“Al-Fârâbî’s metaphysics”, as understood here, means not just his views, and arguments for those views, on a series of metaphysical topics, but his project of reconstructing and reviving metaphysics as a science. This is part of his larger project of reconstructing and reviving “the sciences of the ancients”: his scientific project in metaphysics is inseparable from his interpretation and assimilation of Aristotle’s Metaphysics. We start with some motivation for Fârâbî’s larger project of reconstructing “the sciences of the ancients”, then turn to what he says about metaphysics as one such science and about Aristotle’s Metaphysics, and then to details of his reconstruction of metaphysics as a science, both in his account of maximally universal concepts such as being and unity, and in his account of God as the first cause of existence.
- 1. Fârâbî’s project of reviving the sciences of the ancients
- 2. Fârâbî on metaphysics as a science and Aristotle’s Metaphysics
- 3. Fârâbî’s ontology: the Book of Letters and On the One and Unity
- 3.1 Fârâbî’s project in the Book of Letters
- 3.2 Logical and grammatical form, and the role of particles
- 3.3 Fârâbî on the word for being, in Greek and Arabic
- 3.4 Fârâbî on the senses of being [mawjûd] and the corresponding senses of existence [wujûd]
- 3.5 Fârâbî on the scientific questions about being
- 3.6 On the One and Unity: senses of unity, different relations between one and many, and the circumscription of a thing by its quiddity
- 4. Fârâbî’s philosophical theology: the Perfect City and Political Regime
- Academic Tools
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- Related Entries
- Supplement: Fârâbî’s project of reviving the sciences of the ancients
- Supplement: Fârâbî on the word for being, in Greek and Arabic
1. Fârâbî’s project of reviving the sciences of the ancients
Fârâbî does metaphysics, not by writing a commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics, but by trying to reconstruct Aristotle’s aims and demonstrative method and to write the book that Aristotle would have written had he been writing in Arabic for a largely Muslim readership. This is a part of Fârâbî’s approach to the “sciences of the ancients”, i.e., to Greek philosophy, mathematics, and medicine, with all their sub-disciplines. A brief summary follows but, for a fuller account, see Supplement: Fârâbî’s project of reviving the sciences of the ancients.
Fârâbî, more than any other medieval philosopher, distrusts the surface appearance of Greek philosophy as presented to him in the Arabic translations. He tries to go beyond this surface to reconstruct the ancient authors’ aims and methods, and even to reconstruct the structure of their Greek expressions, which he suspects have been badly served by the Arabic translations. In some cases the Greek texts he is interested in were not available to him even in Arabic translation, but only in translations of later ancient summaries or descriptions, but this does not stop him from trying to reconstruct their underlying thought. (He has access to translations of almost all of the texts of Aristotle that we have now, but apparently to none of the texts of Plato.) He thinks this is worth the effort because he thinks that the Greeks, especially Plato and Aristotle, developed sciences which have since decayed or have been transmitted only imperfectly to the Arabic-writing Muslim-ruled lands, but which it is still possible to reconstruct and to apply to the urgent questions of his own time.
Fârâbî is particularly interested in applying the “sciences of the ancients”, and particularly metaphysics, to resolve the issues addressed and disputed by the “religious sciences” within Islam, especially kalâm or “dialectical theology”. These issues include whether the world was created in time or has existed from eternity, proofs of God’s existence and of his having no partner or contrary, God’s attributes (knowledge, power, will …) and his action in creating the world, and how his causality relates to the causality of creatures. (Fârâbî systematically addresses these issues, as well as kalâm issues about prophecy, the religious community, and the “return” or afterlife, in his Principles of the Opinions of the Perfect City: see Section 4 below.) Fârâbî thinks that the arguments about these issues within the Muslim community (and other religious communities within the Muslim world) have been merely dialectical, so that it is equally possible to argue on both sides of each issue. He thinks that if the sciences of the ancients, especially metaphysics, can be reconstructed and practiced according to a demonstrative method, they will be able to resolve these disputes. He thinks, however, that earlier philosophers in the Muslim world, in practicing what they saw as Platonic or Aristotelian philosophy, have argued sub-demonstratively, and so have been unable to resolve the disputes. Fârâbî claims to be the first person in the Muslim world to have mastered Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics and so recaptured Aristotle’s demonstrative method. And he claims to be the first to have understood Aristotle’s Metaphysics, and to have mastered the science of being and its universal attributes which gives the only scientific foundation for making judgments about God and his causality.
Fârâbî and his contemporaries use the word “philosophy” (in Arabic “falsafa”), borrowed from the Greek, only for those schools and disciplines that present themselves as continuing ancient Greek philosophy. Before Fârâbî’s time this kind of philosophy was mainly practiced, in the Muslim world, by Christians, often Syriac-Arabic bilinguals (and almost all the translators of Greek texts were Christian); although Christian philosophers also had Muslim and Jewish students, and although some Ismaʿili Shiʿites had integrated a version of Greek philosophy into their ideal of what the imam must know. Fârâbî wants to break the association of philosophy with particular (and often marginalized) linguistic and religious communities. The Arabic grammarian Sîrâfî had accused Fârâbî’s Christian teacher Abû Bishr Mattâ of presenting as universal rules of logic, normative for any rational being, what were simply rules of Greek grammar, as translated from Greek through Syriac into Arabic and probably damaged in translation. Against this charge, Fârâbî wants to show that logic, and philosophy is general, is not community-bound like Arabic grammar or Muslim kalâm. Logic is to thought as the grammar of a particular language is to that language: its rules apply to all thought insofar as it is correct, whatever language it may be expressed in, and they give the common core shared by all languages, abstracted from the merely conventional and community-relative aspects of particular languages. And philosophy is to religion as logic is to grammar, giving rules for how to think about God and the physical world and human beings, and therefore for how to act to achieve the aim of human life, which apply to all humans insofar as they reason and act correctly; and these rules give the common core of doctrines and practical prescriptions shared by all religions, or at least by a plurality of correct religions, abstracted from the merely conventional and community-relative aspects of particular religions.
2. Fârâbî on metaphysics as a science and Aristotle’s Metaphysics
Fârâbî aims to revive the sciences of the ancients, especially the philosophical disciplines practiced by Plato and Aristotle, to replace the (as he thinks) non-demonstrative disciplines of his contemporaries, and to resolve their otherwise interminable disputes. This centrally includes a project of reviving scientific metaphysics, because metaphysics (rather than physics or other sciences) offers the hope of a scientific demonstration that God exists and has no partner or contrary, and a scientific resolution of the kalâm issues about God’s attributes and acts, and the relation of God’s acts to creatures and their acts. Perhaps metaphysics can also determine whether the human soul, or some part of it, survives death, and thus can resolve the kalâm issue about our “return” to God. But also, apart from whatever metaphysics may say about immortality, Fârâbî thinks, following Aristotle, that the highest human happiness consists in the contemplation of God, so that metaphysics will describe the content of our possible happiness after death, and will come as close as we can come to anticipating it in this life.
Fârâbî did not write any one systematic work on metaphysics, corresponding to Aristotle’s Metaphysics, although his Book of Letters and On the One and Unity, taken together, stand in a close relation to some parts and aspects of Aristotle’s Metaphysics, and parts of his Principles of the Opinions of the People of the Perfect City and On the Political Constitution stand in close relations to other parts and aspects of the Metaphysics (other parts of these treatises are closer to other Greek models). Fârâbî’s starting-point in trying to revive the science of metaphysics and to reconstruct and imitate its classical texts (above all Aristotle’s Metaphysics) is his discussion of the “aim” or “object” [Arabic gharaḍ = Greek skopos] of metaphysics. Fârâbî takes over late ancient philosophers’ assumptions that each of Aristotle’s treatises is devoted to teaching some one science, and that each science (and the treatise teaching it) has some one “aim”, such that everything the science treats is somehow related to that aim. Thus the “aim” of medicine is health: the science of medicine also discusses, for instance, anatomy and pathology and pharmacology, but only because they are somehow related to health. Much of Fârâbî’s discussion of Aristotle’s texts picks up late ancient discussions of what science each text transmits, the “aim” of the science and the text, how those sciences function together to attain the human good and what role each text can play in that larger undertaking. In order to reconstruct what Aristotle would say now, instead of what he said in Greek in the Metaphysics, if he were addressing a different linguistic and religious community in a different historical situation, Fârâbî must start by understanding the aim of metaphysics as a science and how each book of the Metaphysics is directed toward attaining that aim. He gives surveys of the Greek sciences in his Enumeration of the Sciences and Attainment of Happiness, and of Aristotle’s works in the Philosophy of Aristotle, all of which include brief discussions of metaphysics; he also has a brief discussion of metaphysics and its relation to some other sciences in his Book of Letters, and he writes an entire short treatise On the aims of the Sage in each book of the treatise which is called the Book of Letters, that is, the determination of Aristotle’s aim in his treatise the Metaphysics (for short, On the Aims of the Metaphysics). In the bulk of the Book of Letters and On the One and Unity he is not talking about metaphysics as a science or about Aristotle’s text, but rather imitating Aristotle in practicing this science. Some of On the Aims of the Metaphysics is also imitating Aristotle, since, in describing the distinction between the different theoretical sciences (physics, mathematics, metaphysics) and the different things that metaphysics considers, he is imitating Aristotle’s discussion in Metaphysics VI,1.
Fârâbî starts On the Aims of the Metaphysics by saying:
Our intention in this book is to indicate the aim that is contained in the treatise of Aristotle called Metaphysics, and [to indicate] its primary divisions. For many people have followed their fancy that the meaning and content of this treatise is the account of the Creator (glory be to Him and be He exalted!) and the intelligence and the soul and the other things that are related to these, and that the science of metaphysics and the science of theology are one and the same. And thus we find that most of those who investigate [this treatise] are confused and go astray, since we find that most of the account in it lacks this aim, indeed we do not find in it any special discussion of this aim except what is in the eleventh book, which bears the sign lam [L or Λ].
Here Fârâbî is referring to the discussion, which Arabic writers had inherited from late ancient Greek commentators, about the aim of the Metaphysics, or equivalently about what the science of metaphysics is about: Aristotle himself does not use the word or phrase “metaphysics”, but he speaks both of “wisdom [sophia]” and of “first philosophy”, and Greek and Arabic commentators assume that “wisdom” and “first philosophy” are different names for the same science, and that the Metaphysics as a whole is dedicated to this science, which can therefore also be called “metaphysics”. For two reasons, there is an inherited problem about what this science is about. The first reason is that Aristotle in different places says different, not obviously compatible, things about what this science is about: notably, in the Metaphysics I,1–2 he says that wisdom is the science of first causes and principles; in Metaphysics VI,1 and in several texts outside the Metaphysics he says that first philosophy is the science of divine things (which he calls “theology”) or the science of eternally unchangeable separately existing things; in Metaphysics IV,1–2 he says that there is a science of being as such and its attributes, and in Metaphysics VI,1 he apparently identifies that science with first philosophy or theology; and in Metaphysics IV,2 he also identifies the science of being as such with the science of substance. So the commentators try in different ways to reconcile these different things that Aristotle says about wisdom or first philosophy. The second reason that there is a problem is that what Aristotle actually does in the different books of the Metaphysics does not obviously fit with what he says that wisdom or first philosophy will do. If, as Fârâbî says here, “most people” have concluded that “the meaning and content of this treatise is the account of the Creator … and the intelligence and the soul and the other things that are related to these”—i.e., an account of things that can be argued to be eternal and separable from matter—this is not because (as Fârâbî puts it here) they have simply “followed their fancy”, or because they have confused Greek metaphysics with Islamic kalâm. Rather, it is because Aristotle repeatedly says that first philosophy is a science of separate eternally unchanging things. The problem is that, as Fârâbî says, most of the Metaphysics outside of Book XII (indeed, outside of roughly the second half of Book XII) does not seem to be talking about such things, except inasmuch as Metaphysics XIII–XIV try to refute other philosophers’ candidates for separate eternally unchanging things, namely Platonic Forms and mathematical objects. So Fârâbî’s problem in On the Aims of the Metaphysics will not be simply to find a way of reconciling the different things Aristotle says about wisdom or first philosophy and show how these can all be referring to the same science, but also to say what Aristotle actually does in each book of the Metaphysics and to show how it contributes to this science.
In his Enumeration of the Sciences Fârâbî gives a description of “the divine science” (corresponding to Aristotle’s word “theology” in Metaphysics VI,1, and his description of wisdom as “divine science” in Metaphysics I,2), crowning his previous descriptions of mathematics and physics. Here Fârâbî says the divine science is divided into three parts. The first part investigates “beings and the things that belong to them inasmuch as they are beings”: this reflects Aristotle’s programmatic declaration in Metaphysics IV,1. The second part, says Fârâbî, investigates (i.e., establishes) the principles of the particular sciences, and also investigates (i.e., refutes) false opinions of earlier philosophers about the principles of these sciences, among which Fârâbî mentions the opinion that mathematical objects are separately existing substances: the latter would reflect Metaphysics XIII–XIV, but Fârâbî is probably also thinking of the refutation in Metaphysics IV,3–8 of people who deny the principle of noncontradiction. (There is little support in Aristotle for the idea that metaphysics establishes principles of other sciences, except for universal axioms like noncontradiction and excluded middle, but this idea can be found in late ancient commentators. Aristotle does accept cases where one science can establish principles that are assumed in another science—for instance, number theory establishes principles that are assumed in mathematical music theory, and geometry establishes principles that are used in astronomy and optics—and Porphyry says that metaphysics is related to physics in this way.) The third part of the “divine science”—and here Fârâbî has much more to say—shows that there are beings which neither are bodies nor exist in bodies, that these beings are not one but many, and not infinitely but finitely many, and that they do not all share the same degree of perfection, but rather some are superior and others inferior. This then leads to the conclusion that these beings separate from bodies culminate in some first being which has nothing prior to it and thus has no further cause of its existence. And, Fârâbî says, this science shows that this being also has no partner (nothing sharing its degree of perfection) and no contrary; that there is no multiplicity in it in any way, and that it is one, being, and true in a stronger sense than everything else; and that it is the first cause which bestows being, unity and truth on everything else. Then, Fârâbî says, this science shows that this being deserves the name “God”, and satisfies the rest of the divine attributes; and then it shows how other beings arise from God and how they form an ordered hierarchy (some beings arise from God directly, others indirectly through these), explains how God acts on other things, and refutes the false opinion that God is responsible for evils. The description of this third part of the “divine science” reads like an analytical table of contents for much of what Fârâbî does in his Principles of the Opinions of the People of the Perfect City and Political Regime, but it is not closely related to anything in Aristotle. At best, it is an enormously expanded version of some things that Aristotle covers very quickly in Metaphysics XII,6–10: XII,6 shows that there are separate incorporeal substances, XII,7 justifies the name “god”, XII,8 argues that there is a finite multiplicity of such substances but only one first among them, and then XII,10 identifies this first principle with the good itself and argues (very sketchily) that it is the cause of good order in the cosmos and that there is no evil principle contrary to it. Aristotle does not seem to say in Metaphysics XII that the first principle is one, being, and true in a stronger sense than everything else, or that it bestows being, unity and truth on everything else (the best support for this view might be Metaphysics II,1 993b23–31). But the more serious problem is that Fârâbî here just gives a list of the things that the science will investigate or prove, without explaining why these tasks all belong to the same science, and without explaining what principles the science can draw on to demonstrate all these conclusions. His account here looks like a wish-list of what he would like the science to do, especially as a Greek scientific alternative to Islamic kalâm, but it does not explain how a science can do all this. Rather than solving the inherited problem of how a single science can meet the different descriptions that Aristotle gives of wisdom or first philosophy, he aggravates the problem by adding more things that the science must do.
In On the Aims of the Metaphysics, Fârâbî tries to resolve the tension between “ontological” and “theological” descriptions of metaphysics (science of beings universally, vs. science of God or of separate immaterial substances), and the tension between Aristotle’s mostly “theological” descriptions of his task and his mostly “ontological” practice in the Metaphysics, in two fundamental ways.
First, Fârâbî takes up Aristotle’s contrast, in Metaphysics IV,1 and VI,1, between metaphysics and the “particular sciences” such as physics and the mathematical disciplines, each of which takes some one genus of beings and investigates what can be said of the things in that genus. By contrast, says Fârâbî,
universal science is that which investigates what is common to all the things that are, such as being and unity, and its kinds and its attributes, and things which are not accidents [proper to] any of the subjects of the particular sciences, [i.e., things] like priority and posteriority and potency and act and the perfect and the deficient and what is like these, and the common principle of all the things that are: this is the thing that must be called by the name of God.
Fârâbî says that there can be only one such universal science, because sciences are individuated by their subject-domains: if there are two sciences, such that the subject-domain of one includes something that is not within the subject-domain of the other, then at least the second science is not a universal science; so any two universal sciences would have the same subject-domain, and would therefore be the same science. So a universal science, if there is one, would be a science of being as such, and also of unity if (as Fârâbî says, following Aristotle in Metaphysics IV,2) unity is coextensive with being, and also of any attributes (more literally “consequences”) of being or unity, i.e., predicates that can be shown to apply to every existing thing just because it exists or because it is one. (Since Fârâbî cites pairs like “the perfect and the deficient”, he apparently means to include, not just attributes that apply to all beings, but also pairs of attributes that apply disjunctively to all beings, in something like the way that even and odd apply disjunctively to all numbers.) Fârâbî does not argue here that there is a universal science, beyond saying that “it does not belong to any of [the particular sciences] to investigate what is common to all the things that are”. Perhaps his view is that there is at least something to investigate here, namely “what, if anything, is common to all the things that are?”. If that investigation yields no answer, or a negative answer, then there is no universal science; if we discover, for some value of P, that P belongs universally to all the things that are, then that proposition and the arguments for it belong to the universal science, so there is a universal science. Fârâbî is not assuming that being is univocal and so constitutes a single genus. He says in On the Aims that Aristotle in Metaphysics V investigates whether the terms for being and its attributes are univocal or not, and in his Book of Letters (see Section 3 below) he says that being is not univocal, but is said of substances primarily and of other things derivatively. So if all beings have some attribute P, it will be because substances are P primarily, and other beings are P because substances are; but this is still enough for “all beings are P” to be a theorem of the universal science.
We have seen that Fârâbî lists God as one of the things investigated by the universal science. God is investigated by the science that “investigates what is common to all the things that are” because God is “the common principle of all the things that are”: he belongs to all beings in common, not because he is an attribute predicated of all beings, but because he is a cause of all beings. More precisely, he is a cause of all beings quâ being: that is, he is a cause, to the things that are, of the fact that they are, rather than of other facts about them. As Fârâbî says a bit further down,
the divine science must enter into this science, since God is the principle of being simpliciter, not of one being as distinguished from another being. And the division which gives the principle of being must be the divine science, since these concepts are not proper to physics but are higher than physics in generality. So this science is higher than the science of nature, and after the science of nature, and for this reason it should be called the science of metaphysics [lit. the science of what is after nature].
Here Fârâbî is taking a stand on an issue that was controversial among Aristotelians, by saying that we do not come to know God through the science of physics, even though Aristotle argues in his Physics 8 that the eternal circular motions are caused by eternally unmoved movers. Fârâbî is saying that the right way to come to know God is as a cause of existence rather than as a cause of motion. On the face of it, this could be taken in two ways. (a) Perhaps Fârâbî means that God is both a cause of existence (to everything) and a cause of motion (to the things that move, i.e., to bodies rather than to incorporeal substances), but that the right way to gain scientific knowledge of God is to know him as the cause of existence. Fârâbî’s reason might be that, when we know about God that he is a first cause of motion (an unmoved mover), we do not thereby know what God is, since what God is must apply only to God, and there are many unmoved movers, of the many circular motions in the heavens. Fârâbî’s point may be that there is only one first cause of existence (although many first causes of motion), and knowing about God that he is a first cause of existence gives us knowledge of what God is. (b) In fact, however, Fârâbî thinks that the first cause of existence is prior to the first cause of motion in a stronger sense: knowing the first cause of motion does not give us knowledge of God, because God is not a cause of motion at all. On Fârâbî’s account in the Perfect City and Political Regime, God is not the first of the unmoved movers, but is rather a cause of existence to the unmoved movers and thus indirectly to everything else. So an ascent to the first cause of motion does not get us to God at all, but only to some lower being: only a study of the causes of being will get us to God.
So far, Fârâbî’s description of metaphysics is ontological: theology is part of metaphysics, because theology is part of the study of being, namely the study of the first cause of existence. This allows Fârâbî to reconcile Aristotle’s saying in Metaphysics VI,1 that first philosophy is a science of being quâ being with his saying in the same chapter that first philosophy is theology. Unfortunately, this solution seems to conflict with something else Aristotle says in the same chapter, namely that
physics is about things that are inseparate but not unmoved, some of mathematics about things that are unmoved, but probably not separate but rather existing in matter, whereas first philosophy is about things that are both separate and unmoved. (1026a13–16)
This seems to mean, not just that the study of things that are separate and unmoved belongs to first philosophy, but that first philosophy is defined as the science of things that are separate and unmoved. How then is first philosophy the science of being and its universal attributes? One possible answer would be that first philosophy is by definition the science of God (or perhaps the science of separate unmoved things including God), and that it studies being and its universal attributes instrumentally, because starting with them and investigating their causes is the only way we have to come to knowledge of God. (This might imply that those aspects of the study of being and its universal attributes which are not useful for drawing conclusions about God would not belong to first philosophy.) But Fârâbî gives a different answer, by reinterpreting what Aristotle means by “separate”. This is the second way that Fârâbî tries to resolve the tension between ontological and theological descriptions of metaphysics.
Fârâbî infers from the universality of the science he has described, including its investigation of God as the cause of existence universally, that
this science is higher than the science of nature, and after the science of nature, and for this reason it should be called the science of metaphysics [i.e., literally, the science of what is after nature].
But, as he admits, mathematics too “is higher than the science of nature since its subjects are abstracted from matters”: so why doesn’t it count as metaphysics? Aristotle in Metaphysics VI,1 says that mathematics falls short of being first philosophy because its objects, although unchanging, do not exist separately but rather are thought in abstraction from the things they really exist in, whereas the objects of first philosophy are not merely thought in abstraction but really exist separately. Fârâbî takes this up, and, like all ancient and medieval interpreters, takes “abstraction” and “separation” to mean abstraction and separation from matter. It makes sense to say that God exists really separated from matter and triangles don’t. But Fârâbî thinks that the objects of metaphysics include not only God but also being and unity. Why should being and unity be any more “separate” than triangles are? Here Fârâbî reinterprets the notion of separation. Some of the objects of metaphysics, like God, “are things that have no existence at all in natural things”. But others, like being and its universal attributes, “are things that exist in natural things but are imagined as abstracted from them”, and are to that extent like mathematical objects; but, unlike mathematical objects, they
do not exist per se in these [natural] things in such a way that their existence could not be divested from them: these are the things whose subsistence is in natural things but which exist both in natural things and in non-natural things.
So because being and its universal attributes are attributes of natural things but are also attributes of separately existing immaterial things, they too can be said to be “separate” from natural things and from matter.
Recall that in the Enumeration of the Sciences Fârâbî describes metaphysics as investigating three things—being and its attributes, the principles of the particular sciences, and separate incorporeal beings (especially God)—but he does not explain why the three investigations fall under a single science or what premisses the science can draw on to resolve the questions. In On the Aims of the Metaphysics he tries to explain how these investigations fit together. The science starts by studying its primary subject, namely being and unity; then, “since the science of opposites is the same”, their opposites, non-being and multiplicity; then it divides being and unity and their opposites into their main species, or rather quasi-species—“quasi” because substances, qualities, and the other categories are each called “being” in a different sense, whereas if being were a genus and they were its species it would be said of them all in the same sense. Then the science investigates the attributes and principles of being and unity and their opposites,
and these things are divided and subdivided until the subjects of the particular sciences are reached, and this science terminates and there are manifested in it the principles of all the particular sciences and the definitions of their subjects.
Because being and unity are not univocal, we cannot just straightforwardly investigate their attributes and causes, but once they have been analyzed into their different senses, we can investigate the attributes and causes of each sense of being or unity in the same way that any other science investigates the attributes and causes of some given genus. A given effect, say substantial being, may have different kinds of causes (for instance, both a formal cause and a material cause), and these different kinds of causes may not all converge on a first principle which is a cause in all these ways at once (there will not be a single first principle that is both a formal and a material cause). Some chains of causes may proceed upwards ad infinitum without reaching a first principle (like the chain of my ancestors, if the world and species within it are eternal); and chains of causes of some kind may lead to many first causes which have no further causes of that kind, rather than to a single first cause (each animal has a soul as a first formal cause which has no higher formal cause, but there will be as many such souls, not a single soul which is a first formal cause of all animals). Nonetheless, Fârâbî claims that there is a single first cause of all beings, which does not itself have a cause of any kind; if so, such a thing would deserve the name “God”. If the science can show that there is such a single first principle, the science would then try to deduce what this principle must be like in order to be a cause of all beings, and in order not to have any further cause itself, and would then try to deduce how it must acts in order to cause the existence of other things, some directly and others indirectly. Here in On the Aims Fârâbî says that Aristotle does all these things in Metaphysics XII:
The eleventh book [i.e., Book XII, Lambda] is about the principle of substance and [thereby] of all existence, the existence [of this principle] and the confirmation that it is knowing by its essence and true by its essence, and about the separate beings which are after it, and about how the existence of beings depends on it.
But that is all that Fârâbî says here, and he never gives any more detailed discussion of how he thinks Aristotle does this in Metaphysics XII. But Fârâbî himself tries to deliver on this promise in his Perfect City and Political Regime, which we will turn to after discussing his analysis of being and unity and other equally universal concepts in his Book of Letters and On the One and Unity.
3. Fârâbî’s ontology: the Book of Letters and On the One and Unity
Fârâbî’s most widely-known and perhaps best-understood work, the Principles of the Opinions of the People of the Perfect City, and his often similar Political Regime, presuppose analyses of being and unity in arguing for conclusions about God and his attributes and his causality; but Fârâbî makes these analyses fully explicit only in two much less widely known and less well-understood texts, the Kitâb al-ḥurûf = Book of Letters and On the One and Unity, which are intended to be read together. Both of these texts were edited for the first time by Muhsin Mahdi, the Book of Letters in 1969 and On the One and Unity in 1989; only partial translations of the Book of Letters, and no translations at all of On the One and Unity, have been published in English or any western European language. Both texts are difficult, and at least the Book of Letters presents serious textual problems; there have been few studies of On the One and Unity, and most studies of the Book of Letters have focussed on its socio-political rather than metaphysical sections. So what is said here must remain tentative.
3.1 Fârâbî’s project in the Book of Letters
The most basic questions about the Book of Letters are what, if anything, the treatise is about overall, and how the different parts of the treatise contribute to knowledge of that aim. Mahdi 1969a divides the text into three “Parts” [abwâb]; in the manuscripts that have been studied so far, the three Parts are probably not transmitted in the right order, some parts of the text and perhaps in particular an introduction are missing, and it is not obvious what the subject-matters of the three Parts have to do with each other. The title Kitâb al-ḥurûf = Book of Letters is the same title by which Fârâbî in On the Aims cites Aristotle’s Metaphysics (which presumably gets called Book of Letters because Arabic authors cite its individual books by the names of letters of the alphabet, just as we do now), so the title suggests that Fârâbî intends this treatise to correspond to the Metaphysics; and there are heavy overlaps of content between the Book of Letters and Aristotle’s Metaphysics, especially but not exclusively Book V, which make it very unlikely that the correspondence of titles is a coincidence. But the title Kitâb al-Ḥurûf can also mean something else, since “ḥurûf” (sg. ḥarf), besides meaning “letters”, can also mean grammatical “particles”, i.e., any words that can neither be declined like a noun nor conjugated like a verb, so pronouns and articles and prepositions and adverbs and conjunctions. Parts I and III of the Book of Letters are organized “lexically” (like Fârâbî’s On Intelligence), around the many meanings of each of a series of terms, and the majority of the terms here are grammatically particles rather than nouns or verbs: once again, it seems very unlikely that this is a coincidence. But how can the same book be Kitâb al-Ḥurûf both in the sense of filling the role of Aristotle’s Metaphysics, and in the sense of being about grammatical particles? And how would a study of the meanings of particles (and of some selected nouns) contribute to metaphysics as Fârâbî has described it in On the Aims? To see how this could work, we have to see something about the projects of the three Parts of the Book of Letters and how they fit together; and we have to start with Part II, which Fârâbî probably intended to come first, and which can be taken as programmatic for the whole treatise. After discussing the project of the treatise, we will focus on its most remarkable claims about the different senses of being [mawjûd] and the corresponding senses of existence [wujûd], and about how they should be investigated, and the implications for metaphysics. Finally, we will look more briefly at the corresponding claims about one and unity in On the One and Unity.
Part II of the Book of Letters gives an account of the development of the “syllogistic arts” (arts of reasoning such as rhetoric, dialectic and sophistic), culminating in demonstrative science, within a given linguistic and religious community, and their transmission from one community to another. Fârâbî is especially interested in the language of these arts, especially of demonstrative science. He talks about the origin of language as such; but language as it naturally arises is not well suited to being the vehicle of demonstrative science, because it is chiefly devoted to naming and describing the objects of immediate practical interest to human beings, which are not the main objects of theoretical interest. But natural language can be extended in two main ways to provide the terminology of the syllogistic arts. First, terms of ordinary language can be extended metaphorically to new meanings, and can then be frozen for use as technical terms; and this process of metaphorical extension and freezing can be repeated indefinitely many times. Second, new terms can be formed from old ones by regular grammatical processes of morphological derivation, and this type of extension too can be repeated and combined with the first type. Special problems, however, arise when the arts, especially demonstrative science, are transmitted from one community to another, and the translators must create a new technical vocabulary in the target-language. If the technical terms of the source-text were derived by freezing metaphorically extended words in the source-language, the translator may try to create new technical terms either by imitating the metaphors of the source-language in the target-language, where they may be much less natural, or else by forming new terms from metaphors more natural to the target language: either way, there is a risk of misunderstanding. Fârâbî talks about these problems in general, but he devotes special attention to the transmission of demonstrative philosophy and its vocabulary from Greek into (Syriac and thus) Arabic.
Although Fârâbî does not make explicit connections between the different Parts of the Book of Letters, Part II can be seen as giving an implicit program for Parts I and III, each of which is organized lexically around a list of terms: in each case Fârâbî lists the different meanings of the term, starting with an ordinary-language meaning and then explaining how it is metaphorically extended to a series of further meanings, including technical meanings in the different arts and especially in philosophy. Part I treats in this way terms including the names of many of the ten Aristotelian categories, or the interrogative particles from which names of categories are derived (“kamiyya” = quantity is derived from “kam?” = “how much?”, and so on); it also discusses particles such as “from” and “because” and nouns such as “being”, “essence”, and “accident”, with a heavy overlap with the list of terms investigated in Aristotle’s Metaphysics V. Part Three applies the same lexical method to the four kinds of scientific question or investigation described in Posterior Analytics II, the questions “whether X is”, “what X is”, “that S is P”, and “why S is P”. In each of these cases Fârâbî distinguishes the ways of investigating these questions in different disciplines—for instance, how they are investigated in dialectic vs. how they are investigated in demonstrative science—as if they turned on different meanings that the particles, “whether” or “what” or “that” or “why”, have in different syllogistic arts. There are clear connections between Parts I and III, notably between Part I on the senses of “being” [mawjûd] and Part III on the senses of “whether it is” [hal mawjûd]. Fârâbî evidently thinks that people have gone wrong in the sciences through confusing different meanings of the terms he discusses, in particular through confusing ordinary-language meanings of these terms with technical meanings in the syllogistic arts, or confusing meanings in one syllogistic art with meanings in another. And he thinks these problems are made worse when the technical terms of these arts are first developed in one language (Greek) and then translated into another (Arabic) in the ways he has described in Part II: if a word which has a meaning in ordinary Arabic (or in the technical vocabulary of some native Arabic art), or a word morphologically derived from such an Arabic word, has its meaning extended to serve as the artificial Arabic equivalent of some Greek technical term, then there is a serious risk that it will be misunderstood by Arabic readers. This explains why Fârâbî thinks that the sort of work Aristotle does in Metaphysics V, distinguishing different meanings of a series of technical terms, would be even more necessary in Arabic than it was in Greek.
3.2 Logical and grammatical form, and the role of particles
Something more, however, is needed to explain why Fârâbî concentrates so heavily on the meanings of particles, and why he thinks (as he does) that this study will lead to a scientific investigation of being and its causes.
A crucial point is that Fârâbî is worried not just about lexical confusions (confusions between two meanings of a term or between two similar terms), but about confusions arising from the misleading grammatical form of a term: he thinks that these confusions have given rise to serious philosophical errors, and he thinks that the translation process has made such confusions more likely. Part I of the Book of Letters distinguishes between the primitive terms of a language and the terms derived or “paronymous” [mushtaqq] from them. Fârâbî takes the notion of paronymy ultimately from Aristotle’s Categories 1 (1a12–15). A proper noun like “Socrates”, a common noun like “horse”, and an abstract accidental term like “whiteness” are all primitive terms, but the concrete accidental term “white” is paronymous or derived from “whiteness”, not necessarily in the sense that it arises later in the history of the language than “whiteness”, but in the sense that something is called “white” (rather than “whiteness”) because there is a whiteness in it. Fârâbî, unlike Aristotle, also treats (finite) verbs as being paronymous from their infinitives, where the infinitive [maṣdar] in Arabic is a noun expressing the action of the verb. The grammatical form of a paronymous term suggests that something is X by having an X-ness present in it, or V’s by having an action of V-ing in it. But sometimes the grammatical form of a term misleadingly fails to track its logical form, and in these cases there is a risk of being deceived by what Aristotle in On Sophistical Refutations calls sophisms of skhêma tês lexeôs: this is usually translated into English as “sophisms of figure of speech”, but they would more accurately be called “sophisms of grammatical form”, i.e., sophisms which arise because the grammatical form of an expression fails to correspond to its logical form, and which can be solved only by diagnosing this discrepancy. The Arabic translators of Greek philosophical texts, in trying to find Arabic equivalents for the Greek source-terms, often use such awkward and potentially misleading expressions, and so do Arabic philosophical texts written in imitation of the language of the translations. In particular, Fârâbî says that the Greek word for “being” was non-paronymous, but that some translators, not finding a good non-paronymous Arabic equivalent, instead used the paronymous word, “mawjûd”, literally “found”, and that this gave rise to the grammatical appearance that something is existent or “found” [mawjûd] through an existence or “finding” [wujûd] present in it, as something is white through a whiteness present in it. Fârâbî, applying a methodological principle of charity, seems to assume that in each case the Greek original was free of such infelicities: this means that, in practice, his reconstructed Greek serves as an ideal logical language, i.e., a language in which grammatical form always tracks logical form.
Where grammatical form tracks logical form, a non-paronymous noun will signify either a substance or a being in one of the nine Aristotelian categories of accidents, and a paronymous noun or a verb will signify that such a being is present in or attributed to some underlying subject. But metaphysics, as Fârâbî understands it, is not about things in the categories (Book of Letters I,11–17), but rather about the categories themselves (especially substance) and about trans-categorial concepts such as being, unity, essence, cause, and also God (who also, for Fârâbî, does not fall under any category). And where grammatical form tracks logical form, these concepts will be signified neither by non-paronymous nouns, nor by paronymous nouns or verbs, but by particles. Particles in an ideal logical language thus correspond roughly to what a modern philosopher would call logical constants. And it is clear that Fârâbî thinks that at least some important metaphysical notions were expressed in Greek by particles, or by terms morphologically derived from particles. As noted above, the names of many of the Aristotelian categories in Arabic (and of some of them in Greek) either are particles or are morphologically derived from particles, and the scientific questions from Posterior Analytics II, which Fârâbî treats in Book of Letters Part III, are distinguished by their different interrogative words (“if/whether”, “what”, “why”), which in Arabic are all particles. And Fârâbî may well have thought that the Greek original of Metaphysics V was devoted to distinguishing the many meanings of particles (not just of words in general), not in the sense that the lexical items that head each chapter of Metaphysics V are in all cases themselves particles or even nouns morphologically derived from particles (although some of them are), but in the sense that the many meanings of these nouns would track the many meanings of some particle, as the meanings of the noun “cause” (Metaphysics V,2) track the meanings of the particle “because”. There is in fact good reason to think this is true for a reasonable number of the chapters of Metaphysics V. Metaphysics V also discusses the categories of quantity and quality (V,13–14), where, as noted, the name of the category is derived from an interrogative word which is a particle in Arabic and which Fârâbî might well expect to be a particle in Greek (although in fact it is not), and the category of substance (V,8), where it is reasonable to say that the many meanings of “substance” track the many meanings of the question “what it is” from Posterior Analytics II and Book of Letters Part III, where again the interrogative word “what” (ti in Greek, mâ in Arabic) is a particle in Arabic. We can also reasonably say that the many meanings of “being” (V,7, on in Greek, mawjûd in Arabic) track the many meanings of the question “whether it is” from Posterior Analytics II and Book of Letters Part III (ei esti in Greek, hal mawjûd in Arabic), where the interrogative word “whether” is a particle in both languages. More surprisingly, although Fârâbî cites the Greek word for “being” as astîn = estin, which is in fact the third-person singular present-tense verb “is”, he says explicitly that this word is not a verb and that it is not a paronymous noun: his description of its functions implies that it also cannot be a non-paronymous noun, and so for Fârâbî this word must be a particle.
3.3 Fârâbî on the word for being, in Greek and Arabic
Fârâbî’s analysis of the Greek word for being as a particle is important in his reconstruction of the syntax of Greek as something close to a logically ideal language, in his reconstruction of the underlying logical syntax of any language, and in his diagnosis of the misunderstandings that can arise when the grammatical form of an expression in some natural language fails to track its underlying logical form, as when the paronymous Arabic word mawjûd = “being” suggests that being is an accident. While Fârâbî gives what we can think of as an Arabic analogue to Aristotle’s discussion in Metaphysics V,7 of the many meanings of “being”, the Arabic analogue focusses on several features that the Greek original does not: the paronymous form of the word mawjûd, the difficulties that led the translators to draft the word mawjûd, literally “found”, into service as an equivalent to the Greek word for being, and the relation between mawjûd = “being” in the sense of “that which is”, and wujûd = “existence” or “being” in the sense of “the being of that which is”. Furthermore, while the use of mawjûd in the syllogistic arts to mean “being” is always a metaphorical extension from the original meaning “found”, and its use, Fârâbî also thinks that mawjûd = “being” has different meanings in different syllogistic arts, and in particular that it has a distinctive meaning in demonstrative science, contrasting with its meaning in dialectic, and that the paronymous form of the word, while it has some justification in dialectic, is more seriously misleading in demonstrative science. Fârâbî thinks that bringing out the distinctive scientific meaning of “being”, and the distinctive logical form of the word “being” as used in demonstrative science, will show the path to a scientific treatment of being, based on distinctively scientific ways of investigating (for a given X) both the question whether X is and the question what X is.
in all other languages [i.e., other than Arabic], such as Persian and Syriac and Sogdian, there is an expression which they use to signify all things without specifying one thing as opposed to another thing [i.e., it is a predicate which is true of any subject whatever], and they also use it to signify the connection [ribâṭ, elsewhere translated “copula”] between the predicate and what it is predicated of: this is what connects the predicate with the subject when the predicate is a noun or when they want the predicate to be connected with the subject absolutely, without any mention of time. (Book of Letters I,82, p.111,4–8)
A brief summary is given below of Fârâbî’s view on how being is expressed in Greek and Arabic, and of the difficulties faced by the Arabic translators, but for a fuller discussion see Supplement: Fârâbî on the word for being, in Greek and Arabic
Fârâbî assumes that Greek (like Arabic) distinguishes syntactically between tensed and tenseless sentences, and that (unlike Arabic) it expresses the copula in both kinds of sentences. Because, according to Aristotle’s definition of “verb” in On Interpretation 3, a verb must “consignify a time”, the tenseless copula cannot be a verb. Nor can it be a noun: if to predicate one noun of another we must insert a third noun between them, there will be an infinite regress of copulas. So the tenseless copula estin (or astîn), in Greek as Fârâbî reconstructs it, must be a particle, although there will also be tensed copulas which are verbs paronymously derived from this particle. He also thinks that the same particle can function, not only in 2-place contexts, i.e., in tenseless predicative statements “X is Y”, but also in 1-place contexts, i.e., in tenseless statements of existence “X is”: and he assumes that this is the word that Aristotle is discussing in the chapter on the meanings of being, Metaphysics V,7.
We have seen that Fârâbî thinks that all languages other than Arabic have a word with these functions. Since Arabic has no word that does all these things, he thinks that the Arabic translators of Greek philosophical texts have had trouble with this word, and he discusses different strategies that they have adopted. The most common strategy is to use the Arabic passive participle “mawjûd”, literally “found”, as a tenseless “is” in both 1-place or 2-place contexts, and to use passive forms of the verb “wajada”, “find”, for the tensed “is” and “was” and “will be”. The disadvantage of “mawjûd” is that then the Arabic word for “is” or “being”, unlike the Greek word it translates, is grammatically paronymous, so that its grammatical form does not correspond to its logical form:
the expression “mawjûd” is, in its first imposition in Arabic, paronymous, and every paronymous term by its construction gives the impression that there is in what it signifies an implicit subject and, in this subject, the meaning [ma‛nâ] of the maṣdar [the infinitive, functioning in Arabic as an abstract noun] from which [the term] was derived [i.e., as “white” implies, without explicitly mentioning, a subject in which whiteness is present]. For this reason the expression “mawjûd” has given the impression that there is in every thing a meaning/entity [ma‛nâ] in an implicit subject, and that this meaning/entity is what is signified by the expression “wujûd” [“finding” or “being found”]: so it gave the impression that wujûd is in an implicit subject, and wujûd was understood as being like an accident in a subject. (Book of Letters I,84, p.113,9–14)
There is thus a grammatical appearance that X exists or is a being (“X mawjûd”) through an accident of existence or beingness which inheres in X, or an act of finding X; and Fârâbî thinks that this appearance gives rise to serious metaphysical errors. His account of the logical syntax of being in the Book of Letters is designed to expose and root out these errors. In particular, it will function as a critique of anyone who wants to understand God as something like a Platonic form of being, so that other things would exist by participating in this form. (Averroes, later, will adapt Fârâbî’s account of the logical syntax of being to give a criticism of Avicenna’s distinction between essence and existence, see Menn 2011.) But Fârâbî also wants to give the ontological foundations for a positive metaphysical account of God, which he thinks Aristotle was aiming at in Metaphysics XII and which he will try to reconstruct in his Principles of the Opinions of the People of the Perfect City and his Political Regime (see Section 4 below).
3.4 Fârâbî on the senses of being [mawjûd] and the corresponding senses of existence [wujûd]
We might expect Fârâbî to say that the paronymous form of the Arabic word for being or “exists” [mawjûd] is a mere grammatical accident and that there is no such thing as the existence [wujûd] through which things exist. Instead he distinguishes (at least) two senses of being [mawjûd], each applicable in both 1- and 2-place contexts, and says that in each case there is a corresponding sense of existence [wujûd]. But he thinks that only a conflation between these two senses of being would lead us to believe that a being X exists through an existence which is both independent of the mind and extrinsic to the essence of X. Fârâbî tries to connect these two main senses of being with differences in how the term “being” is understood in different disciplines, specifically in dialectic and demonstrative science, and with differences in how dialectic and demonstrative science investigate the questions whether X is and what X is, which Fârâbî discusses in Book of Letters III in connection with the particles “whether” and “what”. His discussion is complicated and difficult, but some of his main points seem to be as follows.
Fârâbî in Book of Letters I,88–94 describes the different senses of being [mawjûd] and the corresponding senses of existence [wujûd], concentrating on 1-place contexts. Aristotle in Metaphysics V,7 distinguishes four main senses of being (giving mostly 2-place examples), in some cases with sub-senses: being per accidens, being per se (with subsenses corresponding to the different categories), being as the true, and being in actuality or potentiality. Fârâbî has nothing in I,88–94 corresponding to being per accidens, and his treatment of the other main senses of being corresponds only roughly to Aristotle’s—of course, his treatment is longer and more detailed, and includes the discussion of existence [wujûd], which does not correspond to anything in Metaphysics V,7. Fârâbî starts in I,88 by distinguishing three main senses of being, namely the sense of being which is divided into different senses for the different categories (pp.115,15–116,3), being as the true, i.e., what “is outside the soul and is in itself [bi-‛aynihi] as it is in the soul” (p.116,3–6), and being as what is “circumscribed [munḥâz] by some quiddity outside the soul, whether it has been represented in the soul or has not been represented” (p.116,6–7). But in I,90 he says that these three senses of being can be reduced to two, “that it is true and that it has some quiddity outside the soul” (p.117,18–19). In this discussion Fârâbî is giving his interpretation of two of Aristotle’s four senses of being, being per se and being as the true. (Later, in I,93–94, he discusses being in actuality and potentiality, but only as a subdivision within being as what has a quiddity outside the soul, and it does not seem to play a large role in the Book of Letters.) In I,89, starting from the I,88 enumeration of three main senses of being, he discusses what kind of existence [wujûd] corresponds to each of these senses of being [mawjûd]; and in I,92 he tries to show that being as what has a quiddity outside the soul (unlike being as the true) is said not univocally, but of some things in more primary senses and of other things in derivative senses, across different categories and even within the category of substance.
Clearly the foundation of Fârâbî’s account of being is his distinction between being as the true and being as what is circumscribed by a quiddity outside the soul. It is not immediately obvious what he means by this distinction, and there is no obvious precedent, either in Greek or in Arabic, for his notion of “circumscription”. At first blush, “being outside the soul and in itself as it is in the soul” and “being circumscribed by some quiddity outside the soul” (or “having some quiddity outside the soul”) sound similar, although it is clear that Fârâbî wants them to be very different. We might guess that the main difference is something can have a quiddity outside the soul even if it is not represented in the soul (as Fârâbî notes p.116,7); and in this sense Fârâbî says that “whatever is true is also circumscribed by some quiddity outside the soul” (I,91 p.117,20). But the deeper difference is that while “being circumscribed by some quiddity outside the soul” is predicated of an external object, being in the sense of “true”, i.e., “being outside the soul as it is in the soul”, is predicated of something in the soul, and asserts that what is in the soul has something outside the soul corresponding to it. So in I,89, in discussing the kinds of existence [wujûd] corresponding to each sense of “being” [mawjûd], Fârâbî says that “the existence [wujûd] of what is true is a certain relation which thoughts have to something outside the soul” (p.117,4–5). Fârâbî is explicit that being in the sense of “true” applies not only to the soul’s judgments but also to its concepts (I,88 p.116,3–5): to say of a concept that it “is” in the sense of “is true” is to say that it is instantiated. Fârâbî is apparently the first person to have said that existence, in one sense of existence, is a second-order predicate or second-order concept, a concept that is predicated only of concepts; but, unlike Frege, he understands concepts psychologistically, as mental states.
Despite Fârâbî’s saying in I,91 (cited just above) that being-as-having-a-quiddity-outside-the-soul is more widely extended than being-as-true, it emerges from his later discussions that, taking “quiddity outside the soul” in a strict sense, having a quiddity outside the soul is more demanding, and that we must first ask whether something is in the sense of true, i.e., whether a given concept is instantiated outside the soul, and only then, if the answer is yes, ask whether what instantiates it is also circumscribed by a quiddity outside the soul. If a concept is not instantiated outside the soul, such as (for Aristotle and Fârâbî) the concept of vacuum, then, while there vacuum has a quiddity-in-an-extended sense, since we can ask “what is vacuum?” and answer the question by giving an explanation of the name “vacuum”, a so-called “nominal definition” which identifies what concept the word “vacuum” stands for, nonetheless vacuum has no quiddity in the proper sense, and certainly no quiddity outside the soul (I,91 p.118,4–9). Even after we have determined “that what is understood by the expression is the same outside the soul”, we can still ask “does it exist [hal mawjûd] or not?”, meaning now not “is it true?” but rather “does it have some thing by which its constitution [qiwâm] [is] and which is present in it” (III,229 p.214,4–9). This will be “one of the causes of its existence”, so that “our saying ‘does the thing exist?’ in the second way” is equivalent to “does it have a cause by which its constitution [is] in its essence?” (III,229 p.214,11–13). For
not everything which is understood by some expression, such that what is understood by it is also outside the soul, is such that it also has an essence: like the meaning of “privation”, for it is a meaning which is understood, and it is outside the soul as it is understood, but it is not an essence and does not have an essence. (III,240 p.218,12–15)
Examples of concepts which are instantiated, but whose instantiations are not circumscribed by a quiddity, might include on the one hand negations like not-a-horse or privations like blindness, and on the other hand beings per accidens, i.e., accidental combinations like white horse. Each of these will have a nominal definition which identifies what concept the name stands for, but it will not have a real definition expressing a real quiddity, “the thing by which its constitution [is] and which is in it”: things can be not-horses or blind through many different positive causes, and a white horse will have a cause of being white and a cause of being a horse, but no one cause that constitutes it as a white horse.
In Book of Letters I,88–90 Fârâbî describes not only the different senses of “being [mawjûd]”, but also the corresponding senses of “existence [wujûd]”, i.e., that through which a mawjûd in each sense is mawjûd. As we have already seen, “the existence [wujûd] of what is true is a certain relation which thoughts have to something outside the soul” (p.117,4–5). The existence [wujûd] of something which is a being [mawjûd] in the sense in which being is divided into the categories will just be the category under which that thing falls, which licenses calling it a being. Fârâbî’s treatment of the existence [wujûd] of something which is a being [mawjûd] in the sense of being circumscribed by some quiddity outside the soul depends on whether it is a complex (divisible) or a simple (indivisible) quiddity.
As for that whose quiddity is divisible, three [kinds of] things are said to be its quiddity: (i) its unarticulated whole, (ii) [its whole] articulated by the parts by which its constitution [is], (iii) each of the parts of the whole, each of them through [?] the whole in turn. Its whole is what its name signifies, and what is articulated by its parts is what its definition signifies, and each of its parts is genus and differentia, each in turn, or matter and form, each in turn. (I,88 p.116,8–13)
The existence [wujûd] of a being [mawjûd] circumscribed by a complex quiddity, but not of a being circumscribed by a simple quiddity, can therefore be distinguished from the being itself:
in the case of what is divided so that it has a whole and the articulated [result] of this whole, the being [mawjûd] and the existence [wujûd] are different: the being is [the thing] as a whole (this is the possessor of the quiddity) and the existence is the quiddity of this thing, either articulated or each of the parts of the whole, either its genus or its differentia, and since its differentia is more proper to it, [the differentia] is more appropriately called the existence which is proper to it. (I,89 p.117,1–4)
(Fârâbî adds that since the existence [wujûd] of something which is a being in the sense of falling under a category is the category or highest genus under which it falls, this will also be its existence as a part of its quiddity, so that being in the sense of falling under a category reduces to being in the sense of having a quiddity, and the initial three senses of being reduce to two, I,89 p.117,5–8 and I,90 p.117,14–19.) By contrast, “everything whose quiddity is indivisible either is a being which does not exist [yakûna mawjûdan lâ yûjadu]”—because the finite verb “exists” is paronymous and would imply that existence belongs to it as an accident—“or else the meaning of its existence and that it exists [maʿna wujûdihi wa-annahu mawjûdun] are one and the same, and that it is an existence [wujûd] and that it is a being [mawjûd] are one and the same meaning”, since its existence [wujûd] is not a further entity explaining the fact that it is a being [mawjûd], but is just that being, which is simple and not explained by any further cause to explain it (I,89 p.117,8–10). This will be true both of each of the categories or highest genera (each category is an undefinable highest genus, and not a composite of being as a genus and some differentia added to being), and of “whatever is not in a subject and is not a subject of anything at all, for it is forever simple in its quiddity” (I,89 p.117,10–13).
In all of this Fârâbî is broadly following the Aristotelian idea that, for any composite object X, we can ask “what is X?” and answer the question either by giving a definition of X spelling X out into many in-some-sense-constituents of X, or by giving some one such constituent of X, which is a partial answer to “what is X?”. Fârâbî is also following Aristotle in insisting that all of the things which should be mentioned in the definition of X are causes of X’s being (“the thing by which [X’s] constitution [is]”), and, furthermore, essential causes, in the sense that it is not simply that some instance of X happens for this reason, but that a thing wouldn’t be X if it weren’t caused in this way: according to Aristotle in Metaphysics VIII,4, a scientific definition of X should mention all and only such causes of X. He is also following Aristotle in saying that this process must come to a stop with simples, where there will be no further definition and no distinction between the thing and any further answer to “what is it?”. He also follows Aristotle further down, in Book of Letters III,244, in saying that in asking for the cause of X’s being, we cannot look for a middle term between the subject and predicate of “X is [X mawjûd]”, or between the subject and predicate of “X is X”. Rather, we must unpack this judgment so that its subject and predicate are different, so that we can seek a middle term connecting them (“why are there eclipses?” might be unpacked as “why is the moon eclipsed?” or “why is the moon darkened at opposition?”): if X is simple, so that “X is” cannot be unpacked into a judgment with distinct subject and predicate, then there is no further investigation into why X is, and therefore also not into what X is. But Fârâbî is putting all of this in the service of an argument which has no direct parallel in Aristotle, that, contrary to the linguistic appearance of the paronymous term mawjûd (being or existent), a thing does not exist through an accident of existence [wujûd] as it is white through an accident of whiteness (so I,84, p.113,9–14, cited above). If we say that X exists [mawjûd] in the sense that X is true, then the existence [wujûd] of X is not an attribute of the real thing X outside the mind, but only an attribute of the mental concept of X, namely, that that concept is instantiated outside the mind. If we say that X exists [mawjûd] in the sense that X is circumscribed by a real quiddity, then the existence [wujûd] of X is that quiddity: either it is the whole essence of X as spelled out by its definition, or it is some part of the essence of X, or if X is simple it is just X itself, but in no case is it an accident of X. (Fârâbî also says similar things about two-places uses of mawjûd as a tenseless copula “X is Y”: particularly in I,101 he argues that “X is Y” has a sense which does not assert, e.g., that the quiddity of X is to be Y, or that either X or Y have real quiddities outside the mind. What it asserts is something like two-place being-as-truth, but Fârâbî says that such a sentence need not assert that something is outside the mind as it is in the mind, since in some “X is Y” is true although neither X nor Y exists outside the mind.)
Fârâbî’s distinction between being-as-true and being-as-having-a-quiddity-outside-the-mind also allows him to resolve the issue about whether being is univocal or whether it is said of one thing (or of one kind of thing) primarily and of other things in a dependent and derivative sense. Looking only at one-place cases, being-as-true must be univocal to beings in all categories, and also to beings in no category such as negations or privations and beings per accidens like white horse. For I must be able to ask “is the concept of X instantiated?” before I know what category the instances of X will fall under, or even whether X will turn out to be merely a privation, or an accidental combination of two positive entities. (If X is eclipse, we might reasonably start by keeping many of these options open: only the investigation of actual eclipses, if it turns out that there are some, will determine which option is right.) By contrast, “what has a quiddity outside the soul, although [being in this sense] is general, is said by priority and posteriority in order” (I,92 p.118,14–16), since if the quiddity of X involves a reference to Y as the cause of existence to X, then Y has a prior and stronger claim than X to have a quiddity outside the soul, rendering it capable of independent existence. First, substances will be prior in this way to accidents, since for an accident to be is for it to belong to a substance, and the scientific definition of any kind of accident will mention the kind of substance that it can be predicated of. But then, within the category of substance, “what requires a differentia or genus in this category in order for its quiddity to be realized is more deficient with respect to quiddity than the thing in this category which is a cause of the realization of its quiddity”, and by pursuing causes of quiddities in this way we can come to some first substance, “whether this is one or more than one”, which has a stronger claim to the title of “being” than all other substances, and a fortiori than accidents (I,92 pp.118,18–119,4).
And if something is discovered outside all these categories which is the cause of the realization of the quiddity of the most fundamental thing in this category [i.e., the category of substance], then this *is more deserving to be called “being” [mawjûd] than the most perfect thing in this category, and this is the first cause of existence [wujûd] to the most perfect thing in this category, and this most perfect thing [sc. within the category of substance] is the cause in the quiddity of* the other things in this category, and what is in this category is the cause in the quiddity of the other categories: thus the beings, where what is meant by “being” is what has a quiddity outside the soul, are ordered by this order. (I,92 p.119,4–8)
It was traditional enough to say that God (and only God) is being in the strictest sense, and is the cause of existence to all other beings. But Fârâbî’s version is importantly different. Fârâbî is taking up Aristotle’s program of defining each thing through its essential cause, and arguing that this kind of cause of X’s existing (such that something would not be an X if it were caused in some other way) is the existence [wujûd] of X and has a stronger claim to the title of being [mawjûd] than X: if this causal chain leads ultimately to God, so that God is ultimately involved in the quiddity of each other thing, then Fârâbî will have a scientific Aristotelian way of filling in the program of the Aims of the Metaphysics, of showing how an analysis of being and of its causes (once we grasp the relevant senses of being and of cause) will lead to God as the first cause of being and universal first principle. As this is presented in the Book of Letters, it is just a program for research, which might or might not lead up to a single first cause of existence from which all other beings can be derived carried out. But in the Perfect City and the Political Regime Fârâbî gives at least a sketch of the upward causal argument to God as a single first cause of existence, and of the downward path from God to all other beings. Fârâbî sees a charter for this causal investigation of the existence of thing especially in Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics II.
3.5 Fârâbî on the scientific questions about being
Fârâbî further develops the discussion of the relation between a being and its existence, in different senses of “existence”, in Book of Letters III. Here he is officially continuing the discussion of particles by explaining the meanings of various interrogative particles in different “syllogistic arts”: the main interest is to explain the distinctive meanings these particles have in demonstrative science, and to warn against confusing them with the meanings they have in other disciplines. This resembles the discussion in Book of Letters I, but the particles (and “logical” particles which are grammatically nouns in Arabic) discussed in Book of Letters I correspond roughly to those discussed in Aristotle’s Metaphysics V; Book of Letters III, by contrast, picks up issues from Posterior Analytics II. There Aristotle discusses the different kinds of scientific “question” or “investigation” [zêtêsis], and he specifies each one by an interrogative particle (“whether”, “what”, “why”). But Aristotle is interested mainly in the methods the scientist uses to answer these questions; nobody before Fârâbî had thought there was a distinctive scientific meaning of the particles themselves. But Aristotle does talk about how the scientist should investigate whether something is, what something is, and why something is, and Fârâbî takes this discussion as giving not just a methodology but a scientific account of existence and quiddity, i.e., of the scientific meanings of the particles “whether” and “what”.
Aristotle discusses there four types of scientific question or investigation, “whether X is”, “what X is”, “whether X is Y”, and “why X is Y”. His main claim is that the investigation what X is stands to the investigation whether X is, as the investigation why X is Y stands to the investigation whether X is Y. So in order to determine what X is, we must first investigate whether X is, and then, if the answer is yes, investigate why X is. An answer to why X is can be converted into a scientific answer to what X is; where to discover why X is, we must reformulate the judgment “X is” as a two-place judgment with distinct subject and predicate terms, and then look for a middle term connecting them. In the standard example, if X is (lunar) eclipse, before we can scientifically investigate what eclipses are, we must first investigate whether there are eclipses; if there are, and if the nominal definition of (lunar) eclipse is “darkening of the moon at opposition”, then we investigate why the moon is sometimes darkened at opposition; and if we conclude that this is due to the interposition of the earth between the moon and the sun, we can convert this into a scientific definition of eclipse as “darkening of the moon at opposition due to the interposition of the earth between the sun and the moon”. Fârâbî takes all this up in Book of Letters III,226 and following, under the headings of the scientific meanings of the particles “whether”, “what”, and “why”: or rather, when he says “whether X exists” (or “does X exist?”, hal X mawjûdun), both the word “whether” and the word “exists” are logically, if not grammatically, particles. Fârâbî follows Aristotle in saying that there is an ordered series of questions or investigations: first we must ask whether X exists, and only then, if the answer is yes, can we ask what X is, by asking why X exists. But Fârâbî’s story is more complicated than Aristotle’s, because he distinguishes different senses both of “whether X exists” and of “what X is”. Fundamentally, Fârâbî thinks that there is a series of four questions: first “what X is” seeking the nominal definition of X, which spells out the concept of X in the soul; then “whether X is” in the sense of being-as-the-true, asking whether X exists outside the soul as it does in the soul; then “whether X is” in the sense of being as having a quiddity outside the soul, asking rather “does it have some thing by which its constitution [qiwâm] [is] and which is present in it” (III,229 p.214,6–7, cited above); then “what X is” seeking the quiddity of X outside the soul, namely this thing present in X which is the cause of X’s constitution. The Posterior Analytics has nothing corresponding to the distinction between the two “whether X is” questions, but Posterior Analytics II,2 does say that when we ask/investigate whether X is Y, or whether X is, we are asking “whether there is a middle term for it”, and that when we then ask/investigate why X is Y, or what X is, we are asking “what that middle term is” (89b37–90a1). And Fârâbî argues that this requires a distinctive meaning of “is” in the question “whether X is”, since X could exist in the sense that it is outside the soul as it is in the soul, without there being a middle term between some subject and some predicate which would cause X’s existence. There are at least two ways this could happen. First, if X is a privation or even “privation” in general (see III,240 p.218,12–15, quoted above), or presumably also if X is an ens per accidens like white horse, there simply is nothing outside the mind by which X is constituted. Second, if X has/is a simple quiddity, then “X is” cannot be expanded into a sentence “Y is Z” where there might be a middle term between the subject and the predicate. So once we have established that X exists outside the soul, we must still investigate whether X is constituted by some cause outside the soul, and then what that cause is.
Fârâbî takes this result as indicating that dialectic and demonstrative science give different meanings, not only to the “what is X?” question and thus to quiddity (dialectic seeking a nominal definition, science a causal definition), but also to the “whether X is” question and thus to existence. So he says that, as in dialectic the two-place investigation “whether X is Y” is only concerned with the copula (not with whether it is essential predication), so in dialectic the one-place investigation “whether X is” is asking only about being as the true, i.e., about whether the concept of X is instantiated (III,246–7). He connects this with an inherited problem in Aristotle’s dialectic: in the Topics Aristotle classifies dialectical problems as asking whether Y is an accident of X, whether Y is the genus of X, whether Y is proper to X, or whether Y is the definition of X—so how should we treat the question whether X exists? As Fârâbî says, Alexander of Aphrodisias in his commentary on the Topics classifies questions of existence as questions of accident, treating the existence of X as an accident of X. And Fârâbî says that he is right to do so, since dialectic is asking whether the concept of X in the mind is instantiated outside the mind, and this belongs as an accident to the concept of X. However, if we mean whether the real thing X outside the mind is constituted by some quiddity, or whether X falls under one of the categories, then we would be asking whether something belongs to X as its genus or definition. Fârâbî also says that different particular sciences give different meanings to these questions. Notably, in physics the questions “whether X is” and “what X is” are asking for any kind of cause of X’s existing, whether that cause is internal to X or not (III,237)—it could be an extrinsic efficient or final cause, like the earth blocking sunlight from reaching the moon, which would be incorporated into a physical definition, as in this case of eclipse. Most importantly, in “the divine science”, if we ask whether God is, and if we mean by this whether there is some cause through which God is constituted, then while this is a legitimate question the answer can only be no (III,238–9 and III,243). Nonetheless, we can still ask of God “whether he is some circumscribed essence” (III,240, p.218,11), and we can discover that he is, not because we can give a definition analyzing that essence into simpler terms, but because in analyzing other beings and seeking their causal definitions, tracing them back step by step to their causes, we discover that they all lead ultimately to a single first cause of their existence, so that God enters into the fully spelled out quiddities of everything else (III,251). Because we learn in this way that God is simple and dependent on no cause, we can ask “whether his existence is an existence which, in order for him to exist through it, needs nothing other than itself in any way” (III,242 p.220,1–2), neither a substratum nor an efficient cause, and the answer is yes. So too in the divine science, if we ask “whether God is X” for some predicate X (whether God is an intelligence, is knowing, is one, is a maker or cause of something else’s existing, III,242 p.220,2–5), and if we mean by that “whether there is a middle term for it” as Posterior Analytics II,2 suggests, i.e., a cause to God of his being X, such as an accident inhering in God, or a part of God’s essence distinct from the whole essence, then again the answer can only be no. But we can also mean
whether the existence by which his constitution is not by anything other than he, is that he is intelligence and knowing, and whether his essence is that he is intelligence,
and in asking whether he is the cause or agent of something else’s existing we can mean
whether his existence by which he is existent, or his quiddity which specifies him, or which belongs to him, necessitates that he is a cause of the existence of something other than he, or the maker of something other than he. (III,242 p.220,3–6)
And again we discover, by tracing back the causes of things to a first cause which needs nothing beyond itself to know and to produce, that the answer is yes. This text is a charter for the theological parts of the Perfect City and Political Regime, discussed in Section 4 below.
3.6 On the One and Unity: senses of unity, different relations between one and many, and the circumscription of a thing by its quiddity
To Fârâbî’s “general metaphysics”—his study of being and its universal attributes, rather than of God as the first cause of being—belongs not only the Book of Letters but also On the One and Unity. Fârâbî in On the Aims of the Metaphysics had included unity alongside being in the object of metaphysics; and when Book of Letters I follows the agenda and many of the subject-headings of Aristotle’s “lexicon” in Metaphysics V, it is strange that it leaves out unity, which Aristotle treats in Metaphysics V,6. But the treatment of unity, missing from the Book of Letters, is supplied by On the One and Unity [henceforth On the One]. Since the Book of Letters as is incompletely transmitted, it is not entirely out of the question that On the One is a missing part of the Book of Letters. Perhaps more likely, On the One was originally intended as a part of the Book of Letters, but got too long and complicated, and was spun off as a separate treatise. The treatise is too complicated and too little-studied (with major editorial problems) to treat here in full detail, but we can describe some major themes. The treatise is helpful in understanding the notion of circumscription by a quiddity, which is thematized both in the Book of Letters and On the One and used without explanation in the Perfect City and Political Regime, and also in understanding Fârâbî’s explanation of Aristotle’s claim in Metaphysics IV,2 that being and unity are coextensive and mutually entailing, and his account in the Perfect City and Political Regime of how unity is predicated of God.
Main themes of the treatise include distinguishing a whole family of senses of “one” (in a few cases Fârâbî also gives the corresponding senses of the abstract “unity”), but also and especially distinguishing different ways that senses of “one” are related to senses of “many”. The treatise can read like a dry catalogue, and Fârâbî rarely gives arguments or admits that his claims might be controversial, but it is often clear that he has an opponent in mind. That opponent might be a type rather than a particular earlier philosopher, but it seems likely that it is specifically al-Kindî. Kindî had argued in On First Philosophy that any thing other than God that is called “one” is many as well as one, and therefore that it is one not essentially but only accidentally, indeed that it is one only improperly or “metaphorically”; and he argues that such a thing can be one only through participation in some unity extrinsic to it, which (to avoid infinite regress) must be purely one and not also many. Kindî also argues that any many is a collection of ones: and since everything is either one or many, and any many depends on ones, and any one depends on a pure one, and God is the only pure one, everything owes its existence directly or indirectly to God. While Kindî, like Fârâbî, gives a long list of different kinds of things that can be said to be one, and while he has different reasons for disqualifying each of them from being a pure one, i.e., a one that is not also many, typically he seems to think that each of these senses of “one” is predicated of some subject which is many, so that if the unity were removed, that underlying multiplicity would remain. Kindî infers that each of these ones is a many-that-is-one, and therefore that it has contrary attributes, and therefore that it is not essentially one, and even that it is only metaphorically one, since (as he argues in a tradition going back to Zeno of Elea and to the first Hypothesis of Plato’s Parmenides) for something to be truly one is for it not to be many in any way, e.g., by having many constituents.
Fârâbî by contrast maintains, following Aristotle in Metaphysics IV,2, that unity is coextensive with being, and that both “one” and “being” are truly and properly said of many things. Indeed, Fârâbî claims, not just that these many things are each truly being and truly one, but that they are essentially so, i.e., that they are not being and one [mawjûd, wâḥid] through an existence or unity [wujûd, waḥda] which is accidental to them or extrinsic to their quiddity, as something is white through an accident of whiteness. There are senses of being, notably being as the true, in which existence is accidental, but in the primary sense of being, and the sense of primary interest to the metaphysician, the things’s existence is its quiddity or part of its quiddity; and so too, Fârâbî claims, for the unity corresponding to the sense of “one” of primary interest to the metaphysician, which is convertible with this sense of “being”. In order for Fârâbî to deflect Kindî’s arguments against the claim that there are many things that are each truly and essentially one, it is crucial for him not only to distinguish different senses of “one”, but also to distinguish different ways that senses of “one” can be related to senses of “many”. Fârâbî distinguishes between a many that is the subject of a one, a many that is opposite to a one, and a many that arises from a one. When Fârâbî says that some sense of “many” is the opposite of some sense of “one”, he apparently means that these kinds of unity and multiplicity are contraries or that one of them is the privation of the other. When he talks about a many that arises from a one, he seems to mean what Aristotle calls a many that is “measured by” a one, i.e., a many composed out of ones of this type, so that the one or unit can be used to count the many. (Aristotle says in Metaphysics X that in this kind of one-many relationship the unity and the multiplicity are correlatives, as the measure and the measured, whereas when one and many are related as indivisible and divisible, unity as indivisibility is a privation of multiplicity as divisibility. Or perhaps he really means that, although from the point of view of our language and our concepts divisibility is the more basic and indivisibility is its privation, in reality indivisibility is basic and divisibility is its privation. In Aristotle’s terminology, possession and privation are one kind of opposites, contraries are another, contradictories are another, and correlatives are yet another. But Fârâbî apparently does not count correlatives here as opposites.)
Fârâbî grants to his implicit opponent that some senses of “one” do presuppose a many as their subject, so that if the one were removed the many would remain. There are two-place senses of “one”, as there are two-place senses of “being”: for instance, we can say “X and Y are one in species”. Or perhaps it is better to say, not that these are two-place senses of “one”, but that they are plural-subject senses, since we can equally well say “X and Y and Z are one in species”. In any case Fârâbî grants that there are several senses of “one” which presuppose a many as their subject. Perhaps surprisingly, Fârâbî includes here not only “one in species” and the like but also “one in number”: he thinks that the appropriate expression is not, e.g., “Aristotle is one in number” but “Plato’s best student and Alexander’s teacher are one in number”. Also perhaps surprisingly, he tries to trace back the other plural-subject senses of “one” to “one in number”, saying for instance that if X and Y are one in species, then the species of X and the species of Y are one in number (#1–#8). Fârâbî also grants that there are some senses even of the one-place predication “X is one” which presuppose, not a plural subject, but still a subject consisting of many parts, so that for X to be one is for X’s parts to be related in an appropriate way. For instance, for X to be one as continuous is for X to have parts whose limits are the same; for X to be one as contiguous is for X to have parts whose limits, while not the same, are kept in contact by some bond; for X to be one as whole as for X to have all the parts it needs in order to perform its activity well (#9–#15). But Fârâbî says that where many things are said to be one, or where something is said to be one in a way presupposing that it has many parts, this sense of “many” and this sense of “one” are not opposite: nothing is predicated of its opposite. Thus the opposite of one-in-number is many-in-number, but the subject of one-in-number is many names or descriptions of the same thing; the opposite of one-as-continuous is discretely many things disconnected from each other, but the subject of one-as-continuous is magnitude. Fârâbî insists equally emphatically that there are senses of “one” that are not plural-subject senses and do not presuppose a subject with many parts, and indeed in some cases contradict having a subject with many parts. One sense of “one” is as “undivided” or “indivisible” (the Arabic phrase, like the Greek word, is ambiguous between these two construals). Or perhaps rather, as Fârâbî suggests at the end of the treatise, all senses of “one” can be traced back in one way or another to being undivided (#95). Certainly there are many ways that something could be divided, and filling them out leads to different senses of one-as-undivided or one-as-indivisible. For instance, as Fârâbî notes, “one” is said of something extended that is divisible but not actually divided; of something that is spatially located but quantitatively indivisible, i.e., a point; of what is not spatially located and is therefore quantitatively indivisible; of what has (or is) a simple quiddity not divisible into parts of a definition such as genus and differentia; and of what is not “divided” between a paronymously named subject X and an X-ness through which it is X (#20–24). Some of these senses of “one”, such as one in the sense of an indivisible point, are never predicated of a many. Something can also be called one because it does not have a partner, i.e., because is the only F, for some predicate F, or if nothing else is F in the same way that it is F; and especially if F is its quiddity, as, e.g., the moon can be called “one” in the sense that there is nothing else of the same species as it (#25, pp.55–6). This sense of “one”, too, does not presuppose any plurality in its subject. Fârâbî also talks about different senses of “one” as “circumscribed” in some way (see below): at least some of these senses do not presuppose any plurality in their subject, and apparently in all these senses, if the subject that is one were stripped of its unity, it would not become many instead. Fârâbî apparently does not say that “one” in such a sense does not have an opposite, but it does not have an opposite that is a sense of “many”: the opposite of “one” in such a sense would be the contradictory, “not one”, but not a contrary or privative “many”.
Fârâbî also insists that the many arising from some sense of “one”, i.e., a many composed out of things that are each one in this sense, is not the many opposite to this sense of “one”, although he admits that in some cases the many arising from the one and the many opposite to the one are the same per accidens (#37–#49). As before, there are senses of “one” that do not have an opposite sense of “many”. There are also senses of “one” that do have an opposite sense of “many”, but where the many that arises from the one is not the same as the many that is opposite to the one. Thus the many arising from the one as a point (the one as what is indivisible although spatially located) is many points, while the opposite of the one as a point is a continuous extension. The many arising from the one as having-no-partner-in-its-species might be a plurality like a unique moon and a unique sun (or a unique phoenix), each without a partner in its distinct species, whereas the opposite of having-no-partner-in-its-species is having-a-partner-in-its-species. The opposite of the one as indivisible quiddity is a divisible quiddity; the many arising from the one as indivisible quiddity is several indivisible quiddities, which could be a divisible quiddity if, say, one of them is an unanalyzable genus and the others are successive unanalyzable differentiae of that genus, but the several indivisible quiddities need not be a single quiddity at all. But, beyond these examples, Fârâbî’s basic point is that, in the many arising from a one, the one is an essential constituent of the many, “a part by which its constitution [is]” (#62, p.75): and so it can no more be opposite to this one than a species can be opposite to its constituent genera and differentiae. And likewise, if a one, in some sense of “one”, is what it is by being a unit, a constituent of a many, then it cannot be opposite to that many, even if there is some other sense of “many” which is its opposite.
When Fârâbî says that there are senses of “one” which do not presuppose any plurality and which have no opposite except a bare contradictory—so that there is no sense of “many” opposite to these senses of “one”, although there is a sense of “many” arising from each such sense of “one”—he is interested above all in the sense of “one” as “circumscribed by a quiddity” (first introduced #17). Fârâbî does not assume that the reader will already be familiar with this analysis of a special sense of “one”: he tries to build up to it from other senses of “one” as “circumscribed” in some other way. He starts by talking about a “body circumscribed by a limit that specifies [takhuṣṣu] it” (#16, p.50). “Circumscribed” here has a straightforward literal sense: the body is surrounded on all sides by its limit or boundary. “Specifies” adds that everything inside that limit is the body, and everything outside that limit is not the body. This may connect with “one” as having no partner in some property, since the body is the only thing inside its limit. Fârâbî passes from “one” as a body to a circumscribed by a limit to “one” as a body circumscribed by a place, where a body’s place is, on the Aristotelian analysis, not the limit of the body itself but the limits of the bodies that surround it. Here again, everything that is in the place is the body, and everything that is not in the place is not the body. Thus the limit, or the place, contributes in two ways to making the body one: it makes the parts of the body one with each other, and it makes the body one body distinguished from other bodies, with which it yields the many that “arises from” this sense of one. The unity [waḥda] corresponding to these senses of “one” [wâḥid] is presumably the circumscription [inḥiyâz] by the limit or the place, which is an accident of an underlying subject. But Fârâbî denies that if this unity were removed, its subject would thereby become a many: rather, it would fuse with other things into a larger one when the circumscription separating them from each other is removed (#28). Still, these kinds of unity do also unify a divisible subject, as do the unity of what is one as continuous or contiguous or whole. But Fârâbî is building up to a less familiar but more fundamental, non-spatial kind of circumscription which has only the function of distinguishing a one from other ones and not the function of uniting a plurality. Fârâbî talks about the circumscription of a thing by any attribute, which would include limits and places and other accidents such as qualities (some examples at #78), but he concentrates overwhelmingly on the circumscription of a thing by its quiddity. This can happen at different levels of generality—it can be a specific or a generic quiddity (#27). What is circumscribed by a quiddity, unlike what is circumscribed by a limit or a place, need not be a body and need not be divisible, but can be as general as “being” or “thing” (#64). In some cases, if a thing’s circumscription by its quiddity were removed, it would fuse into a one with other ones when it the attributes distinguishing it from these others are removed, as a body circumscribed by a limit or place would fuse into a one with other bodies when its circumscription by its limit or place is removed. If a thing’s circumscription by its specific quiddity were removed, it would still be circumscribed by its generic quiddity, and would fuse into a one with the other things in its genus, but if all circumscription by a quiddity were removed from it, there would no longer be anything left at all (#27). So there is no opposite to this sense of “one” except sheer non-being (#27): there is a sense of “many” arising from this sense of “one”, but it is not opposite to this sense of “one” (#49). The cases of circumscription by a limit or a place might wrongly lead us to think that whenever something is called “one” its unity is an accident attaching to some underlying subject, but in the present case if the unity were removed the quiddity would be destroyed. Fârâbî does seem to distinguish a thing’s unity in this sense from its quiddity when he says that the unity of a species, as circumscribed by its specific quiddity, is the differentia by which it is circumscribed from other species of its genus (#78): but this is still essential to the thing, and we know from the Book of Letters that the differentia can be called the existence of the thing, as here it is called the unity of the thing.
Fârâbî says that what is one in the strongest [aḥrâ] sense is what is circumscribed by a quiddity (#78). He says equally that what is circumscribed by a quiddity is “circumscribed by its portion [or allotment] of existence [qisṭ al-wujûd]” (#17), i.e., by its being what it is: this being-what-it-is is described in the Book of Letters as the existence [wujûd] of the thing, and On the One and Unity argues that it is also the thing’s unity [waḥda]. Fârâbî uses this analysis to try to make good on Aristotle’s programmatic claim in Metaphysics IV,2 that being and one are mutually entailing and in a way equivalent, or that there is a sense of “being” and a sense of “one”, or a family of senses of “being” and a corresponding family of senses of “one” which are mutually entailing and in a way equivalent. Thus here in On the One #17 he says that “one” in this meaning, i.e., the meaning “circumscribed by a quiddity”, is mutually entailing or equivalent [musâwiq] with being. So “one” in this sense needs to apply to things in all categories, not just substances, and indeed Fârâbî says that in #17, and he adds that it also applies to “other things, if there are any outside the categories” (#17, p.51, compare the Book of Letters on a possible ascent to a first cause of being to substances which would itself be outside all categories including substance). Again, if “one” in this sense is necessarily coextensive with being, Fârâbi needs to say that not only species and genera but also individual substances (and individual qualities and so on) are each circumscribed by their own quiddity—not merely by a shared quiddity and an individual place or other accidental attributes—so that there are many things in each species, in the sense of “many” arising from this sense of “one”.
The meaning [maʿnâ] of human [i.e., the species human] is circumscribed and isolated from what is not human, i.e., horse and so on, and this human is circumscribed from that human by a circumscription more perfect [or complete] than the circumscription of human from horse. (#64, p.78)
Fârâbî is thus committed to individual quiddities, even though our language does not allow us to formulate a definition of any individual. “Every being and every thing must have no partner in something which is attributed to it” (#26, p.56), and “having no partner” in turn is mutually entailing or equivalent [musâwiq] with “circumscribed by a quiddity” (#26, p.57).
“One” is said of everything that is circumscribed by a quiddity which specifies it [takhuṣṣuhu] and an existence which specifies it, by which it is circumscribed from everything other than it, and it is one by a unity which is that by which it is circumscribed from other things. And if the quiddity of each thing is circumscribed from other things only by some category, it [i.e., this sense of “one”] is equivalent to the “being” that signifies the categories, and to whatever else is equivalent to “thing”. (#94, pp.101–102)
Thus Fârâbî’s analyses of the senses of “being” in the Book of Letters, and of the senses of “one” in On the One, give the basis for his account of a “transcendental” sense of “one” in which it is mutually entailing with “being”, and also for his account of how unity and existence are predicated of God (see the next section): once we distinguish the different senses, and understand how they are related, we will see that circumscription by a quiddity is both the strongest sense of existence and the strongest sense of unity. And since every being in every category, individual or universal, is circumscribed by a quiddity, Fârâbî’s analysis allows him to vindicate his claim against Kindî that each of these things is truly one, and indeed essentially one.
4. Fârâbî’s philosophical theology: the Perfect City and Political Regime
Finally, we turn to metaphysical texts where Fârâbî tries to do what in the Enumeration of the Sciences he says that the “third part of the divine science” does: namely, to show that there are beings separate from bodies, culminating in a first uncaused being which has no partner and no contrary, contains no multiplicity, is one, being, and true in a stronger sense than everything else, is the first cause of existence, unity and truth to everything else, and satisfies (some interpretation of) the other traditional divine attributes; and then to show how this first being acts to produce other beings directly or indirectly, and how its action relates to theirs. This is also what Fârâbî more briefly says in the Aims of the Metaphysics that Aristotle does in Metaphysics XII:
The eleventh book [i.e., Book XII on our numbering] is about the principle of substance and of all existence, its existence and the confirmation that it is knowing by its essence and true by its essence, and about the separate beings which are after it, and about how the existence of beings depends on it.
Presumably Fârâbî thinks that Aristotle drew these conclusions on the basis of his analyses of the senses of being and unity, of the ways in which one kind of being [mawjûd] could be prior to another being, of what a being’s existence [wujûd] is, of how one being can cause existence to another being, and so on. Fârâbî himself undertakes such analyses in his Book of Letters and On the One, and in one section of the Book of Letters he sketches in a purely hypothetical way how they might lead to a first being that is being in the strongest sense.
However, the two extant books where Fârâbî tries to carry out this part of metaphysics, the Perfect City and the Political Regime, are of a rather different character from the texts that he wrote for an audience within the Baghdad philosophical school, engaging with Aristotle’s texts and trying to rewrite them for a modern audience. Neither of these books is devoted exclusively to metaphysics: each first gives a long account of God as first cause, and then an account of the heavenly and sublunar things that proceed from God, before focussing on the human soul, human societies and their governance, prophecy, and the conditions for the soul’s successful “return” to God or for more or less satisfactory approximations. Especially in the Perfect City it is clear that Fârâbî is adopting an overall sequence of topics from kalâm treatises, and is trying to show that the methods of falsafa allow him to give a scientific content to the knowledge of God, and a demonstrative resolution of the issues in dispute, which in his view the methods of kalâm cannot. The full titles of the two texts, the Principles of the Opinions of the People of the Perfect City and the Political Regime known as “Principles of Beings” suggest that he is trying to reconstruct and rewrite Plato’s Republic (about which he has only indirect information), or perhaps a sequence of several Platonic texts including the Republic. In Plato, the thesis that the best society will be ruled by philosophers leads to a discussion of the objects the philosophers need to know, Platonic Forms and especially the Good-itself, and this may give Fârâbî a model for including in these treatises a metaphysical account of the first cause and how other things proceed from it: the rulers of the best society will know these truths, and other members of the society will either believe them without demonstration, or accept some imitation of them. But while Plato starts with a discussion of the city and uses it to motivate digressions into metaphysics, Fârâbî starts at the top, with metaphysics (in the Political Regime with a classification of “principles” or non-bodily causes, in the Perfect City with the first cause), with no prior context or motivation. He does not frame the metaphysics by saying that this is what the people of the perfect city know or believe. Rather, he starts from the first cause, explains how the various types of being in the cosmos, including human souls, depend on it, and draws conclusions about what sort of city would further human perfection and what its rulers or other inhabitants would have to know or believe: this conforms to the structure of kalâm treatises, which typically start with God’s existence and unity and attributes and acts, then talk about God’s creation including human beings, and then about prophecy and the religious community and the afterlife (âkhira) or “return” (maʿâd) to God.
Fârâbî does not seem to know about the metaphysics of the Republic, and in any case it would not give him what he needs. He fills in the content of the metaphysics from elsewhere, from Metaphysics XII as he would like it to be, guided by later Greek interpreters—Themistius’ commentary, and texts of Plotinus and Proclus in their Arabic adaptations. This goes beyond the actual Metaphysics XII both in that it infers to God as a first cause of existence rather than of motion, and in that it includes a downward way from God to the beings that derive their existence from him. Fârâbî is also much more systematic than Aristotle, in the manner of a kalâm treatise, in showing that God is simple, i.e., free from all the different modes of composition, and is unique and has no contrary (all things that Metaphysics XII does briefly say), and in going through a whole series of attributes of God. It is plausible that both treatises are directed to potential princely patrons, perhaps after Fârâbi’s departure from Baghdad for Aleppo and Damascus late in his life. Fârâbî would be trying to break falsafa out of its Christian (or Ismâʿîlî) ghetto and to present it as a “religious science” superior to kalâm, not exclusively Muslim but suited for Muslim needs: Fârâbî presents falsafa as giving the content of the ruler’s or his adviser’s religious knowledge, and implicitly presents himself as an adviser to princes. Thus both the Perfect City and the Political Regime are supposed to be intelligible to a non-specialist audience. In neither case does Fârâbi show himself struggling with a difficult Greek model, and while he draws on his technical analyses of being and unity from the Book of Letters and On the One, this technical substructure is tastefully concealed. The Political Regime seems to stay closer to Fârâbî’s Greek models, and may thus be the earlier of the two texts, while in the Perfect City he seems to have more fully digested those models and to be presenting the results in a simpler and more independent form, concentrating on the elements more central to presenting falsafa as a “religious science” to a contemporary Muslim audience. But some passages remain verbally identical or almost identical in the two treatises.
Both treatises put human beings and their societies in an Aristotelian cosmological context, which Fârâbî describes in some detail. Humans and other kinds of animals, and also plants, are composites of some kind of soul (including, for humans, a rational soul) with a body composed out of the four sublunar elements, earth and water and air and fire; the whole sublunar world is governed, ultimately by God, but proximately by a series of nested heavenly spheres (each moved by an incorporeal intelligence) and by the “active intelligence” which is a source both of intellectual cognition to the human rational soul and of intelligible order to the sublunar world. But in what follows I will discuss only the strictly metaphysical parts of these texts, not the cosmology or the theories of the human soul, prophecy, or society. I will mainly follow the Perfect City, while noting some interesting differences in the Political Regime. The Political Regime in general seems more interested in classification and comparison. The human soul is introduced by being compared to various higher and lower things, and the way it achieves its intended perfection is compared to the ways they do. Likewise, God is introduced, in the prologue to the Political Regime, on a list of six kinds of incorporeal “principles” of physical things, and his causality is compared with the modes of causality of these other principles.
The Perfect City sweeps away this introductory framework, and starts directly with the thesis-statement, “The first being [mawjûd] is the first cause of existence [wujûd] to all other beings [mawjûdât]”. Fârâbî’s strategy is to argue that there is a unique “first being”, and then to derive its attributes, including that it produces other things, and indeed produces everything else either directly or indirectly; in the process he hopes to have shown that this first being has enough of the traditional attributes of God, suitably reinterpreted, that the readers will acknowledge it as God. The Perfect City never once uses the word “God”, and this is surely a deliberate strategy. We cannot validly deduce “God exists”, or “God is F” for any value of F, unless we have at least one premise containing the term “God”, and no such premises are available. Especially in Islam it is very common to refer to God, not by the name “God”, but by one of his attributes, and Fârâbî in the Perfect City consistently uses “the First”, one of the standard Qurʾânic attributes (Q 57:3).
Fârâbî does not accompany the initial thesis of the Perfect City, “The first being [mawjûd] is the first cause of existence [wujûd] to all other beings [mawjûdât]”, by any explicit proof. What is his strategy for convincing the reader to accept it? On the face of it, there are several ways in which this thesis could be falsified. There might be no first being, because every being has another being prior to it, ad infinitum. Or there might be many beings each of which is “first” in the weak sense that it has nothing prior to it; in which case no being will be “first” in the strong sense that it is prior to everything other than itself. (We might also want clarification of what priority-relation Fârâbî is talking about. He does not explicitly say, but he seems to mean roughly what Aristotle calls priority in being by contrast with priority in time and priority in definition. X is prior to Y in being if X can exist without Y existing but not vice versa, or if neither can exist without the other existing but X is the cause of Y’s existing.) If there is some X which is “first” in the strong sense that it is prior to everything other than itself, Fârâbî seems to think it will be clear that X is the first cause of existence, either immediately or by a chain of intermediate causes, to any other being Y, because every being other than the first will have some cause (distinct from itself) of its existence, and because, if (as Fârâbî assumes) there can be no circles or infinite regresses of such causes, the chain of its causes can only terminate in the first being X. Fârâbî says nothing here about the infinite regress problem (although he is certainly aware of the issue, and we can make plausible guesses about why he thinks the objectionable infinite regresses do not arise). But he has a clear (although not obviously successful) strategy for showing that there cannot be many things each of which is “first” in the weak sense that it has nothing prior to it, and therefore nothing which is prior to everything other than itself. Fârâbî does not immediately draw this conclusion: rather, it is supposed to follow from a series of inferences he makes about what anything that is “first” must be like.
Fârâbî’s general strategy is (1) to argue that anything that is “first” must not have any kind of cause, since any such cause would be prior to it and it would not be first, and that it has no privation or potentiality (either of which would imply dependence on something prior); then (2) to infer that since it has no cause it must be simple, i.e., that it is “one” in the sense of not having any of the different kinds of internal composition (e.g., out of matter and form, genus and differentia, or physically extended parts); then (3) to infer from its simplicity and non-dependence that it has no partner and no contrary, i.e., that it is “one” in the sense of being unique; (4) then to infer from its negative attributes (especially its immateriality) to its being intelligence and to the kind of intelligence it is, and then to derive its other positive attributes from its being this kind of intelligence (or simply to reduce the other attributes to its being this kind of intelligence); and finally (5) to infer from its simplicity to the only possible way that it can generate something outside itself. Since we know that there are things other than the First, and since anything other than the First must derive its being directly or indirectly from the First, it will follow that the First does immediately generate at least one thing, a “Second”; and Fârâbî will try to sketch how the First either directly or indirectly causes all the main types of constituents of the world. Fârâbî’s transitions from the First’s simplicity to its uniqueness, from its negative attributes to its being intelligence, and from its intrinsic attributes to its producing something outside it, are all high-risk moments, and will all be challenged by other Arabic thinkers.
We will concentrate here on the stages of argument up through the uniqueness of the First, with a few comments at the end on how Fârâbî hopes to get to its being intelligence (and to what kind of intelligence it is) and to its generating a Second. Sometimes Fârâbî just states his conclusions without explicit argument, and sometimes he suggests what premisses the conclusion is supposed to follow from, while leaving it to the reader to figure out how it is supposed to follow. It is usually not too hard to fill in a broadly plausible argument. But the obvious ways of doing this, not drawing on any technical Farabian metaphysical notions, are often disappointingly vague. We may be able to get more precise, using notions from the Book of Letters and On the One which Fârâbî’s terminology here points back to.
At a first stab: Fârâbî argues that, if something is “first” in the sense that nothing is prior to it, it cannot be dependent on anything for its existence or for its continuation in existence. Therefore it has existed without beginning and will exist without end, and has no potentiality for not existing. It has no efficient cause, but also no material cause: if it had a material cause, its matter would be prior to it, and presumably it would also depend on an efficient cause to turn its matter into it. It is less obvious how Fârâbî wants to infer that it is perfect, with no deficiency or privation, but perhaps the thought is that if it were deprived of F, it would have to be of such a kind that it could be F, and therefore it (or its matter) would be potentially F. And Fârâbî apparently thinks he can conclude, not just that a first being has no potentiality for not existing, but that it has no potentiality for any predicate that it does not have by its essence: perhaps his reason is that if it were potentially F, it would depend on something else which is actually F to make it actually F, and this other thing would be prior to it. Fârâbî also says that a first being has no final cause, and while he officially says here only that there is no final cause for its existence, he also thinks that there is no final cause that it aims to achieve through its activities, again because it would be in potentiality to some perfection that it does not have by its essence. It also has no form, because nothing can have a form unless it also has an underlying matter, which has already been excluded. And Fârâbî adds another argument, that
if it had a form, its essence [dhât] would be composed out of matter and form, and if it were so then its constitution [qiwâm] would be through its two parts out of which it is composed, and its existence [wujûd] would have a cause. (Walzer 1985, 58,2–5
This allows him to generalize from the case of matter and form to other kinds of constituents: as he says when he comes back to this issue after the uniqueness arguments,
it is not divisible in account [Arabic qawl = Greek logos] into things by which it is substantified, since it is impossible that each part of the account which explicates its meaning should signify a part of what it is substantified by. For if it were so, the parts by which it is substantified would be causes of its existence [wujûd] in the way that the meanings which the parts of a thing’s definition signify are causes of the existence of the thing defined, and in the way that the matter and the form are causes of the existence of what is composed out of them; and this is impossible for it, since it is first and its existence has no cause at all. And if it is not divisible by these divisions, it is even further from being divisible by divisions of quantity or the other ways of being divided. (Walzer 1985, 66,8–68,1)
So any kind of composition is incompatible with its being first, since each of its components would be prior to it and would be a (partial) cause of its existence; we could also argue that the components would need a cause to unify them, and that this cause would cause the existence of the composite.
Fârâbî gives a series of arguments for the conclusions (central from a Muslim point of view) that a First can have no partner and no contrary. He does not actually use the word “partner” here, but uses phrases like “nothing other than it can have the existence [wujûd] that it has”. While Fârâbî gives a number of arguments for these conclusions, we can reconstruct perhaps the central arguments as follows. To conclude that, if X is first, no other being Y can have the same existence that X has, Fârâbî says that, if this were so, X and Y would not differ, and so would be the same thing, not two things. But what justifies the claim that X and Y would not differ? Fârâbî says,
if there were a difference between them, then that by which they differ would be other than what they share, and the thing by which each of them differs from the other would be a part of that by which their existence is constituted, and what they share would be the other part: so each of them would be divided in account, and each of its parts would be a cause of the constitution of its essence, and so it would not be first. (Walzer 1985, 58,13–60,3)
An obvious objection is that although X, being first, must be simple, Y might not be: perhaps X is wholly constituted by what X and Y share, but Y is only partially constituted by this common element and is partially constituted by something else. Fârâbî considers this objection and replies that in that case
the existence of the latter is not the existence of the former, rather the essence of the former is simple and indivisible and the essence of the latter is divisible, and therefore the latter has two parts by which it is constituted, and therefore its existence has a cause, and therefore its existence is inferior to the existence of the former and deficient in comparison with it, and therefore it is not existence in the first rank, (Walzer 1985, 60,9–13)
contrary to the hypothesis that Y has the same existence that X has.
Fârâbî gives two arguments that, if X is first, it cannot have a contrary Y. Both arguments turn on a definition of “contrary”: X and Y are contrary if they cannot be together in the same place or substratum, so that X is present in some place or substratum through Y’s being absent from it, and X is absent from a place or substratum through Y’s being present in it. On the basis of this definition, Farâbî argues, first, that if the First, X, were contrary to Y, then X’s being (in some place or substratum, or being at all) would be conditioned on Y’s absence, and therefore X’s substance would not be sufficient to explain X’s continuing to exist, or X’s existing at all: so, Fârâbî says, X’s constitution [qiwâm] would not be in X’s substance (alone), but would be through something else, and so X would not be first. Second, X and Y would have to have something common that is receptive of both of them, so that this common thing would persist in being and X and Y would succeed each other in it, and so this common thing would be prior to them and neither of them would be first. These arguments are recognizably developments of Aristotle’s arguments in Metaphysics XII against there being a pair of contrary first principles like Empedocles’ Love and Strife, although Aristotle relies on the premiss that the first principle is pure actuality, while Fârâbî makes relatively little use of the notion of actuality and relies on the premisses that the first principle is simple and that it does not depend on anything else for its existence. Fârâbî’s conclusion that the First has no contrary is not simply a special case of his conclusion that the First has no partner, or as he says that “nothing other than it can have the existence [wujûd] that it has”, since he does not assume that contraries would have the same existence or would be members of the same species or genus.
But it would be unfair to summarize Fârâbî’s arguments by saying
the First must have nothing to be prior to it, therefore it must be simple; so there cannot be two Firsts, since if there were they would have something in common and something that distinguishes them, and so they (or at least one of them) would not be simple.
This argument seems open to an immediate objection: why would they have to have anything in common, except that they are both first, in the sense that neither of them has anything prior to it? And being “first” in this sense is a mere negation—indeed merely the negation of a relation to something else—and so firstness would not be a constituent of the thing that is first, and so would not threaten its simplicity. And, while it is not clear that Fârâbî has an adequate reply to this objection, his argument is more sophisticated than this quick summary would suggest, and its extra sophistication may give him more resources to deal with objections, including the objection that Fârâbî has not ruled out the possibility of infinite regresses and that there may be no First, or that there could be a First and also other things independent of the First if the chains of their causes go back ad infinitum without leading to a First.
It should be clear already that Fârâbî’s argument in the Perfect City uses the word “existence” [wujûd] a great deal, in contexts where it is not obviously necessary. Why say that “the first being is the first cause of existence to all other beings” and not just “the first being is the cause of all other beings”? Why say “nothing other than it can have the existence that it has” rather than “nothing other than it is first” or “nothing other than it is in the same species or genus as it”? Why say that if X and Y are similar in one respect and different in another respect,
the thing by which each of them differs from the other would be a part of that by which their existence is constituted, and what they share would be the other part: so each of them would be divided in account, and each of its parts would be a cause of the constitution of its essence, and so it would not be first
rather than “the thing by which each of them differs from the other would be a part of it, and what they share would be the other part, and then its parts would be prior to it, and so it would not be first”?
What does it mean, for Fârâbî, to say that X is the cause of existence to Y, or that X is the existence of Y, or that X enters into the constitution [qiwâm] of Y or is part of that by which the existence of Y is constituted? At first blush, the first sentence of the Perfect City, “the first being [mawjûd] is the first cause of existence [wujûd] to all other beings [mawjûdât]”, seems to be taking the position of al-Kindî that Fârâbî had criticized in the Book of Letters, according to which the first being, God, would be a separately existing existence-itself, such that everything else would come to exist by participating in it: things would exist [would be mawjûd] through an existence [wujûd] as they are white though a whiteness, and God would be that existence. Is he here, in the Perfect City, slipping into the kind of popularizing philosophy that he had criticized through a logical syntax of language in the Book of Letters? An immediate response is that Fârâbî’s position in the Perfect City is not the same as Kindî’s, since Fârâbî does not say that God is the existence of anything else. But we would still want to know how God is the cause of the existence of other things, and more generally what it means to say that X is the cause of the existence of Y, and what role this plays in Fârâbî’s argument in the Perfect City. And Fârâbî’s positive theory in the Book of Letters gives us resources for understanding this.
As we saw in Section 3.4, on Fârâbî’s analysis in the Book of Letters there are two main senses of being [mawjûd], with corresponding senses of existence [wujûd]. If “being” [mawjûd] means “being outside the mind as it is inside the mind”, then the subject of which is predicated is a thought in the mind (a concept or judgment), and its existence [wujûd] is its relation to something extramental, and this existence holds univocally of all true thoughts. Clearly this cannot be what Fârâbî means in the Perfect City—it would be pointless to ask, in this sense, whether something else has the same existence [wujûd] that the First has. On the other hand, if “mawjûd” means “being circumscribed by a quiddity outside the mind”, then the subject of which it is predicated is a thing really existing outside the mind, and, according to Book of Letters I,89, its corresponding wujûd is either its quiddity or part of its quiddity. Interpreting wujûd as quiddity does not make sense of the Perfect City’s question whether anything else has the same wujûd as the First: it would be trivially true that no two distinct things could have the same quiddity, or, if we say that the quiddity of a thing is just its form without its matter, it would still be trivially true that no two distinct immaterial things could have the same quiddity. But “part of a quiddity” works, particularly if we reflect on what kind of part of the quiddity of X could be called the wujûd of X, and why. As we saw in Section 3.4, Fârâbî in the Book of Letters, following Aristotle’s Metaphysics VII,17, analyzes X’s existence [wujûd = ousia in Aristotle’s Greek] as the cause of the fact that X exists, and, in order to search for this cause as a middle term, tries to reanalyze the existential judgment “X exists” as a predicative judgment, something like “Y is X” where Y is the per se subject of X. If X is entirely simple, then “X exists” cannot be reanalyzed in this way, but in this case there is no cause of the fact that X exists, and X’s existence [wujûd] is identical to X without remainder. In cases where X can be analyzed into a subject and a predicate, one meaning of “X exists” is that there is a middle term explaining why the predicate belongs to the subject: and this middle term (not the linguistic expression but the reality it signifies) is one of the things that can be called “the existence [wujûd] of X by which it is constituted” or “the cause of existence to X” or “a part by which its existence [is constituted]”. In this sense the interposition of the earth between the sun and the moon is a partial existence [wujûd] of eclipse, or a part of the quiddity of eclipse which is a cause of existence to eclipse, or a cause of the constitution of eclipse. Since the First is entirely simple, its quiddity cannot be spelled out into a definition, and so the First’s existence is identical to the First without remainder, and there is no way that two simple things can share the same existence. But the First is a “cause of existence” to a Second, or is “part of that by which the existence of the Second is constituted”, and similar expressions, if the First enters as a cause into the real causal definition of the Second, which it does, since (as we will see) the Second is constituted by its act of cognizing the First. This makes sense of the different things Fârâbî says in the Perfect City about X being the cause of existence to Y, or X being a part of the constitution [qiwâm] of Y, of X and Y sharing the same existence. It also helps to show what the extra content is to saying “X is the cause of existence to Y” rather than just “X is the cause of Y”, and helps to explain Fârâbî’s ground for his assumption that there is a First, i.e., that there is not an infinite regress of causes of existence: if X is the cause of Y, X counts as the cause of existence to Y only if X would be mentioned in a causal definition of Y, i.e., if it is essential to Y to be caused by X, so that a Y not caused by X would not really be a Y. If there were an infinite regress of causes of existence to X, it would follow that the causal definition of X would be infinitely long, which Fârâbî presumably regards as absurd, as does Aristotle in Metaphysics II,2. There may well be an infinite regress of causes of coming-to-be, e.g., the infinite chain of my ancestors, but because these are not causes of existence, which would enter into the quiddity of the effect and so would be mentioned in its scientific definition, they do not lead to the absurdity of an infinitely long definition.
As we saw in Section 3.4, Book of Letters I,92 sketches out a program for finding a chain of causes of existence, where each cause enters into the quiddity of its effect and has a stronger claim to the title of “being” [mawjûd]. A substance is a cause of existence to the accidents proper to it, and enters into their quiddity, but then there will be a hierarchy of causes of existence within the category of substance itself, until we reach some first substance, “whether this is one or more than one”, which has a stronger claim to the title of “being” than all other substances, and a fortiori than accidents.
And if something is discovered outside all these categories which is the cause of the realization of the quiddity of the most fundamental thing in this category [i.e., the category of substance], then this is more deserving to be called “being” [mawjûd] than the most perfect thing in this category, and this is the first cause of existence [wujûd] to the most perfect thing in this category, and this most perfect thing [sc. within the category of substance] is the cause in the quiddity of the other things in this category, and what is in this category is the cause in the quiddity of the other categories: thus the beings, where what is meant by “being” is what has a quiddity outside the soul, are ordered by this order. (Book of Letters I,92)
Fârâbî in the Perfect City and Political Regime claims to have shown that there is indeed exactly one such first being, which enters as an essential cause into the quiddities of other things. The claim is not that the First acts on each quiddity, from “outside” the quiddity, to give that quiddity actual existence, but rather that whatever immediately depends on the First is essentially constituted by its act of cognizing the First, so that a full account of what the Second is necessarily involves the First; and lower things are essentially constituted by their relations to these higher things, and so are essentially dependent on the First.
The Perfect City and Political Regime make particularly striking use of Fârâbî’s “general” metaphysical treatises, the Book of Letters and On the One, in their accounts of the senses in which the First is one. The Perfect City and Political Regime go through a list of attributes of God, and try to show that (and in what sense) each of them belongs to the First, and from a Muslim point of view one of God’s most important attributes is that he is one—first in the sense that there is no other god, and then also in the sense that he contains no internal multiplicity. The Perfect City marks several senses in which the First is “one”. It is one in that no other being shares its species of existence (66,5–7), and it is one in that it is “undivided” or “indivisible”, into quantitative parts or any other kind of parts (68,2–6); but then, finally,
if the First is indivisible in its substance then the existence by which it is circumscribed [yanḥâzu] from existences other than it cannot be other than [the existence] by which it exists [is mawjûd] in itself, and therefore it is circumscribed from what is other than it through a unity which is its essence [i.e., through a unity which it is, not through a unity distinct from itself]. For one of the meanings of unity is the specific existence [wujûd khâṣṣ] by which each being is circumscribed from what is other than it: this is that by which every being is called one inasmuch as it exists [is mawjûd] in respect of the existence which specifies it, and this is the meaning of “one” which is coextensive with existence. So the First is one in this way too, and is more deserving of the name and meaning of “one” than any one other than it.
Here the Perfect City is relying on the conclusion of the Book of Letters that “circumscribed by its quiddity” is one of the meanings of “being” and the conclusion of the On the One that “circumscribed by its quiddity” is one of the meanings of “one”, and using these conclusions to interpret Aristotle’s claim in Metaphysics IV,2 that “being” and “one” are mutually entailing. Any being X has a “specific existence” which “circumscribes it”, i.e., distinguishes it from all other things, and it is one in the sense that it is uniquely specified by this existence. If X is a member of a species, then X’s “specific existence” might include the matter or the place or other accidental attributes which distinguish X from other members of the same species. But, Fârâbî is saying, if X is the First and therefore indivisible in its substance, it cannot have both a quiddity which it shares with other things and then a distinct “specific existence” which distinguishes it from those other things. So because it is one both as “unique” and as “indivisible”, its unity, that by which it is one, is completely identical with the quiddity by which it exists [is a being]. Here, as with the other attributes which he demonstrates of the First, Fârâbî is paralleling the Muʿtazilite pattern of asserting that, for any attribute F such that we can say that God is F, the F-ness through which God is F is identical with the divine essence. But Fârâbî claims to have based his account of the First and its attributes on demonstrations grounded in analyses of the meanings of being, unity, intelligence and the other fundamental philosophical concepts; whereas, Fârâbî would say, when the Muʿtazilites say that God is F through an F-ness which is identical with his essence, and therefore is F in a different way from creatures, this is bare assertion to save their theses that God is simple and that he is nonetheless F, and does not rest on an analysis of a special sense of F that applies to God and how it relates to more ordinary senses of F. In the cases of being and unity, the special metaphysics of the Perfect City and Political Regime is supposed to rest on the general metaphysics of the Book of Letters and On the One, and is supposed to vindicate Fârâbî’s claim that Aristotelian general metaphysics, when properly understood, will give the path to a scientific special metaphysics.
We conclude by briefly sketching two further, and problematic, key steps in the metaphysical section of the Perfect City and Political Regime, namely Fârâbî’s argument that the First is both intelligence [ʿaql = Greek nous] and intelligible [maʿqûl = noêton], and his argument that the First is a cause of existence to other things, and immediately to a single Second, the immaterial intelligence which moves the outermost sphere (in the Perfect City), or to a small finite number of Seconds, the immaterial intelligences which move the different heavenly spheres (in the Political Regime). By arguing that the First is intelligence and intelligible, Fârâbî tries to derive versions of the attributes of knowledge and truth standardly ascribed to God, and by arguing that it produces a Second he tries to derive a version of the act of creation standardly ascribed to God. But he is deriving radically stripped-down versions of these attributes and acts, since the First directly knows only itself, and directly creates only the Second (or a few Seconds), even if it may be said as a consequence to indirectly know and create other things too.
Fârâbî’s basic steps in arguing that the First is intelligence and intelligible are the premisses that
what prevents the form from being intelligence and from actually intellectually cognizing is the matter in which the thing exists
what prevents the thing from being intelligible in actuality [or “from being intellectually cognized in actuality”] and from being by its substance intelligible [or “intellectually cognized”] is also matter. (Walzer 1985, 70)
Since the First has no matter, it would follow that it is actually intelligence and actually intellectually cognized. Fârâbî’s first premiss, that anything would be intellectually cognizing if it did not have a matter blocking it, initially seems strange and ill-motivated. But Fârâbî would see the second premiss, that matter is the obstacle to something’s being intellectually cognized, as grounded in an Aristotelian analysis of intellectual cognition: the mind intellectually cognizes the form of a material thing precisely by abstracting it from its matter, and if the object had no matter to begin with, then there is nothing further to do to it and it is already intellectually cognized. And Fârâbî apparently sees the first premiss as following from the second: if X is intrinsically without matter, it is actually intellectually cognized intrinsically, and not through a relation to something else which would cognize it: and this can only because it actually intellectually cognizes itself, and does so intrinsically or essentially, not in dependence on some other cause. Following this Aristotelian analysis, the First’s act of intellectually cognizing its object would not be an accident of the First, but would be its essence; put the other way around, the First would be an intelligence, not by being a power for intellectually cognizing various objects, but by being an act of cognizing its object, namely the First itself. So, as Fârâbî says,
that it is intelligence [or “intellectual cognition”] and that it is intellectually cognized and that it is intellectually cognizing are all a single essence and a single undivided substance. (Walzer 1985, 70)
Or, as Fârâbî says in switching from the Aristotelian language of “intelligence” to the Qurʾânic and kalâm language of God’s attribute of knowledge, the First’s knowledge does not require anything other than itself for it to know, and its knowledge is identical with its essence (Walzer 1985, 72). This sounds like the Muʿtazilites in claiming to reconcile God’s knowledge with his simplicity. But while the Muʿtazilites try to show how God’s knowledge can be simple and eternal despite God’s knowing a vast plurality of things, some of which change, Fârâbî short-circuits the problem by saying that God’s knowledge is just knowledge of himself. Perhaps Fârâbî would say that the problem just cannot be solved if we assume that God is omniscient. Or perhaps he would say, with Themistius (followed by many medieval philosophers), that God in knowing himself also implicitly knows other things because he is a cause of those other things.
Fârâbî also applies his groundwork from the Book of Letters to save the Qurʾânic attribute that God is “true” or “truth” [al-ḥaqq]. The First is “truth” [ḥaqîqa] in the sense in which the ḥaqîqa of X is the quiddity of X, i.e., the existence [wujûd] which specifies X as distinct from all other things, which might be expressed by the definition or the ultimate differentia of X; and, as Fârâbî has already argued, there is no distinction between the First itself and the existence by which the First is distinguished from other things. Also, if S thinks X in a way that corresponds to the way X is in itself, S’s thought of X can be called “true” [ḥaqq], and X can also be called true insofar as it corresponds to S’s thought of X. Since the First knows itself, it can be called “true” in this sense through itself, apart from any relation to anything outside itself; and because this is essential to it, the “truth” [ḥaqîqa] through which it is “true” in this sense is not anything other than itself (Walzer 1985, 74). For the First to be “truth” in this second sense seems to be equivalent to its being essentially intellectually cognized.
In passing from the First as intelligence to the First as causing being, Fârâbi is passing, in kalâm terms, from God’s attributes to God’s acts. His account of the First as intelligence was perhaps less concerned to show that God has knowledge, more concerned to show that God’s knowledge is identical with his essence, and to show in consequence the differences between the way that God knows and the ways that other things know. His account of the First as causing being to other things, or (in kalâm terms) of God’s act of creation, does not attempt to deduce, starting from what we have shown about the First, that it must create other things rather than remaining in isolation. He does say that
when the First exists with the existence which it has, it necessarily follows that there exist from it all the other beings whose existence is not by human will and choice, with the existences which they have, (Walzer 1985, 88,11–14)
but he gives no argument that the First’s existence entails the existence of other things. Rather, he seems to rely on the argument that since other things in fact exist, their existence must ultimately be caused by the First; his main concern is not to show that the First causes the existence of other things, but to show how it causes the existence of other things, and in particular to show that that by which the First causes the existence of other things is identical with its essence, just as that by which the First knows is identical with its essence. As Fârâbî says, “it is not divided into two things, such that the substantiation of its essence is by one of them and something else’s arising from it is by the other” (Walzer 1985, 92,3–5): as he says a bit further down, the First does not require an accident or a motion in itself in order for something else to arise from it. (Nor is it affected or moved by something else’s arising from it, since it cannot be affected or moved at all.) Nor, more generally, does the First require anything other than its essence—whether an accident or motion that would inhere in the First itself, or an external instrument or material substrate that the First would cooperate with in producing some effect—in order for something other than itself to arise from it. The First does cooperate with external instruments and material substrata in producing some of its effects, and this is important for Fârâbî in explaining how it can produce a plurality of effects, and how it can produce more and less perfect effects, and how it can produce effects which are connected or “ordered” rather than independent of each other. But the First must be able to produce at least some first effect without an instrument or substratum, or it would not be able to produce anything at all, and in that first case the existence of the First must be a sufficient cause of the existence of its effect.
Fârâbî gives no further explanation of how or why the existence of X can be a sufficient cause of the existence of Y. (He says that the existence of Y “emanates” [using the root f-y-ḍ] from the existence of X, but this is just a technical term meaning that X’s existence, rather than some further act of X, causes Y to exist; the term “emanation” does not explain how this happens, and Fârâbî does not pretend that it does.) He just infers that this must happen in some cases, since more than one thing exists. Fârâbî’s situation is analogous to Aristotle’s in Metaphysics XII. After Aristotle has argued that the existence of motion presupposes a first cause which is essentially pure actuality, and which therefore cannot be changed or moved, he faces the problem of explaining how such a cause can move something else. Aristotle answers that while an eternally unchanging cause cannot, by itself, cause changing motions, it can cause an eternally constant motion (such as the eternal rotation of a heavenly sphere around its axis) if it causes it as a final cause, as an object desired by the object in motion. This leaves many puzzles—why should this desire lead a heavenly sphere to move in circles, how will that help it attain the desired object—but Aristotle can say that since every other kind of causality is impossible, this is what must be happening even if we don’t understand the details. Fârâbî faces a similar difficulty in explanation, but he finds Aristotle’s solution unsatisfying, not so much because these details are missing, as because it does not explain why the heavenly spheres, or their incorporeal movers other than the First exist—at best, Aristotle assumes that the incorporeal substances and the spheres exist, and explains why the spheres move. Fârâbî, by contrast, has undertaken to understand the First as a cause of existence; and final causality, even if it is sufficient to explain the motion of an already existent substance, does not seem sufficient to explain the existence of substances other than the First, either the heavenly spheres or their incorporeal movers. The First must cause existence before it can cause motion, and in fact Fârâbî does not make it a mover at all, but rather says that it is responsible for the existence of something which is in turn the first cause of motion. And if the First causes existence at all, it must first cause the existence of at least one thing simply by its own existence, not cooperating with any further attribute or motion or instrument or matter. Fârâbî does not and cannot say anything about what the First does to cause the existence of something else (he does not say that it causes the existence of something else by thinking that thing, or even that it causes the existence of something else as a byproduct of thinking itself); rather, he tries to describe how, and in what order, other things are essentially dependent on the First.
In the Perfect City Fârâbî says that the First causes existence, immediately and without cooperation with an instrument or matter, only to a single thing, the Second; in the Political Regime, apparently, the First causes existence immediately to several things, the Seconds. But in both treatises, when he introduces his discussion of the First as the cause of existence to other things, he does not start by singling out a Second or Seconds. Rather, he starts by saying that “the substance of [the First] is a substance from which every existence emanates, whatever this existence may be like, whether it is perfect or deficient”; (Walzer 1985, 94), but he then immediately adds that “when all the beings arise from it, they are ordered in their ranks, and each being receives from it the portion of existence which is due to it and the rank which is due to it” (ibid.). But then there is a problem why the First’s single simple existence, assuming that it causes the existence of something else, should cause a plurality of beings receiving greater or lesser “portions” of existence from it. Fârâbî’s answer to this problem seems to be less developed in the Political Regime than in the Perfect City. In the Political Regime, he says that the Seconds (the intelligences that move the heavenly bodies), and apparently also the “active intelligence” that governs the sublunar world, “have all received existence from the First” (Butterworth 2015, 46, #34, translation modified); other things depend on the Seconds or the active intelligence for their existence, and for this reason receive lesser portions of existence. Fârâbî says here that the Seconds, like the First, are such that their specific existence is sufficient for the existence of something else to emanate from them (ibid.): each Second produces a heavenly sphere composed of body and soul (it produces not merely the motion but the existence of the sphere), and sublunar substances depend for their existence both on the heavenly spheres and on the active intelligence. The Political Regime says that the Seconds have different ranks (Butterworth 2015, 46, #34) but it does not say anything to explain why there should be many of them or why they should differ in rank. In particular, it does not say that lower Seconds depend on higher Seconds for their existence: each Second is described only as producing a heavenly sphere, not as producing another Second, and as far as we can tell each Second is produced immediately by the First without cooperation with any other cause. However, in the Perfect City, Fârâbî says that the First, immediately and by itself alone, produces only a single Second (Walzer 1985, 100), and that all other beings are produced by the First in conjunction with instruments or material substrata, where these must be either the Second or things which are produced by the First in conjunction with the Second. This allows Fârâbî to explain why there should be a plurality of separate immaterial substances, and why they should differ in rank: the Second which is immediately produced by the First has a greater “portion of existence” than the Third which depends essentially on the Second, and so on, and all of these separate intelligences (the movers of the heavenly spheres and then the active intelligence that governs the sublunar world) have greater portions of existence than sublunar substances which essentially depend on the heavenly spheres and on the active intelligence. Here Fârâbi is following out the program of Book of Letters I,92, discussed above, of finding a single first substance (here the Second, i.e., the mover of the outermost heavenly sphere) on which all other substances are essentially dependent, and then tracing it back in turn to a single simple First: the causal definition of any other substance, if made fully explicit, would have to refer to the motion of the outermost sphere and to the Second as its cause, and thus ultimately to the First. But Fârâbî has the problem of explaining how a single Second can be responsible for causing all this multiplicity of essentially differing beings. The Perfect City, like the Political Regime, stresses that the Seconds (or Second, Third, and so on), like the First, are each an intelligence which is essentially actually cognizing and is itself the object it cognizes, and whose specific existence is sufficient for the existence of something else to emanate from it; both treatises also stress that these intelligences are also inferior to the First, notably in that they do not have their full perfection purely in themselves, but only through a relation to the First, namely through intellectually cognizing the First. But if each of these intelligences, like the First, immediately produces only a single being like itself, they will not be able to explain the multiplicity and complexity of the beings that arise indirectly from the First. In the Political Regime apparently each of the Seconds produces just a single being, namely the heavenly sphere it governs (although this sphere has some complexity as a compound of body and soul, and although the active intelligence that governs the sublunar world has more complex effects), but in the Perfect City each of these intelligences has to produce two beings, namely the heavenly sphere it governs and the next intelligence. Thus
from the First emanates the existence of the Second, and this Second too is a substance which is not embodied at all and is not in matter, and it intellectually cognizes itself [or “its essence”] and it intellectually cognizes the First, and its intellectual cognition of itself is not something other than its essence; and by its intellectually cognizing the First there follows necessarily from it the existence of a Third, and by its being substantified by the essence which is specific to it there follows necessarily from it the existence of the first heaven. (Walzer 1985, 100)
So for the Perfect City, as in the Political Regime, the Second, like the First, essentially cognizes itself, and there is no distinction between its act of cognizing itself, the existence by which it is substantially constituted, and that through which it gives rise to the existence of the heavenly sphere it governs. But the Perfect City can say that there is a distinction between this intelligence’s cognition of itself, which is essential to it, and its cognition of the First, through which it attains a perfection, by relation to something else, exceeding what it has just by itself. Or perhaps it would be better to say that its essence includes a relation to the First, and that its essence is therefore compound, in something like the way that a species-essence composed of genus and differentia is compound. Fârâbî does not want to say that an immaterial intelligence is composed of two beings [mawjûdât], such as substance and accident or matter and form, but he wants to say that it has two existences [wujûdât], that it is in two ways or in a compound way. His wager in the Perfect City is that he can explain this plurality of existences in immaterial substances by the way in which they are caused by the First, and that this plurality of existences will in turn explain how these immaterial substances can give rise to the many complex beings ultimately arise from the First.
A. Primary sources
A.1 Editions of texts by Fârâbî
- Falsafat Aflaṭûn, in Franz Rosenthal and Richard Walzer (eds. and trs.), [Latin], Alfarabius de Platonis philosophia, London: Warburg, 1943.
- Iḥṣâʾ al-ʿulûm, in Ángel González Palencia (ed. and tr. [Spanish]), Al-Farabi: Catálogo de las ciencias, second edition, Madrid: Consejo Superior de Investigaciones Científicas, 1953.
- [Kutsch & Marrow 1960] Sharḥ al-Fârâbî li-Kitâb Arisṭûṭâlîs fî l-ʿIbâra = Alfarabi’s Commentary on Aristotle’s PERI ERMHNEIAΣ (De Interpretatione), Wilhelm Kutsch and Stanley Marrow (eds.), Beirut: Imprimerie Catholique, 1960.
- Kitâb al-siyâsa al-madanîya = Alfarabi’s The Political Regime, Fauzi M. Najjar (ed.), Beirut: Imprimerie Catholique, 1964.
- [Mahdi 1968] Kitâb al-alfâẓ al-mustaʿmala fî l-manṭiq, Muhsin Mahdi (ed.), Beirut: Dar el-Mashreq, 1968.
- [Mahdi 1969a] Kitâb al-ḥurûf = Alfarabi’s Book of Letters, Muhsin Mahdi (ed.), Beirut: Dar el-Mashreq, 1969a. [Note that Boook of Letters is cited by part and paragraph number followed, possibly, by page number and line number.]
- [Mahdi 1976] Kitâb iḥṣâʾ al-îqâʿât, selections edited by Muhsin Mahdi in ʿUthmân Amîn (ed.), Nuṣûṣ falsafîya muhdât ilâ l-Duktûr Ibrâhîm Madkûr, Cairo: 1976, pp. 75–8.
- Kitâb al-wâḥid wa-l-waḥda = Alfarabi’s On One and Unity, Muhsin Mahdi (ed.), Casablanca: Toubkal, 1989.
- Kitâb al-jamʿ bayna raʾay al-ḥakîmayn, in Cecilia Martini Bonadeo, (ed. and tr. [Italian]), al-Fârâbî: L’armonia delle opinioni dei due sapienti: il divino Platone e Aristotele, Pisa: Plus, 2008.
A.2 Editions of earlier Arabic philosophical texts
- Oeuvres philosophiques et scientifiques d’al-Kindî, Jean Jolivet and Roshdi Rashed, (ed. and tr. [French]), 2 vols., Leiden: Brill, 1997.
A.3 Translations of texts by Fârâbî
- Bertolacci, Amos (tr.), 2006a, “On the Aims of the Metaphysics”, in Bertolacci 2006b, 66–72.
- Bučan, Daniel (tr.), 1999, Abu Nasr Al-Farabi: Knjiga o slovima, Zagreb: Demetra. Croatian translation of the Book of Letters.
- Butterworth, Charles E. (tr.), 2001, Alfarabi: The Political Writings: “Selected Aphorisms” and Other Texts, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press. Contains the Selected Aphorisms, Book of Religion, The Harmonization of the Two Opinions of the Two Sages: Plato the Divine and Aristotle, and selections from the Enumeration of the Sciences.
- ––– (tr.), 2015, Alfarabi: The Political Writings, Volume II: “Political regime” and “Summary of Plato’s laws”, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press
- González Palencia, Ángel (ed. and tr. [Spanish]), 1953, Al-Farabi: Catálogo de las ciencias, second edition, Madrid: Consejo Superior de Investigaciones Científicas.
- Khalidi, Muhammad Ali, 2005, Medieval Islamic Philosophical Writings, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Contains a partial English translation of the Book of Letters, pp. 1–26.
- McGinnis, Jon and David C. Reisman, 2007, Classical Arabic Philosophy: An Anthology of Sources, Indianapolis, IN: Hackett. Contains translations of On the Aims of the Metaphysics, On Intelligence, and part of the Political Regime.
- Mahdi, Muhsin (tr.), 1969b, Alfarabi’s philosophy of Plato and Aristotle, revised edition, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press. Contains the Attainment of Happiness, Philosophy of Plato, and Philosophy of Aristotle.
- Martini Bonadeo, Cecilia (ed. and tr. [Italian]), 2008, al-Fârâbî: L’armonia delle opinioni dei due sapienti: il divino Platone e Aristotele, Pisa: Plus.
- Rosenthal, Franz, 1975, The Classical Heritage in Islam, London: Routledge. Contains a translation of On the Appearance of Philosophy, pp. 50–51
- Rosenthal, Franz and Richard Walzer (ed. and tr. [Latin]), 1943, Alfarabius de Platonis philosophia, London: Warburg
- Türker, Ömer (tr.), 2008, Harfler Kitabı: Kitâbu’l-Hurûf, Istanbul: Litera Yayıncılık. Turkish translation of the Book of Letters.
- Walzer, Richard (ed. and tr.), 1985, Al-Farabi on the Perfect State: Abû Naṣr al-Fârâbî’s Mabâdiʾ Ârâʾ Ahl al-Madîna al-Fâdila, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Zimmermann, F.W. (tr. [with book-length introduction]), 1981, Al-Farabi’s Commentary and Short Treatise on Aristotle’s De interpretatione, London: Published for the British Academy by Oxford University Press
A.4 Translations of earlier Arabic philosophical texts, and a Greek text surviving in Arabic/Hebrew
- Adamson, Peter and Peter E. Pormann (trs), 2012, The Philosophical Works of Al-Kindî, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Elamrani-Jamal, Abdelali, 1983, Logique aristotélicienne et grammaire arabe, Paris: Vrin. Contains a French translation of the debate between Abû Bishr Mattâ and al-Sîrâfî, pp. 149–63.
- Jolivet, Jean and Roshdi Rashed (ed. and tr. [French]), 1997, Oeuvres philosophiques et scientifiques d’al-Kindî, Leiden: Brill
- Madelung, Wilferd and Paul Walker, 1999, The Advent of the Fatimids: A Contemporary Shiʿi Witness, London: Tauris
- Margoliouth, D.S., 1905, “The Discussion between Abu Bishr Matta and Abu Saʿid al-Sirafi on the Merits of Logic and Grammar”, Journal of the Royal Asiatic Society, 37(1): 79–129. doi:10.1017/S0035869X00032706
- Meyrav, Yoav (tr.), 2020, Themistius: On Aristotle Metaphysics 12, London: Bloomsbury.
B. Secondary sources
- Abed, Shukri B., 1991, Aristotelian Logic and the Arabic Language in Alfârâbî, Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
- Adamson, Peter, 2002, The Arabic Plotinus: A Philosophical Study of the Theology of Aristotle, London: Duckworth.
- Bertolacci, Amos, 2005, “On the Arabic Translations of Aristotle’s Metaphysics”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 15(2): 241–275. doi:10.1017/S0957423905000196
- –––, 2006b, The Reception of Aristotle’s Metaphysics in Avicenna’s Kitâb al-Šifâʾ: A Milestone of Western Metaphysics, Leiden: Brill.
- Décarie, Vianney, 1961, L’objet de la métaphysique selon Aristote, Paris: Vrin.
- Diebler, Stéphane, 2005, “Catégories, conversation et philosophie chez al-Fârâbî”, in Les catégories et leur histoire, Otto Bruun and Lorenzo Corti (eds.), Paris: Vrin, pp. 275–305.
- Druart, Thérèse-Anne, 2007, “Al-Fârâbî, the Categories, Metaphysics, and the Book of Letters”, Medioevo: Rivista di storia della filosofia medievale, 32: 15–37.
- Galston, Miriam, 2015, “The Puzzle of Alfarabi’s Parallel Works”, The Review of Politics, 77(4): 519–543. doi:10.1017/S003467051500056X
- Gutas, Dimitri, 1999a, “The ‘Alexandria to Baghdad’ Complex of Narratives: a Contribution to the Study of Philosophical and Medical Historiography Among the Arabs”, Documenti e Studi sulla Tradizione Filosofica Medievale, 10: 155–93.
- –––, 1999b, “Fârâbî i. Biography”, Encyclopedia Iranica, Vol. IX, Fasc. 2, pp. 208–213; current version [Gutas 1999b available online]
- Janos, Damien, 2012, Method, Structure, and Development in al-Farabi’s Cosmology (Islamic Philosophy, Theology and Science. Texts and Studies, 85), Leiden: Brill. doi:10.1163/9789004217324
- –––, 2016, “Al-Fārābī’s (d. 950) On the One and Oneness: Some Preliminary Remarks on Its Structure, Contents, and Theological Implications”, in The Oxford Handbook of Islamic Philosophy, Khaled El-Rouayheb and Sabine Schmidtke (eds), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 101–28.
- Menn, Stephen, 2008, “Al-Fārābī’s Kitāb al-Ḥurūf and His Analysis of the Senses of Being”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 18(1): 59–97. doi:10.1017/S0957423908000477
- –––, 2011, “Fârâbî in the Reception of Avicenna’s Metaphysics: Averroes against Avicenna on Being and Unity”, in The Arabic, Hebrew and Latin Reception of Avicenna’s Metaphysics, Dag Hasse and Amos Bertolacci (eds), Berlin: De Gruyter, pp. 51–96. doi:10.1515/9783110215762.51
- Rashed, Marwan, 2009, “On the Authorship of the Treatise On the Harmonization of the Opinions of the Two Sages Attributed to al-Fārābī”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 19(1): 43–82. doi:10.1017/S0957423909000587
- Rudolph, Ulrich, 2008, “Reflections on al-Fârâbî’s Mabâdiʾ ârâʾ ahl al-maḍîna al-fâdila”, in In the Age of al-Fârâbî: Arabic Philosophy in the Fourth/Tenth Century, Peter Adamson (ed.), London: Warburg Institute, pp. 1–14.
- –––, 2017, “Abû Naṣr al-Fârâbî”, in Philosophy in the Islamic World, Volume 1: 8th–10th Centuries, Ulrich Rudolph, Rotraud Hansberger, and Peter Adamson (eds), Rotraud Hansberger (tr), Leiden: Brill, pp. 526–654.
- Shiloah, Amnon, 1971, “Traités de musique dans le Ms. 1705 de Manisa”, Israel Oriental Studies, 1: 305–7.
- Vallat, Philippe, 2004, Farabi et l’école d’Alexandrie, Paris: Vrin.
- Watt, John W., 2008, “Al-Fârâbî and the History of the Syriac Organon”, in Malphono w-Rabo d-Malphone: Studies in Honor of Sebastian P. Brock, George A. Kiraz (ed.), Piscataway, NJ: Gorgias Press, pp. 703–731.
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