Notes to Torture

1. Earlier versions of especially the last three sections appeared in Miller 2005 and Miller 2009 (Chapter 7).

2. See also Shue 1978. Shue seems to be arguing, implicitly at least, that in practice torture is never justifiable. However, he does countenance the possibility of an extreme emergency – a ticking bomb scenario – in which torture would be morally justifiable.

3. For an account of torture by a victim of torture, see Mendez 2005.

4. Suppose a woman agrees to be savagely beaten for a specific time period in exchange for money, but she can choose to abort the beating if she wants; however, if she aborts the beating, she does not get the money. On the definition put forward here this is an ordeal that the woman has freely chosen to put herself through, but it is not torture. See the discussion of ordeals at the end of this section.

5. This real-life example (slightly modified) was provided to the author by an Indian police officer.

6. See Davis 2005. Davis identifies two other purposes, namely, to destroy opponents without killing them and to please the torturer.

7. See Davis 2005 and Sussman 2005, for a similar view.

8. Biko was taken into custody denied food and sleep, and kept naked in solitary confinement. However, rather than submit he apparently attacked his torturers leading to further physical harm. Denied medical attention, he died in transit. The implication is that he died from brain injuries in part as a consequence of severe beatings. It seems that Biko was in effect tortured to death, but apparently without giving in.

9. Some have suggested that torture in this minimalist sense is not really torture. For example, in policing it is referred to as the ‘third degree’. Since the minimalist and the maximalist forms meet the criteria laid down here and exist on a continuum, it seems best to stay with the adopted terminology. Others can do otherwise, but if not their dispute would only be a verbal one – unless of course, they seek to reject torture in the minimalist sense as really being torture qualitatively speaking, or to provide it with a different moral gloss.

10. Confessions extracted by the police are not admissible in courts in India. However, the fact that stolen goods have been retrieved obviously assists the prosecutor's case. So the police sometimes torture thieves to retrieve the stolen goods and thereby secure a conviction. It goes without saying that this practice is both unlawful and immoral.

11. Naturally, if it is a self-defence situation or the persons to be killed are otherwise ‘guilty’, then killing them might be morally justified. Below the argument for this same point in relation to torturing the guilty is presented.

12. For those who believe that to lose one's autonomy is a greater evil than to lose one's life and that, other things being equal, intentionally causing harm is morally worse than causing harm that is merely foreseen, there will be more cases in which torture is morally worse than killing than have been thus far admitted to. But the point is that, nevertheless, there will still be cases in which killing is morally worse than torture.

13. Influentially discussed in Walzer 1973.

14. For an analysis of joint actions, see Miller 2010 (Chapter 2).

15. But see Luban 2005 for a contrasting view, at least in the U.S.

16. Frederick Schauer (2003) argues this thesis in relation to laws and uses the speed limit as an example. Arguably, Schauer goes too far in his account of laws, and is insisting that the law is blunter than it needs to be. However, that does not affect what is being said here.

17. Thanks to Andrew Alexandra, who reminded me of this example.

18. For an account of social institutions, see Miller 2010.

19. For a real-life example, see Miller & Blackler 2005 (129).

20. A “one-off” moral problem in this sense might in fact recur; but the point is that it will not recur often, and in any case each occurrence ought to be treated as if it were a one-off.

21. This suggestion is also made by Shue (1978: 143).

Copyright © 2017 by
Seumas Miller <>

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