Why Should Libraries at Small Colleges or Public Universities Support the SEP?

A question that we sometimes encounter is:

Why should libraries at small colleges or public universities pay membership dues to an organization (SEPIA) that supports a project at a large, rich, private institution like Stanford?

There are three reasons we give in response to this question:

Of these, the most novel and perhaps most significant is the first — the guarantee.

SEPIA membership dues come with a money-back guarantee.

The SEP's funding plan is a true partnership between Stanford University and the world-wide library community. Our library partners (ICOLC and SPARC) helped us create a plan in which the academic library community attempts to raise $3 million (of the $4.125 million needed). These funds are being put into an escrow account ("The SEP Library Fund") in Stanford's endowment. The conditions placed on this account are that (1) the payout from The SEP Library Fund can only be used to support the SEP, and (2) should the SEP project ever terminate, all the funds in The SEP Library Fund would be returned to the contributing libraries, together with any interest and appreciation that hasn't been spent on the payout to the project. Any interest and appreciation in excess of the payout stays with The SEP Library Fund and in reasonable economic times, the fund will grow.

Consequently, your membership dues become a protected investment with the following features:

So this is truly a novel model for funding an open access reference work.

Joining SEPIA Makes Economic Sense

We'd like to suggest that by supporting the SEP's plan at the recommended level, your institution would be acting in its own economic self-interest. Your library budget is under enormous pressure. Librarians seek ways to reduce annual costly outlays and they have an economic interest in supporting innovative alternative publishing and funding models that avoid such outlays. (Indeed, open access journals and reference works are viewed as desirable, but no one seems to know how to fund them.) On our plan, libraries pay a one-time cost (with the option to spread it over 3 years), as opposed to the ongoing costs associated with a traditional subscription model. We have found a plan on which everyone contributes a little bit to help preserve open access for all. In return, our library supporters receive the benefits of membership in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy International Association (SEPIA).

Students and scholars at small, low/moderate-income, and public institutions are using the SEP. Given that the SEP is being funded by a global community effort, all the institutions using the SEP should therefore help ensure its long-term viability. Note that computers from a wide range of departments across your campus access the SEP. (If you write to us, we can send you a total number of accesses to the SEP from the computers on your campus.) This justifies using library funds from different units within the University, not just from the Philosophy Department.

We opened our budget and budget justification to the large library umbrella organizations who helped us create our funding plan. They vetted our budget and found it to be reasonable. The fact that they are recommending our project indicates that they believe the SEP funding model to be in the interests of their constituent libraries. Our library partners agreed that if we were to move to a subscription model (which cuts off those who don't pay) or sold ourselves to one of the publishers who wanted to buy us out, the library community would, in the long run, have to pay more to obtain the SEP, and on an ongoing basis. (For a fuller discussion of our reasons for not adopting a traditional subscription model, see the document Problems with a Traditional Funding Model.)

SEPIA dues support a world-wide project, not just a Stanford project

It is important to note that the question we are addressing here presupposes that the SEP is a “Stanford project”. But that is not completely accurate. Our 1300+ authors and 115+ subject editors who write and referee the content of the SEP are distributed at universities throughout the world. By supporting the SEP, you are not supporting Stanford but rather a world-wide (and open access) scholarly publishing project that reaches far beyond the walls of a single institution or country. As we mentioned earlier, Stanford may use the SEPIA membership dues it has collected from the library community only for the support of the SEP, and thus for the benefit of everyone, given that the SEP is freely available and open access.

The SEP differs from a proprietary series with a publisher's or university's name on it; you cannot access the content of those publications without paying for them. Stanford's name is on the project because its contribution to the project has been and continues to be quite substantial. Stanford has (a) provided support to the SEP since its inception, including office space, networking, and administrative support; (b) contributed startup costs during the 1995–1997 academic years; (c) waived indirect costs on SEP grants or contributed cost-sharing funds to those grants; (d) contributed annual funds to cover part of our operating costs as bridge funding while we raise an endowment; and (e) agreed to use its Office of Development to help us raise $1.125 million from private donors.

The SEP organizes the members of the professional community of philosophers to collaboratively maintain a world-class, up-to-date reference work. Now we — with our library partners — are trying to organize and encourage the members of the library community to collaboratively keep this resource available in perpetuity.

We hope you will choose to join us in this effort!

John Perry, Faculty Sponsor
Edward N. Zalta, Principal Editor
Uri Nodelman, Senior Editor
Colin Allen, Associate Editor

Center for the Study of Language and Information
Stanford University
Stanford, CA 94305-4115