Supplement to Trinity


1. Terminology

The term “unitarian” was popularized in late 1680s England as a less pejorative and more descriptive term than “Socinian”for Christians who hold God to be identical to one and only one divine self, the Father. It has since been used as a denominational label for several distinct groups, but it is here primarily used in the descriptive, generic sense just stated. (The capitalized “Unitarian” is occasionally used here in the denominational sense.) All these groups have been labeled “antitrinitarian”. Although many unitarians have proudly flown the antitrinitarian banner, others strenuously argued that they expounded the correct trinitarian doctrine, the difference being that the former were promoting rival denominations, while the latter sought to be included in mainstream groups (i.e., traditionally trinitarian churches, or ones which were often assumed to be).

Dating back at least to John Newman’s (1801–90) critique of Arius, a popular narrative among mainstream trinitarians is that it is mainly “rationalists” who reject mainstream trinitarianism, meaning something like: people who refuse to believe things they can’t fully understand or can’t explain, even when those things are divinely revealed (Newman 1890, 221; Williams 2001, 2–6). The term “rationalist” implies some sort of epistemic over-confidence or dogmatism, and usually suggests some underlying moral or spiritual defect(s) as well (e.g., Newman 1890, xiii, 18–24, 133–42, 219–30). This narrative received impetus from late 18th and 19th century English and American Unitarianism, which also revised some other Christian doctrines. (See section 4 below.) Further, “philosophical” (non-biblical) objections have at times been emphasized. Various trinitarian claims, especially those in the “Athanasian” creed, have been criticized as inconsistent. And various claims (e.g., that the three enjoy “perichoresis”) have been criticized as unintelligible. The rationalist explanation, though, is inadequate, as unitarians’ views on the Bible, the place of reason, the usefulness of philosophy, the authority of tradition, miracles, and ecclesiology run the gamut— Anabaptists, Anglicans, Catholics, Congregationalists, deists, Presbyterians, and denominational Unitarians appear in their ranks. The kernels of truth here are that most unitarians hold that some elements of some Trinity and Incarnation doctrines are self-contradictory, and they typically reject mysterian theology. (See main entry section 3.)

Most unitarians have led with and emphasized the objection that the Bible provides little to no support for mainstream trinitarianism, and teaches things inconsistent with it. Further, some trinitarian proof texts (e.g., 1 John 5:7) are later interpolations, while others have been mistranslated (e.g., the application of personal pronouns to the holy spirit). Some make a detailed case that New Testament era and early patristic Christianity was in some sense unitarian (Clarke Scripture; Lamson 1875; Priestley History). While some ridicule all appeals to “mystery” others accept them in principle, arguing that

The true Veneration of Mysteries consists, not in making them ourselves, and in receiving blindly the Words of Men without understanding them; but it consists… in taking care there to stop, where the Scripture itself has stopped… (Clarke Scripture, xiii; cf. Crellius 1691, 245–6)

2. 16th and 17th Century Socinianism and Unitarianism

2.1 Socinians

In the Reformation era, many individuals sought to revise or reject Trinity theories based on their own studies of the Bible, and influenced by the biblical scholarship of Erasmus of Rotterdam (d. 1536) (Williams 2000, 42–6).Some of these held that the Father alone is God, that Jesus Christ had only a human nature, and that the Holy Spirit is a divine power (of the Father, God), and not a divine person (Lindsey 1818, 14–7; Wilbur 1925, ch. 15–6; Williams 2000, 1135–61).

The history of such groups is complex. For example, a body of these Christians in Poland followed the forceful Italian theologian Faustus Socinus (or Fausto Paolo Sozzini, 1539–1604), and were thereafter dubbed “Socinians” by their opponents. The term came to be used by some as a derogatory expression for any sort of unitarian. This tradition, centered in Rakow in Poland, flourished until 1660 when its members were forced by governmental persecution to flee the country. But in its heyday, soon after the death of Socinus, the first edition of the Racovian Catechism was published. This book was the end result of a commission given to Socinus and three other ministers to revise an earlier Polish catechism. Later versions of this in Latin and other languages have repeatedly influenced later unitarians (Rees 1818, lxxi-lxxviii; Williams 1967).

This Racovian Catechism identifies the God of Israel with the Father of Christ, engaging all the major passages commonly brought to bear as evidence for a Trinity of persons in God. Both the Trinity and the doctrine of two natures (divine and human) in Christ are argued to be both contradictory and unsupported by the Bible. It is argued that Christ is a man who did not pre-exist his miraculous conception in Mary, though he’s denied to be a “mere” man, but affirmed to be the unique Son of God, the Messiah, worthy of worship and a proper recipient of prayer (Crellius, et al. Racovian).

Worship of and prayer to Christ had been a bone of contention earlier; Socinus famously debated the Hungarian unitarian Ferenc Dávid (a.k.a. Francis David, ca. 1510–79) on this point, the latter vehemently denying the appropriateness of worshiping or praying to any being but God. Dávid later argued that worship and prayer to Christ are as inappropriate and ungrounded in scripture as the Catholic cults of Mary and the saints. Had it been God’s will for us to worship or pray to Christ, such would have been explicitly commanded somewhere in scripture. But as Socinus admits, there are no such commands. Therefore, it is not God’s will for us to worship or pray to Christ. Socinus made a stand on passages such as “let all the angels of God worship [Christ]” (Hebrews 1:6), defending worship and prayer to Christ as permissible but not required for salvation. Later, he and his successors made these obligatory, adding that Christ was the intermediate, but his Father the ultimate object of worship (Crellius Racovian, 196–7; Lindsey 1783, 152–93, 237–64; Rees 1818, xli–lxii; Wilbur 1925, ch. 22). A small stream of unitarianism deriving from the Ferenc Dávid survives to this day in Transylvania (part of present-day Romania).

2.2 John Biddle

Influenced by his reading of the New Testament, and then by some Latin writings of the Polish unitarian diaspora (including the Racovian Catechism), Englishman John Biddle (a.k.a. Bidle) (1615–62) was the focus of a small unitarian movement, which seems to have ended with his early death (Lindsey 1783, 301f; Wilbur 1925, Ch. 28). Biddle identified the Father with the one God, Yahweh the God of the Jews, and argued that the Bible teaches that Christ is a human (with only a human nature), who is nonetheless worthy of being called “God” by virtue of his immortality, and his supernatural and benevolent dominion (Biddle 1691, 1–3, 8–17). He held the Holy Spirit to be a personal agent, not divine, but created, who is in his words,

…chief of all ministering spirits… in the third rank after God and Christ… So that as there is one principal spirit amongst the evil angels [Satan]… even so there is one principal spirit… amongst the good angels… (Toulmin 1791, 29)

God created the cosmos by means of the personal agency of the Holy Spirit; the Son wasn’t involved, but later the man Jesus became “the second Cause of all Things pertaining to our Salvation, and consequently, the intermediate Object of our Faith and Worship” (Biddle 1691, 4). Biddle’s writings drew a massive refutation from Puritan theologian John Owen (1616–83) (Owen Vindiciae).

2.3 The London Trinity Controversies (1687–98)

Thomas Firmin (1632–97), who had attended Biddle’s meetings as a young man, later became a successful businessman and respected philanthropist in London. In 1687 Firmin published the first of many writings promoting a kind of unitarianism, a tract by minister Stephen Nye (1648–1719) entitled A Brief History of the Unitarians, Called also Socinians. In Four Letters, Written to a Friend (Nye 1691b) Despite the title, this is a closely argued polemic against mainstream views on the Trinity, arguing from the Bible and rebutting the major texts usually given to support the orthodox (Athanasian, pro-Nicene, or Latin) doctrine. Further,

Theirs [i.e., the unitarians’] (they say) is an accountable and a reasonable Faith; but that of the Trinitarians is absurd, and contrary both to Reason and to It-self, and therefore not only false, but impossible. For you, say they teach, That there are Three Almighty, most Good and most Wise Persons, and yet but One God; as if every Almighty most Wise and Good Person were not a God, a most perfect God; and consequently Three such Persons, Three Gods. You add yet more absurdly, That there are three Persons who are severally and each of them true God, and yet there is but one true God. This is an Errour in counting or numbring; which, when stood in, is of all others the most brutal and inexcusable: and not to discern it, is not to be a Man. But we would not, say they, trouble our selves at the Non-sense of this Doctrine, if it did not impose false Gods on us; by advancing Two to be Gods, who are not so: and rob also the One true God of the Honour due to him, and of which he is jealous. (Nye 1691b, 9, original emphases)

As with Biddle and the Racovian Catechism, Christ is a unique servant of God and the messiah, possessing a human nature only. Against Biddle, the Holy Spirit is just the power of God (Nye 1691b, 7–8).

There ensued a heated controversy within the Anglican church concerning the doctrine of the Trinity. (Walker 2013, 157–251) Firmin’s side urged that since the Bible doesn’t teach the traditional doctrine of the Trinity, the Anglican church, being Protestant, should tolerate and welcome unitarians. To the delight of the unitarians, two prominent Oxford professors published books propounding contrary views, but both purporting to defend “the” doctrine of the Trinity. William Sherlock (c.1641–1707) argued for what was widely derided as tritheism, as he called the three persons of the Trinity three infinite minds, substances, spirits, and intelligent beings, each a God, but existing as one God because of their perfect mutual consciousness, their perichoresis. Against him, John Wallis (1616–1703) propounded the pro-Nicene view that we can’t grasp the meaning of “person” applied to the Trinity, but gave analogies which suggested modalism about the three (three dimensions of a cube, a soul’s existence, knowledge, and action), in the form of the “persons” being properties of God. (See supplementary document on the history of trinitarian doctrines section 3.3.) These two engaged in a nasty public quarrel (with several others joining in the fray), and the views of Sherlock were eventually condemned by his university as “false, impious, and heretical”. For their part, the unitarians were happy to exploit the evident divisions in the trinitarian camp (Dixon 2003, 125–9; Nye 1693).

At one point in the debate, Sherlock argued that the unitarians were as much trinitarians as Wallis was (Hunt 1871, 201–21). Firmin and many in his party, it seems, agreed. They argued in several tracts that there is only a verbal disagreement between themselves and the orthodox trinitarians. Both may be called “nominal trinitarians”, who hold that there are three “persons” in God not in the sense of three selves or subjects of consciousness, but in the sense of three distinctions within, properties of, or relations in God, such as Augustine’s mind, wisdom, and love (Dixon 2003, 131; Hunt 1871, 220; Wilbur 1925, ch. 29). (Cf. supplementary document on the history of trinitarian doctrines section 3.3.2.) In short, as the Anglican church had repudiated tritheism, the unitarians felt that their concerns about upholding God’s uniqueness had been satisfied. The idea that Sabellianism, unitarianism, and nominal trinitarianism differ only verbally, continued for some time, dubious though it may be. (Depending on how they are defined, they’ll probably differ with respect to christology, an area not much in focus in that controversy.)

For his part, in 1701 Nye declared himself orthodox, repudiated at least some of his previous writings, and proceeded to expound a one-self Trinity theory on which a “person” in God “is only a mode or Property; as such Mode is considered together with the Divine Essence, Godhead, or God.” Nye also sounded notes of pro-Nicene style mysterianism (see main entry section 3), and defended his views from the charge of heretical modalism by insisting that his three person-modes were internal to God, i.e., God’s intrinsic properties (Dixon 2003, 172–4).

3. Subordinationism

Subordinationists hold that the Son is divine but is nonetheless in some sense ontologically dependent on God, that is, the Father. (Some also allege a similar dependence of the Holy Spirit on the Father.) Its proponents argue that there is a strong strain of subordinationist thinking about the Son in most of the church fathers prior to the 4th century. (Anti-subordinationists often counter that this strain is exaggerated or partly due to misinterpretation of those ancient writers.) Current patristic scholars tend to hold that this early subordinationism has been downplayed by church historians because it is unorthodox relative to later standards, although they sometimes find counterbalancing themes in many writers inconsistent with subordinationism. Clear and well-developed subordinationist unitarianism mainly belongs to two periods of history, the fourth and the eighteenth centuries.

3.1 Fourth-Century “Arian” Subordinationists

Recent scholarship has illuminated the views of that groups of fourth-century theologians called “Arians”, “semi-Arians” (“homoian Arians”), and “neo-Arians” (sometimes called “anhomoian Arians”) (Hanson 1988; Kopecek 1979; Wiles 1996; Williams 2001). Here we can only give a rough sketch of this loose family of fourth-century theories. All these terms but the first were coined by 19th and 20th century scholars. The term “Arian” was bestowed on them by their fierce opponent Athanasius in order to associate them with the formally condemned Arius. (See section 3.2 of the supplementary document on the history of trinitarian doctrines.) These “Arians” were aggressively denounced by Athanasius, who argued (in the summary of a recent scholar) that their “appeal to reason is sophistic, their appeal to Scripture a pretence, and their appeal to tradition an insult” (Wiles 1996, 9).

While Athanasius’ terminology and harsh critique have been massively influential, recent scholars have sought to understand these “Arians” in their own terms. Arius was neither the origin of, nor the leader of most of this group of theologians, and thus they rejected the label. It has been suggested that this terminology be scrapped or used with quotes (Wiles 1996, 4). Accordingly, we here call them “Arian subordinationists”, for they did hold, in different ways, that the Son (and less clearly, the Holy Spirit) were subordinate to the Father in ways which the emerging pro-Nicene consensus would reject.

These “Arian” subordinationists shared with their third-century antagonists a basic approach to reading the Bible, on which God’s word and spirit are in some sense distinct from him but also in some sense on a par with him. Again, like their opponents, they held that Proverbs 8 reveals the origin of this Wisdom (“Word” or logos) which later became incarnate (John 1).

The Lord created me [Wisdom] at the beginning of his work, the first of his acts of long ago. Ages ago I was set up, at the first, before the beginning of the earth. When there were no depths I was brought forth, when there were no springs abounding with water. Before the mountains had been shaped, before the hills, I was brought forth when he had not yet made earth and fields… when he assigned to the sea its limit, so that the waters might not transgress his command, when he marked out the foundations of the earth, then I was beside him, like a master worker; and I was daily his delight, rejoicing before him always, rejoicing in his inhabited world and delighting in the human race. (Proverbs 8:22–31, NRSV)

Whereas their opponents distinguished creating from timeless “begetting”, some of these subordinationists took the above passage to teach that the Son of God was created prior to the creation of the cosmos. Others held that the Son has been eternally and ineffably or mysteriously “generated” by the Father rather than created in the normal sense. Some affirmed, and others denied that the Son was “made from nothing”. In any case, the Son bears a unique relation to the Father, being the only thing that comes directly and only from him. Based on various other passages they held that through this second god, the one true God, the Father, created everything else, which they thought preserved God’s transcendence. They rejected the new description of the Son as “consubstantial” (homoousios) with the Father as wrongheadedly materialistic (i.e., the Son came to be when some of the Father’s matter was separated from him), as inconsistently involving the impassible, immutable, and incorruptible God in the sufferings and death of Christ, or as compromising the primacy and uniqueness of the one true God, the Father, or as implying (as a form of modalism—see the main entry, section 1) that the three are in fact one person (“confounding the persons”, as they sometimes put it), or as implicitly denying monotheism.

Some of the earlier “Arians” thought that even the Son couldn’t understand the ineffable God, while some of the latter “neo-Arians” thought he could. The Son’s incarnation involved his taking on a soul-less human body. Like their opponents, they held that a merely human Christ could not save humankind, although they denied that his redeemer status requires him to be (as it was later put) “fully divine” and “ontologically equal to” the Father. They held that a god must suffer to redeem us, but the one true God is incapable of suffering. The Son is worthy of worship, or something close to it, and it is through the Son that we know and worship the Father. Less was said of the Spirit, although some held him to be an agent subordinate to both the Father and Son, some considering the Spirit to be “the noblest of the creatures, produced by the Son at the Father’s bidding, the source of illumination and sanctification” (Kelly 1978, 256).

In sum, they took themselves to be conservative traditionalists, following or developing a subordinationist strand of earlier theology, wherein the Son is in some sense divine, though he derives his divine qualities from the will of the Father. Several recent scholars have pointed out that

…in the intellectual climate of the fourth century, it was quite logical to maintain that the Son was God or divine while not being fully equal to the Father, and… the assumption that there was no plausible halting-place between full divinity and ordinary creaturely status was by no means obvious. (Hanson 1988, 574)

Although some polemical writers have painted these “Arians” as “rationalists” or presumptuous speculators, the philosophies of the day seem to have influenced and been appropriated by them to about the same degree as their pro-Nicene antagonists, and in general their views seem no more speculative than those of their opponents. Various members of each party put more or less weight on philosophical distinctions and arguments. It is true that one party of the subordinationists, the so-called “Neo-Arians”, seemed to emphasize philosophical precision and argument, and upheld (contrary to the emerging pro-Nicene view) that God is in some sense comprehensible by us (Hanson 1988, 3–128, 557–638; Wiles 1996, 17–23).

3.2 17th–18th Century English Subordinationists

A number of late 17th century and early 18th century English thinkers came to hold subordinationist views. A seminal figure was the great physicist Isaac Newton (1642–1727), who was as concerned with Christian theology as he was with physics. He was too cautious to publish his subordinationist views during his lifetime, but two of his younger associates became famous for propounding views similar to his (Mandlebrote 2005; Wiles 1996, 76). One of these was the man who succeeded him as Lucasian professor of Mathematics at Cambridge, the eccentric but principled William Whiston (1667–1752) (Wiles 1996, 76–93). Unlike most other subordinationists, Whiston accepted the “Arian” label (though preferring “Eusebian” or simply “Christian”, and strove (unsuccessfully) to revive what he considered “primitive Christianity” outside the confines of Anglicanism. Again, unlike the others, Whiston embraced the claim that Christ a creature, although created in an different way than all other creatures, and created prior to the cosmos (Wiles 1996, 97–9). All of them framed the issue as being fundamentally between the clear teaching of the scriptures together with the early church fathers and the “Athanasian” doctrine of the Trinity. They held that Athanasius was at best a shady character, and that the theory he proposed was unscriptural and unreasonable. In its place, they held what they considered the genuinely scriptural doctrine of the Trinity. The best developed such theory to emerge from this circle is that of Samuel Clarke (1675–1729) (Clarke Scripture; Ferguson 1976; Pfizenmaier 1997; Wiles 1996, 110–34).

Inspired by the elder Newton, Clarke seems to have scoured the New Testament and early church fathers some time in the early years of the century. In 1712 he published the first edition of his The Scripture-Doctrine of the Trinity (Clarke, Scripture). Here he first lists fifty-five propositions which express the essence of his theory. Clarke then lists and classifies every passage in the New Testament relevant to trinitarian doctrine, comments on the important ones, and gives dozens of quotations (translated, together with the original language) of ante-Nicene church Fathers in order to support the interpretations offered. Each of the aforementioned propositions is then (allegedly) deduced from the scriptural evidence, and explicated and defended. In the final section of the book, Clarke dares to suggest revisions to the liturgy of the Anglican church, purging various “Athanasian” elements. The book is notable for its careful argumentation, clarity, brevity, and close interaction with pre-Nicene catholic theology. This controversial and widely read book generated dozens of responses (Ferguson 1976, 119–49; Hunt 1873, 24–9; Pfizenmaier 1997, 179–216; Van Mildert 1856, 28–81), and went through three editions during Clarke’s life and one shortly after. Clarke and a few allies wrote several defenses of it, and its core account remained unchanged through the editions.

The core of Clarke’s subordinationism is as follows. Certain names or titles in the Bible, including “God”, always are nearly always refer to the Father, giving him a kind of primacy among the three. The word “God” is used in higher and lower senses, and in his view the former always refer to the Father. The God of Israel, the one true God, just is the Father of Jesus. Further, he is the main and the primary and ultimate object of Christian worship and prayer, and as the sole recipient of the highest kind of worship. In his view, the Son of God has all the divine attributes but one, that of existing a se that is, existing and not being in any sense derivative of or dependent on anything else. To the contrary, “The Father Alone is Self-existent, Underived, Unoriginated, Independent” (Clarke, Scripture, 123). It is contradictory to suppose that something has this property in any sense because of another thing. In his view the Son and the Holy Spirit (like the Son, a personal agent or self distinct from the Father) exist and have their perfections because of the Father. Both are functionally and ontologically subordinate to him, and in the Spirit is at least functionally subordinate to the Son. What sort of dependence relations are these? The Son and Spirit derive their being from the Father as from a “Supreme Cause”, but we are not to infer from this that the Father existed before them. The Bible doesn’t enlighten us on the nature of this dependence relationship, but seems to presuppose that it always was (i.e., that infinitely back in time, the Son and Spirit existed in dependence on the Father). Thus, “Arian” subordinationists (see section 3.1 above) are speculating groundlessly when they say there was a time when the Son didn’t exist. And if a “creature” must at some time begin to exist, then neither Son nor Spirit are creatures. Still, Clarke thinks that we should affirm with some of the early church fathers that this derivation of the Son from the Father is “not by mere Necessity of Nature, (which would be in reality Self-existence, not Filiation;) But by an Act of the Father’s incomprehensible Power and Will” (141, original emphases). Clarke argues that the New Testament teaches the eternal existence of the Son, and that he is (co-) creator of the world. Further, it teaches that the Holy Spirit is a personal agent distinct from God (and not a power of God, or an exercise of such). And against the mainstream tradition, “The word God, in Scripture, never signifies a complex Notion of more Persons (or Intelligent Agents) than One; but always means One Person only, viz., either the Person of the Father singly, or the Person of the Son singly” (155, original emphases). While the Spirit is nowhere called “God” or held up for worship, Clarke holds that his divinity is implied, and thus so is the appropriateness of his being worshiped as the Son is worshiped. The early Fathers, he holds, thought Father and Son to be homoousios only in the sense that the latter is ineffably derived from the former—not in the sense of their being the same thing or the exact same kind of thing.

Clarke attempts to recast the debate, taking a middle course between Socinian unitarianism and more mainstream trinitarian views. This middle view took voluminous fire from both sides. Clarke’s most formidable opponent was his learned and prolific friend, the reverend Daniel Waterland (1683–1740), Regius Professor of Divinity at Cambridge (Waterland 1856a-e). His main objections to Clarke may be summed up as follows. Clarke’s scheme differs in no important way from Arianism. Clarke posits a greater and two lesser gods (both creatures), and can’t defend the practice of creature-worship. Clarke misreads both the Bible and the early church fathers, both of which teach that the Father, Son, and Spirit are God and are divine in the same sense, and the latter of which teaches that the three are homoousios in a sense which implies they are one and the same being, although three persons. In short, Clarke is deluded in thinking that there’s any option other than the catholic doctrine, Sabellianism, and Arianism. Waterland’s own views are essentially pro-Nicene and mysterian (Waterland 1856a, 453–63; 1856e, 405–6). (See the supplementary document on the history of trinitarian doctrines section 3.3 and main entry section 4.) This very long and intricate debate between Waterland and Clarke and their respective allies, has been canvassed but never thoroughly analyzed (Dixon 2003; Ferguson 1976; Pfizenmaier 1997, Wiles 1996).

Another objection to Clarke’s views was given in conversation to Clarke not long before his premature death. He was asked: Is it possible for the Father to annihilate the Son and Spirit? Presumably, the dilemma is that if Clarke answers negatively, then the Son must be God himself, who alone exists necessarily, or at least the Son must be divine in an “absolute” sense. On the other hand, if he answers affirmatively, then he compromises the divinity of the Son and renders him a mere creature, as it will be possible for the Son to not exist—his existence will not be inevitable. Clarke answered that he hadn’t thought of the question (Ferguson 1976, 146, 247–8; Pfizenmaier 1997, 195–6; Van Mildert 1856, 78–9).

3.3 Late 19th–21st Century Jehovah’s Witness Subordinationists

The Watchtower Bible and Tract Society, since its inception in the late 19th century, has taught that the Son is a creature, created before the cosmos, and the agent through which God created the cosmos. The Holy Spirit is simply the power of God, the Father. Thus, they have been tagged as “Arians”, although they seem to have developed their theology independently of any prior unitarian literature. Like earlier unitarians, they make their stand on the Bible, holding that it supports their view and is inconsistent with creedal trinitarian views (Anonymous 1989; Holt 2002; Stafford 2007). They make many points in common with earlier unitarians, but have produced little scholarly literature.

4. 18th–21st Century Unitarianism

A relatively strong subordinationist movement in England gradually lost momentum after Clarke’s death, and was supplanted by a more radical unitarianism which nonetheless owed more to Clarke than to earlier unitarian or Socinian sources. Having been convinced that the Bible teaches the Father and the one God are one and the same, they proceeded to discard the rest of Clarke’s scheme in favor of one they held was simpler and more in keeping with the teaching of the apostles.

In many cases, as with Newton’s younger colleague Hopton Haynes (ca. 1667–1749), the motivation seems to have been entirely biblical (Haynes 1797). But another factor in the decline of Clarkean subordinationism was the declining fortunes of mind-body dualism. Clarke held that Christ pre-existed in the form of divine spirit, which spirit at the incarnation then indwelled the body of Jesus, taking the place of a normal human soul (Cf. section 3.1 above.) Materialism about human nature, then, implies that the subordinationists’ Jesus isn’t a human being. But it is a central tenet of Christianity that he was a human being. Thus, many had a motive to adopt a materialist version of what was later called a strictly “humanitarian” christology—that Christ was a normal human and didn’t pre–exist his conception, but was instead a wholly material being like any other human. Further, belief in a realm of spirits other than God, i.e., in angels and demons, as well as human souls, was on the decline (Belsham 1812, 209–14; Wiles 1996, 161–4). Finally, Priestley and others held that former subordinationist and prolific scholar Nathaniel Lardner (1684–1768) had made a powerful scriptural case against Clarkean subordinationism. (See section 3.2 above.) Lardner undercut a christology favored by subordinationists, in which the eternal Word or Logos unites with a human body in the man Jesus (as opposed to the mainstream view that the Word united with both a human body and a human soul). Lardner argues that the New Testament doesn’t teach that either Jesus or an element within him pre-existed Mary’s pregnancy. The logos (English: Word, Reason) of the first chapter of the Gospel of John is best understood as a divine attribute, which metaphorically “became flesh” in the man Jesus, and other traditional pre-existence proof texts are interpreted in ways consistent with Christ not existing before his conception. Lardner analyzes the use of “spirit” in the Bible and concludes that it refers to God, or to various of God’s properties, actions, or gifts (Lardner 1793a-b).

The driving forces of this new, English denominational Unitarian movement were Joseph Priestley (1733–1804) and his friend Theophilus Lindsey (1723–1808), the latter having publicly resigned a post as an Anglican minister in protest of the doctrine of the Trinity, and founded the first avowedly unitarian church in London in 1774 (Lindsey 1818). These two, along with their fellow travelers, poured out a large volume of plainly written, polemical but cool-headed literature. They argued for what came to be called “humanitarian” christology (Jesus had only a human nature), and denounced worship of Christ as Christian idolatry, urging true believers to leave trinitarian churches for the new Unitarian ones. They were particularly concerned with the interpretation of Bible texts which in their view had been commonly misread as attributing pre-existence to Christ (or to his divine nature), and literal divinity to Christ. Their antitrinitarianism was a part of a larger program to thoroughly de-catholicize and de-calvinize Christianity, and they gave a historical account of (as they saw it) the gradual, near-total corruption of the religion of Jesus (Priestley 1791a-c). This movement grew in England and Scotland producing well-developed arguments against the deity of Christ, the doctrine of two natures in Christ, and against trinitarian interpretations of the Bible (Belsham 1817; Christie 1808, 1810; Lindsey 1776). Many of its proponents, including Priestley and Lindsey, revised other Christian doctrines as well, for example disavowing belief in a personal Devil and demons, holding the accounts of the birth of Christ to be later and unbelievable additions to those gospels, or holding Christ to have been mistaken in some of his interpretations of the Jewish scriptures.

Influenced by these Unitarians, a somewhat different unitarian movement arose in America. In the late 18th and early 19th centuries there arose a “liberal”, anti-creedal, anti-Calvinist wing of New England Congregationalism, which contained humanitarian and (more commonly) subordinationist unitarians. After a series of public controversies from 1805 to 1835, these liberal Congregationalists accepted the label “Unitarian”, and left Congregationalism to form their own denomination. Like the English Unitarians, many of these American Unitarians argued at length that the Bible supports unitarianism and humanitarian christology over trinitarianism (Lamson 1828; Norton 1859; Wilson 1846). Others argued for subordinationist unitarian views (Worcester 1854).

Still anti-creedal, anti-Calvinist, and dedicated to “freedom of conscience”, American Unitarianism was transformed over the course of the mid 19th century by internal movements towards Transcendentalism and universalism (see heaven and hell, section 1.2, and by an increasing focus on various political causes. It evolved to the point where even theism was considered optional for its congregants (Grodzins 2009). While American Unitarians were long a part of the “Protestant establishment”, by the early 20th century American Unitarianism was widely written off by other Christians as either a version of theological liberalism, or simply not a version of Christianity at all, either way, irrelevant to their concerns. Thus, in 1908 the Federal Council of Churches rejected a Unitarian delegation on the grounds that they were not Christians, and Unitarians have never been a part of the World Council of Churches. This evolution from liberal Christian denomination to a theism-optional religion has often been seen, both within and without the movement, as a natural, perhaps inevitable development. Because of this, most present day Christian theologians feel free to ignore the entire history of unitarianism and its arguments.

There are presently a number of small Christian groups calling themselves “biblical unitarians” (or: Christian monotheists or one God believers)to distinguish themselves from late 19th to 21st century Unitarians and Unitarian Universalists. Their arguments draw on early modern unitarian sources, while eschewing some of the idiosyncrasies of Socinus’s theology and most of the extra revisions of the Priestley-derived stream of unitarians. Like late 18th to early 19th century unitarians, they argue at length that trinitarianism has no biblical foundation, and is inconsistent with its clear teachings. They also reject trinitarianism as contradictory or unintelligible, as involving idolatry, and as having been, as it were, illegally imported from Platonic philosophy (Buzzard 2007; Buzzard and Hunting 1999; Graeser et al. 2000; Snedeker 1998). On some issues they draw support from recent biblical scholarship, for example, the point that talk of “generation” and “procession” in the gospel of John doesn’t support later claims about inter-trinitarian relations (Buzzard and Hunting 1999, 306–8). Although this literature points out real tensions within contemporary theology (between text-oriented commentators and systematic theologians) it is widely ignored in academic theology and philosophy, and its adherents are generally excluded from the institutions of mainstream Christianity.

Copyright © 2020 by
Dale Tuggy <>

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