success. For partisans, it matters that their team wins, even if they display less, or a lower form of, athletic excellence than the opposition.

Some have argued that the admiration of individual sporting heroes, characteristic of purist spectators, is morally problematic. On this view, enthusiasm and awe surrounding the achievements of elite athletes are not morally respectable. Indeed, such attitudes reflect a fascistoid ideology (Tännsjö 1998, 2005). Admiration for winners in sport involves the celebration of strength and, inevitably, the expression of contempt for weakness. Strength is understood as a trait for which one is not responsible but which has its origin in genetics (Tännsjö 2005), so admiration for athletes based on their strength is thought fascistoid. On this view, in admiring the victor(s), we cannot but demonstrate contempt for the loser(s): admiration for the former and contempt for the latter are two sides of the same coin.

It has been argued against Tännsjö’s account that it is descriptive rather than normative. At best, Tännsjö describes how spectators do behave, not how they should behave. Moreover, admiration for the winner does not necessarily imply contempt for the loser, and by extension, for the weak. Contra Tännsjö, there is no necessary link between these two attitudes. Our admiration of elite athletes need not rest on an appreciation of their excellence understood solely in terms of strength (Tamburrini, 2000, ch. 5), as admiration for sports stars, properly understood, is only to a limited extent admiration of them because of their physical strength (Persson, 2005).

3.7 Disability Sport

‘Disability sport’, also referred to as ‘Paralympic sport’ or ‘sport for athletes with disabilities or impairments’ contrasts with sport for able-bodied persons. The two principal ethical questions that arise regarding disability sport are: 1. What criteria should be used to classify disability athletes in competition?; and 2. Should disability athletes, specifically those with prosthetic limbs, be allowed to compete with able-bodied athletes?

Who may be considered a Paralympic athlete? In order to compete in disability or Paralympic sport, one must be classed as having a disability. The notion of disability is a contested concept (Boorse 2010, 2011; Nordenfelt 1987, 2007). It is unsurprising, then, that, what counts as a disability for the purpose of sport and how to categorise those with disabilities for the purpose of competition are matters of some dispute (Edwards and McNamee 2015). For example, for an athlete to qualify as a disability athlete, must her disability be permanent, or could it be temporary? Could the disability be only somewhat impairing or must it be profoundly impairing?

Central to this dispute is whether it is preferable to adopt a ‘functional classification system’, which would group together athletes with different disabilities but similar ability levels, or a ‘disability-specific classification system’, which would group together athletes with similar types of disabilities despite different capabilities. At least for the purposes of the quadrennial Paralympic Games, this question cannot be addressed adequately in isolation from the proper aims of the Paralympic Movement, including whether these aims are in contrast with, or even in tension with, those of elite able-bodied sport.

The second question concerns the appropriate relation between disabled and able-bodied sport. Specifically, should disabled athletes who use prosthetic limbs be allowed to compete in able-bodied sport? Oscar Pistorius was controversially permitted to compete in the 400m at the Olympic Games in 2012 (in addition to the 2012 Paralympic Games) despite using carbon-fibre prosthetic legs. Some objected that his prosthetic legs conferred him with an unfair advantage while others questioned whether the prosthetics precluded him from ‘running’ in the relevant sense at all (Edwards, 2008).

Finally, the practice of Therapeutic Use Exemptions (TUEs) operates in elite able-bodied and disability sport to allow athletes with chronic or temporary illness to use medication for therapeutic (as opposed to enhancement) purposes that they would otherwise be prohibited from using. This practice has proved controversial as the therapy/enhancement distinction is difficult to specify with precision (Daniels, 2000), and the system has been criticised as open to abuse. However, if the use of such substances were denied across the board, athletes with chronic conditions, for example, would effectively be excluded from sport on account of being unfairly disadvantaged (Pike, 2018).

3.8 The Aesthetics of Sport

While the ethical analysis of sport has been the central preoccupation of recent philosophy of sport, the last two decades has seen a revived interest in the aesthetic analysis of sport (Edgar, 2013b; Lacerda, 2012a). The study of aesthetics and sport has focused on two principal areas. The first concerns the relevance of aesthetic qualities to the experience of playing and watching sport. Does sport elicit aesthetic values? If so, what are these values and are they inherent to or only incidental to sport? The second examines the relationship between sport and art. Is sport one of the arts? If so, what makes sport an art? An early precursor of these discussions is C. L. R. James’ (1963) classic, Beyond a Boundary. In his seminal analysis of cricket, James explores the identity between sport and art, arguing that both yield aesthetic pleasure because they have been created to be beautiful.

Related to both of these concerns is whether the aesthetic appreciation of sport is distinctive, that is, different in kind to other forms of aesthetic appreciation. For Joseph Kupfer (1975), sport has multiple purposes. One of these purposes is to create aesthetically pleasant experiences. Stephen Mumford (2011) observes that the aesthetic values elicited by sports depend on the physical demands that each sport makes of participants. However, in Mumford’s view, all sports yield aesthetic experiences related to bodily motion and grace, high-level abstract forms, drama, and innovation and genius. Edgar (2012, 2013a) criticizes this view as narrow because it connects sport only to values related to harmony, neglecting the fact that sport is also ugly. Since sport yields aesthetic pleasure, James (1963) argues that sport should be seen as one of the arts. More recently, Spencer K. Wertz (1985; 1985), Hans Ulrich Gumbretch (2006), and Wolfgang Welsch (1999) have supported the idea that sport has aesthetic qualities and that sport should be regarded as an art. However, some have denied sport’s artistic credentials.

Eliseo Vivas (1959, p. 228) contends that, unlike aesthetic experiences, sport cannot be experienced disinterestedly. To do so, one must bracket an essential feature of sport: competition. For Maureen Kovich (1971), if athletes and spectators focused on the aesthetic aspects of sport, their preoccupation would be the observation and creation of art in movement rather than on scoring and winning. The main purpose of sport is to meet physical challenges and to compare oneself to others in doing so. For instance, in the high jump, the goal is to clear the bar by jumping over it. Athletes compete to see who can jump the highest, not the most beautifully. Dick Fosbury introduced the ‘flop’ not because it was more beautiful than previous techniques (i.e., scissors, western roll, and straddle jump), but because it was more effective (2007). To ignore the essential competitive elements of sport in favor of aesthetic principles is to fail to take sport seriously. To strengthen this claim, Paul Ziff (1974) argues that some sporting events have little or no aesthetic value. Often, athletes play dirty and achieve ugly victories. In support of this view, David Best (1974, 1985) argues that most athletes prefer an ugly victory than a defeat where they have performed gracefully. On this view, not only is aesthetics inessential to sport, but the pursuit of aesthetic purposes can undermine the achievement of sport’s main goals. Thus, Ray Elliot (1974) posits that the goddess of sport is not Beauty but Victory. Creating beauty should never be the main goal of sport. Aesthetics is incidental in sport, whereas, in art, it is the principal aim. Therefore, sport is not an art.

A further challenge to the idea that sport can be art is that art concerns something beyond itself, whereas sport concerns play and nothing in real life beyond play. For instance, an actor playing Hamlet is not Hamlet in real life. They represent the modern individual’s existential struggle. By contrast, a point guard in basketball is actually a point guard; point guards do not represent anything outside the game of basketball. In response, Kevin Krein (2008) and Tim L. Elcombe (2012) have argued that, like art, sports convey values and meanings external to sport that represent, or present an alternative to (in the case of non-traditional sports such as climbing and surfing), the culture in which sport practitioners find themselves. In Terrence J. Roberts’ (1995) view, athletes are ‘strong poets.’ They expresses something about our life situation as embodied agents (Mumford, 2014). Drawing on Nelson Goodman (1978), philosophers such as Edgar, Breivik, and Krein understand sport as worldmaking, that is, sport embraces and refigures symbolic worlds outside of sport, opening up new ways of describing, or making, such non-sporting worlds. Sport provides resources for re-describing the non-sporting world. Building upon this view of sport, Edgar (2013a) argues for a shift from sport aesthetics to sport hermeneutics, that is, to the interpretation of the meaning of sport and how that meaning is interpreted (see Lopez Frias & Edgar, 2016).


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