Philosophy of Theater

First published Fri Nov 22, 2019

In contrast to Plato’s well-known disparagement of theatrical practices (in Republic, Books III and X, for example), Aristotle held in the Poetics that tragedy in theatrical performance, perhaps tragedy in particular, could have therapeutic value. Whether what he meant was a kind of cognitive therapy or a form of psychological therapy is a question that has vexed scholars to this day; and it turns on how one understands two terms: katharsis and mimesis (Schaper 1968; Golden 1973; Diamond 1989; Lear 1992; Woodruff 1992). This dispute is interesting first because it reflects the fact that theater has been a topic of philosophical dispute, investigation, use, or illustration since near the beginning of Western philosophy in the ancient Greek world. Second, its terms continue to have influence over current disputes within theater studies and performance theories (Puchner 2013). Finally, and primarily, it links descriptive metaphysical issues, such as what theater is by its nature, with normative issues, such as the value of theatrical performances within a culture. Several recent philosophical works emphasizing descriptive issues have attempted to understand just what is going on in theatrical performances and other performance arts (Saltz 1991a; Thom 1992; Osipovich 2006; Hamilton 2007; D. Davies 2011). This entry will focus largely on topics that are similar to or are themselves the issues examined in these works.

Philosophy of theater, like much else in aesthetics and philosophy of art, is wide in its scope and makes contact with many other disciplines within philosophy and outside of it. This entry should help make that clear. The first section of this entry will provide background information and describe an important normative issue derived from certain metaphysical and epistemic positions. The next three sections sort the issues in a way familiar among analytic philosophers in aesthetics and philosophy of art, according to whether the issues concern a) descriptions of instances of the art form, b) understanding (and interpretation) of instances of the form, and c) evaluations of such instances. However, some elements of theater not discussed in this entry are otherwise interesting in their own right, for example: the relationship between theater and music (and the special case of musical theater); the relationship between theater and dance (as a related but historically distinct kind of performance); the relationship between theater and architecture (which yields a focus upon scenography); the relation between acting and portraiture (people describe acting as “portraying a character”); the relationship between narratives in theater and narratives in video games (and questions about immersion and interactivity); the relationship between acting and story-telling; the relationship between theater and narratology (and the distinction between narrative and non-narrative theater); the relationship between theater with live human actors and theater with puppets; and so on.

1. Philosophy of Theater, Historical Diversity of Theatrical Traditions, and the “Anti-Theatrical Prejudice”

1.1 The Historical Diversity of Theatrical Traditions

Although some of the following contrasts have more to do with the means of theater than with its ends, the point is that, historically, theater never has had just one form.

Theater might be thought of as singular and unified. One reason for believing this has to do with the phenomenon known as “the anti-theatrical prejudice”, an animus towards theater that has been expressed by philosophers and theologians as well as theater theorists and practitioners (and that is more fully described in §1.3). While it has been alleged by some that distrust of theater practices is present in every culture, Jonas Barish, who coined the phrase “the anti-theatrical prejudice”, does not claim this kind of ubiquity. The idea that it is ubiquitous may be mere speculation and not based on any historical evidence. If it is not a universal, it represents a preoccupation arising in only one of the four regions of the globe in which theater originated as a distinct set of social practices aimed at portraying aspects of human life.

Other traditions appear to have originated in ways that are distinguishable from European theater (which originated in Athens). The African (Yoruba) tradition of theater emerged initially from masquerades celebrating ancestors (Adedeji 1969, 1972). Yet some traditions seem to have arrived fully formed: the Sanskrit Treatise on Theatre (Natya Shastra, Ghosh (trans) 1951) offers, at a very early time (somewhere between 200 BCE and 200 CE), a reasonably complete list of topics any treatise on theater that is focused on dramatics should include (acting, dance, music, dramatic construction, architecture, costuming, make-up, props, the organization of theater companies, the nature of audiences, theater competitions, and so on) (Schwartz 2004). Unlike Athenian theater, and its legend about the first actor, Thespis, human actors were not always the first evidence of theater. The early form of theater in the Han Dynasty in China consisted largely of shadow-puppet theater. The much later Tang Dynasty (618–907) is most famous for developing a form of theater that would be recognizable to Europeans as theater, were it not for the fact it was largely musical.

The diversity of theatrical forms is also revealed by the study of theatrical performances and their literatures that arose at different times within Japan. The oldest form is Noh theater (originating around 1300 and continuing to the present), which can be characterized not only by having different aims than its, possibly Chinese, predecessor form, but also by being largely dependent on its performers being proficient in either pantomime or vocal acrobatics or both. Bunraku, in contrast (originating around the mid-1500s and still being performed), is a form of theater that consists of large puppets with visible puppeteers dressed in black to imply invisibility, with the dialogue spoken by a single person who uses extensive vocal technique and range to present the language and expression of the different characters. Kabuki theater (beginning at the end of the 1500s) is also distinguishable from Noh theater, if not in subject matter (most of its subject matter comes from Noh or Bunraku theater), then in form because it employs dance, singing, pantomime, as well as physical acrobatics. Even more distinctive—and as distant from these predecessors as one can imagine—is Butoh (originating after World War II) that includes dance, performance, and abstract movement, in the service of challenges to public authority by means of presenting grotesque imagery, “forbidden” topics, as well as absurd environments and situations. Butoh is performed in white make-up and may be purely conceptual, having no movement at all.

1.2 Philosophical Underpinnings in Theater Studies and Performance Theory

Diversity in the histories and forms of theater has made it difficult for theorists within any theater tradition to arrive at a sound analysis that also has the promise of being extensionally adequate. This situation is exacerbated by the difficulty in drawing a distinction between philosophy of theater on the one hand, and theater studies or performance theory on the other. There are two ways in which this distinction may been drawn.

First, the discussion of theater in so-called “Analytic Philosophy” has rarely focused on the social or moral effects of theater (with Cavell 1987 as one exception). Those discussions have been mostly in the form of determining the epistemological and metaphysical status of the art form (Beardsley 1958; Danto 1981; Levinson 1996; D. Davies 2004; S. Davies 2006). But, in theater studies, performance theory, and so-called “Continental Philosophy” (Bergson 1889 [1910]; Deleuze 1968 [1994]; Heidegger 1950 [2008]; Badiou 1990 [2013]) theater frequently has been addressed in the form of criticisms or defenses of the practices of theater in terms of the moral or social effects those practices have had; although in most of those cases, ethical considerations have rested on metaphysical views.

Second, philosophy of theater might be distinguished from theater studies or performance theory by the following facts: most philosophical theories have emphasized descriptive issues, whereas most theater studies or performance theories have emphasized normative issues. Discussions of theater concerned with descriptive issues typically ask what acting and spectating are, what the relation is between theatrical practices and practices in other art forms, what theatrical criticism is, and so on. The contrasting normative theorizing can be illustrated by what theater theorist Philip Zarrilli has called “acting theories”, where we find particular ideologically inflected theories—e.g., by or based on Konstantin Stanislavski, Bertolt Brecht, and so on—specifying ways in which to act successfully in theater (Zarrilli 2002b: 3; Zarrilli 2007: 636).

One route to providing a sound analysis that has been taken in theater studies and performance theory, since at least the 1960s, has been to appeal to some broader understanding of the human condition found in philosophical reflections. This was possibly the expression of a hope that in philosophy one might find something more universal than theater itself; and if that led to fruitful explorations of theater practices, that would be a relevant form of imprimatur. However, as Marvin Carlson makes clear, theater artists are not different from artists of other kinds in reacting primarily to the thoughts and practices of their immediate artistic predecessors. So, although this route was taken by theorists, this is not the route taken in theater or performance practice. Moreover, any plausible way of making out what a theater or performance theory is—as for example, taking “theory” to refer to “statements of general principles regarding the methods, aims, functions, and characteristics” of theater—is unlikely to enable us to maintain a bright line between philosophy of theater and theater theory (Carlson 1984 [1993: 9]). Nevertheless, in an entry on the Philosophy of Theater, it is important to note this prominent theoretical strategy.

The most influential attempt of this kind rested on a popular set of theories about language owing much of their provenance to the work of linguist Ferdinand de Saussure (1916 [1977]) and to certain literary theories that Saussurean linguistics informed as well. This attempt was made in the form of semiotic theories of theater (Ubersfeld 1976 [1999]; Eco 1977; Elam 1980; Pavis 1982; Fischer-Lichte 1983 [1992]). These theater or performance theories involved applications from language, conceived as a sign-system, to the theatrical event, which was conceived of as either a single complicated sign-system or as a complicated conjunction of various sign-systems. And these theories continue to be influential in reflections on theater. But it soon became evident that the materiality of the actor’s body marked a limit of what can be analyzed in terms of semiotics, in terms of signs and meanings. For in some performances bodies seem not to mean something but to be something, namely, themselves (States 1985; Sofer 2003). Treating material things, such as props, as “signs” not only makes it difficult to say what is and what is not a material object, it also renders inexplicable the pleasure that spectators find in props and theater sets qua material objects. However, the materiality of the performer’s body and of props, while challenging to semiotic analysis, is not, at least according to some, a fact that presents an insuperable barrier to a more sophisticated semiotic theory. A standard (although partial) argument here is that, since anything can function as a prop for anything else in a theatrical performance, then anything just does act as a “sign” when it appears in a performance (Elam 1980).

In contrast, phenomenological theories of theater, resting on the philosophical phenomenology of either Edmund Husserl (1913 [1981]), Martin Heidegger (1950 [2008]), Maurice Merleau-Ponty (1945 [2012]), or Bruce Wilshire (1982), gave rise to phenomenological theories of theater (Carlson 1984 [1993], States 1985, Rayner 1994, Garner 1994). The motive for phenomenological theorizing about theater, in large part, had to do with retrieving for theater studies and performance theory the spectator’s appreciation of the materiality of what has been performed. The single most important achievements of this movement were a) putting the spectator’s position foremost and b) regarding the spectator as someone who engaged in processes of understanding on the basis of both cognitive and affective responses. Merleau-Ponty, for example, was famous for making the observer’s perception of the world paramount. This could have translated into spectator-centered theories of theater and theater cognition. Unfortunately, most phenomenological research of theatrical productions focuses on either the plays themselves, as works of dramatic literature, or on the techniques of staging, principally the actor’s techniques. This orientation towards the means of producing performances, rather than the conditions of their reception, is fairly common among theater studies and performance theory. As a result, the writings of many phenomenologically oriented theater or performance theorists only begin with descriptions of a spectator’s experience and the cognitive challenges spectators face. This often has had the effect of estranging their views from attempts to answer the classical questions of aesthetics and philosophy of art, which are often drawn from the point of view of the amateur spectator or audience (Kristeller 1951: 517–521).

Material offered by speech act theories in philosophy—by J. L. Austin (1962) and John Searle (1969)—have given rise to “speech act” theater studies and performance theories. This is perhaps because the idea of thinking of a word “not as [an expression of an] idea but as action, as gesture” was already a familiar albeit contested idea among such theorists (Carlson 1984 [1993: 398]). These philosophical theories about the nature of language utterance hold that there are more ways in which to communicate some attitude about a content than by asserting it first and only then expressing an attitude (see §3 of the entry on speech acts as well as §5.2 and §6.1 of the entry on assertion in this Encyclopedia). A performative utterance is one that aims at achieving some state of affairs in the world rather than reporting whether the state of affairs obtains, and such an utterance could fail due to certain “infelicities” of circumstance of speaker, listener, or environment. Interestingly both Austin and Searle thought that the utterances of actors, because actors were merely pretending to do things (see §2.2), were not genuinely performative utterances. However, these ideas about performative utterances gave rise to views like Judith Butler’s—who used them in an argument, specifically with respect to gender, that we should “take the social agent as an object rather than the subject of [a] constitutive [speech] act” and that we should

understand constituting acts not only as constituting the identity of the actor, but as constituting that identity as a compelling illusion, an object of belief. (Butler 1988: 520)

More to the point of this entry, the ideas of Austin and Searle also gave rise to the thinking of theorists focused mainly on what performance or theater could be or do (Saltz 1991a; Rozik 1993).

In contrast to the four fairly separate disciplines that are involved here—philosophy, philosophy of theater, performance theory and theater studies, together with performance and theater practices—a recent view suggests there is but one overarching discipline, namely “performance philosophy”, wherein performance is its own kind of thinking which is, itself, a kind of philosophizing. This recent view is not, at least currently, widely credited either by philosophers of theater or very many theater or performance theorists (Puchner 2013). But it is now the basis of a new discipline with its own professional association and its own journal. Like many theater or performance theories, it takes its inspirations from philosophers, notably Gilles Deleuze (1968 [1994]) and Francois Laruelle (1996 [2013]).

To see how this goes, first suppose one argues that thinking about theater can be teased apart into three distinct practices: the philosophy of theater which is concerned with

clarifying and/or defining the central concepts that organize the practices of theater…, scrutinizing what those concepts entail…, and identifying and addressing the disjunctions, anomalies, contradictions, and paradoxes that combining concepts sometimes entails;

theater theory which yields empirical results about the actual practices of theater, “isolating the component parts of theatre and explaining how they operate”, whether as a kind of “reverse engineering” characteristic of the “scholarly theatre theorist” or as a “search for general empirical principles or methods that will bring about coveted results” as is characteristic of the “practical theatre theorist;” and criticism which is also empirical but “preoccupied with saying what is special about the [particular] works in question” (Carroll and Banes 2001: 158, 159, 160). Then second, if one thinks this might not be a mistaken view of the nature of philosophical reflection so much as a “narrow view” of what philosophical reflection might amount to, one might instead conceive of “performance as a site for immanent thought” and seek to avoid the implication that the only thing theatrical performance can do is illustrate a theory or a bit of philosophical reflection (Cull 2013; Cull Ó Maoilearca 2018).

1.3 The “Anti-Theatrical Prejudice”

The so-called “anti-theatrical prejudice” has been a feature of Western European theater since the very beginnings of both theater and philosophy. It is, moreover, an issue that theater studies and performance theory have focused a fair amount of attention upon. Jonas Barish identified its roots in the dispute, referred to in the Introduction to this entry, between Plato and Aristotle over the notion of mimesis and the value of theatrical practices within the good city (Barish 1966, 1981). Two later periods of philosophical reflection on human practices stand out as concerned nearly exclusively with the morality of theatrical practices themselves: during the period of the early Latin Church fathers, and during the eighteenth century (Tertullian and Jean Jacques Rousseau are good examples). The degree to which the distrust of theater in these periods was grounded in the earlier differences between the ways Plato and Aristotle had understood mimesis is still much debated (Puchner 2013). The interest in and estimations of the social and moral effects of theatrical practices, on which the alleged “prejudice” has been grounded, staged a resurgence in the literary and artistic period known as Romanticism (Friedrich Nietzsche and John S. Mill are good examples). And this worry about, or even a distrust of, theatricality has continued into the present, but interestingly enough, now among theater practitioners and theorists themselves (Schechner 1992, and both Bertolt Brecht and Samuel Beckett provide good examples, see also Puchner 2001).

However, this viewpoint is often grounded in metaphysical and epistemic questions about what a theatrical performance is and how a spectator understands a theatrical performance of some kind (for example, as a literary performance or one that is actual and physical). This viewpoint is also often motivated by moral and social views, not just about performances but also about performers. But it is often not clear what relationship this viewpoint has to the actual practices of the art form (Puchner 2013: 548). So even if the motivations for the view can and should be criticized, the viewpoint often seems to be less “a prejudice” than a considered judgment resting on prior argued-for epistemic, metaphysical, or moral positions. And this leads one to wonder if there is anything special, or especially troubling, about the general social or moral problems associated with theater in these periods at all. In short, it is difficult to determine whether and when this animus is actually aberrant—and genuinely prejudicial—or if it is of a piece with standard examinations of social and moral effects of theatrical practices. That said, it is worth noting that suspicion of theatrical practices seems to be a persistently recurring and characteristic attitude within Western European philosophical, social, and political traditions.

2. Describing an Instance of Theater

2.1 Ontological Questions

What is a work of art? Are all works of art alike? How so, or how not? When asked to determine what sentences are about, philosophers often will want to know what objects, properties, or relationships the objects of a certain bit of human discourse are and what the referents of its nominal and pronominal phrases are. The answers to these questions might well be taken to be the basic ontology of that discourse. In this sense, the word “ontology” is playing the same role it plays in, for example, computer science: and it answers the question, “What is there?” The most common practice in doing ontology of art is to use a roughly Quinean approach (Quine 1948) since it seems a fairly pragmatic way to undertake the initial task in the ontology of art (see Pettersson 2009 for a detailed discussion). Dissenters from this common practice have often pursued mereological accounts (in terms of parts and wholes) of how certain ostensible “multiple instances” of works of art are related to the works themselves (Cook 2011; Hackett 2017).

But some cast doubt on the utility of terms like “works of art” and “artworks” altogether, arguing that, at least with respect to literary and musical communication, the choices open to us seem to be language-dependent in a way that makes it dubious to construe them as elements in “the basic furniture of the world”, so to speak, even if there is nothing intrinsically problematic within our ordinary descriptions of art using these terms (Rudner 1950; Cameron 2008; Pettersson 2009; but for arguments for the indispensability of works-talk see S. Davies 2003). And others raise the equally serious question about whether all events and objects that we describe as art can be distinguished cleanly into single-instance and multiple-instance objects or events (Currie 1988; Hazlett 2012), largely on the grounds that any work of art can be repeatable and that the alleged distinction turns out to be an artifact of our current technological capabilities rather than an enduring feature of some kinds of art.

That said, many philosophers who have accepted the terms “works of art” or “artworks” have also accepted some distinction between multiple-instance and single-instance works of art. Allan Hazlett begins an essay on repeatable artworks, ones that have multiple instances, this way:

There seem to be repeatable artworks. Plays and musical works, like Shakespeare’s Hamlet or Mussorgsky’s “Pictures at an Exhibition”, can be performed again and again; installations, like Sol LeWitt’s Wall Drawing #260 (1975), can be installed over and over; dishes of food, like Jean-George Vongerichten’s tuna tartare, can be prepared many times (Hazlett 2012: 161).

In light of this distinction, determining the kind of entities works of art are depends upon explaining and defending one of the following proposals:

  1. the view using C. S. Peirce’s (1906) “type/token” distinction, wherein some works are themselves both tokens and types and others are types that take multiple instances as their tokens;
  2. the view that all works of art are extended individuals and what appear to be mere instances are, in fact, parts of the larger whole work;
  3. the view that works of art are instances of “norm kinds”, wherein they function as types (or kinds) and also have a normative dimension that enables us to determine if instances of the kind are properly or improperly formed; and
  4. the view that works of music, dance, and theater are “stages” of “perduring” objects and events

(see §4 of the entry on the history of the ontology of art and Rohrbach’s article (2012) in the Routledge Encyclopedia of Aesthetics, third edition, for in-depth surveys of these views; and also see work by Peirce 1906: 505ff.; Wolterstorff 1980; Predelli 2001, S. Davies 2003; D. Davies 2004, Thomasson 2005; Dodd 2012; and Moruzzi 2018.

One striking feature of the disputes about these proposals is that each of these proposals makes sense of one class of them but has difficulty explaining—or explaining away—certain others of them. This may be due in part to the wide diversity among artistic events and objects. But, whatever the cause, one result is that “increasingly, the very rules of engagements are as much the topic of philosophical dispute as the ontological proposals themselves” (Rohrbaugh 2012).

When it comes to narrowing down to the ontology of theater there are more specific questions that make any approach to the ontology of theater more difficult. The first question concerns how we determine what one must say there is within the discourse of theater. On the common view outlined above, the most basic ontological question is “What do we (have to) say there is?” with respect to some domain of discourse (Quine 1948). On the Quinean view one should first determine what the best empirical theory is in some field of inquiry, second regiment that theory in terms of some system of formal logic, and then, thirdly, ask what objects satisfy the existentially quantified variables within that regimented discourse. That will be the ontology of that field of inquiry. But before we can ask what one must say there is with respect to theater, one first must ask what the discourse is that generates the descriptive facts over which the variables of quantification are supposed to range. That is, to what discourse is this method for determining the ontology of theater to be applied? Any answer we can currently give to this question will be the devastating observation that what exactly the descriptive facts are that are discussed in the relevant discourse, and thus what the actual discourse is, are themselves questions that are not actually settled.

The second, and perhaps the more practically pressing of the two more specific questions that must be asked regarding theater, is “What exactly are instances of theater: performances, productions, or illustrations of dramatic literature?” It is commonly assumed by theater or performance theorists that the correct answer is “performances”. But this is both far from clear and under-argued (see Hamilton 2007: 3–16 for a discussion of this point). One way to address this question is to ask a more fundamental question about theater, as Paul Woodruff does (2008): what is it to make something worth watching? Another is to ask, as David Saltz, James Hamilton, Noel Carroll do (2001): what it is that people are interpreting and evaluating when they discuss theatrical performances and what is an interpretation? Yet another is to ask, as David Osipovich does (2006): what is a theatrical performance actually like in the experience of those who present it and those who attend it at the time of the performance itself? And a further is to ask, as W. B. Worthen (2007) and Hamilton (2009a) have: what is the relation between performances/productions and texts—i.e., specifically in relation to works of dramatic literature? Once again, “the rules of engagement”, as Rohrbaugh calls them, are as much disputed as the proposals themselves.

Notably, the methods for responding to this question seem to be epistemic rather than ontological—that is, they seek to defend an answer to the question based on the role each of the possible answers would play in our reasoning about theatrical performances. And they seem to yield no distinctive proposals regarding the ontology of theater. Moreover, to the extent they do yield such proposals, they often seem to offer empirical, rather than a priori, evidence to support the answer their view entails (Fine 2012). Thus, the standard answers to the second question—which certainly appears to be ontological—point in a different direction, namely to epistemic concerns about how we know what it is we know about theatrical performances and less about what we must say there is. And this is despite the fact that, in Carroll’s case at least, the answer is derived from a general ontological view, namely, his widely discussed view about the ontology of mass art.

2.2 Theater and Performance

So far, this entry has treated theatrical performance and performance art as fundamentally the same. But that is regarded as a contentious standpoint by some theater and performance theorists. And the distinction between theater and performance, even if only alleged, has been a growing concern in theater studies and performance theories since at least the beginnings of the twentieth century, when Spingarn and Matthews debated whether one should emphasize either the “theatricality” of theater or the adherence of a performance to a written script (Matthews 1910; Spingarn 1911 [1931]). Their debate concerned text-based theater, and they each thought of “performance” in terms of theatrical performances of texts. But the wrinkle is that if there is a profound difference between performance as an art and theater as an art, then before one can describe an instance of theater, one has to know it is one and not an instance of performance art instead.

Despite the differences in the background thinking used in developing their theories, some theater studies and performance theorists have nevertheless held one view in common, namely, that there is a distinct difference between acting and performance. Roughly that difference has been explained this way: when acting one is not being oneself, but one is being oneself when performing. This has turned out to be a troubled explanation. For what then are we to say about the actor in a play—the real, flesh and blood actor (Auslander 1986 [2002])?[1]

A leading approach to this problem in theater studies and performance theory relies on anthropological investigations into ritual, turning them into a theory of performance that distinguishes between the role of performer and the role of actor as exhibiting different kinds of human behavior (Turner 1982; Schechner 1988). This way of distinguishing between the practice of theater and the practice of performance has been persuasive to some theater and performance theorists because of a feature of the avant garde theater practices in the traditions of Antonin Artaud and Jerzy Grotowski (Artaud 1938 [1958]; Grotowski 1968 [2002]). It is alleged that in those practices the actor seeks to be, or at least to appear to be, metaphysically present to the spectator—appearing to speak spontaneously even when scripted, appearing to have authority in the theater about the direction of the plot, again even when scripted, and appearing to deliver words that are meant, perhaps unambiguously, and could be taken as though spontaneously delivered. In the latter case especially, actors re-enforced what theorists following Derrida called “logocentrism”. In contrast, some theorists held the performer (the non-actor) is free to be, as it were, “absent” (Fuchs 1986).

Responding to the challenge posed by these proposals, and noting both the absence of any definition of performance and any attention to the historical facts about the ways the relevant practices actually developed (see §3.1 below), it has been argued that the most plausible way to characterize “performance” has its roots in standard ethnological and ethological theories, and characterizes “performance” as a kind of “display behavior” that is exhibited by members of various species, including our own (Hamilton 2013). In this account, however, performance is not an alternative to acting but more like acting’s “genus” to which it corresponds as a “species”.

If right, this would dissolve the issues raised among performance and theater theorists. For rather than being different kinds of human behavior, they would be modeled as the same kind, but with different scope. However this proposal confronts a robust history of thought to the contrary, conflicts with a sizable amount of the common discourses among theater and performance artists themselves, and challenges the leading theory of acting among those philosophers and cognitive scientists who study the phenomena of pretense and imagination, and who either might or do think of acting as pretending rather than as display behavior (Searle 1975; Lewis 1978; Harris et al. 1993; Kavanaugh and Harris 1999; Nicholls and Stitch 2000; Goldstein and Bloom 2011; Brown 2017).

3. Understanding a Theatrical Performance

3.1 Recognizing an Instance

If, as historically has been claimed, there is nothing more to theatrical performances than illustrations of a text (Spingarn 1911 [1931]), then there might be a quick way to answer the question, “How does a spectator recognize an instance of theater?”: to encounter an instance of theater is nothing more than to encounter a dramatic text. But, even so, you must still figure out precisely what sort of illustration of a text a live performance is (Worthen 2007). If one takes the view that one should think of a theatrical performance as something to be described, interpreted, and evaluated on its own terms, there is much more to do (Hamilton 2007).

This may seem obvious: one encounters an instance of theatrical performance by means of the senses and by their typical operation, leading to a recognition of the social form, assuming there is a social form of sufficient familiarity. But, even when everything in a spectator’s repertoire of sensory apparati and social nous is functioning normally, there is a problem with any spectator’s ability to discern genuinely theatrical behavior from the non-theatrical.

One source of this problem is the phenomenon sometimes called “the theatricality of everyday life”. Suppose human beings present themselves in everyday life and that they do so in the same ways that actors do. How then could anyone tell if/when someone else is acting or not (Goffman 1959)? The easy answer to this has to do with framing effects. A person is acting only if they are performing for an audience on stage (Thom 1992). That is, they act only if they are within a socially agreed upon frame. And, indeed this is the answer that Erving Goffman gives to his own question.

This problem also arises from considering the differences between artistic performance and performance art (see §2.2 above). Noël Carroll has argued there is no definition of “performance” in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions, but only coincidental histories. In the 1960s, theater performers became dissatisfied with the forms and institutions of theater and found they could express those dissatisfactions more readily in the context of gallery spaces in which they were allowed the freedom to carry out theatrical experimentation. At the same time, artists became dissatisfied with the forms and institutions of the “artworld”—museums and galleries—and found they could express those dissatisfactions in the form of performances that—coincidentally—looked a lot like theatrical performance (Carroll 1986a). But if this is the case, how can anyone tell whether one has encountered a case of what Carroll called “artistic performance” or of what he and many others have called “performance art”? The natural answer is historical and empirical: either it does not, nor should not, matter which one it is or, if it does matter, then probably one can have an answer if one can detect which institution is being challenged.

The most natural way to respond to the problem with a spectator’s ability to discern a theatrical performance is by appeal to some sort of institution or framing device. But such an answer to this problem has the following challenge to consider: in Augusto Boal’s so-called “invisible theater”, audiences are usually unaware that some of the people around them are actors, acting out a prepared script or scenario, getting a conversation going, and being prepared to leave their audience to continue to discuss the issues raised by the actors, usually about class distinctions and exploitation (Boal 1974 [1979: 143–147]). The challenge is that actors in “invisible theater” have eliminated the very institutions or frames that are assumed to be available to spectators.

Boal calls this kind of activity “theater” because it involves actors, scripts or scenarios, and audiences. One might argue that in these circumstances there is not, in fact, an audience, for they certainly do not recognize themselves as such. If an audience member’s self-recognition of her social role, qua audience, is necessary for an event’s counting as theater—and not merely her presence in that role—then Boal is simply mistaken in calling it theater, although it might be “theatrical” in some tenuous sense.

A substantial literature has developed concerning the question whether the presence of an audience is necessary for a theatrical event. Paul Woodruff defines theatrical performances as events in which someone makes something “worth watching” (Woodruff 2008: 18). He also claims that nothing is a theatrical event—although it may be a performance—unless there actually is someone watching. However, one could define theater as the making of something worth watching even if no one is watching it; and something should tie these two thoughts together. Paul Thom (1992) does supply a connection—because he, like some theater theorists, thinks of theater in terms of speech acts and holds that theater addresses its audience by uttering an imperative addressed to a particular subject ordering them to attend to the one making the utterance. This seems, at least, to require there be an addressee (but see D. Davies 2011: 173, for a contrary view). David Osipovich (2006) has held a similar view to Thom’s but for a different kind of reason. Osipovich’s view is based on the demonstrable fact that performers respond to their audiences. They do this, for example, when feeling the “heat” or the “chill” of an audience and sometimes adjust their performance to fit the audience they have at a given performance. It follows from this that any performance will be different in some respects from any other performance. A different view from these holds that a theatrical performance is still a theatrical performance even if there is no audience. This is because, although the performance may be prepared with an audience in mind, the presence of the audience is not required for the display of the routine that constitutes the performance. It just happens not to be displayed to anyone (Hamilton 2007; D. Davies 2011).

To respond adequately to Boal’s challenge, views like Thom’s, Osipovich’s, and possibly Woodruff’s need to answer a further question—whether an audience must not only be present as an audience but also be aware of their role qua audience. Yet, on the views of Hamilton and Davies, one need not ask this question because audiences do not even need to be present in order for there to be a performance. But, assuming we can credit Boal’s case of “invisible theatre” as a case of theater, it suggests there are two classes of theatrical performances, one in which spectators do not know that there is a performance at all and one in which spectators can determine, either by explicit appeal to or an implicit reliance upon an institution or a set of framing social practices, that they are watching, hearing, smelling (and perhaps tasting or touching) a theatrical performance that engages them. And the latter is by far the larger of the two classes.

3.2 Perception and Grasping a Performance

Moreover Boal’s “invisible theatre” also suggests two further things: one an observation; the other a question. The observation is that the pull of Boal’s case is felt because the interaction between spectators and performers can be explained as consisting only of the ordinary uses of one’s sensory apparatus. Second, Boal’s “invisible theatre” prompts the non-skeptical question, namely, how do spectators grasp and understand the content of theatrical performances in either of the two classes?

A straightforward answer to the question is given in terms of the observation, namely, “by means of the senses”. This answer invokes an idea of human perception and attention that is naturalistic, requiring us to appeal to nothing more than the basic features of perception and attention that are studied empirically by psychologists and neuropsychologists. This leaves room for philosophers of theater—and other philosophers of art—to discuss what the objects of attention and perception are in theatrical performances and other forms of art. For example, one suggestion that might be made with regard to theater and performances is that the objects attended to in them are the gestures, sounds, and speeches presented by performers and the props, sets, and so on, displayed in the performance (Melinger and Levelt 2004; Novack and Goldin-Meadow 2017); and the mechanism by which this happens is deliverable by standard empirical psychology (Rutherford and Kuhlmeier 2013). Moreover, it will be useful to philosophers of art and aesthetics to note that most perception is, as our colleagues in neuroscience and neuroaesthetics say, “cross-modal”, involving information delivered by more than one sense modality (Driver and Spence 2004; Kastner 2004; Nanay 2012; Seeley 2013). But, assuming this is on the right track, what does a spectator then do with her perceptions of gestures, sounds, and speeches, in order to understand the content of the performance she has witnessed?

One framework, or model, for understanding what is done when a spectator grasps or understands a performance might be supplied by using signaling theory, much as that theory has been developed as a model for understanding social relations and social norms (Skyrms 2010; Wagner 2015, and see the entry on social norms). The rough idea is that a sender, in this case a performer, signals a content to a receiver, the spectator, a content which the spectator cannot see at the moment (e.g., how the performance will go, what to expect next, what kind of thing to expect). And then the receiver performs some action—and indeed that action can be as minimal as theatrical spectators’ actions often are—which indicates to the performer whether or not they have understood the signal. Perhaps unlike standard signaling games, the relevant actions in this case are reasoned to by the spectators from the data they are given in the performance. Accordingly, this enhanced model would require spectators to update their expectations upon being presented with new signals, or new data (Perfors et al. 2011). And because the same data can be used to increase one’s credence in an expectation and to help one determine the right category in which to place one’s expectations, this model would also allow for prior knowledge to play the kind of role in the understanding of a performance that seems appropriate (Tenenbaum et al. 2011). It would allow for both “bottom up” and “top down” guidance of perception and reception that comports well with a priori as well as empirical reasoning about theatrical and other kinds of perception and reception. This would include event-segmentation in narrative understanding and scene gist detection, as two fairly low-level examples (Zacks et al. 2007; Larson and Loschky 2009). It would also include such higher levels examples as recognition of styles and genres in performance (Walton 1970; Saltz 2006; Liao and Protasi 2013).

None of the details in this view are settled, nor is there agreement that it is even on the right track as a way to account for what it is that spectators understand in watching a theatrical performance. Jerrold Levinson has suggested an account for musical understanding and Noël Carroll has put forth another for understanding the movies created in the Hollywood system (Levinson 1997; Carroll 1986a, 2008). Yet no alternative to the account just sketched has been set forth with respect precisely to theatrical performances.

Levinson’s is a “concatenationist” account of what it is to understand and enjoy music. In its boldest form, Levinson writes, concatenationism is a conjunction of four propositions.

  1. Musical understanding centrally involves neither aural grasp of a large span of music as a whole, nor intellectual grasp of large-scale connections between parts; understanding music is centrally a matter of apprehending individual bits of music and immediate progression from bit to bit.
  2. Musical enjoyment is had only in the successive parts of a piece of music, and not in the whole as such, or in relationships of parts widely separated in time.
  3. Musical form is centrally a matter of cogency of succession, moment to moment and part to part.
  4. Musical value rests wholly on the impressiveness of individual parts and the cogency of the successions between them, and not on features of large-scale form per se; the worthwhileness of experience of music relates directly only to the former. (Levinson 1997: 13–14)

Levinson’s account is developed and refined in considerable detail over the course of his book. And there are two features of this account that bear special mention here. One is the fact that each listener must update her expectations about what is going to happen in the music at each moment of listening. The other is that no large-scale musical structures are invoked in this story—and in this latter regard it is, perhaps, best described as a bottom-up only tale of musical perception.

Carroll’s view is an “erotetic” (or question-and-answer) theory of movie comprehension. The shape of this view is as follows: the data a movie-goer encounters generate the questions which the movie-goer consciously or unconsciously asks, the movie-goer waits for new data that supplies answers to those questions, and then the movie-goer updates and comprehends. What makes the view distinctive—and what has generated some controversy about it—is what the view depends on: the creation of so-called “Hollywood style” film conventions. By means of those conventions the problem of attention focus is resolved. For the conventions themselves (for example, variable framing) are the very devices in which specatorial attention is directed (Carroll 1985: 188). This set of effects has resulted in what is rightly called the “tyranny of movies” with respect to visual attention (Loschky et al. 2015) and is clearly a top-down theory.

However, the problem of focusing spectator attention looms large as a problem in theatrical performances and is one of the crucial questions that a theater company faces in developing a performance (Chaikin 1972). The data are presented by the performance, but the data are whatever the spectator experiences. They may be data about events that are transpiring outside of and prior to the performance. They may be about the kind of events transpiring in or outside of the performance. Rather than asking questions and waiting for the performance to deliver data to supply answers to those questions, spectators are engaged in updating their expectations from the onset of the data. Crucial to this process is that a spectator must determine where to focus her attention. Spectators enter a venue of presentation with at least some expectations already in place. Spectators who are experienced may have quite a few expectations about the performance but, if they are not experienced theater-goers, they will have very few of such expectations. What is needed is a model that is consistent with at the least the first observation about the “concatenationist” theory of musical comprehension that Levinson presented—the need to update in the moment. It should also be consistent with much of Carroll’s “erotetic” theory of the comprehension of Hollywood Style movies, but it needs to be wider in its application than Carroll’s view, which seems tailored to movies where the attention focal point is much easier to manage than it is in the theater. And, it should offer an explanation of how a spectator determines the kind of performance with which she is confronted.

4. Evaluating a Theatrical Performance

Against the background in §2.2 and §3, it seems clear that to evaluate an instance of theater demands a decision on the part of the evaluator: to evaluate either the text (as an instance of dramatic literature), the performance or production (as an instance of a public event), or both of them in relation to each other. If both, the evaluator is able to consider the intersection between performance or production and text, to assess the performance or production in relation to the text and to assess the text against the performance of it. Despite their disagreements on the ontology of the art form and the pattern such an ontology should take, criticism of both text and performance is what Carroll, Saltz, and Hamilton all appear to have in mind (Saltz, Hamilton, and Carroll 2001). Moreover, this appears to be congruent with the practices of critics as well.

Before discussing how this is to be done, however, there are two major issues about criticism, or “evaluation”, of any works of art that should be described. For both of them will affect how to understand the evaluation of theatrical performances.

4.1 Theoretical or Practical Criticism

The first major question concerning artistic evaluations is whether they are to be understood as a process of theoretical or of practical reasoning. The majority view among analytic philosophers of art now favors the former, and their view is that the conclusion of any act of reason-giving is, perhaps must be, a proposition, something to which one might give some degree of credence (or assent to believing) if the reasoning is good. But recent work has revived an earlier view, due to Arnold Isenberg (1949), that descriptions plus interpretations (“characterizations”) guide us to evaluations understood as “perceptions”. The objection to this view is that

if critics simply guide us in perception, then what they do not do is give us a reason which supports an ascription of overall value to an artwork. Instead, they simply tell us something about how they see the work, and try—by whatever means necessary—to get us to see it in the same way. This, many have argued, fails to qualify as reasoning. (Cross 2017: 302)

Robert Hopkins has responded to this objection by recognizing that perception is a more complex affair in the case of “perceiving works of art” than are those perceptions we ordinarily have occasion to experience. The important thing is that perceptions of works of art have a kind of conceptual content that requires justification—of the sort that critics can supply by appeal to premises about the work (Hopkins 2007). Another attempt to respond to the objection is to argue that criticism provides us with reasons—premises—aimed at getting us to act toward works of art in ways that might best be construed “particular acts of looking, contemplating, listening, reflecting, or otherwise engaging with the artwork” (Cross 2017: 304, emphasis added).

But suppose there is a difference between assessments of the value of works of art and assessments of whatever it is we might do with respect to works of art. Could it not be that either of those, as aims of reasoning, might be legitimate? Those who reject the “practical vs. theoretical reasoning” distinction on the grounds that all reasoning is means/ends, and who thus hold that whether a bit of reasoning is good or bad cannot be determined without first determining what the reasoner’s end is, will find both Isenberg’s (or the “Isenbergean”) view and the objection to it considerably less interesting. Applied to evaluations of theatrical performances, qua performances, we also have no reason to choose between these various forms of reasoning.

4.2 Aesthetic and Artistic Evaluations

The second major question about evaluation concerns whether there are any non-aesthetic artistic values. Behaviorally there is a clear difference between aesthetic and non-aesthetic artistic values, indicated by the fact that appeals to aesthetic responses do not explain many individual’s interest in works of art (Carroll 1986b; Stecker 2006). There is disciplinary support for a distinction here: the study of the felt quality of perceptions of the senses is conducted by cognitive scientists and neuroscientists, while the study of the historical practices of art making are studied by anthropologists and art-historians. But this behavioral way of remarking the distinction still needs an explanation. We might explain this distinction by appeal to a metaphysical difference between aesthetic properties and artistic properties. Robert Stecker’s epistemic way of explaining the distinction is by means of proposing a “test”—as he calls it—for whether an evaluative verdict regarding a work of art appeals to an aesthetic or an artistic value:

artistic value derives from what artists successfully intend to do in their works as mediated by functions of the art forms and genres to which the works belong. [So] does one need to understand the work to appreciate its being valuable in that way? If so, it is an artistic value. If not, it is not. (Stecker 2012: 357)

This position has had its detractors (Lopes 2011; Dodd 2013), but something quite like it has also had defenders who have argued, for example, against the view of “appreciation as liking” and in favor of “appreciation as sizing up” (Carroll 2016). Each of these notions of appreciation appeals to David Hume’s claim that “good sense” is necessary for avoiding prejudice and for being able to discern the relevant features of a work. But, as Hume saw, good sense is not essential to what Carroll calls “appreciation as liking”. Whereas, Carroll notes, it is both essential and crucial to “appreciation as sizing up”.

The crucial thing to notice about this distinction between aesthetic and artistic value is that it moves us away from thinking of the value of a work of art as residing in the experience it might provide us (a view that David Davies has called “aesthetic empiricism”) and suggests, at the very least, that we do not look only to experience for the source of values in a work of art. One place to look is suggested by the position of Stecker himself, who requires what he calls “understanding” a work of art by means of examining

what artists successfully intend to do in their works as mediated by functions of the art forms and genres to which the works belong. (Stecker 2012: 357)

Or we might look at what Noël Carroll has called “an appreciative heuristic applied to art” which requires one to

1) identify [a work of art’s] intended purpose or purposes and 2) determine the adequacy or appropriateness of its form—its formal choices—to the realization or articulation of its intended purpose (or purposes). (Carroll 2016: 4–5)

Each of these suggestions hold that artistic evaluations are assessments of the artistic achievements that the work has made. And we might propose that aesthetic evaluations of the very same works (and much else in the world as well) could turn out to be, as Paul Ziff has argued, the registration of preferences for the experiences provided by the work (or other object) (Ziff 1979 [1984]). This analysis already seems to be adopted by Stecker (2006) in what he calls the “broad” analysis of aesthetic pleasure, which he endorses.

If we follow Ziff’s suggestion about aesthetic verdicts, then just about anything could be grounds for aesthetic evaluations of a theatrical performance. But Ziff’s suggestion may not be the right idea about aesthetic verdicts. According to Jerrold Levinson, Hume appealed to what he called “ideal judges” to resolve the puzzling conflict between the fact that there are demonstrably better and worse artworks and the fact that our tastes—what we prefer—differ with respect to works of art (Hume 1757). Levinson, who refines and defends Hume’s solution to this conflict, notes that if we have good reason to appeal to “ideal critics”, who possess good taste and who can discern which objects are worthy of aesthetic attention, both of the fact claims that appear to be in conflict could turn out to be true. And there are real advantages in Hume’s solution: it seems to square with the fact we are able to learn from others, others whose judgment we trust, and so whose good taste should lead us to choose the right works of art; and it also squares with the fact we do seem to acquire “taste” from following the judgments of others whom we trust.

The “ideal critics” solution has its problems, however. Briefly they concern three things. First, does the artistic appreciation of a work of art depend on first-hand acquaintance with that work of art? Whether there is independent empirical evidence that this appeal—to the need for first person experience in order to support any verdictive judgment—is a vexed problem. Second, how does the ideal critic come to her/his views in the first place? It is either by a process of learning from others whom they regard as ideal critics or it is by a process independent of the existence of ideal critics. If the latter, then we don’t need the “ideal critics;” all we have to do is undergo that independent process ourselves. If the former, then we have a either a “vicious infinite regress” with no rational starting place in the chain or we rely on the testimony of others (which in this area is also vexed). And, third, what is the case for the claim that there are “ideal judges” in the first place (Ross 2008)? Is there any reason to believe there are any?

The attractiveness of Ziff’s point of view is that it allows for a quite different form of solution to the puzzle created by our two facts, one that gives each fact a different kind of explanation. The first claim—that there are demonstrably better and worse artworks—asserts the artistic merits of a work of art by reference to the achievements made or not made in the particular work of art. Whether such achievements are or are not made in the work is an objective question of fact, and so could be made on behalf of everyone. The second claim—that our tastes differ with respect to works of art—asserts the aesthetic value of a particular work of art to some individual or group on the basis of the aesthetic qualities that that individual or group prefers. Since preferences are usually subjective or sometimes inter-subjective, these assessments are made only on behalf of particular individuals or groups.

One advantage of this solution is that it squares with our standard ways of dealing with the lack of artistic value of forgeries. For, despite the fact forgeries may provide more “appreciative experiences worth having” than even the originals may, they may still be objectively less valuable, in the same way that a piece of property may be less valuable, from a realtor’s point of view, than some potential homeowners think it is because they feel a preference to own it (Carroll 2016). Another advantage is that it also squares with everyday kinds of remark about the aesthetic value of some works of art being “merely opinions”, because those comments are explicitly about what we like, and are not really about what is better or worse. Claims that are genuinely about what is better or worse in a work of art rest on considerations of the achievements in them, not on our varying preferences for or against them. Moreover, this solution is better positioned to explain why some works of art do not even aim to provide high-quality aesthetic experiences. And, finally, it results in no contradiction between either finding that a work is good but not to one’s liking or finding that a work is bad but is something one really likes, for example a so-called “guilty pleasure” (Carroll 2016).

Applied to theatrical performances the distinction between aesthetics and artistry seems solid enough even if we have no final determination of how to explain the distinction. Yet, no matter how we work that out, it seems that spectators and critics will need to provide and explain a rather complicated set of things; for now it appears they must provide both aesthetic and artistic evaluations. This is made more complicated in those cases in which the artistic achievements a work makes do consist in provision of preferred experiences. Moreover, focusing just on the artistic appreciation of theatrical performances and accepting the achievement story about what the artistic value of a work of art is, there are still two further tasks. If theatrical texts and performances are works belonging to different forms of art, then artistic evaluations of theater will still come in two kinds, namely, the achievements of dramatic texts, and the achievements of performances.

4.3 Achievements in Theater

A given piece of literary writing “for the stage” may be either a work of dramatic literature or a script, either a writing to be read for certain literary features and values or a writing to be used in a quite different way. That a bit of writing functions as a work of dramatic literature does not alter the fact that the relevant effects, features, and values to be analyzed and examined are exactly those that are analyzed and examined with respect to any other narrative literary work. Crucially, a work of dramatic literature does not require theatrical performance for the realization of those effects, features, or values (Worthen 2007, Hamilton 2009b).

This way of construing writing “for the stage” does not preclude what may be called a “literary theater”. If we think of scripts as “scores for action” (Saltz 1991b), we may also think of them as providing particular orderings of the information an audience will encounter (Stoppard 1999). Some scripts do this to excellent effect; in theater parlance, they “have legs”. Like some gymnastic or jazz routines, they are frequently repeated and approximated because they yield performances that mark great achievements. Writing may contribute to this achievement for theater because it allows greater control over the flow and order of information than do complex scenarios crafted for improvisational sequences or even than do scenarios and language passed down from performer to performer over generations. Whatever the case may be with respect to the value of scripted performances over performances generated in other ways, however, a script driven theater is likely to be a literary theater simply because it will produce some written scripts that can—indeed will—also be taken to function as works of literature.

Literary analyses of a work of dramatic literature that happens to get used as a script may or may not be useful for performers. The content of a theatrical performance is not fully governed, deliverable, nor retrievable by a written text. Texts—which are relatively “thin”—are underdetermined by performances (Ball 1983; Worthen 2007, but see Goodman 1968: 210–211 for a contrary view). If this is right, a quite different set of standards for measuring the achievements of performances, per se, is required.

As of this date, very little progress has been made in philosophy on what those particular standards might be. And perhaps that debate is best left to practicing critics, performers, and performance or theater theorists. But some philosophical headway can be made by considering what is required for assessing the achievements of performances.

To ask what achievements are possible in theatrical performances requires that we understand what an achievement is in the first place. One source of thinking about this will certainly come from empirical work on achievements in education—correlating them with other factors, but not specifying what achievement, per se, consists in (for example, Burke and Sass 2013). Another source will undoubtedly come from those concerned with virtue epistemology, virtue ethics, or perhaps perfectionist accounts of value. Gwen Bradford has examined the basic idea of “achievements” in several publications (Bradford 2013, 2015, 2016). Bradford describes achievements as requiring two things:

First, achievements are characterized by a process-product structure: all achievements have a process, which culminates in a product. Second, the process of an achievement is difficult. Something must be difficult to some sufficient degree in order to be an achievement; after all, if running a marathon and writing a novel were easy, we wouldn’t be inclined to call them achievements. …[and] for now we will suppose that an activity is difficult just in case it requires effort from the agent engaging in the activity. (Bradford 2013: 205)

She ultimately denies that it might make a difference if the product is independently valuable, on the grounds that at least as a matter of codifying our everyday assessments of achievement we do count things—running a marathon, scoring well on an examination—as achievements even though they have less independent value than, say, saving thirty lives from otherwise certain death by fire, or finding a cure for polio (Bradford 2016: 797). Accordingly, if one is to mark achievements in theatrical performance, one must state clearly what the process of preparing a performance involves, why the tasks undertaken in that process are not easy, and how these achievements are to be noticed and assessed.

In preparing and performing a routine, performers make choices about what to utter and what to do. Performers also choose how to utter what is uttered and how to do whatever it is they do. And, performers determine what to do and how to do it for every moment of the performance. These decisions, so far, concern what each performer utters and does independently of other performers, but performers usually do not make even these decisions in isolation from each other. Another aspect of these decisions requires concerted, perhaps collective, effort. Any company needs to decide where they wish to direct attention at each moment and how they will do that. Some of those decisions involve thinking about such things as how performers are situated relative to each other and to the audience in the performance space. Many decisions that determine how attention gets directed involve deciding the manner and timing of each performer's utterances in relation to the content, manner, and timing of the utterances of other performers. Similarly, to regulate the attention of audiences, companies think about how what each performer is doing relates to what the other performers are doing.[2] Clearly, none of these tasks, especially the ones demanding coordination among the performers, is particularly easy.

Beyond this, spectators must be able to determine the style in which a performance occurs in order to be guided to relevantly correct expectations. Consequently, performers must make stylistic choices as well. For it is actually sequences of features (resulting from sequences of choices) that give shape to a performance over time and guide spectators’ expectations. This will be so if the sequence is a convention governed by some overall goal the performers have. And again, none of these tasks, especially since stylistic choices demand coordination among the performers, is particularly easy to succeed at.[3]

This leads to a set of ideas about how spectators measure success and, in particular, what they are able to say about performers, sets, and overall mise-en-scène, when they detect failures. If a spectator is unaware of a convention—a sequence of choices governed by some overall goal—as a convention, and if the presence of that convention is responsible for the aspects of the work that are present to be appreciated, then that spectator simply cannot appreciate that work, at least not for those aspects. This is partly because appreciation depends on having some level of understanding of what one is experiencing. Understanding requires spectators to offer hypotheses regarding what performers are up to in a performance, to test those hypotheses against the actual details of the performance, usually as it unfolds, and to assess the achievement the performance manifests given its aims and its context. Only spectators who understand performances and their features are able to offer the relevant kinds of hypotheses.

Such spectators are able to detect and explain failures of skill. A suitably backgrounded spectator who thereby understands the conventions and styles in play will know what to watch for. A performer will fail who does not exhibit the relevant features in voice, speech, mood, movement, or action. Such a failure may be a result of lack of skill. A spectator who understands performances and their features will not only notice this but will also be able to explain this failure due to lack of skill to other spectators.

At the level of style, failures in performance can occur in at least three ways. They can occur if some of the features grouped together into conventions do not clearly and coherently induce the effects—the goals—at which they appear to be aimed. Or they may occur if the performers do not understand what effects the conventions they have adopted actually induce and, so, have made choices quite at odds with their own self-conscious aims. They may also occur if the aims of the performers are unclear and they have selected a mix of conventions that is confusing to an audience. If a spectator is tracking the adequacy of hypothesis about what performers are doing and she understands performances and their features, she will notice these failures and be able to explain them to others as well.

These are the basic achievements a theatrical performance aims at; and these are the kinds of successes and failures that some audience members detect. Artistic evaluations of theatrical performances qua performances are determinations that achievements of these sorts are made or not made.


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