Notes to Wittgenstein’s Aesthetics

1. For a discussion of the use of the phrase “language game” and its significance for aesthetics, see G. L. Hagberg, Meaning and Interpretation: Wittgenstein, Henry James, and Literary Knowledge (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1994), pp. 9–44.

2. For a discussion of gestures and their relations to pictures, see Karlheinz Ludeking, “Pictures and Gestures”, British Journal of Aesthetics 30.3 (July 1990): 218–232.

3. See in this connection the discussion of the sign and its life in (Wittgenstein 1958a).

4. Wittgenstein does not here discuss the connection to aspect-perception or “seeing-as”, but this is to emerge as a central theme in his subsequent thinking about perception (figuring centrally in Section xi of Philosophical Investigations, Part II), and it has been much discussed in the secondary writings on Wittgenstein's aesthetics. The list is long, but for a start, see the papers collected in Seeing Wittgenstein Anew, ed. William Day and Victor Krebs (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, forthcoming).

5. For a very helpful recent discussion of Wittgenstein's conception of such pictures, see Eugen Fischer, “Philosophical Pictures”, Synthese (2006) 148: 469-501. The most sustained work to date in excavating and dismantling such pictures is still found in Frank B. Ebersole's three volumes; see his Things We Know (Eugene: University of Oregon Press, 1967), Language and Perception (Washington, D.C.: University Press of America, 1979), and Meaning and Saying (Washington, D.C.: University Press of America, 1979. See also, in connection with questions of aesthetic perception, Garry L. Hagberg, “The Aesthetics of Indiscernibles”, in Visual Theory, ed. Norman Bryson, Michael Ann Holly, and Keith Moxey (New York: HarperCollins, Icon Editions, 1991), pp.221-230.

6. This is not to suggest that Wittgenstein was anything like an uncritical follower of Kohler or of Gestalt psychology generally; whole sections of his multifarious writings on the philosophy of psychology can be read as sustained critical meditations on the philosophical wrong-turns taken by that movement (e.g. reifying the interpretation-laden perception into a mental object).

7. For a full examination of Wittgenstein's comments on Freud and their significance for the philosophy of psychology more broadly, see Jacques Bouveresse, Wittgenstein Reads Freud, trans. Carol Cosman (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1995).

Copyright © 2014 by
Garry Hagberg <>

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