Charles Leslie Stevenson

First published Fri Apr 15, 2011; substantive revision Fri Jul 2, 2021

Charles Leslie Stevenson (1908–1979) was an American philosopher best known for his pioneering work in the field of metaethics (roughly: the study of the meaning and nature of moral language, thought, knowledge, and reality) and, specifically, as a central figure along with C. K. Ogden and I. A. Richards (1923) and A. J. Ayer (1936) in the development of emotivism. Emotivism, a precursor to the metaethical expressivism today championed by Simon Blackburn (1993, 1998), Alan Gibbard (1990, 2003), and Michael Ridge (2014), among others, is typically understood as a theory of moral language according to which ethical sentences may be usefully compared to exclamative and imperative sentences (‘Hooray!’, ‘Be kind’) in that they are used to express a speaker’s affective or noncognitive psychological states (such as approval or disapproval). This contrasts with views according to which the primary use of such sentences would be to describe some action, person, institution, etc. Stevenson’s emotivism, however, was more than a theory of moral language, his account of moral language was but one part of a metaethical theory, grounded in moral and linguistic psychology. It was intended to clarify the nature and structure of a whole range of normative problems common to everyday life—ethical, aesthetic, political, etc.—as well as the methods typically used to resolve them.

1. Life and Work

C. L. Stevenson was born in 1908 in Cincinnati, Ohio. In his youth, he developed a life-long passion for literature and the arts, especially poetry and music, whose power to influence a person’s emotions and actions fascinated him—a fascination that would remain at the center of Stevenson’s personal and professional life.

In 1926, Stevenson entered Yale University, earning a prize for best entrance examination for piano at the Yale School of Music. He graduated from Yale in 1930 with a B.A. in English Literature, a field he intended to pursue upon entering Cambridge University, England later that year. While at Cambridge, however, Stevenson became increasingly attracted to philosophy, in large part because of acquaintances with I. A. Richards, G. E. Moore, and Ludwig Wittgenstein. Each of these figures produced important, and different, kinds of work on the nature, analysis, and use of language, had strong personalities, and shared Stevenson’s love for literature, arts, and aesthetics. Stevenson earned his B.A. in Philosophy from Cambridge in 1933 and entered Harvard that same year to earn his Ph.D. in Philosophy, which he received in 1935. While at Harvard, Stevenson worked closely with Ralph Barton Perry, whose General Theory of Value (1926), conversant in early American pragmatism and early Continental phenomenology, had a lasting influence on Stevenson’s work (Sartris 1984; Warnock 1978).

Stevenson remained at Harvard as an instructor for three years until 1938, during which time three early essays were published in Mind: “The Emotive Meaning of Ethical Terms” (1937), “Ethical Judgments and Avoidability” (1938a), and “Persuasive Definitions” (1938b). In 1939, Stevenson accepted the position of Assistant Professor at Yale, where he remained until 1946, and during which time his landmark Ethics and Language was published in 1944. One of the conclusions Stevenson reached in this book was that some ethical disputes may be rationally irresolvable. Apparently on these grounds, and in the historical context of World War II atrocity, Stevenson was denied tenure.[1] The University of Michigan immediately offered Stevenson a position as Associate Professor, which he accepted, and where he remained until 1978. Stevenson’s most important articles in ethics are collected in Facts and Values (1963a), which also contains an informative retrospective essay (1963b) that clarifies, expands, and refines his mature views. His partly related work in aesthetics (e.g., 1950b, 1957, 1958) remains uncollected.

Stevenson passed away in 1979 in Bennington, Vermont, where he had moved to be near family and where he had accepted a position as Professor of Philosophy at Bennington College. He was survived by his second wife Nora, whom he married in 1965, after the death, two years earlier, of his first wife, Louise. With Louise, Stevenson had three children, including acclaimed poet Anne Stevenson.

2. Ethics and Psychology

2.1 Ethics, Metaethics, and Moral Problems

For Stevenson, a field of study is demarcated by the kinds of problems into which it inquires. Biology inquires into problems concerning life; history inquires into problems concerning past social events and cultural developments; etc. Ethics inquires into ethical problems, problems about what is good or bad, what ought to be done, how we ought to feel about something, etc. Ethical problems are ubiquitous. They are the “problems that are familiar in everyday discussions, and which range from idle bits of gossip about this or that man’s character to prolonged and serious discussions of international politics” (1963a, v). Stevenson conceives of his work as having “far less to say about the summum bonum of the philosophers than about the judgments of the ordinary” person as they finish “reading the morning’s newspaper” (1963a, v). He writes about his approach to the nature of moral problems as follows:

It requires us to abstract from the detailed subject matter of the problems and pay selective attention to the aspects of them that are most likely to prod us into problem solving. It requires us to see these aspects not from a moral point of view (which would attend any attempt to settle the problems) but rather from the point of view of an informal, common sense psychology. In effect, then, it asks for a generic description, given in psychological terms, of those ethical doubts and uncertainties, or discords and disagreements, that we often resolve by inquiry, deliberation, and discussion, but which on some occasions can lead us into an impasse, and on other occasions can induce us temporarily to suspend judgment, acknowledging that we are not yet in a position to come to a trustworthy conclusion. (1963b, 186–187)

Stevenson’s aim was that of “sharpening the tools” for the “legislators, editorialists, didactic novelists, clergymen, and moral philosophers” addressing ethical (and other normative) questions (1944,1). It is an interesting question how, precisely, the sharpened tools would help us in addressing such questions of normative ethics (Stevenson doesn’t say very much about this, but see 1944, Ch. 15) Quite independently of this issue, though, Stevenson’s insights into how moral problems arise and are dealt with in our lives as social, communicative beings, are of seminal importance to the development of metaethics.

2.2 Disagreement in Belief and Disagreement in Attitude

Moral problems can be interpersonal or personal. A moral problem is interpersonal when there is disagreement among two or more people and personal when an individual is uncertain about a moral issue. But what is the nature of this disagreement or uncertainty? These are the questions around which Stevenson organizes all of his work in metaethics and with which he begins both Ethics and Language (1944) and Facts and Values (1963a).

Interpersonal disagreement is of two broad kinds: disagreement in belief and disagreement in attitude. Very roughly, the idea is to distinguish between disagreement that involves opposed or incompatible beliefs and disagreement that involves opposed or incompatible attitudes: “the former is concerned with how matters are truthfully to be described and explained; the latter is concerned with how they are to be favored or disfavored, and hence with how they are to be shaped by human efforts” (1944, 4). Stevenson’s discussion of disagreement in attitude has been highly influential as a starting point for attempts to find an account of disagreement that would suit non-cognitivist, expressivist, or contextualist views in metaethics (see, e.g., Blackburn 1998, 69; Gibbard 2003, 65–71; Dreier 2009; Ridge 2013; Toppinen 2013, 272–280; Finlay 2017).

Disagreement in belief occurs when two people have beliefs that cannot both be true and “neither is content to let the belief of the other remain unchallenged” (1948b, 1). If Smith believes that their and Jones’s anniversary is in June, while Jones believes their anniversary is in July, their respective beliefs are incompatible, since they cannot both be true; but Smith and Jones only disagree in the sense that Stevenson mostly focuses on when they desire, need, or attempt to coordinate their beliefs, perhaps because they would like to celebrate their anniversary as close to their wedding date as possible. Their disagreement is resolved when they modify their beliefs in ways that make them compatible, or when both cease to care about coordinating their incompatible beliefs.

Analogously, disagreement in attitude occurs when two or more people have attitudes—e.g., desires, plans, or intentions, or other states whose general nature is that of being for or being against something (1948b, 2)—that cannot all be jointly satisfied (had, felt, etc.) and there is a desire, need, or attempt to coordinate those attitudes. Importantly, disagreement in attitude is to be distinguished from disagreement about attitudes, which is a kind of disagreement in belief (1948b, 3; see also 1944, 9–10). If Smith and Jones desire to dine together, but Smith desires to dine at a restaurant where there is music, while Jones desires to dine at a quiet restaurant, they disagree, in a quite ordinary sense of the term, about where to dine (1944, 3). This kind of disagreement, as Stevenson notes, “springs more from divergent preferences than from divergent beliefs, and will end when they both wish to go the same place” (1944, 3). For Stevenson, disagreement in attitude is a very common phenomenon:

Further examples are easily found. Mrs. A has social aspirations, and wants to move with the elite. Mr. A is easy-going, and loyal to his old friends. They accordingly disagree about what guests they will invite to their party. The curator of the museum wants to buy pictures by contemporary artists; some of his advisors prefer the purchase of old masters. They disagree. John’s mother is concerned about the dangers of playing football, and doesn’t want him to play. John, even though he agrees (in belief) about the dangers, wants to play anyhow. Again, they disagree. (1944, 3)

Agreement, Stevenson notes, may be dealt with “mainly by implication” (1944, 2–5). The accounts of disagreement and agreement differ in that while two persons only disagree when they have opposing beliefs or attitudes and when, moreover, at least one party to the dispute “has a motive for altering or calling into question” the belief or the attitude of the other, their agreement seems to be secured, on Stevenson’s view, simply in virtue of their having converging beliefs or attitudes (1944, 4–5). People may “neither agree nor disagree—as will happen when they are in a state of mutual indecision or irresolution,” or when they simply differ, “having divergent beliefs or attitudes without a sufficient motive for making them alike” (1944, 4–5)

Ridge (2013, 41–45) contrasts Stevenson’s account of disagreement with what he calls a Stevensonian view. The former demands that in order for two persons to disagree at least one must be motivated to coordinate the relevant beliefs or attitudes, whereas the latter only demands that the two persons have, roughly, beliefs that cannot be jointly true or attitudes that cannot be jointly satisfied. The former account of disagreement may seem implausible. It seems that two persons may disagree, both in belief and in attitude, without even being aware of the existence of each other (Ridge 2013, 45–49). The latter option, the Stevensonian view—which has been the more influential one in later discussions of the idea of a disagreement in attitude—avoids this problem (Ridge 2013, 41–43). However, Stevenson’s view plausibly was the Stevensonian one. We may distinguish between disagreement as a kind of activity—having a disagreement—and disagreement as a state (Cappelen & Hawthorne 2009, 60–61). While two people who are not aware of the existence of each other may be in a state of disagreement, they won’t be engaged in having a disagreement. Plausibly, Stevenson is operating with a distinction along these lines, and simply wishes to focus on disagreement in the sense of a kind of activity. This is understandable, given his focus on moral problems and on the ways of dealing with such problems. So, when Stevenson contrasts merely differing with having a disagreement (1944, 4–5 and 111) the contrast is plausibly meant to capture the contrast between merely being in a state of disagreement and having a disagreement. He writes, for instance:

There are times, of course, when people differ in their attitudes without having a sufficient motive for resolving the difference. They may feel that the difference will lead to no clash; they may be too timid, too aloof, or too economical of their time to make an issue of the matter; they may consider certain men too fixed in their ways to be changed, and others capable of leading their own lives. (Stevenson 1944, 111)

Clearly, in these sorts of cases, Stevenson sees the relevant people as disagreeing in an important sense, despite the fact that they see no point in engaging or in arguing with each other. Indeed, he then goes on to point out that in certain kind of circumstances (e.g., when concerted social action is needed) the motives for arguing in a way that “may change disagreement in attitude to agreement” become manifold—thus implicitly applying the notion of a disagreement in attitude also to a mere conflict of attitudes (1944, 112).

Stevenson does not assume that interpersonal disagreement always signals that one is intending to get another to change their beliefs or attitudes, to win the argument as it were. It may, and often is, the case that one is open to having their own beliefs or attitudes changed in the course of open-minded discussion or deliberation. Thus neither disagreement in belief nor disagreement in attitude need be an “occasion for forensic rivalry; it may be an occasion for an interchange of aims, with a reciprocal influence that both parties find to be beneficial” (1944, 4–5).

Uncertainty in attitude occurs when an individual is uncertain about how to feel or about what to do. For example, Smith may have conflicting attitudes about some particular legislation proposal (being in disagreement with themselves, so to speak). Alternatively, they may, while currently having no attitudes regarding the proposal, wish to determine whether to be for or against it, so that they can vote responsibly (1963b, 191–199; 1950a, 55–60). Stevenson doesn’t say much about uncertainty in belief, but it is, presumably, a matter of being disposed both to believe and to disbelieve some proposition, or of wanting to settle on a belief regarding some issue.

Especially in Ethics and Language, Stevenson’s focus is primarily on interpersonal disagreement rather than on personal uncertainty, but this is not because he would have deemed the latter less important. Rather, he is supposing that personal uncertainty may be usefully understood in terms of a person being in disagreement with themselves (1944, 131). However, Stevenson later came to have some regrets over the lack of emphasis on personal deliberation and uncertainty, which, he thought, also contributed to a somewhat misleading picture of interpersonal moral problems. In particular, he came to worry that this emphasis made it easy to think of his theory as downplaying the difficulty of moral questions and the preparedness of people to revise their moral views, and contributed to the impression that there would be “something more to ethics” than what Stevenson had been able to find (1963b, 186–194).

How, then, is the crucial distinction between beliefs and attitudes to be understood? Stevenson adopts a dispositional theory, according to which these states are distinguishable by their respective complex causal relations (1944, 7–8; 1950a). (More will be said about Stevenson’s view of dispositions in Section 3.2.) While he concedes that the complexity of the relevant dispositions makes them difficult to specify, he does think that beliefs and attitudes are easily distinguishable in our daily experience. Consider an onlooker who witnesses a chess expert open weakly against a novice and wonders:

Does he make the move because he believes that it is a strong one, or because out of charity to his opponent, he doesn’t want to make a strong one? The distinction here between a belief and a want (attitude) is certainly beyond any practical objection. One can imagine the expert, with constant beliefs about the opening, using it or not in accordance with his changing desires to win; or one can imagine him, with constant desires to win, using it or not in accordance with his changing beliefs. (1944, 7–8)

2.3 Moral Disagreement and Non-Cognitivism about Moral Judgment

Are moral problems essentially disagreements or uncertainties in belief, attitude, or both? Are moral judgments constituted by beliefs, attitudes, or both? Stevenson suggests that moral problems almost always involve both types of disagreement or uncertainty (1944, 11; 1948b, 4). For example, consider an ethical disagreement between a union representative and a company representative over an increase in employee wages:

Such an argument clearly represents a disagreement in attitude. The union is for higher wages; the company is against them, and neither is content to let the other’s attitude remain unchanged. In addition to this disagreement in attitude, of course, the argument may represent no little disagreement in belief. Perhaps the parties disagree about how much the cost of living has risen and how much the workers are suffering under the present wage scale. Or perhaps they disagree about the company’s earnings and the extent to which the company could raise wages and still operate at a profit. Like any typical ethical argument, then, this argument involves both disagreement in attitude and disagreement in belief. (1948b, 4)

However, although moral problems almost always involve both types of disagreement or uncertainty, their distinguishing feature is disagreement or uncertainty in attitude.

If the men come to agree in belief about all the factual matters they have considered, and if they continue to have divergent aims in spite of this … they will still have an ethical issue that is unresolved. But if they come to agree [in attitude], they will have brought their ethical issue to an end; and this will be so even though various beliefs … still remain debatable. Both men may conclude that these remaining beliefs, no matter how they are later settled, will have no decisive effect on their attitudes. (1944, 14–15; see also 1948b, 6)

Stevenson accepts, then, non-cognitivism, a view according to which moral judgments are essentially constituted at least in part by attitudes and moral disagreement is essentially disagreement in attitude. Stevenson’s main focus project is on developing, in sufficient detail, an attractive non-cognitivist account of moral problems, rather than on arguing for the superiority of non-cognitivism over the competing views (although see 1937; 1944, ch. 12; 1950a). However, he does support his claim that moral disagreements would essentially involve disagreement in attitude by considering a number of examples (e.g., 1944, 13–18; 1948b, 3–4). In addition to the kinds of cases mentioned above, Stevenson invites us to consider, for instance, a person who seems to be fully persuaded that what he did was wrong and, for that very reason, is more in favor of doing it again:

Temporarily puzzled to understand him, we shall be likely to conclude, ‘This is his paradoxical way of abusing what he considers our outworn moral conventions. He means to say that it is really all right to do it, and that one ought to do it flagrantly in order to discredit the many people who consider it wrong’. But whatever we may make of his meaning (and there are several other interpretations possible) we shall scarcely take seriously his protestations of agreement. Were we not trying all along to make him disapprove of his action? Would not his ethical agreement with us require that he share our disfavor—that he agree with us in attitude? (1944, 16–17)

Here Stevenson seems to appeal to motivational internalism, or to the idea that, roughly, a moral judgment is necessarily accompanied with having some motivation to act accordingly (see Section 3.2 of the entry on moral motivation), or with a favorable attitude toward acting in the relevant way. Indeed, elsewhere Stevenson notes that “‘goodness’ must have, so to speak, a magnetism”: a person who “recognizes X to be good must ipso facto acquire a stronger tendency to act in its favour” (1937, 16).

Interestingly, Stevenson suggests that a point in favor of his non-cognitivist or emotivist view is that it allows us to recognize “the cognitive content of ethics [...] in its full variety”—that “an emotive conception of ethics, so often criticized for depriving ethics of its thoughtful, reflective elements, has actually just the opposite effect” (1950a, 60). The idea is a variation on Moore’s (1903) Open Question Argument: Let us suppose that being good may be identified, as a matter of conceptual or meaning analysis, with having some descriptive feature, D—being promotive of survival, say. If one now wishes to determine whether some action would be good, it turns out that one only needs to consider its impact on the instantiation of Dness. This may be part of what is cognitively relevant. But it is at least possible to deem all sorts of descriptive features as relevant to determining what is good. And so most non-emotive accounts (Stevenson grants that there are exceptions) will be too restrictive regarding what may be deemed to be cognitively relevant to ethics (1950a, 60–63). One type of non-emotive view that would escape this argument is Moorean non-naturalism, according to which moral judgments are beliefs concerning sui generis, non-natural properties. Stevenson applauds such views for recognizing “an added factor” to the meaning of moral language that “the purely scientific analyses of ethics are accustomed to ignore,” but takes them to unnecessarily intellectualize the “emotive meaning into an indefinable quality” (1944, 272).

Stevenson also appeals, in passing, to an argument from the best explanation about the cause of the disparity of ethical views that often occur between people of widely different generations, ethnic or geographic locations. According Stevenson, the disparity is adequately explained if ethical disagreement were essentially disagreement in attitude, “for different temperaments, social needs, and group pressures would more directly and urgently lead these people to have opposed attitudes than it would lead them to have opposed factual beliefs” (1944, 18).

3. Language and Psychology

For Stevenson, language is an instrument or tool for serving certain purposes; ethical language is thus suited especially for the central purposes of ethics. Since the central purposes of ethics are to resolve or coordinate attitudes, an analysis of ethical language must reveal how ethical language serves these dynamic purposes. It does so, according to Stevenson, by having emotive meaning in addition to descriptive meaning, where meaning is to be cashed out in “pragmatic” or dispositional terms.

3.1 Pragmatic Meaning

Stevenson intends to provide a theory of emotive and descriptive meaning in the “pragmatic” or “psychological” sense, where this sense of ‘meaning’ invokes the work of Charles Morris. In Foundations of the Theory of Signs (1938), Morris had suggested a tripartite division of the study of signs into (i) syntax, the study of the relations among signs; (ii) semantics, the study of the relations among signs and their designations or denotations; and (iii) pragmatics, the study of signs as they are used by members of a community in order to “meet more satisfactorily their individual and common needs” (10), that is, the study of signs as they are used to coordinate mental and social life. Taking his cue from Morris, Stevenson seeks to provide a theory of meaning in terms of the “psychological reactions” of those who use the signs (1944, 42), and, then, to distinguish emotive and descriptive meaning by the different types of psychological reaction associated with the use of emotive and descriptive language respectively.

According to Stevenson, explaining emotive and descriptive meaning in this psychological sense of ‘meaning’ would be promising if it did not encounter an immediate problem that “has long been one of the most troublesome aspects of linguistic theory” (1944, 42; 1937, 20). The problem, as Stevenson saw it, is that the meaning of an expression must be relatively stable across a variety of social and linguistic contexts, lest the expression be unhelpful to our understanding of the many contexts in which the expression is used; however, the psychological states associated with an expression vary widely across social and linguistic contexts. At a football game, for example, ‘Hooray!’ may be shouted in connection with terrific excitement, but at other times with little emotion at all; likewise, to a postmaster who regularly sorts the mail, “‘Connecticut’ may cause only a toss of the hand, but for an old resident it may bring a train of reminiscences” (1944, 43). Similarly, the sentence ‘This legislation is just’ may be used to express a favorable attitude towards a particular piece of legislation, but not when embedded within the more complex sentence ‘Vote for this legislation only if it is just’. Thus,

Some variation (of psychological states) must of course be allowed, else we shall end with a fictitious entity, serene and thoroughly useless amid the complexities of actual practice; but ‘meaning’ is a term wanted for marking off something relatively constant amid these complexities, not merely for paying them deference. A sense is needed where a sign may ‘mean’ less than it ‘suggests’—a sense in which meanings are helpful to the understanding of many contexts, not some vagrant sense in which a word has a wholly different ‘meaning’ every time it is used. (1944, 43)

Stevenson’s task, then, is to provide a psychological theory of meaning according to which the psychological state associated with an expression’s use, and hence an expression’s meaning, remains relatively constant across contexts.

3.2 Dispositional Theory of Meaning

Stevenson’s solution to this problem of flux is to provide a dispositional theory of meaning grounded in the causal-historical relations between a sign and the psychological states of those within a linguistic community who have used and reacted to, and continue to use and react to, the sign. For Stevenson, a sign’s meaning is not constituted by its use on an occasion of utterance. Rather, a sign’s meaning is constituted by its power—its “tendency,” “potentiality,” “latent ability,” or “disposition” (1937, 20–22; 1944, 46; 1948a, 158)—to evoke the psychological states of a hearer or to express those of a speaker. The power of an expression, like the purchasing power of a dollar, or the stimulating power of coffee, is to be understood as a complex network of causal relations:

The word ‘disposition’ …, is useful in dealing with complicated causal situations, where some specified sort of event is a function of many variables. To illustrate … Although coffee often ‘causes’ stimulation, it is never the only cause. The degree of stimulation will depend as well on many other factors—the initial state of a man’s fatigue, the absorptive state of his stomach, the constitution of his nervous system, and so on. (1944, 46)

Just as the stimulating power of coffee remains relatively unchanged despite varied reactions or responses to the ingestion of coffee, so too does the meaning of an expression remain relatively unchanged despite varied psychological states resulting from or leading to the articulation of an expression (1944, 46–47).

The stimulating power of coffee, for instance, is a disposition constituted by a complex causal network consisting of: (i) stimuli, such as the variable amounts of coffee ingested; and (ii) responses, such as the resulting changes in energy, attention, anxiety, or irritation. These stimuli and responses are mediated by: (iii) attendant circumstances, such as a drinker’s fatigue at the time of ingestion, the absorptive rate of their stomach, or the constitution of their nervous system; and (iv) the basis of the disposition, such as the chemical composition of the coffee or the soil conditions where it was grown. The responses, then, are a function of the stimuli, attendant circumstances, and basis, and one who specifies these and who specifies in detail their correlation “has said all about the disposition that there is to say” (1944, 51).

The meaning of a term is the “conjunction” or union of two dispositions, one “active” disposition to evoke psychological states of a hearer, another “passive” disposition to be used to express the psychological states of a speaker, where a disposition is a complex causal network of stimuli (e.g., an utterance, in the case of a sign’s active disposition, or a mental state, in the case of a passive one), responses (e.g., a belief, in the case of an active disposition, or an utterance, in the case of a passive one), attendant circumstances (e.g., the context of utterance), and basis (perhaps the sign’s history of use within a linguistic community) (1944, 57–58). Stevenson warns that his account of meaning, understood in causal-dispositional terms, should not be taken as anything close to a complete theory of meaning, but only as “half analysis, half analogy,” “a device for pointing to” one that must be extraordinarily complex (1944, 58).

3.3 Emotive and Descriptive Meaning

For Stevenson, the meaning of a sign is, then, a complex dispositional property. Consequently, since the sentences of a language have distinguishable kinds of dispositions, they have distinguishable kinds of meaning.

The emotive meaning of a sign is a disposition that relates the sign to a range of attitudes (1944, 59–60). From a hearer or reader’s point of view, feelings or attitudes are the responses, tokens of the sign are the stimuli; from a speaker or writer’s point of view, attitudes are the stimuli, tokens of the sign are the responses. An attitude is itself a disposition whose stimuli and responses relate to “hindering or assisting” the object of the attitude, that which one is for or against (1944, 60). As a disposition, the emotive meaning of a sign remains relatively stable, though responses may vary across contexts given different attendant, or contextual, circumstances (1944, 60). Thus, a speaker’s utterance of “Hooray!” may be occasioned by excitement or, on rare occasion, even indifference; but the disposition of the sign to be used to express or to evoke these varying attitudes remains relatively stable, its stability a result of an “elaborate process of conditioning” that gives rise to linguistic conventions (1944, 60–62; for discussions of emotive meaning, more generally, and of Stevenson’s account, in particular, see, e.g., Stroll 1954, Kerner 1966, Urmson 1968, and Satris 1987).

The descriptive meaning of a sign is a disposition that relates the sign to a range of “cognitive” states, including belief, supposition, presumption, etc. From a hearer or reader’s point of view, cognitive states are the responses, tokens of the sign are the stimuli. From a speaker or writer’s point of view, cognitive states are the stimuli, tokens of the sign are the responses. Cognitive states, like attitudes, are complex dispositions. (1944, 62–71)

The emotive and descriptive meanings of signs are related in a variety of ways. Signs may have both emotive and descriptive meaning, and often do. Perhaps a noncontroversial example is the sentence ‘That was courageous’, whose descriptive meaning relates tokens of the sentence to cognitive states that, in some way, represent the action referred to as one performed in spite of an actor’s fear, and whose emotive meaning relates tokens of the sentence to favorable states, such as admiration towards the action or actor. According to Stevenson, almost all words in a natural language have both emotive and descriptive meaning owing to their historical uses in emotional contexts (1944, 71). The interplay of emotive and descriptive meaning is complex. For example, the word ‘democracy’ may have come to possess its laudatory emotive meaning in certain contexts because the word refers, via its descriptive meaning, to properties of government that are favored in these contexts. Under suitable circumstances, the word might retain its descriptive meaning and acquire a less laudatory emotive meaning, or change its descriptive meaning due to its emotive meaning remaining constant (1944, 72).

4. Ethics, Language, and Methods

Ethical language should be suitable for the purposes of ethics. Since, for Stevenson, the purposes of ethics are to settle, coordinate, or otherwise resolve disagreements in attitude (and ethical uncertainty), an analysis of ethical language must display how ethical language is apt for performing these functions. It is apt, according to Stevenson, because ethical language (i) almost always has both emotive and descriptive meaning, where (ii) emotive meaning is essential and (iii) often strongly independent of descriptive meaning (in the sense in which “thin” ethical terms, such as ‘good’, might be said to have emotive meaning that is strongly independent of any descriptive meaning it might have). That ethical language has essential emotive meaning—that is, has dispositions in which attitudes play a most prominent role—implies as it should that attitudes and feelings are at issue in cases of moral disagreement or uncertainty. That ethical language usually has both emotive and descriptive meanings which often interact in various ways suggests as it should that beliefs, and therefore rational methods, can be relevant to resolving moral disagreement or uncertainty. That emotive meaning is often strongly independent of descriptive meaning suggests as it should that nonrational “persuasive” methods can also play a role in settling or resolving moral disagreement or uncertainty.

4.1 Patterns of Analysis

Stevenson aims to clarify ethical language by using “tools” of analysis. One tool that Stevenson will not use to clarify ethical language is the tool of definition, at least in the sense of ‘definition’ that implies “finding synonym for synonym,” since he thinks that ethical terms, due to their emotive meanings, are indefinable in this sense (1944, 82). Rather, Stevenson’s analytic tool of choice is a set of models. The models highlight the respective dispositional elements (i.e. elements of meaning) of ethical language that, via its use, are to varying degrees in linguistic play (1944, chapters II, IV, and IX; see esp. 82–83; for discussion, see also Urmson 1968, chapters 4 and 6).

Two such models, labeled ‘(P1)’ and ‘(P4)’ below, receive a great deal of Stevenson’s attention, because they paradigmatically exemplify for the sentence ‘This is good’ what Stevenson calls respectively his “First Pattern” and “Second Pattern” of analysis (1944, chapters IV and IX). These patterns and, hence, (P1) and (P4) differ most importantly in descriptive richness and emotive force. (P1)’s descriptive content is scant, conveying only information about the speaker’s attitude and, therefore, conveying only somewhat more information than is conveyed by (P1)’s relatively strong emotive element; therefore, (P1) well-models those uses of an ethical sentence at which front and center is a speaker’s attitude. (P4)’s descriptive content conveys more complex, precise information about the qualities of which the speaker approves and merely characterizes ‘This is good’ as conveying emotive force; therefore, (P4) well-models those uses of an ethical sentence at which front and center are a speaker’s moral standards.

As models, (P1) and (P4) have different strengths and weaknesses, and while discussing them Stevenson suggests or implies several other models: (P2a)-(P3c). Like (P1), (P2a)-(P2c) exemplify Stevenson’s First Pattern of Analysis, and, like (P4), (P3a)-(P3c) exemplify Stevenson’s Second Pattern of Analysis. Notice that each subset of models, and each model within each subset, is listed roughly in order of increasing descriptive richness and decreasing emotive force.

Discussion begins with (P1), returning later to (P0a)–(P0d).

‘This is good’ means:

Approve of this!
Let’s all approve of this!
Hooray for this!
Hooray for this for being X, Y, and Z!
I approve of this; do so as well.
I approve of this; let’s all do so!
I approve of this; hooray for this!
I approve of this; how I wish we would all do so!
This is X; hooray for this!
This is X; hooray for things that are X!
This is X, Y, and Z; hooray for things that are X, Y, and Z!
This is X, Y, and Z [“except that ‘good’ has as well a laudatory emotive meaning which permits it to express the speaker’s approval and tends to evoke the approval of the hearer”]

Stevenson devotes a great deal of space in Ethics and Language discussing the various features and implications of (P1). However, despite its usefulness, (P1) is not be taken as some sort of “official” model of ethical sentences. Five of (P1)’s misleading features, acknowledged by Stevenson himself, are as follows:

Problem 1:
The imperative is “too blunt an instrument” (1944, 32), evoking attitudes in a overly aggressive, crude way. Moral claims, according to Stevenson, lead rather than command people to alter their attitudes and, so, the force of the judgment ‘This is good’ “has been poorly approximated” by (P1) (1944, 32–33).
Problem 2:
The imperative suggests that the purpose of moral deliberation and discussion is to convert others. Since the use of a second-person imperative implies a position of authority over one’s audience, this model gives the impression that the speaker or writer “wishes only to propagate his preconceived aims, without reconsidering them” (1944, 32). However, most moral claims are often occasioned not by a desire for “conquest,” but rather by a desire for mutual understanding (1944, 32).
Problem 3:
The declarative suggests that the descriptive element is often quite narrow and perhaps quite precise, when in point of fact it is often quite broad or complex and quite vague (1944, 33–34 and 206–213).
Problem 4:
The declarative fails to model the possibility of disagreement in belief, which intuitively is a part of many moral disagreements. Suppose, for example, that Smith declares that complimenting others is good, while Jones declares that complimenting others is bad, and that their disagreement is grounded in the conflict between Smith’s belief that complimenting others generally leads to a healthy degree of self-esteem and Jones’s belief that complimenting others too often leads to excessive pride. According to (P1), the descriptive element of Smith’s utterance is rendered ‘I approve of complimenting others’, while Jones’s utterance is rendered ‘I disapprove of complimenting others’ (1944, 22). But here, Smith and Jones disagree in belief not at all.
Problem 5:
The declarative implies, implausibly, that the full justification of a moral claim always requires the provision of reasons for believing that a speaker approves or disapproves of that to which she refers (1963b, 210–212).

Models (P2a)–(P2c) rectify Problems 1 and 2 to some degree. They lessen the blunt force and authoritativeness of the second-person imperative by using a more interpersonally agreeable first-person plural imperative, exclamative, and optative respectively. (P2a), because it retains an imperative, models better than (P2b) and (P2c) the dispositions of moral sentences to evoke an audience’s attitudes or behaviors. The latter two, containing instead an exclamative and optative respectively, model better than (P2a) the dispositions of moral sentences to express a speaker’s attitudes.

Models (P3a)–(P3c) rectify Problems 3-5 to some degree. Each suggests that the descriptive element in ethical sentences is more complex and perhaps more vague, suggesting as they do a more general description of an action, person, policy, etc. as exemplifying certain characteristics or properties, rather than the narrower and more precise description of a speaker as exemplifying a specific attitude. Thus, each allows that moral disagreement may be grounded in disagreement in belief—e.g., Smith and Jones can use ‘complimenting others is good’ and ‘complimenting others is not good’ respectively as a means of disagreeing in belief about whether complimenting others exemplifies property X (or Y or Z)—and, thereby, eliminates the implication that fully justifying a moral claim requires providing reasons for believing that a speaker has the particular attitude she is described as having.

Stevenson’s (P4), has a descriptive element that is more precise than (P3a)–(P3b). It also removes even a model of the emotive element, leaving instead just a characterization to the effect that some emotive element is present. Thus, unlike (P0a)–(P1), which place the dispositional relations between ethical terms and attitudes—i.e., emotive meaning—front and center, (P4) instead places front and center the dispositional relations between ethical terms and beliefs—i.e., descriptive meaning. (P4) thus captures the passive dispositions of ethical terms to be used as a result of a speaker or writer’s more specific cognitive states about the properties or characteristics of an action, person, etc., and the terms’ active dispositions to cause such cognitive states in an audience. Perhaps the more descriptive “thick” ethical terms, such as ‘cruel’, ‘kind’, or ‘courageous’ provide the best examples of terms that possess such dispositions.

Returning to (P0a)–(P0d), these rectify to some degree an additional problem, one that encumbers all of (P1)–(P4).

Problem 6:
It is often simply too difficult to determine whether the descriptive meaning of ethical language is strictly designated or merely suggested (1944, 85–87).

The distinction between ‘strictly designates’ and ‘suggests’ is most plausibly understood as invoking the distinction between semantics and pragmatics, or the distinction between that which is conveyed as a matter of convention or as a matter of conversational dynamics:

The distinction which the question presupposes, that between what ‘good’ means and what it suggests, is often beyond the precision of ordinary language. It is a distinction between descriptive dispositions of the term, one of which is preserved by linguistic rules and the other is not. In the rigorous discourse of science or mathematics, which avails itself of interrelated sets of definitions or formal postulates, the distinction is readily made. In the rough contexts of daily life, however, a great many rules are not stipulated, being imperfectly evident from people’s linguistic habits; and even those rules which are occasionally stipulated are not constantly followed. Certain rules, of course, are always observed; for ‘good’, whatever else, is ‘not bad’ and ‘not indifferent’. But many other rules remain as mere possibilities. If such a rule is specifically called to a person’s attention he may accept it—though usually only temporarily, for a given purpose. Not until a great many rules are permanently settled, though, do we get beyond the undecided region that separates descriptive meaning from suggestiveness. When rules are in the course of becoming generally accepted, there is a long period over which we may either accept or reject them without violence to conventional language. Our decision may settle the matter for our own usage, and determine what is afterward to be called the term’s descriptive meaning, and what is to be called its suggestiveness; but our finished product is by no means the same as the raw material. (1944, 86; see also 1948a, 154–158; 1963b, 208–210)

Thus, Stevenson’s distinction between ‘strictly designates’ and ‘suggests’ is plausibly captured by the later Gricean distinction between that which is “said” or “conventionally implicated” on the one hand, and that which is “conversationally implicated” on the other (Grice 1975). Models (P0a)–(P0d), then, are useful for reminding us that the “strict” meaning of ethical terms may include only its emotive meaning; if so, however, its descriptive meaning is strongly suggested and, thus, always remains in linguistic play (1944, 95–96).

4.2 Reason and Reasons

An ethical problem is essentially constituted by disagreement or uncertainty in attitude, though it is often constituted by disagreement or uncertainty in belief as well. Resolving an ethical problem, therefore, requires coordinating attitudes, sometimes by coordinating beliefs that causally affect those attitudes. Attitudes may be coordinated by methods that do not involve the use of language; physical force, bribery, and physical seduction are just a few nonlinguistic means of shaping and coordinating attitudes. Stevenson, however, is interested only in linguistic methods of coordinating attitudes, which he categorizes as either “rational” or “nonrational.” Rational methods seek to shape or coordinate attitudes by using language to produce reasons; Stevenson thus calls the set of such methods, aptly enough, “Reason.” Nonrational methods seek to shape or coordinate attitudes by using language in other ways; Stevenson calls this set of methods “Persuasion.”

A reason, for Stevenson, is “any statement about any matter of fact which any speaker considers likely to alter attitudes” (1944, 115). “Whether this reason will in fact support or oppose the judgment will depend,” Stevenson says, “on whether the hearer believes it, and upon whether if he does, it will actually make a difference to his attitudes; but it may conveniently be called a reason (though not necessarily a ‘valid’ one) regardless of whether it is accepted or not” (1944, 115). Thus, a reason is a statement whose content, if believed, is causally relevant to altering attitudes. (This may seem like a very surprising account of what it is to be a reason for some attitude; see also Section 5.1, below.)

Stevenson provides a plethora of examples throughout his work to clarify the variety of ways in which beliefs, in their intermediary roles, may serve to strengthen or weaken attitudes (1944, especially Chapters V, VI, VIII). For example, suppose that Smith disapproves of policies that put a great burden on the poor and make little difference to the rich. They say of a proposed policy that it is good. Assuming model (P1), Smith’s claim is akin to the claim “I approve of this policy; do so as well.” Assuming model (P3a), their claim is akin to the claim “This policy does not put great burden on the poor while making little difference to the rich; hooray for this policy.” Jones might then, in appealing to the claim that the policy puts great burden on the poor and makes little difference to the rich, alter Smith’s attitude toward the policy either by directly contradicting a belief of Smith’s (assuming model (P3a)) or by leading Smith to accept that they do not approve of the policy, which again contradicts their belief (assuming model (P1)). Here the impact of Smith’s newly acquired belief on their earlier moral judgments is due to the logical relation between the beliefs. Next consider a case where Smith hasn’t really thought about the policy before. They might nevertheless be disposed, upon coming to believe that the policy puts a great burden on the poor while making little difference to the rich, to disapprove of the policy. Here the newly acquired belief would not contradict an earlier belief of Smith’s, but it might nevertheless have an impact, thanks to a suitable psychological relation, on their beliefs and attitudes. Other sorts of examples, discussed by Stevenson, of reasons for attitude revision without a logical relation to existing beliefs include appeals to authority, or to the genealogy of beliefs or attitudes (1944, 123–125).

Thus, ethical inquiry and deliberation often proceeds rationally by presenting reasons to be for or against something, reasons whose effectiveness is tied to their logical or psychological relation to others’ beliefs (for criticism and further discussion of Stevenson’s account reasons, see, again, also Section 5.1).

4.3 Persuasion and Persuasive Definitions

Not all linguistic attempts to coordinate or settle attitudes appeal to reasons. For example, we often merely invoke or stress the purely emotive element of words, or use metaphor, intonation, pleasantness of speech or rhythm, and the like. These are all nonrational, but still linguistic, methods of settling and coordinating attitudes that Stevenson calls “Persuasion.” Consider, first, the many uses of thick ethical terms, such as ‘courageous’ or ‘democratic’. Often, we try to coordinate attitudes by invoking these words more for their emotive meanings than for their descriptive, especially when the descriptive meanings are taken for granted. Saying that one acted in the face of fear may be descriptively accurate; saying that one acted courageously, especially when all relevant parties already believe that one acted in the face of fear, is more likely an attempt to coordinate admiration among the parties. Consider also the persuasive strategy of repetition. Smith says that Jones did the right thing; asked for a reason, Smith merely states that Jones’s act was an instance of performing his duty. Here, Smith provides no reason at all, but merely attempts to coordinate positive attitudes by relying on the repeated effect of the emotive force of evaluative terms. For a different use of repetition, consider the persuasiveness of Martin Luther King, Jr.’s repetition of ‘I have a dream’ and ‘Let freedom ring’ during his “I Have a Dream” speech, delivered during the 1963 March on Washington. These are just a few examples of moral persuasion.

Persuasive techniques, according to Stevenson, play a vital role in attempts to modify the standards of a society or group. At the center of such reform is the use of what Stevenson calls “persuasive definition,” or attempts to give “a new conceptual meaning to a familiar word without substantially changing its emotive meaning, and which is used with the conscious or unconscious purpose of changing, by this means, the direction of people’s interests” (1938b, 32; 1944, chapter IX). Suppose Smith recognizes that Jones has had little formal education and uses grammatically incorrect sentences and obvious literary references and, on this basis, claims that Jones is simply not a person of “culture.” Rodriguez agrees that Jones has such qualities but claims that Jones is a person of culture notwithstanding, for “in the true and full sense of the term, ‘culture’ means imaginative sensitivity and originality,” and these qualities Jones has in abundance:

It will be obvious that [Rodriguez], in defining ‘culture’, was not simply introducing a convenient abbreviation, nor was he seeking to clarify ‘the’ common meaning of the term. His purpose was to redirect [Smith’s] attitudes, feeling that [Smith] was insufficiently appreciative of their friend’s merits. ‘Culture’ had and would continue to have, for people of their sort, a laudatory emotive meaning. The definition urged [Smith] to stop using the laudatory term to refer to grammatical niceties, literary allusions, and the rest, and to use it, instead, to refer to imaginative sensitivity and originality. In this manner, it sought to place the former qualities in a relatively poor light, and the latter in a fine one, and thus to redirect [Smith’s] admiration. When people learn to call something by a name rich in emotive meaning, they more readily admire it; and when they learn not to call it by such a name, they less readily admire it. The definition made use of this fact. It sought to change attitudes by changing names. (1944, 211–212; see also 1938b)

Persuasive definitions lie at the heart of much moral reform, whether for good or ill (1944, 209–210). “The words are prizes,” Stevenson writes, “which each man seeks to bestow on the qualities of his own choice” (1938b, 35).

5. Objections to Stevenson’s Emotivism

A number of objections have been leveled against Stevenson’s emotivism over the years. They fall within two categories, one related to Stevenson’s account of moral thought and metaphysics, the other to his account of moral language.

5.1 Objections to Stevenson’s Account of Moral Thought

Stevenson holds a non-cognitivist view, according to which moral judgments or thoughts are essentially constituted at least in part by desire-like attitudes, feelings, or interests, those mental states whose general character is to be for or against something. Several objections to Stevenson’s theory have been due to perceived implications of non-cognitivism.

Objection from Moral Properties. According to this objection, if non-cognitivism is true, then something is bad (good, evil, etc.) only if a person has an unfavorable attitude towards it; however, having such an attitude (the objection goes) cannot be a necessary condition for an event’s being bad (good, evil, etc.). Consider, for example, Blanshard’s (1949) example in which a rabbit has been caught in a severe hunting trap for several days, causing the rabbit unnecessary, prolonged, and extreme agony. According to Blanshard’s understanding of non-cognitivism, until a person has an unfavorable attitude towards such an event or state of affairs, the rabbit’s being in such agony would not be bad. Since (the objection continues) this conclusion is absurd, Stevenson’s account of moral thought must be false. However, this objection conflates Stevenson’s theory of moral thought with a theory of moral properties, assuming as it does that having, for example, an unfavorable attitude towards an event constitutes the badness of that event, at least in part. But this is the kind of moral metaphysics that Stevenson’s theory is designed to avoid. According to Stevenson, either there is nothing that constitutes badness (or goodness, etc.), because there are no such moral properties, or, perhaps better: questions concerning what constitutes the badness of an event are ethical questions of what to disapprove of—questions to which non-cognitivism as a metaethical theory offers no answers. Non-cognitivism is silent on what it is in virtue of which things have the moral properties that they have (if they have any). It just tells us what it is to think that something is bad.

Objection from Unemotional Moral Judgments. Blanshard also invites us to consider a person who thinks, with great contempt, that unnecessary, prolonged, extreme agony is bad and claims repeatedly that it is bad, still repeating the claim even a week later though fatigue has dissipated all contempt:

When we repeat the remark that such suffering was a bad thing, the feeling with which we made it last week may be at or near the vanishing point, but if we were asked whether we meant to say what we did before, we should certainly answer Yes. We should say that we made our point with feeling the first time and little or no feeling the second time, but that it was the same point we were making. And if we see that what we meant to say remains the same, while the feeling varies from intensity to near zero, it is not the feeling that we primarily meant to express. (1949, 45)

The possibility of continuing to think that a certain event is bad, even though the attitude or feeling with which one originally judged the event as bad has partially or even completely dissipated over time may seem incompatible with non-cognitivism. However, it is not clear that this is correct. Stevenson’s account of the meaning of evaluative judgments, given in complex dispositional terms (see Section 3.2), allows for considerable variability in terms of the kinds of feelings that may or may not attend a moral judgment. (Similar considerations would apply to the question regarding whether it is possible to hold a moral judgment without being suitably motivated. For discussion, see, e.g., Svavarsdóttir 1999.)

Objection from Moral Chaos. Stevenson grants that moral disagreement may sometimes be rationally irresolvable. Some might worry that if this is so, then moral chaos is likely to ensue. Taking this objection to heart, Blanshard goes as far as to claim that “[The general acceptance of strong emotivism] would, so far as one can see, be an international disaster” (1949). Stevenson could simply respond that even if true, this would not imply that his account of moral thought is false. However, he also suggests that such an objection arises from fear that cannot be assuaged by postulating some objective truth or robust moral properties awaiting to be discovered (e.g., 1944, 336 and 1950a, 68–70). Rather, such fear can be assuaged only when we have a clear, realistic understanding of the nature and complexity of moral disagreement and of the methods by which they can be, and often are, resolved:

The present analysis can afford no assurance that dictators and self-seeking politicians, whose skill in exhortation is so manifest, “inevitably must” fail, if left unopposed, in reshaping moral codes to serve their narrow interests. … But this much must be said: Those who cherish altruism, and look forward to a time when a stable society will be governed by farsighted men, will serve these ideals poorly by turning from present troubles to fancied realms. For these ideals, like all other attitudes, are not imposed upon human nature by esoteric forces; they are a part of human nature itself. If they are to become a more integral part of it, they must be fought for. They must be fought for with the words ‘right’ and ‘wrong’, else these attitude-molding weapons will be left to the use of opponents. And they must be supported with clear-minded reasons, else hypostatic obscurantism will bring contempt to the cause it is intended to plead. (1944, 110; see also 1961–62b)

Objection from Normativity. Stevenson writes that whether a statement, adduced as a reason in support of an ethical judgment, “will in fact support or oppose the judgment will depend on whether the hearer believes it, and upon whether if he does, it will actually make a difference to his attitudes,” and that such statement or consideration “may conveniently be called a reason (though not necessarily a ‘valid’ one) regardless of whether it is accepted or not” (1944, 115). It may easily seem, then, as if Stevenson would wish to explain what it is for some consideration, R, to count in favor of some action, for instance, in terms of the causal efficacy of citing R in producing the action in question, or in altering attitudes. It may seem as if he would wish to explain normativity, or normative authority, directly in terms of psychological impact. This may seem implausible, regardless of the details of the psychological story.

Objection from Irrelevant Reasons. Moreover, Stevenson’s account of reasons seems to deliver wrong results, as what is psychologically effective is not always normatively relevant. A colleague of Stevenson’s, Richard Brandt, put the worry as follows:

On the emotive theory, … if one is moved to disapprove socialized medicine by the thought that any expression of approval would oust him from his favorite club, he has been moved, according to the emotive theory, by as ethically relevant a consideration as any other he might have thought of. Now, I do not think this describes ordinary ethical thinking; we think some persuasive beliefs are distinctly irrelevant. (Brandt 1950a, 313)

The last two objections are based on a misunderstanding. We may give the response in Stevenson’s own words:

… to say that a reason is “relevant” to a judgment is sometimes to say that the reason … ought to make a difference to it. In this sense most people will agree that a man’s being ousted from his club is “irrelevant” to his judgment about socialized medicine; for they will feel his judgment ought not be influenced by such consideration. Whenever we say what a man’s reasons ought to be, we are making a judgment of our own about the way he reaches his judgment. That is an important thing to do, but it is not a part of the specialized task that I have set for myself. I have tried not to judge but only to understand what goes on in ethics—my metanormative inquiry being itself nonnormative. (1950c, 528)

So, Stevenson escapes the Objection from Normativity because he is not offering an account of normative authority, or of reasonhood, in terms of efficacy in modifying attitudes. And he escapes the Objection from Irrelevant Reasons because nothing in his theory suggests that what is ethically relevant, or what is a (good) reason for what, would be determined by such considerations of efficacy. There remains, of course, an interesting challenge regarding how, exactly, we should understand judgments about normative reasons, or about ethical relevance—an issue which Stevenson does not address in any detail (for Brandt’s concerns regarding what remarks Stevenson offers, see Brandt 1950b; for a more recent discussion of this challenge in the context of contemporary expressivist views, see Sinclair 2016).

Objection from Fallibility. An interesting challenge is articulated by Stevenson himself, regarding our judgments of ethical fallibility. The question here is whether Stevenson’s emotive theory allows us to “provide a proper place” for “our willingness to acknowledge that our judgments must often be held open to correction, as distinct from being proclaimed in a manner implying that we have said the last word” (1968, 203). We need (1) an account of expressions of ethical fallibility, and (2) an explanation for why it makes sense to acknowledge our fallibility, given the emotivist account of the phenomenon. So, first, what does an expression of ethical fallibility amount to, on the emotivist view? Stevenson suggests that just as we may acknowledge fallibility in belief by saying “Many things that I believe to be the case may not be the case,” we may also acknowledge fallibility in attitude by saying “Many things that meet with my approval may not be right” (1968, 206). The function of this sort of acknowledgement is to indicate that the speaker is “prepared, on further reflection,” to change their mind, which creates “hope for two-way discussion” and allays fears to the effect that the audience would be expected to listen to the speaker as their “disciples” (1968, 207–210). This preparedness to revise one’s attitudes is a matter of expecting that there are reasons for approving or disapproving that one has yet to consider (1968, 214–215). On Stevenson’s account of such reasons, it would then be a matter of thinking that there may be considerations such that ought to influence one to revise one’s attitudes. Stevenson’s brief remarks on the topic do not provide us with a detailed account of fallibility judgments, but it is suggestive of a later and much discussed proposal by Blackburn (1998, 318; for discussion, see Egan 2007 and, e.g., the literature cited in Bex-Priestley 2018).

Given the emotivist account of moral thought and discourse, does it make sense to acknowledge our fallibility? Stevenson puts the worry as follows:

We acknowledge our fallibility in science, it may be urged, because we are convinced that the universe, as studied by science, is in some sense “out there” to be described. … When we express beliefs about these facts, then, we are very far from being non-objective painters, who are free to make such designs as they will. Instead, we are realistic painters, intent on being faithful to what we are representing. Now it is our attempt to be faithful to the facts of the universe, it may be urged, that leads us to acknowledge our scientific fallibility. The facts may belie our beliefs, just as the objects that a realistic painter is painting may belie his picture. … But in ethics, the objection continues, so long as that discipline is conceived as involving an expression of attitudes, we have no such situation. We of necessity become non-objective painters rather than realistic painters, for we find nothing “out there” for our attitudes to represent. … And why, it may be asked, so long as we accept this conception of ethics, should we have any incentive to acknowledge our fallibility? (1968, 211–212)

Stevenson replies that this worry is mistaken both in what it expects for ethics and in what it expects for science. In the case of beliefs, too, we don’t first look directly at the facts and then to our beliefs (as we might compare our model with a portrait that we have painted), but rather “accumulate as many reasons as [we] can that bear on the question” (1968, 213). In both science and in ethics, what we worry about, in acknowledging our fallibility, is the possibility of there being reasons for beliefs or attitudes that we haven’t taken into consideration in forming our views. And in both cases, our acknowledgments of fallibility serve the important functions of encouraging further discussion and inquiry. Given the account of fallibility judgments provided by the emotive theory, there is no reason to think that our expressions of fallibility in ethics would have to be in any way half-hearted or capricious, and so our acknowledgments of fallibility in attitude make perfectly good sense (1968, 212–215). Or this is, in any case, Stevenson’s reply to the worry about fallibility, as he construes it.

5.2 Objections to Stevenson’s Account of Moral Language

Objections also arise in connection of Stevenson’s account of the meaning of moral language.

Objections from Illocutionary/Perlocutionary Conflation. Stevenson claims repeatedly that moral language is used to express a speaker’s attitudes or to evoke or otherwise shape the attitudes of others. One might worry that this involves conflation of illocutionary acts and perlocutionary intentions (e.g., Hare 1952 Section 1.7 and 1997 Sections 1–5–1.6; Urmson 1968). Illocutionary acts are the acts that a speaker performs in uttering a sentence: warning, advising, describing, commanding, and so on. Like sentences, illocutionary acts are subject to logical constraints—it would be logically inconsistent, in some intuitive sense, to direct one’s hearer to both close and open a particular window (‘Close that window and open that same window’), for example. Since sentences and the illocutionary acts they are typically used to perform have similar logical constraints, illocutionary acts may plausibly be associated in some appropriate way with the meanings of sentences. Now when a speaker performs an illocutionary act in uttering a sentence, she often does so with particular intentions or effects in mind. For example, knowing that her audience often attempts to annoy her by doing the opposite of what she asks, a speaker may utter ‘Keep the window closed’ with the intention that her audience will in fact open the window. Thus, there need be no logical inconsistency between directing one to keep a particular window closed and an intention that the window be opened. Thus, it is concluded, perlocutionary intention ought not be associated with the semantics or meanings of sentences. The Objection from Illocutionary/Perlocutionary Conflation, then, is that Stevenson’s theory of meaning incorporates that which is irrelevant to semantics, namely perlocutionary intentions. This objection is related to the next.

The Objection from Instrumentalism. Stevenson’s theory may seem to be an “instrumentalist” theory that explains the meaning of moral sentences by appealing to the illocutionary acts they are typically used to perform, that is, to their typical illocutionary forces. However, a great many uses of moral sentences fail to have such force. For example, when moral sentence 1 is used in utterances of sentences 2 or 3, it is used without its usual expressive force.

  1. Insulting others is wrong.
  2. If insulting others is wrong, I’ll stop.
  3. It is possible that insulting others is wrong.

Thus, the objection goes, Stevenson’s theory of meaning leaves too much unsaid about a great many uses of ethical language, and consequently, is radically incomplete.

These last two objections are understandable, given how often Stevenson appeals to the uses and purposes of moral language. Nevertheless, they miss their mark, for Stevenson’s theory of meaning is not an “instrumentalist” theory of meaning, but rather a dispositional theory (Section 3.2; Urmson 1968, Ch. 4; Warnock 1978, Ch. 3). Stevenson associates the meaning of a word or sentence with neither perlocutionary intentions nor with illocutionary force, but rather with the conjunction or union of its passive and active dispositions.

The Frege-Geach Objection. Because Stevenson’s theory is often thought to succumb to the Objection from Instrumentalism, it is also thought to succumb to the Frege-Geach Objection, perhaps the most pressing objection to any emotivist or expressivist theory of meaning. This objection is so-called because Peter Geach (1958, 1960, 1965), relying on insights from Frege (e.g., 1918), argued persuasively that a sentence’s illocutionary force cannot constitute its meaning. The strength of the Frege-Geach Objection arises from the fact that natural languages are compositional and, thus, that a minimal condition of adequacy on any semantic theory is that it specify that which sentences contribute to the more complex sentences into which they are embeddable. For example, a minimally adequate semantic theory for English will entail that the meaning of sentence 1. remains the same when it is embedded within sentences 2. or 3., since an understanding of the latter sentences rests on an understanding of their respective parts, including 1., and of the significance of the way those parts are combined. However, since (it is thought) Stevenson’s theory of meaning holds that moral sentences are used to express a speaker’s attitudes—i.e., used with expressive illocutionary force—and since moral sentences are often used as parts of more complex sentences without such expressive force, as in sentences 2. and 3., Stevenson has failed to provide a minimally adequate theory of meaning for moral sentences.

The Frege-Geach objection may ultimately undermine Stevenson’s theory of moral language, though not, as because his theory identifies a sentence’s meaning with the illocutionary force of its utterance. Associating a sentence’s meaning instead with the set of its passive and active dispositions, Stevenson’s theory of meaning implies that sentences will have relatively stable meanings across contexts of use (Sections 3.1 and 3.2), and therefore, that these dispositions might themselves be contributed to the more complex sentences into which they embed. Precisely how Stevenson’s dispositional theory could be extended to account for compositionality in this way is unclear, and Stevenson himself appears never to have been sufficiently worried by the Frege-Geach objection to respond to it. One idea would be that sentential operators, such as ‘if … then’ and ‘it is possible that’ be treated as functions from the dispositions of the component sentences to a resulting set of dispositions, where the latter would constitute the meaning of the complex sentence. Stevenson hints at such a possible extension of his theory while discussing the compositionality of atomic sentences:

No attempt has been made here to deal with one of the most difficult problems that meaning-theory includes—that of explaining how separate words, each one with its own meaning, can combine to yield sentence-meanings. It is feasible, perhaps, to take each word as having a disposition to affect cognition, just as the full sentence does. The problem reduces, then, to one of explaining the interplay of the dispositions of the several words, when realized conjointly. The analogy of the magnets will still serve, used now to illustrate the relationship of meanings rather than of beliefs. We may compare the meaning of each word with the disposition of some one of the magnets, and compare the meaning of the sentence with the disposition that may be assigned to the group of magnets. Each word has an independent meaning in the sense that if it is replaced by certain others in any context, there will be a typical sort of difference in the meaning of the context; but the precise way in which the word’s meaning is realized will depend on the meaning of the other words that accompany it. (1944, 67)

Since Stevenson suggests that he might explain the compositionality of atomic sentences in terms of functions from the dispositions of a sentence’s parts to a set of resulting dispositions, it is plausible that he might also wish to extend his theory in a similar way to explain the compositionality of complex sentences. Whether such a theory could sustain additional scrutiny is debatable. For more in-depth but accessible discussion of emotivist and expressivist attempts to respond to the Frege-Geach Objection, see especially Schroeder 2008 and 2010 and the entry on moral cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism.

6. Stevenson’s Legacy

Stevenson remains a central figure in current day metaethics, a result of his development of at least four key ideas:

  1. Progress in ethical theory begins by focusing in the first instance on moral thought—on what it is to think that something is good, bad, evil, etc.
  2. Moral thoughts are essentially constituted at least in part by attitudes or interests, that is, those feelings, attitudes, or other affective states that are most closely related to motivation and action, which can be generally characterized as states of being for or being against.
  3. Attitudes or interests can be, and often are, rationally governable.
  4. Moral sentences have both emotive and descriptive meaning.

These four ideas remain central to current day expressivists, such as Blackburn (1984, 1993) and Gibbard (1990, 2003), whose work arises especially from ideas 1–3. Indeed, the title of Gibbard 1990, Wise Choices, Apt Feelings, suggests all three ideas. Current day hybrid theorists and relational expressivists, such as David Copp (2001, 2009), Stephen Barker (2002), Michael Ridge (2006, 2014), Daniel Boisvert (2008), and Teemu Toppinen (2013) hold that moral language is used conventionally to express both beliefs and attitudes—or states of being in some suitably related belief- and attitude states—and, thereby, continue to develop in different ways Stevenson’s idea that moral sentences have both emotive and descriptive meaning (see also Schroeder 2009; 2013; Fletcher and Ridge 2014; Toppinen 2018).


Works by C. L. Stevenson Cited in This Article

  • 1937, “The Emotive Meaning of Ethical Terms,” reprinted in Stevenson 1963a, pp. 10–31.
  • 1938a, “Ethical Judgments and Avoidability,” reprinted in Stevenson 1963a, pp. 138–152.
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Other Internet Resources


The authors thank Giulio Pietroiusti for especially helpful discussion concerning Stevenson’s First and Second Patterns of analysis.

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Daniel Boisvert
Teemu Toppinen <>

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