Simone de Beauvoir
Simone de Beauvoir (1908–1986) was a philosopher, novelist, feminist, public intellectual and activist, and one of the major figures in existentialism in post-war France. She is best known for her trailblazing work in feminist philosophy, The Second Sex (1949), but her original contributions to existentialism and phenomenology can be found across her work, from her first philosophical novel She Came to Stay (1943) to her politicization of old age in The Coming of Age (1970). Although active in the French intellectual scene all of her life, and a central player in the philosophical debates of the times both in her role as an author of philosophical essays, novels, plays, memoirs, travel diaries, and newspaper articles, and as an editor of the leftist journal Les Temps Modernes, Beauvoir was often regarded as merely the midwife to Jean-Paul Sartre’s existential ethics rather than a thinker in her own right. She also, however, refused to identify herself as a philosopher, referring to herself as an author in spite of her rigorous philosophical training and accomplishments. Yet, decades of scholarship on Beauvoir’s life and work, undertaken predominantly by feminist scholars, secured for her a place in philosophy against her word, and for good reason. Beauvoir has made enduring contributions to the fields of ethics, social and political philosophy, existentialism, phenomenology and feminist philosophy and her significance as an activist and public intellectual are clear. Beauvoir’s life and work continue to inspire contemporary research and debate in the discipline of philosophy and beyond.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. Beauvoir the Philosopher
- 3. She Came to Stay: Freedom and Violence
- 4. Pyrrhus and Cinéas: Radical Freedom and the Other
- 5. The Ethics of Ambiguity: Bad Faith, the Appeal, the Artist
- 6. America Day by Day: A Concrete Encounter
- 7. The Second Sex: Woman As Other
- 8. “Must We Burn Sade?” Freedom and the Flesh
- 9. The Long March: Politics, Time, and Possibility
- 10. Djamila Boupacha: The Concrete Appeal
- 11. All Men are Mortal, A Very Easy Death, Adieux: A Farewell to Sartre : Finitude, Passion and the Body
- 12. The Coming of Age: The Other Again
- 13. Life Writings: Situation, Becoming, and the Self-Other Relation
- 14. Influence and Current Scholarship
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Life and Works
Simone de Beauvoir was born on January 9, 1908 in Paris, France. Her parents, Georges Bertrand de Beauvoir and Françoise (née) Brasseur provided Beauvoir and her younger sister Hélène, often referred to by her nickname “Poupette,” with a traditional bourgeois, Catholic upbringing. Beauvoir spent much of her childhood rebelling against the values of her faith and bourgeois ideology. The disdain for the latter would continue throughout her adult life. In her childhood, Beauvoir vowed to never become a housewife or mother and admired her father’s intelligence. He introduced the young Beauvoir to great works of literature and encouraged her to write. She pursued this out of her own interest, writing stories and keeping diaries throughout her girlhood, and more formally in her educational training at the private Catholic school for girls, the Institut Adeline Désir. At school, she formed an intimate bond with Elizabeth Mabille, or Zaza. Together, the two confronted and resisted the rigid expectations of bourgeois, Catholic femininity. When Zaza died of meningitis in 1929, Beauvoir suffered intense heartbreak. She fictionalized this heartbreak and their intimacy in the novel Inseparable (2021), which was written in 1954 but deemed “too intimate” to publish during Beauvoir’s lifetime.
In her girlhood, Beauvoir was independent, curious, and a gifted student. She was often defiant of the rules of the adult world and desired to fill her life with as many experiences as possible. Although initially devout in her faith, at age fourteen Beauvoir rejected the existence of God, which was a pivotal moment in her life, as was her family’s loss of class status in 1919. The former event propelled Beauvoir into studying philosophy, while the latter made the bourgeois expectation of marriage improbable. Her early devotion to an intellectual life proved to have social and material benefits, offering her a way to concretely realize her independence during an era when most women were economically dependent on men.
In 1925, at the age of seventeen, Beauvoir passed the baccalauréat exams in mathematics and philosophy. In 1926, she earned Certificates of Higher Studies in French literature and Latin after studying at the Institut Catholique and the Institut Sainte-Marie. In the fall of 1926 she began studying philosophy at the Sorbonne where, in 1928–1929, she would write her graduate thesis (diplôme) on Leibniz prior to taking the competitive agrégation exam in philosophy in 1929. At twenty-one Beauvoir was the youngest candidate to pass the exam, finishing second to Jean-Paul Sartre who had taken the exam for the second time. As the eighth woman to pass the agrégation, Beauvoir’s success solidified her economic independence and she continued to assume her independence in the face of patriarchal constraints. In the second volume of her autobiography, The Prime of Life (1960), Beauvoir recounts this time as carefree, as if she were untethered to the constraints of the world. Years later, different conditions would shift her attitude.
While studying for the agrégation, Beauvoir met Sartre and they found in each other intellectual companions and lovers. Although Beauvoir has often been framed as merely adopting Sartre’s philosophical commitments, her diaries and memoirs tell another story. They both relied on one another as interlocutors and Sartre often relied on Beauvoir’s intellectual acuity to develop his ideas. Though they refused the tradition of monogamy, the two remained together their entire lives. In 1929, they made a famous pact to be “essential lovers”, yet allowed for “contingent loves” that they disclosed to one another. During her lifetime Beauvoir had numerous affairs with men and women, but none paralleled her relationship with American author Nelson Algren, whom she fell deeply in love with. In various personal writings, Algren seems to occupy the place of an “essential love” far more than Sartre. However, the pact with Sartre was never broken and the two were bonded throughout their lifetime. This open relationship was radical for the time, yet Sartre and Beauvoir have also been criticized for their sexual ethics. Given what is exposed in Beauvoir’s diaries about her disappointments with her relationship with Sartre, it is not entirely clear why she honored their pact. If anything, Beauvoir’s life and work are reminders of the concrete contradictions and ambiguities we all, and women especially, face, even in love.
In the 1930s, Beauvoir spent much of her time teaching philosophy until she was dismissed from her post in 1941 by the Nazis who had occupied Paris in 1940. The Nazi Occupation and the changing social and political climate had a profound impact on Beauvoir, and she became more attuned to ethics and the constitutive relationship between circumstance and freedom. During this time, she abandoned the rationalist-voluntarist position of her youth, and became more preoccupied with morality and agency in the concreteness of social context. From 1941–1946 she wrote several important works, including the novel, The Blood of Others (1945), her first philosophical essay Pyrrhus et Cinéas (1944), a precursor of sorts to The Ethics of Ambiguity (1947), and the novel All Men are Mortal (1946). In 1945, she helped found the leftist journal Les Temps Modernes with other French intellectuals, including Sartre and Merleau-Ponty. Beauvoir was a co-editor of the journal and it quickly became an important venue for philosophical and political essays of the time, including Beauvoir’s “Eye for an Eye” (1946). While focusing on her political writings, Beauvoir traveled to the United States and wrote America Day by Day (1948). It was also in Les Temps Modernes that Beauvoir first published extracts of The Second Sex (1949).
Although Beauvoir was not an ardent feminist in her early years, The Second Sex (1949) became one of the most important feminist texts of the twentieth century, and it launched Beauvoir into the public spotlight for generations to come. As The Second Sex became a catalyst for challenging women’s situations, Beauvoir’s political and intellectual place was also reset. After repeatedly refusing to align herself with the feminist movement, Beauvoir declared herself a feminist in a 1972 interview in Le Nouvel Observateur and joined other Marxist feminists in founding the journal Questions Féministes. In 1971, she authored and signed Manifesto 343, a public declaration of 343 women who admitted to having an abortion at a time when it was still illegal in France. In the 1960s, she also used her philosophical voice to engage in political activism against French colonialism, writing publicly against the torture of Djamila Boupacha and criticizing the indifference to the commonplace torture of Algerian women by the French Army.
Beauvoir’s literary and philosophical success and reflections on the concrete world continued after The Second Sex. She published important essays, including “Must We Burn Sade?” (1951–1952) and “Right Wing Thought Today” (1955), that further develop her notions of authenticity, responsibility, and solidarity. Her novel The Mandarins (1954), a story about left-wing intellectuals at the end of World War II, won the Prix Goncourt, the prestigious French literary award. As with many of her other works, this novel examines relationships, events, and struggles that fictionalize aspects of her own life. As Beauvoir describes in the third volume of her autobiography, Force of Circumstance (1963), The Mandarins is not a novel with a message, but rather a philosophical investigation of the meaning of life after the war and the lived confrontation with being and nothingness. It is a work that exemplifies Beauvoir’s turn to literature to do philosophy. A few years later in 1957, she published A Long March, an essay about her six-week visit to Communist China in 1955 as one of the 1,500 delegates to visit for the Bandung Conference. From 1958–1963, she published her autobiography in three volumes (the fourth volume would come out in 1974), and not too long after A Very Easy Death (1964), an intimate reflection on the last six weeks of her mother’s life, and later The Woman Destroyed (1967). After a significant period of interdisciplinary research, similar to the work undertaken to write The Second Sex, Beauvoir wrote The Coming of Age (1970), offering a harrowing account of what it means to become old and the oppression it entails in western, capitalist societies.
After spending the latter half of her life as a feminist icon, public intellectual, and an eminent writer, Beauvoir died at seventy-eight, on April 14, 1986. She was buried, with Sartre, in the Montparnasse Cemetery in Paris, wearing the ring Nelson Algren had given her many years earlier.
In spite of working amidst some of the most prominent French philosophers of her time, Beauvoir’s legacy has often been denied its philosophical significance. Indeed, the details of her life have often been taken to be more interesting than her ideas. This reception exemplifies that circumstances can often steal an individual’s transcendence, a point she pursues time and time again in her work.
2. Beauvoir the Philosopher
Beauvoir was not considered a philosopher at the time of her death. Some have found Beauvoir’s exclusion from the domain of philosophy more than a matter of taking Beauvoir at her word. They attribute it to an exclusively systematic view of philosophy which, apathetic to the philosophical methodology of the metaphysical novel, ignored the ways that Beauvoir embedded existential-phenomenological arguments in her literary works. Between those who did not challenge Beauvoir’s self-portrait, those who did not accept her understanding of the relationship between literature and philosophy, and those who missed the unique signature of her philosophical essays, Beauvoir the philosopher remained a lady-in-waiting.
Some have argued that the belated admission of Beauvoir into the ranks of philosophers is a matter of sexism on two counts. The first concerns the fact that Beauvoir was a woman. Her philosophical writings were read as echoes of Sartre rather than explored as original contributions because it was only “natural” to think of a woman as a disciple of her male companion. The second concerns the fact that she wrote about women. The Second Sex, recognized as one of the hundred most important works of the twentieth century, would not be counted as philosophy because it dealt with the oppression of women, hardly a burning philosophical issue (so it was said). But, decades of scholarship on Beauvoir by feminist scholars has proven that she deserves recognition as a philosopher in her own right.
Such recognition was not without its challenges, especially the one posed by Beauvoir. Her philosophical voice, she insisted, was merely an elaboration of Sartre’s. Those denials coupled with the fact of her life-long relationship with him positioned her in the public and philosophical eye as Sartre’s alter ego. Decoupling Beauvoir from Sartre became the first priority of those interested in establishing her independent philosophical credentials. Sometimes the issue concerned Sartre’s originality: Were the ideas of his Being and Nothingness (1943) stolen from Beauvoir’s She Came to Stay (1943)? Sometimes they concerned matters of influence: What happened in their discussions and critiques of each other’s work? Eventually these arguments abated and scholars turned from exclusive attention to the matter of Sartre’s influence to the more fruitful question of influence in the broader sense. They began to trace the ways that she, like her existential-phenomenological contemporaries, took up and reconfigured their philosophical heritage, identifying her philosophical originality and unique contributions to existentialism and phenomenology. Studying her diaries and memoirs expose her philosophical influences even more explicitly: Descartes and Kant were familiar figures in her philosophical vocabulary; her reading of Hegel was influenced by the interpretations of Kojève; she was introduced to Husserl and Heidegger by her teacher Baruzi; she drew on Bergson before she had studied Hegel or Marx; if she had rewritten Volume I of The Second Sex, she would develop a more Marxist, less Hegelian account of the Other; and after meeting Jean Walh at a dinner party in 1939, Beauvoir became immersed in a study of Kierkegaard which moved her away from Hegelianism and toward an existentialist ethics of freedom.
Beauvoir’s tenuous recognition as a philosopher also has much to do with her critique of and challenge to its methods. She detailed her phenomenological and existential critique of the philosophical status quo in her 1946 essay “Literature and the Metaphysical Essay”, and her 1965 and 1966 essays “Que Peut la Littérature?” and “Mon Expérience d’écrivain”. This critique, influenced by both Husserl and Heidegger, focused on the significance of lived experience and on the ways that literature unveils situated truths in the world. Beauvoir, Albert Camus and Sartre turned to the language of the novel and the theater. They looked to Husserl to theorize their turn to these discourses by insisting on grounding their theoretical analyses in the concrete particulars of lived experience. They looked to Heidegger to challenge the privileged position of abstract discourses. For Beauvoir, however, the turn to literature carried ethical and political as well as philosophical implications. Literature is a way to overcome existential separation between self and other, to engage and be undone by other truths. It allowed her to explore the limits of the appeal (the activity of calling on others to take up one’s political projects); to portray the temptations of violence; to enact her existential ethics of freedom, responsibility, joy and generosity; and to examine the intimacies and complexities of relationships with others. She found in literature a way to reveal the contingency of the world, along with its multiple, interwoven meanings, in ways that traditional philosophical forms could not. Further, many of her works are shaped by rigorous interdisciplinary research, which allowed Beauvoir to think in the concrete, rather than in the abstract mode of traditional philosophy.
In writing The Second Sex, Beauvoir undertook a challenge to the patriarchal status quo. This challenge was a dramatic event that inspired controversy and social upheaval. At its publication, the book was regarded more as an affront to sexual decency than a political indictment of patriarchy or a phenomenological investigation of “woman”. It was the women who came to be known as second-wave feminists who understood what Beauvoir’s first readers missed. It was not sexual decency that was being attacked but patriarchal indecency that was on trial. The Second Sex expressed their sense of injustice, focused their demands for social, political, and personal change and alerted them to the connections between private practices and public policies. No longer considered sexually scandalous, its analysis of patriarchy and women’s oppression, and its proposed antidotes to women’s domination are still debated.
Beauvoir’s work has suffered in translation further obscuring her status as a philosopher and her political ideas in particular. The first English translation of The Second Sex, done by H.M. Parshley, a zoologist with no background in philosophy, is perhaps most well known for its controversial translation, which omits around fifteen percent of the original text, inaccurately translating the central philosophical concepts, and depoliticizing Beauvoir’s feminism. In 1953, when America Day by Day was published for an American audience, it also suffered from serious omissions, many of which focused on her account of race relations in the U.S. The English translations of several of Beauvoir’s novels are also subtly emptied of her political commentary.
Nonetheless, Beauvoir’s oeuvre challenged the borders separating philosophy and literature and disrupted the boundaries between the personal, the political, and the philosophical. Since her death, her status as an original philosopher has been secured, in large part due to feminist scholars who resisted the patriarchal constraints of the discipline of philosophy and reconsidered Beauvoir’s own framing of her life and work. She would have appreciated the fact that her current philosophical status reflects our changed understanding of the domain of philosophy and the changed situation of women, for it confirms her idea of situated freedom—that our capacity for agency and whether or not we are identified as agents, is constrained, though never determined, by our situation. She would also have appreciated the fact that while her works were instrumental in effecting these changes, their lasting effect is a tribute to the ways that others have taken up her philosophical and feminist legacies; for one of her crucial contributions to our ethical and political vocabularies is the concept of the appeal—that the success of our projects depends on the extent to which they are adopted by others.
3. She Came to Stay: Freedom and Violence
Though Beauvoir’s first philosophical essay was Pyrrhus and Cinéas (1944) many of her interpreters identify She Came to Stay (1943) as her inaugural philosophical foray. It is a clear example of what Beauvoir calls the metaphysical novel. The letters between Sartre and Beauvoir and Beauvoir’s diaries of that period (published in the 1980s), show that both Beauvoir and Sartre were concerned with the question of the other, the issue of bad faith and the dynamics of desire. They were also examining the relationship and tensions between our singular existential status and the social conditions within which our singularity is lived. She Came to Stay is packed with philosophical reflections—reflections on our relationship to time, to each other, to ourselves. These reflections are never, however, presented in systematic arguments or brought to closure. They are lived in the concrete, ambiguously triangulated lives of Pierre, Xavière and Françoise. Opening with a quote from Hegel, “Each conscience seeks the death of the other”, and ending with Françoise’s murder of Xavière, which Beauvoir narrates as an act in which Françoise confronts her solitude and announces her freedom, the novel does not necessarily confirm Hegel’s claim. The point of the murder was not to eliminate the other per se but to destroy a particular other, Xavière, who was the other who threatened to leave Françoise without the other she loved, Pierre. Here, existential ambiguity trumps Hegelian clarity. The issues raised in this first novel, including the ambiguity regarding the responsibilities and limits of freedom, the legitimacy of violence, the tension between our experience of ourselves as simultaneously solitary and intertwined with others, the temptations of bad faith and the examination of the existentially faithful relationship to time, will pervade Beauvoir’s subsequent reflections.
4. Pyrrhus and Cinéas: Radical Freedom and the Other
Pyrrhus and Cinéas (1944), published one year after She Came To Stay, is Beauvoir’s first philosophical essay. It addresses fundamental ethical and political issues, such as: What are the criteria of ethical action? How can I distinguish ethical from unethical political projects? What are the principles of ethical relationships? Can violence ever be justified? It examines these questions from an existential-phenomenological perspective. Taking the situation of the concrete existing individual as its point of departure, Pyrrhus and Cinéas provides an analysis of the ways that, as particular subjects, we are necessarily embedded in the world and inescapably related to others. Though not feminist in any identifiable sense, this essay raises such compelling feminist questions as: Under what conditions, if any, may I speak for/in the name of another?
After opening Pyrrhus and Cinéas with Plutarch’s account of a conversation between Pyrrhus and Cinéas, where the justification of action is questioned, Beauvoir, finding the recommendation to be passively inconsistent with the realities of human nature and desire, asks three questions: What is the measure of a person? What goals can one set for oneself? What hopes are permitted to us? She then divides the text into two parts. Part one moves from the ontological truth—that I am a finite freedom whose endings are always and necessarily new beginnings—to the existential questions: How can I desire to be what I am? How can I live my finitude with passion? These existential questions lead to moral and political ones: What actions express the truth and passion of our condition? How can I act in such a way so as to create the conditions that sustain and support the humanity of human beings? Part I concludes with the observation that: “A man alone in the world would be paralyzed by … the vanity of all of his goals. But man is not alone in the world” (PhilW 115, cf. P&C 42). Beauvoir opens Part II with the properly ethical question: What is my relation to the other? Here the analysis is dominated by the problem created by Beauvoir’s insistence on the radical nature of freedom. According to Beauvoir, the other, as free, is immune to my power. Whatever I do—if as a master I exploit slaves, or as an executioner I hang murderers—I cannot violate their inner subjective freedom. Making a distinction between freedom as internal and the external conditions through which self and other engage, Beauvoir argues that we can never directly touch the freedom of others. This inner-outer distinction underscores that our relationships are either superficial, engaging only the outer surface of each other’s being, or they are mediated through our common commitment to a shared goal or value.
This line of argument would seem to lead either to benign Stoic conclusions of mutual indifference or to the finding that tyrants and terrorists pose no threat to individual freedom. Beauvoir does not, however, let it drift in these directions. Instead she uses the inner-outer distinction and the idea that I need others to take up my projects if they are to have a future, to introduce the ideas of the appeal and risk. She develops the concept of freedom as transcendence (the movement toward an open future and indeterminate possibilities) to argue that we cannot be determined by the present. The essence of freedom as transcendence aligns freedom with uncertainty and risk. To be free is to be radically contingent. Though I find myself in a world of value and meaning, these values and meanings were brought into the world by others. I am free to reject, alter or endorse them for the meaning of the world is shaped by human choices. Whatever choice I make, however, I cannot support it without the help of others. My values will find a home in the world only if others embrace them; only if I persuade others to make my values theirs.
So, as radically free I need the other. I need to be able to appeal to others to join me in my projects. The knot of the ethical problem lies here: How can I, a radically free being who is existentially severed from all other human freedoms, transcend the isolations of freedom to create a community of allies? Given the necessity of appealing to the other’s freedom, under what conditions is such an appeal possible?
In answering these questions Beauvoir turns the inner-outer distinction to her advantage as she develops the concept of situated freedom. Though I can neither act for another nor directly influence their freedom, I must, Beauvoir argues, accept responsibility for the fact that my actions produce the conditions within which the other acts. “I am”, Beauvoir writes, “the face of the other’s misery... I am the facticity of their situation” (PhilW 126, cf. P&C 58). Pursuing this difference between my power to effect the other’s freedom and my responsibility for their situation, and exploring the conditions under which my appeal to the other can/will be heard, Beauvoir determines that there are two conditions of the appeal. First, I must be allowed to call to the other and I must struggle against those who try to silence me. Second, there must be others who can respond to my call. The first condition may be purely political. The second is political and material because, as Beauvoir argues, it is only as peers that others are capable of responding to my call. Only those who are not consumed by the struggle for survival, only those who exist in the material conditions of freedom, health, leisure and security can become my allies in the struggle against injustice. Thus, it is only as equals that the second condition can be met. To achieve such equality, we have to strive to pursue justice, as only then will the material and political conditions of the appeal be secured.
Violence is not ruled out. Given that Beauvoir has argued that we can never reach the other in the depths of their freedom, she cannot call violence evil. She does not, however, endorse violence. Neither does she envision a future without conflict. The fact that we are differently situated and engage in the work of transcendence from different social, historical, and economic positions ensures that some of us will always be an obstacle to another’s freedom. “We are”, Beauvoir writes, “condemned to violence” (PhilW 138, cf. P&C 77). As neither evil nor avoidable, violence, she argues, is “the mark of a failure which nothing can offset” (PhilW 138, cf. P&C 77). It is the tragedy of the human condition.
The argument of Pyrrhus and Cinéas ends on an uneasy note. As ethical, we are obliged to work for the conditions of material and political equality. In calling on others to take up our projects and give these projects a future, we are precluded from forcing others to become our allies. We are enjoined to appeal to their freedom. Where persuasion fails, however, we are permitted the recourse to violence. The ambiguity of our being as subjects for ourselves and objects for others in the world is lived in this dilemma of violence and justice. Becoming lucid about the meaning of freedom, we learn to live our freedom by accepting its finitude and contingency, its risks and its failures.
5. The Ethics of Ambiguity: Bad Faith, the Appeal, the Artist
It is impossible to know where Simone de Beauvoir’s thinking would have gone had she been spared the cold, the hunger and the fear of living in Nazi occupied Paris. What we do know is that in coming face to face with forces of injustice beyond her control, the questions of evil and the other took on new urgency. Beauvoir speaks of the war as creating an existential rupture in time. She speaks of herself as having undergone a conversion. She can no longer afford the luxury of focusing on her own happiness and pleasure. The question of evil becomes a pressing concern. One cannot refuse to take a stand. One is either a collaborator or not. In writing The Ethics of Ambiguity, Beauvoir takes her stand. She identifies herself as an existentialist and identifies existentialism as the philosophy of our (her) times because it is the only philosophy that takes the question of evil seriously. It is the only philosophy prepared to counter Dostoevsky’s claim that without God everything is permissible. That we are alone in the world and that we exist without guarantees, are not, however, the only truths of the human condition. There is also the truth of our freedom and this truth, as detailed in The Ethics of Ambiguity, entails a logic of reciprocity and responsibility that contests the terrors of a world ruled only by the authority of power.
The Ethics of Ambiguity, published in 1947, reconsiders the idea of invulnerable freedom advanced in Pyrrhus and Cinéas. Dropping the distinction between the inner and outer domains of freedom and deploying a unique understanding of consciousness as an intentional activity, Beauvoir now argues that I can be alienated from my freedom. Similar to She Came To Stay, which bears the imprint of Hegel’s account of the fight to the death that sets the stage for the master-slave dialectic, and Pyrrhus and Cinéas, which works through the Cartesian implications of our existential situation, The Ethics of Ambiguity redeploys concepts of canonical philosophical figures. Here Beauvoir takes up the phenomenologies of Husserl and Hegel to provide an analysis of intersubjectivity that accepts the singularity of the existing individual without allowing that singularity to justify an epistemological solipsism, an existential isolationism or an ethical egoism. The Hegel drawn on here is the Hegel who resolves the inequalities of the master-slave relationship through the justice of mutual recognition. The Husserl appealed to is the Husserl who introduced Beauvoir to the thesis of intentionality.
The Ethics of Ambiguity opens with an account of intentionality which designates the meaning-disclosing and meaning-desiring activities of consciousness as both insistent and ambiguous—insistent in that they are spontaneous and unstoppable; ambiguous in that they preclude any possibility of self-unification or closure. Beauvoir describes the intentionality of consciousness as operating in two ways. First, there is the activity of wanting to disclose the meaning of being. Second, there is the activity of bringing meaning to the world. In the first mode of activity consciousness expresses its freedom to discover meaning. In the second, it uses its freedom to articulate meaning and give meaning to the world. Beauvoir identifies each of these intentionalities with a mood: the first with the mood of joy, the second with the dual moods of hope and domination. Whether the second moment of intentionality becomes the ground of projects of liberation or exploitation depends on whether the mood of hope or domination prevails.
Describing consciousness as ambiguous, Beauvoir identifies our ambiguity with the idea of failure. We can never fulfill our passion for meaning in either of its intentional expressions; that is, we will never succeed in fully revealing the meaning of the world, and never become God, the author of the meaning of the world. These truths of intentionality set the criteria of Beauvoir’s ethics. Finding that ethical systems and absolutes, insofar as they claim to give final answers to our ethical dilemmas and authoritarian justifications for our actions, offer dangerous consolations for our failure to be the absolute source of the world’s meaning or being, Beauvoir rejects these systems of absolutes in favor of ethical projects that acknowledge our limits and recognize the future as open. From this perspective, her ethics of ambiguity might be characterized as an ethics of existential hope.
Beauvoir’s The Ethics of Ambiguity is a secularism that rejects the ideas of God and Humanity. Their apparent differences conceal a common core: both claim to have identified an absolute source and justification for our beliefs and actions. They allow us to evade responsibility for creating the conditions of our existence and to flee the anxieties of ambiguity. Whether it is called the age of the Messiah or the classless society, these appeals to a utopian destiny encourage us to think in terms of ends which justify means. They invite us to sacrifice the present for the future. They are the stuff of inquisitions, imperialisms, gulags and Auschwitz. Privileging the future over the present they pervert our relationship to time, each other and ourselves. Insisting that the future is undecided and that its form will be shaped by our present decisions, Beauvoir argues that it is only by insisting on the dignity of today’s human beings that the dignity of those to come can be secured.
Beauvoir rejects the familiar charge against secularism made famous by Dostoevsky’s Grand Inquisitor: “If God is dead everything is permitted”. As she sees it, without God to pardon us for our “sins” we are totally and inexcusably responsible for our actions. Dostoevsky was mistaken. The problem of secularism is not that of license, it is the problem of the “we”. Can separate individuals be bound to each other? Can they forge laws binding for all? The Ethics of Ambiguity insists that they can. It does this by arguing that evil resides in the denial of freedom (mine and others), that we are responsible for ensuring the existence of the conditions of freedom (the material conditions of a minimal standard of living and the political conditions of uncensored discourse and association), and that I can neither affirm nor live my freedom without also affirming the freedom of others.
Beauvoir’s argument for ethical freedom begins by noting a fundamental fact of the human condition. We begin our lives as children who are dependent on others and embedded in a world already endowed with meaning. We are born into the condition that Beauvoir calls the “serious world”. This is a world of ready made values and established authorities. This is a world where obedience is demanded. For children, this world is not alienating for they are too young to assume the responsibilities of freedom. As children who create imaginary worlds, we are in effect learning the lessons of freedom—that we are creators of the meaning and value of the world. Free to play, children develop their creative capacities and their ability to confer meaning to the world without, however, being held accountable for the worlds they bring into being. Considering these two dimensions of children’s lives, their imaginative freedom and their freedom from responsibility, Beauvoir determines that the child lives a metaphysically privileged existence. Children, she says, experience the joys but not the anxieties of freedom. Beauvoir also, however, describes children as mystified. By this she means that they believe that the foundations of the world are secure and that their place in the world is naturally given and unchangeable. Beauvoir marks adolescence as the end of this idyllic era. It is the time of moral decision. Emerging into the world of adults, we are now called upon to renounce the serious world, to reject the mystification of childhood, and to take responsibility for our choices.
All of us pass through the age of adolescence; not all of us take up its ethical demands. The fact of our initial dependency and obedience to the serious world has moral implications because it predisposes us to the temptations of bad faith, strategies by which we deny our existential freedom and our moral responsibility. It sets our desire in the direction of a nostalgia for those lost Halcyon days. Looking to return to the security of that metaphysically privileged time, some of us evade the responsibilities of freedom by choosing to remain children, that is, we submit to the authority of others and live in the serious world.
Beauvoir does not object to the mystification of childhood. She acknowledges that parental authority is necessary for the child’s survival, and she insists that this shelter of safety should cultivate a child’s freedom. To choose to remain a child is an act of bad faith. To treat adults as children, however, is immoral and evil. If we are exploited, enslaved or terrorized, however, our submission to authority of the other cannot be counted as an act of bad faith. Absent these conditions, Beauvoir holds us accountable for our response to the experience of freedom. We cannot use the anxieties of freedom either as an excuse for our active participation in or for our passive acceptance of the exploitation of others. Hiding behind the authority of others or establishing ourselves as authorities over others are culpable offenses.
Beauvoir portrays the complexity of the ways that we either avoid or accept the responsibilities of freedom through the figures of the sub-man, the serious man, the nihilist, the adventurer, the passionate man, the critical thinker and the artist-writer. These figures are imaginary, but also historical in the sense that they are lived, and so, disclosed in the actions of human beings. The point of delineating these human types is several fold. It is a way of distinguishing between two kinds of unethical positions. One position, portrayed in the portraits of the sub-man and the serious man, is to refuse to recognize the experience of freedom. The other position, depicted in the pictures of the nihilist, the adventurer and the maniacally passionate man, is to misread the meanings of freedom. The ethical person, as portrayed by Beauvoir, is driven by passion. Unlike the egoistic, maniacal passion of the tyrant, however, the ethical passion of the artist-writer is defined by its generosity—specifically the generosity of recognizing the other’s singularity and protecting the other in their difference from becoming an object of another’s will.
In describing the different ways that freedom is evaded or misused, Beauvoir distinguishes ontological from ethical freedom. She shows us that acknowledging our freedom is a necessary but not sufficient condition for ethical action. To meet the conditions of the ethical, freedom must be used properly. It must, according to Beauvoir, embrace the ties that bind me to others and take up the appeal—an act whereby I call on others, in their freedom, to join me in bringing certain values, projects, and conditions into being. Artists and writers embody the ethical ideal in several respects. Their work expresses the subjective passion that grounds the ethical life. They describe the ways that the material and political complexities of our situations can either alienate us from our freedom or open us to it. By envisioning the future as open and contingent, artists and writers challenge the mystifications that validate sacrificing the present for the future. They establish the essential relationship between my freedom and the freedom of others.
The Ethics of Ambiguity does not avoid the question of violence. Determining that violence is sometimes necessary, Beauvoir uses the example of a young Nazi soldier to argue that to liberate the oppressed we may have to destroy their oppressors. However, she distances herself from the argument of Pyrrhus and Cinéas; now she identifies violence as an assault on the other’s freedom (however misused) and as such this violence marks our failure to respect the “we” of our humanity. Thus, The Ethics of Ambiguity provides an analysis of our existential-ethical situation that joins a hard-headed realism (violence is an unavoidable fact of our condition) with demanding requirements. It is unique, however, in aligning this realism and these requirements with the passion of generosity and a mood of joy.
In January of 1947, Beauvoir traveled to America, landing at LaGuardia Airport in New York. The purpose of her trip, which was sponsored by the French government, was to give lectures at colleges and universities on “the ethical problems of the post-war writer”. In the four months of her visit, she delivered twelve lectures, including those at Vassar, Oberlin, Mills College, and Harvard. Yet, her trip was also much more than a lecture tour. Traveling all over the country by car, train, and bus, Beauvoir visited nineteen states and over fifty cities, furthered her friendship with Richard Wright, fell in love with Nelson Algren, and developed various political critiques of the United States. She details her visit in America Day by Day, a genre bending travel-diary-essay, published in French in 1948. Although often cast as just a travel writing, it should not be overlooked as a political or philosophical text. Indeed, central to Beauvoir’s concerns in America Day by Day is how one’s concrete situation is constitutive of recognition and freedom.
Similar to her autobiographical writings, America Day by Day is a narrated record of Beauvoir’s daily, concrete experiences. Rather than advancing an argument, Beauvoir sets out to describe what she did and what she perceived, while also at times offering critical views of the social and political attitudes she encountered. For these reasons, this book is both a break from the general, abstract writing of her previous philosophical works, and generative of her more concrete, politicized writings, thereby acting as a precursor to her concrete analysis of women’s situation (which she had already begun prior to her visit to America), her account of China, and her personal writings. It is only by being in the everydayness of America, being in its concrete proximity, that Beauvoir is able, perhaps willing even, to offer an account of its problems.
Beauvoir’s account of America elucidates the dominant attitudes of bad faith in America. She writes about her observations of the expressions of political apathy, anti-intellectualism, moral optimism, social conformism, and a capitalist-driven passivity among many Americans, especially among the white, elite. She describes her confrontations with segregation in the South, the violence of whiteness in the North, and she notices the racism of white women and the contradictions between America’s commitment to democracy and its racism. Further, she accounts for class politics and labor relations, America’s foreign policy, and she reflects on the kinds of mystifications of ethics and politics in America that lead Americans into bad faith.
Beauvoir’s attention to America’s race relations and her confrontation with her own whiteness during her visit have much to do with Wright’s influence on Beauvoir, whom she spent time with during her long stay in New York, and her reading of Gunnar Myrdal’s An American Dilemma (1944), which she often references. Yet, even as Beauvoir attends to race relations and white people’s racial hatred in America, scholars have pointed out that there are also aspects of her account that expose Beauvoir’s own white perception and colonizing encounters. This dimension of America Day by Day complicates but does not erase Beauvoir’s political critique of America or the import of her description of the moral and political dispositions of Americans.
7. The Second Sex: Woman As Other
While writing America Day by Day, Beauvoir was beginning to work out her ideas for what would become her most famous book, The Second Sex. In her autobiography Force of Circumstance, Beauvoir looks back at The Ethics of Ambiguity and criticizes it for being too abstract. She does not repudiate the arguments of her text, but finds that it erred in trying to define morality independent of a social context. The Second Sex may be read as correcting this error, reworking and materially situating the analyses of The Ethics of Ambiguity. Where The Ethics of Ambiguity conjured up images of ethical and unethical figures to make its arguments tangible, the analyses of The Second Sex are materialized in Beauvoir’s experiences as a woman and in women’s lived realities. Where The Ethics of Ambiguity speaks of mystification in a general sense, The Second Sex speaks of the specific ways that the natural and social sciences and the European literary, social, moral, political and religious traditions have created a world where impossible and conflicting ideals of femininity produce an ideology of women’s “natural” inferiority to justify patriarchal domination.
Beauvoir’s self-criticism suggests that her later works mark a break with her earlier writings. We should, however, resist the temptation to take this notion of discontinuity too far. Rather than thinking in terms of breaks it is more fruitful to see The Second Sex in terms of a more radical commitment to the phenomenological insight that it is as embodied beings that we engage the world. Our access to, awareness of, and possibilities for world engagement cannot be considered absent a consideration of the body as it is lived in a concrete situation.
It was in 1946, while at the Deux Magots cafe in Paris, that Beauvoir first came up with the idea for The Second Sex. Inspired by L’âge d’homme (1939) written by Michel Leiris, Beauvoir comes up with the question: “What has it meant to me to be a woman?” Beauvoir’s immediate reflection disregarded the significance of being a woman, but she soon realized the world around her had always been a masculine one. Beauvoir then pursued the question through an interdisciplinary study of the myths of femininity, while taking herself, her situation as a woman, and the situation and embodiment of being a woman more generally as the subjects of her philosophical reflections. It is Beauvoir’s initial interest in the myths of femininity and their role in women’s lives that led her to develop the claim central to the book: woman is the Other, man is the essential being.
The Second Sex is a deliberate feminist phenomenological investigation of the sexed/gendered body, and it is considered a founding text in the field of feminist phenomenology. Beauvoir draws explicitly on narrative accounts of women’s lived experience and focuses on the entanglement of the general and the particular, rather than bracketing the contingent to arrive at pure experience. In doing so, she exposes how masculinist ideology exploits sexual difference to create a system of oppression that positions and traps women in the role of the Other. Such entrapment is part of history and mythology (which she explores in Volume I) and lived experience (described in Volume II). Central to Volume I is her discussion of the myth of the eternal feminine, a master myth that works to ensnare women in an unattainable ideal in order to undermine their existence as individuals. For Beauvoir, the myth of the eternal feminine is socially powerful and generative of “feminine existence”. It is through the sociohistorical creation and legacy of this myth and through lived experience that women become anchored to the realm of immanence and are forced to relinquish their claim to transcendence. In doing so, women become split subjects, namely those who have the capacity for world-making activity but are pushed into the repetitive, passive, closed realm of existence.
Beauvoir’s liberatory response to women’s oppression is a feminism of freedom. The Second Sex argues against the either/or frame of the woman question (either women and men are equal or they are different). It argues for women’s equality, while insisting on the reality of sexual difference. Beauvoir finds it unjust and immoral to use sexual difference as an argument for women’s subordination. She insists that women and men must both have the capacity to assume their existence as immanence and transcendence, and therefore must treat each other as equal. Yet, such treatment requires that their sexual differences be validated. She finds it un-phenomenological, however, to ignore it. As a phenomenologist she is obliged to examine women’s unique experiences of their bodies and to determine how these experiences are co-determined by what phenomenology calls the everyday attitude (the common-sense assumptions that we unreflectively bring to our experience). For Beauvoir, since the body is a situation, it is not merely that a subject has a body. Rather, the body is lived and so it is experientially constituted, such that for Beauvoir, what it means to become a woman is to live or experience one’s body in a particular way.
As a phenomenologist, this experiential account of embodiment does not commit her to a biological account of ‘woman’. Beauvoir explores cultural and historical assumptions that frame women’s experience of their bodies and that alienate them from their possibilities. She draws attention to the experiential basis of facts, including biological, psychological, historical, and economic ones, and considers how they obscure the contingent articulation of ‘woman’ or account for women’s experience as an essence. For example, it is assumed that women are weaker. What, she directs us to ask, is the ground of this assumption? What criteria of strength are used? Upper body power? Average body size? Is there a reason not to consider longevity a sign of strength? Using this criterion, would women still be considered the weaker sex? A bit of reflection exposes the biases of the criteria used to support the supposedly obvious “fact” of women’s weakness and transforms it from an unassailable reality to an unreliable assumption. Once we begin this questioning, it is not long before other so-called facts fall to the side of “common sense” in the phenomenological sense.
What is perhaps the most famous line of The Second Sex, “On ne naît pas femme: on le devient” (SS:1949, 13), translated in 1953 as “One is not born but becomes a woman” (SS:1953, 267) and in 2010 as “One is not born but becomes woman” (SS: 2010, 283), is credited by many as alerting us to the sex-gender distinction. Whether or not Beauvoir understood herself to be inaugurating this distinction, whether or not she followed this distinction to its logical/radical conclusions, or whether or not radical conclusions are justified are matters of feminist debate. What is not a matter of dispute is that The Second Sex gives us the vocabulary for analyzing how societal notions of femininity are lived and a method for critiquing them. In this sense, Beauvoir offers a critical phenomenological analysis of the socially constituted meanings of ‘woman’ and how one comes to assume and negotiate those meanings experientially. For Beauvoir, one becomes a woman not just because others say so, but because she actively assumes her bodily existence in such a way.
Beauvoir’s account of becoming is crucial to understanding how human beings called women come into existence. Beauvoir’s target here is essentialist arguments that view ‘woman’ as a biological fact. Beauvoir believes it to be faulty to accept the common sense idea that to be born with certain genitalia or reproductive capacities is to be born a woman. In rejecting this position, asserted in the most famous line of The Second Sex, she pursues the first rule of phenomenology: identify your assumptions, treat them as prejudices and put them aside; do not bring them back into play until and unless they have been validated by experience. Accordingly, she offers a descriptive account of how some human beings become women as a matter of living an imposed social destiny rooted in and generated by particular historical, economic, and political conditions, as well as social and moral conventions. On this view, ‘woman’ is an invention, but also a lived, embodied reality. For Beauvoir, the social destiny those who become women are expected and often coerced to assume is bound up with heterosexism such that to become a woman is to be made and to make oneself an object for men. The detriment of such self-making, Beauvoir shows, is that a woman comes to live an existence relative to men. In doing so, a woman becomes the Other. Women, however, are usually accomplice to this self-making, as being made the Other, although a condition of oppression, also bestows recognition and self-justification in a patriarchal milieu.
A brief but packed sentence that appears early in the The Second Sex alerts us to the ways that Beauvoir used existential and Marxist categories to analyze the unique complexities of women’s situation as the Other. It reads,
Hence woman makes no claim for herself as subject because she lacks the concrete means, because she senses the necessary link connecting her to man without positing its reciprocity, and because she often derives satisfaction from her role as the Other. (SS: 2010, 10, cf. SS: 1949, 24)
Who becomes a woman in the way Beauvoir describes is an important question. Scholars have noted the impact of Richard Wright’s intellectual influence on Beauvoir’s account of women’s situation and oppression, and Beauvoir herself makes direct reference to Wright in The Second Sex, yet her treatment of race in the book is vexed. Scholars have pointed out that her treatment of women’s situation focuses explicitly on becoming a woman, thus privileging an analysis of patriarchal oppression as the most significant form of oppression, and have noted that she generalizes from a white, bourgeois perspective. At the same time, as other scholars have noted, at the beginning of The Second Sex, Beauvoir argues that the patriarchal subjection of women is distinct in kind from racial subjection. While discrete historical events have been generative of other forms of oppression, she describes the subjection of women as feature of human existence across time and place and so not identifiable by a discrete historical event. So, for Beauvoir, it is not that women’s subjection is the only form of oppression or that it is more significant than other forms of subjection. Rather, the formation, structure and effects of the subjection of women is distinct and therefore, on her account, requires a focused investigation.
To account for what it means to become a woman, Beauvoir introduces the concept of the Other early in the text and it drives her entire analysis. She uses it again in her last major work, The Coming of Age (1970), to structure her critique of the ways that the elderly are othered by society. In The Second Sex, Beauvoir’s notion of the Other is based on the Hegelian master-slave dialectic. Unlike Hegel who universalized this dialectic, Beauvoir distinguishes the dialectic of exploitation between historically constituted Subjects and Others from the exploitation that ensues when the Subject is Man, a sovereign existence, and the Other is Woman, a relative existence. In the first case, the Other experiences their oppression as a communal reality. They see themselves as part of an oppressed group. Here, oppressed Others may call on the resources of a common history and a shared abusive situation to assert their subjectivity and demand recognition and reciprocity. The situation of women is comparable to the condition of the Hegelian Other in that men, like the Hegelian Master, identify themselves as the Subject, the absolute human type, and, measuring women by this standard of the human, identify them as inferior. Women’s so-called inadequacies are then used as justification for seeing them as the Other and for treating them accordingly. Unlike the Hegelian Other, however, women are unable to identify the origin of their otherness. They cannot call on the bond of a shared history to reestablish their lost status as Subjects. Further, dispersed among the world of men, women identify themselves in terms of the differences of their oppressors (e.g., as white or black women, as working-class or middle-class women, as Muslim, Christian, Jewish, Buddhist or Hindu women) rather than with each other. According to Beauvoir, they lack the solidarity and resources of the Hegelian Other for organizing themselves into a “we” that demands recognition. Unlike the Other of the master-slave dialectic, women are not positioned to rebel. Beauvoir uses the category of the Inessential Other to designate the unique situation of women as the ambiguous Other of men. As Inessential Others, women’s routes to subjectivity and recognition cannot follow the Hegelian script.
For Beauvoir, women’s conflict with men is ambiguous. She calls the relation between men and women a “primordial Mitsein” (SS:2010, 9, cf. 1949, 22) in order to make a claim about their original togetherness in the world. For Beauvoir, this relationship between women and men draws attention to the interdependence between the Subject and his Other and is the unique tie that binds women to their oppressors. As such, it is generative of women’s inability to identify a common history. This assertion that women live a necessary bond with men regardless of a lack of reciprocity draws on the notion of appeal developed in The Ethics of Ambiguity: in making an appeal to others to join me in my pursuit of justice I validate myself and my values. Given that my appeal must be an appeal to the other in their freedom, I must allow for the reality that the other may reject it. When this happens, I must (assuming that the rejection is not a threat to the ground value of freedom) recognize the other’s freedom and affirm the bond of humanity that ties us to each other. In the case of women, Beauvoir notes, this aspect of the appeal (the affirmation of the bond between us) dominates. She does not approve of the way that women allow the affirmation of the bond to eclipse the requirement that they be recognized as free subjects. But, she does alert us to the fact that recognition in itself is not the full story of the ethical relationship. To demand recognition without regard for the bond is unethical; it is the position of the Subject as master. What is needed, Beauvoir argues, is a reconstitution of the bond that enables women to accomplish themselves.
Such change does not concern women’s happiness. Happiness may be chosen or accepted in exchange for the deprivations of freedom. Recalling the argument of The Ethics of Ambiguity we know why. As Others, women are returned to the metaphysically privileged world of the child. They experience the happiness brought about by bad faith—a happiness of not being responsible for themselves, of not having to make consequential choices. From this existential perspective women may be said to be complicit in their subjugation. But this is not the whole story. If women are happy as the Other, it may be because, given the material and ideological realities of their situation, this is the only avenue of happiness open to them. Beauvoir’s existential charge of bad faith must be understood within her Marxist analysis of the social, economic and cultural structures that frame women’s lives. Though Beauvoir does not argue that these structures deprive women of their freedom, neither does she ignore the situations that make the exercise of that freedom extremely difficult.
For Beauvoir, the work of liberation will not be easy. It is work that will cause conflict because it requires refusing and ultimately sacrificing norms and customs of femininity and masculinity, the very ones that are, for many, sources of happiness and self-justification. Liberation is also not a matter of appealing to men to give women freedom; it is a matter of women discovering their solidarity, rejecting the bad faith temptations of happiness and discovering the pleasures of freedom. While Beauvoir alerts us to the tensions and conflicts that this will create between men and women, she does not envision a permanent state of hostility. Here her Hegelian-Marxist optimism prevails. Men will (ultimately) recognize women as free subjects, but only when both commit to sacrificing patriarchal myths.
Speaking in reference to sexual difference, Beauvoir notes that dismantling patriarchal mythology is not a recipe for androgynous subjects. Given the realities of embodiment, there will be sexual differences. Unlike today, however, these differences will appear differently. They will not be used to justify the difference between a Subject and his Inessential Other. Ultimately, according to her, the goal of liberation is our mutual recognition of each other as free and as other.
Despite the heterosexist structure of the myth of the eternal feminine, Beauvoir describes one situation in which mutual recognition sometimes exists: the intimate heterosexual erotic encounter. Speaking of this intimacy, she writes, “the dimension of the other remains; but the fact is that alterity no longer has a hostile character” (SS: 2010, 415, cf. 1949, 189). Why? Because authentic lovers experience themselves and each other ambiguously, that is, as both subjects and objects of erotic desire rather than as delineated according to institutionalized positions of man and woman. In Beauvoir’s words,
The erotic experience is one that most poignantly reveals to human beings their ambiguous condition; they experience it as flesh and as spirit, as the other and as subject (SS: 2010, 416, cf. SS: 1949, 190).
The concept of ambiguity, developed abstractly in The Ethics of Ambiguity, is erotically embodied in The Second Sex and is identified as a crucial piece of the prescription for transcending the oppressions of patriarchy. This description of the liberating possibilities of the erotic encounter is also one of those places where Beauvoir reworks Merleau-Ponty’s phenomenology of embodiment. By drawing on Merleau-Ponty’s descriptions of the ways that we are world-making and world-embedded subject-objects, she reveals the ways that it is as subject-objects “for the world”, “to the world”, and “in the world” that we are passionately drawn to each other.
The last chapters of The Second Sex, “The Independent Woman” and the “Conclusion”, speak of the current (1947) status of women’s situation—what has changed and what remains to be done. Without ignoring the importance of women gaining the right to vote and without dismissing the necessity of women attaining economic independence, Beauvoir finds these liberal and Marxist solutions to women’s situation inadequate. They ignore the effects of women’s socialization (the subject of Volume II) and they are inattentive to the ways that masculine norms and the masculinist, sovereign subject remain the standard of the human. The liberated woman must free herself from two shackles: first, the idea that to assume herself as a freedom and be independent she must be like men, and second, the socialization through which she becomes feminized. The first alienates her from her existence as a (sexual) subject. The second makes her averse to risking herself for her ideas/ideals. Attentive to this current state of affairs, and to the phenomenology of the body, Beauvoir lays out a few prerequisites for liberation. Women must be socialized to engage the world. And, they must be allowed to discover the unique ways that their embodiment engages the world. In addition, there must be a complete overhaul of patriarchal morality, affective dispositions, and customs that demand girls’ and women’s passivity and deny them their bodily autonomy. In short, the myth of the eternal feminine must be dismantled. So long as it prevails, economic and political advances will fall short of the goal of liberation.
Controversial from the beginning, The Second Sex’s critique of patriarchy continues to challenge social, political and religious categories used to justify women’s inferior status. Ultimately, what was a phenomenological breakthrough became in The Second Sex a liberatory tool: by attending to the ways that patriarchal structures use sexual difference to deprive women of their “can do” embodiment, Beauvoir made the case for declaring this deprivation oppressive. Taken within the context of the feminist movement, this declaration of oppression was an event. It opened the way for the consciousness-raising that characterized second-wave feminism. It has and continues to validate the injustices experienced by girls and women. What was, from an existential-phenomenological perspective, a detailed analysis of the lived body and an ethical and political indictment of the ways that patriarchy alienates women from their embodied capacities, was, from a feminist perspective, an appeal that called on women to take up the politics of liberation.
8. “Must We Burn Sade?” Freedom and the Flesh
Written in response to a request to author an introduction to Sade’s Justine, Beauvoir’s essay “Must we Burn Sade?” (1951–1952) continues her ethical reflections on the drama of intersubjectivity and her interest in the relationship between freedom and intimacy. Indeed, what interests Beauvoir about Sade is that “[he] posed the problem of the other in its extremest terms” (1963, 243, cf. 1963, 333).
“Must we Burn Sade?” identifies Sade’s decision to write as an existential project. Beauvoir credits Sade with uncovering the despotic secrets of the patriarchal political machine. She is sympathetic to his utopian appeal to freedom. She finds, however, that Sade perverted the meaning of freedom. Thus, Beauvoir identifies Sade as a great moralist who endorsed an unsatisfactory ethics.
Sade is Beauvoir’s Janus-faced ally. She does not refute his claim that cruelty establishes a relationship between the self and the other. Sade is correct. Cruelty reveals us to each other in the particularities and ambiguities of our conscious and fleshed existence. The tyrant and victim, Beauvoir tells us, are a genuine couple. They are united by the bonds of the flesh and freedom.
For Beauvoir, Sade is the epitome of maniacal passion dedicated to the project of cruelty. Because he takes full responsibility for his choices, he must be credited with choosing freedom and accepted as being authentic. This does not, however, make him either an ethical or moral figure for his choices destroy the intersubjective bonds of humanity. His account of the power of cruelty provides a convincing critique of our social, political and personal hypocrisies, but it does not critique the ways that cruelty is a perversion of freedom and an exploitation of the vulnerability of the flesh. As a result, his descriptions of the powers of cruelty and the meaning of torture are incomplete and inadequate. The case of the Marquis de Sade makes it clear that assuming responsibility for one’s choices, is a necessary, but not sufficient, condition of an existential ethics of freedom.
In the end, Beauvoir finds that Sade was misled (which does not mean that he was innocent). He mistook power for freedom and misunderstood the meanings of the erotic. In his fascination with the conflict between consciousness and the flesh, Sade exposed the failure of the sadistic enterprise. In his attempt to lose himself in the pleasures of the flesh, and so to experience both the ambiguity of his being as consciousness made flesh (or flesh made consciousness) and the reality of his being for and with others, Sade substitutes the spectacle for lived experience and accepts counterfeit transactions of domination and assimilation/incorporation as genuine relationships of reciprocity and gratuitous generosity. In doing so, he never reaches the other.
Centering his life in the erotic, Sade missed the truth of the erotic. This truth, Beauvoir tells us, can only be found by those who abandon themselves to the risks of emotional intoxication. Living this intoxication we discover the ways that the body turned flesh dissolves all arguments against the immediacy of our bonds with each other and grounds an ethic of the appeal, risk and mutual vulnerability.
Ultimately, in this essay Beauvoir leaves behind the idea that our freedom, as absolutely internal, is immune from an assault by the other, and accepts the radical vulnerability of our lived embodiment. In doing so, the questions of violence and desire cannot be severed from the question of our shared humanity or questions of ethics and justice. In condemning Sade for his perversion of the erotic, Beauvoir also faults him as an artist, which marks a return to the question of the responsibility of the artist raised in The Ethics of Ambiguity. Though she accuses him of being a technically poor writer, the heart of her criticism is ethical not aesthetic. According to Beauvoir, Sade violated his obligations as an author. Instead of revealing the world to us in its promise and possibilities, and instead of appealing to us to work for justice, he took refuge in the imaginary and developed metaphysical justifications for suffering and cruelty. In the end, Beauvoir accuses Sade of being the serious man described in The Ethics of Ambiguity.
In 1957 Beauvoir published The Long March, an essay about her six-week visit to China in September and October of 1955. Although a travelogue in many respects, The Long March does not take on the memoir style form of America Day by Day. She undertook interdisciplinary research to inform her descriptions of her visit, and like The Second Sex and The Coming of Age, Beauvoir mines various sources for ways to engage the observations of her trip. She narrates lengthy descriptions of what she saw and critically considers facts and myths of the time. Similar to America Day by Day, there are standout themes that exemplify Beauvoir’s philosophical and political concerns: labor struggles, the gendered politics of the family, political economy, and the relation between customs, law, and freedom. Beauvoir’s materialist understanding of struggle and revolution underlies these concerns. For these reasons, this travel writing is also a political writing. Notably, American anti-Communists were outraged when the book was translated into English in 1958.
The book is at once a response to right-wing French views on China, and hence a further criticism of her ongoing disdain for French bourgeois ideals, and a consideration of the promise of communist China. While her optimism about communist China is worthy of criticism, Beauvoir’s optimism was not totalizing. She was aware and bothered by her curated visit and she expressed her own doubts and uncertainties about the reality she encountered. But still, she makes no final judgment about China, refusing to have the book serve as a mouthpiece for French anticommunist sentiments. Beauvoir was interested in alternatives to bourgeois capitalism and so she engaged the possibilities of communist China. She attended to the formation of meaning as it broke with the past to create a new future, an engagement with historical time that is necessary for all political projects. Her descriptions also tend to her perception of the cultural differences between China and France, yet the outcome can be disappointing. She describes some encounters with Chinese culture and traditions in dismissive ways, which challenges the possibility of cross-cultural solidarity.
Beauvoir was deeply unsatisfied with and embarrassed by the book. She admitted it was outdated within years of its publication and believed it to be lacking in philosophical rigor. There are also inaccuracies and questionable representations in her account. Among scholars, it is up for debate whether her intellectual curiosity and Western privilege to tour China are part of an orientalizing gaze at work in the text. In spite of, or perhaps even because of, these complicated dimensions and the book’s limits, The Long March is another interesting example of Beauvoir’s political voice and exposes the complexities of the appeal. It also invites us to engage the limits of a particular appeal.
10. Djamila Boupacha: The Concrete Appeal
In 1962, Beauvoir and Gisile Halimi co-authored the story of Djamila Boupacha, an Algerian girl accused of being a terrorist who was tortured by the French during the French-Algerian War. This book may be read as an extension of Beauvoir’s critique of the Marquis de Sade. Instead of fleeing from the horrors of the real into the safety of the imaginary, Beauvoir takes up her responsibility as an author to expose and confront realities that the state would rather hide. Her purpose in writing is concrete and political. The book is both a protest and an appeal. Countering Sade, Beauvoir and Halimi show that the truth of torture lies in the unjustifiable politics of abusive power.
11. All Men are Mortal, A Very Easy Death, Adieux: A Farewell to Sartre: Finitude, Passion and the Body
Beauvoir’s phenomenological understanding of the lived body can also be tracked in her considerations of the question of human finitude. This question is raised early in her 1946 novel, All Men Are Mortal, which is a story of Fosca, a man who chooses to cheat death. His desire for immortality is driven by his desire to realize the abstract ideal of humanism. Fosca does not embrace immortality to escape the ambiguities of the flesh and embodiment. His decision is motivated by his desire to save the world. He believes that time is his enemy, so long as his time is limited. He believes that with sufficient time he can bring the humanist project to closure and secure it from failure.
Contrary to his initial belief, Fosca learns that time becomes his enemy when it stretches endlessly before him. It turns out that time is not what he needs to secure his vision. Rather, what he needs is the commitment of others. No amount of time can secure that. As immortal, Fosca confronts the inevitability of failure that haunts humanity. Unlike mortals, however, who, confronted with the constraints of time, take up their failures with passion, Fosca becomes immobilized. Indifference to life replaces the passion for life. In the end, he discovers the crucial truth of ethical action from his many-generations-removed grandson, Armand. Understanding that the future belongs to others who may or may not take up his projects, Armand commits himself to the concrete possibilities of the present. His passion is embodied in the appeal to others, not in an abstract goal that, however just it might seem, would deny future generations the right to determine their own destiny.
In All Men Are Mortal the givenness of finitude and death concerns our relationship to time. Eighteen years later, writing about the dying and death of her mother in A Very Easy Death (1964), and six years after that, analyzing the situation of the aged in The Coming of Age (1970), and eleven years subsequent to that, chronicling Sartre’s last days in Adieux: A Farewell to Sartre (1981), it is not so much our relationship to time but more a matter of our embodiment that concerns Beauvoir. In A Very Easy Death and Adieux, Beauvoir assumes the position of the phenomenological witness. The bodies of her mother and Sartre are given to us in all their disturbing breakdowns and deteriorations. Some have found these works cold, insensitive and even cruel. They miss Beauvoir’s point. She is showing us who we are. The “I can” body revealed by other phenomenologists as a crucial mark of embodiment is the limited condition of the mature healthy body. It is but one phase of the life of the body. In its early days the body is still learning its “I can’s”. As we age, the body begins losing them. It is one thing, as with the myth of Woman, to alienate an “I can” from its capacities. It is quite another to refuse to attend to the full range of embodied life and to assess the value of that life in terms of its “I can” possibilities.
12. The Coming of Age: The Other Again
We need to read A Very Easy Death and Adieux within the context of the analyses of The Coming of Age to fully appreciate Beauvoir’s role as witness. The project of The Coming of Age is similar to that of The Second Sex. Like The Second Sex, it focuses on a group of people designated as Other; like The Second Sex it exposes the mythical status of the “facts” about aging and the aged; and like The Second Sex it indicts society for its dehumanization of those it designates as Other. The Coming of Age also emulates The Second Sex in its method and scope. It brings a phenomenological lens to bear on biological, psychological, historical, economic, and sociological factors in order to understand the phenomenon of a particular kind of marginalized otherness.
In The Coming of Age, Beauvoir considers the injustices endured by the aged. She describes the experiences of old age and argues that it throws one into the position of the Other not by necessity, but as a result of culturally produced stigmas and a societal loathing of aging. Thus, while the process of aging may be inescapable, old age as a situation of Otherness is not. This non-subject status is a matter of the conditions of experience that foreclose transcendence, including myths, societal attitudes, and the economic conditions of the aged. Whereas in The Second Sex, Beauvoir accused patriarchy of depriving women of their subject status, The Coming of Age argues that the non-subject status of the aged can be traced to the fact that they are barred from existential projects and meaningful relationships with others. To experience old age in this way, Beauvoir argues, is to be denied one’s humanity. “The old man”, Beauvoir writes, “looks to active members of the community like one of a ‘different species’” because he is not engaged in a project (1970, 231, cf. 1972, 217).
Like The Second Sex, which attended to the givens of biology without allowing them to determine the meaning of the subject, The Coming of Age also gives biology its due. The lack of engagement of the aged, Beauvoir notes, is in part imposed from without and in part comes from within; for as we age, the body is transformed from an instrument that engages the world into a hindrance that makes our access to the world difficult. The point of The Coming of Age, however, is that it is unjust to use these difficulties to justify reducing the aged to the status of the Other. Adieux’s witnessing makes this point clearly. However diminished Sartre’s body became, it never severed him from his projects. He could not have sustained his work by himself, however. Rather, he was in a situation where others refused to marginalize him. They did not equate his diminished bodily capacities with a diminished humanity. The Coming of Age argues that the situation of a privileged Sartre ought to be our common destiny.
In a world that recognized the phenomenological truth of the body, the existential truth of freedom, the Marxist truth of exploitation and the human truth of the bond, the derogatory category of the Other would be eradicated. Neither the aged nor women, nor anyone by virtue of their race, class, ethnicity or religion would find themselves rendered inessential. Beauvoir knows that it is too much to hope for such a world. She understands the lures of domination and violence. Throughout her career, however, she used philosophical and literary tools to reveal the possibilities of such a world and appealed to us to work for it.
Beauvoir’s practices of writing the self were deeply connected to her philosophical ideas. Indeed, for Beauvoir, living is philosophy, a point that is evident in her autobiographical works. Beauvoir wrote a four-volume autobiography where she recounts fifty-four years of her life, from the years 1908–1962. In Memoirs of a Dutiful Daughter (1958), Beauvoir narrates the formative years of 1908–1929, while The Prime of Life covers 1929–1944. Force of Circumstance (1963) is written in two volumes, 1944–1952 (After the War) and 1952–1962 (Hard Times). Beauvoir was also a devoted diarist. Her diaries, including Diary of a Philosophy Student Volume 1 (1926–27) and Volume 2 (1928–29), and her Wartime Diaries, often complicate the narration of her autobiographies, exposing different details of her life and thus expose a different Beauvoir to the reader. For Beauvoir, diary writing was an integral part of self-understanding and self-making. The significance of these autobiographical works is threefold. They offer a detailed account of events, experiences and relations with others out of which Beauvoir made her self, that is, these works reveal how she became Beauvoir. They also shed light on Beauvoir’s philosophical trajectory, intellectual influences, the ideas and themes central to her novels and philosophical works, and they offer glaring evidence that her philosophical ideas developed prior to, alongside, and often against Sartre’s.
In writing her life, it is evident that the notion of situation, the set of concrete circumstances, including one’s embodiment that significantly shapes but does not fix one’s existence, is central to Beauvoir’s philosophy of self. It is only in living and living out one’s choices, constrained but not determined by social and historical context, that one’s existence takes shape. Beauvoir’s autobiographical writings make clear that her situation as a girl raised in a Catholic, bourgeois household, as a woman with a certain level of independence and privilege, an intellectual, a writer, a leftist living amidst and in the aftermath of war and colonial projects, are all generative circumstances for her. She is neither the mere product of circumstance nor does she just will herself into existence. Yet, her understanding of ‘situation’ takes time to develop, as Beauvoir herself notes that she did not always recognize the force of circumstance. Though, perhaps that she did not recognize this to be the case was a constraint of her own particular situation. In The Prime of Life, for instance, the Beauvoir we read about is still full of bourgeois idealism and is focused on happiness, which she marks as characteristic of the times. Ultimately, in narrating her experience, Beauvoir discloses the connection between the personal and the collective, and the distinctness of a self unfolding in time.
The ethical significance Beauvoir places on the self-other relation is also central to her autobiographical writings. Although it is not until 1939 that she rejects individualism, Beauvoir’s younger years show a deep interest in her relationships with others. Her relationship with her parents and her love for Zaza and her cousin Jacques, for instance, reveal the capacity of others to open and close the world and to make and remake the self. Indeed, there is a robust philosophy of love across Beauvoir’s personal writings, including her love with Zaza (fictionalized in Inseparable), to the complicated relationship with Sartre, to her longing for Nelson Algren (detailed further in A Transatlantic Love Affair, her published letters to Algren), to her discussion of She Came to Stay and the narration of the triad with Olga in The Prime of Life, that speak not only to Beauvoir’s preoccupations with the role of love in life more generally, but to the bond between self and other that takes shape in an erotic encounter. In Force of Circumstance, Beauvoir considers the self-other relation in more political terms as she describes the politicization of her private existence and the Algerian War and colonial oppression. Beauvoir’s attention to the Algerian War was an encounter that placed an ethical demand on her, out of which she politicized and so reshaped her self.
For Beauvoir, the writing of her life, including writing about her desire to write, is ultimately a way to disclose the ambiguities of concrete existence. The detail at which Beauvoir narrates her life, including the omissions she makes, which are exposed in her diaries, offers important insights about Beauvoir’s philosophical ideas and their emergence within and out of her experience. These writings are also philosophically significant investigations of the meaning of existence and an ethics, one that is not laid out programmatically but that is disclosed in the joys, banality, and failures of living.
Beauvoir is no doubt a feminist icon and one of the most impactful feminist thinkers of the twentieth century. The Second Sex, translated in 40 languages, has inspired generations of women to challenge their status and pursue freedom. In spite of her impact, readings and receptions of Beauvoir among feminist scholars were initially largely antagonistic. The renaissance in Beauvoir scholarship served as a response. While difficult to pin down its exact beginning, it was after Beauvoir’s death in 1986 that different questions about and inquiries into her thinking became more prevalent. The Second Sex has also been the source of important debate and criticism in the interdisciplinary field of feminist theory, and even among those who distance themselves from her work, it has been no less impactful. For instance, Beauvoir’s legacy is apparent in the work of more contemporary thinkers like Sara Ahmed, Judith Butler, bell hooks, and Luce Irigaray.
A significant aspect of the renewal in Beauvoir scholarship has much to do with the posthumous availability of previously unpublished personal writings, the increasing number of works translated into English, especially those in the Beauvoir Series published by University of Illinois Press, and the 2010 new English translation of The Second Sex. Access to such work, made possible by the labor of Beauvoir scholars, has helped shed light on Beauvoir’s philosophical influences and her own criticisms of and distance from Sartre. That access has also challenged misinterpretations stemming from inadequate translations and has encouraged interest in and more thorough engagement with Beauvoir’s work beyond The Second Sex. The interdisciplinary, peer-reviewed journal, Simone de Beauvoir Studies, founded in 1983 and reorganized in 2016, and the International Simone de Beauvoir Society, are important venues for the study of Beauvoir’s life and works.
Given the scope of Beauvoir’s influence internationally and interdisciplinarily, it is difficult to succinctly capture her legacy. The following highlights a few key areas scholarship: Beauvoir’s original philosophical contributions to existentialism (e.g., Le Doeuff 1980; Butler 1986; Kruks 1990 and 2001; Fullbrook and Fullbrook 1994; Gothlin 1999; Arp 2001; Kail 2006; Deutscher 2008; Daigle and Colomb 2009) and phenomenology (Bergoffen 1997; Heinämaa 1997 and 2003; Oksala 2016 and 2022; Mann 2018); her contributions to ethics (e.g., Gothlin 1995; Tidd 1999a and 1999b; Stoller 2014) and political theory (e.g., Kruks 2012;); situating The Second Sex philosophically (e.g., Bauer 2001; Lundgren-Gothlin 1991; Moi 2001; Simons 2001; Heinämaa 2003; Mann and Ferrari 2017); the historical and global receptions of The Second Sex (e.g., Chaperon 1999; Dongchao 2005; Coffin 2020; Rouch 2019 ; Chaperon and Rouch 2020); the limitations of The Second Sex with regard to race and ethnocentrism (e.g., Spelman 1988; Simons 2001; Deutscher 2008; Belle 2010, 2014 and 2017; hooks 2012; Berruz 2016; Collins 2017; Jones 2019; Altman 2020); her perspective on race and racism in America Day by Day (e.g., Alfonso 2005; Bernasconi 2019; Altman 2020; Mussett 2020); Beauvoir’s engagement with the injustices of French colonialism and her position as a colonizer (e.g., Surkis 2010; Nya 2019); critical engagement with Beauvoir’s life (e.g., Moi 2009) and personal writings (e.g., Tidd 1999b); and biographical projects (Bair 2002; Kirkpatrick 2019).
Additionally, Beauvoir’s work inspires feminist philosophical analyses of various lived experiences, such as embodiment and oppression (Young 1980; Bartky 1990; Burke 2019; Froidevaux-Mettiere 2021), patriarchal love (Mann 2009), masculinity and nationalism (Mann 2014), hook-up culture (Bauer 2017), #BlackGirlJoy (Mason 2018), street harassment (Vera-Gray 2018), feminine submission (Garcia 2018), body positivity (Leboeuf 2019); trans subjectivity (Antonopoulos 2017; Burke 2020), non-monogamy (Kean 2018; Anderson 2021), #MeToo (McKinney 2019; Melo Lopes 2021), obstetric violence (Shabot 2021), old age (Stoller 2014; Kruks 2022); rape (Bergoffen 2017); and authenticity (Cleary 2022).
Works by Beauvoir
- 1927, 4e cahier, holograph manuscript, Paris: Bibliothèque Nationale.
- 1928–29, Carnet 6, holograph manuscript, Paris: Bibliothèque Nationale.
- 1929–31, Carnet 7, holograph manuscript, Paris: Bibliothèque Nationale.
- 1943 , L’Invitée, Paris: Gallimard; translated as She Came to Stay, Yvonne Moyse and Roger Senhouse (trans.), Cleveland, OH: World Publishing, 1954.
- [P&C] 1944, Pyrrhus et Cinéas: A Cette Dame, Paris: Editions Gallimard; translated as “Pyrrhus and Cineas: A Cette Dame”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in PhilW: 89–149.
- 1945a, “La Phénoménologie de la perception de Maurice Merleau-Ponty”, Les Temps Modernes, 1(2): 363–367; translated as “A Review of The Phenomenology of Perception by Maurice Merleau-Ponty”, in Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), PhilW: 159–164.
- 1945b, “Idéalisme moral et réalisme politique”, Les Temps Modernes, 1(2): 248–268. Reprinted in ESN: 49–88; translated as “Moral Idealism and Political Realism”, Anne Deing Cordero (trans.), in PhilW: 175–193.
- 1945c, “L’existentialisme et la sagesse des nations”, Les Temps Modernes, 1(3): 385–404. Reprinted in ESN: 13–48; translated as “Existentialism and Popular Wisdom”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.) in PhilW: 203–220.
- 1945d, untitled and undated manuscript. Probably original of “Jean Paul Sartre: Strictly Personal”, Malcolm Cowley (trans.), Harper’s Bazaar, January 1946, pp. 113, 158, 160; translated as “Jean-Paul Sartre”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.) in PhilW: 229–235.
- 1945e, Le Sang des autres, Paris: Gallimard; translated as The Blood of Others, Yvonne Moyse and Roger Senhouse (trans.), New York: Knopf, 1948; translation reprinted New York: Pantheon Books, 1983.
- 1945f, Les Bouches inutiles, Paris: Gallimard; translated as The Useless Mouths, Liz Stanley and Catherine Naji (trans.), in LitW: 33–88.
- 1945g, “Quatre jours à Madrid”, Combat, 14–15 April, p. 1–2; translated as “Four Days in Madrid”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in PolW: 16–21.
- 1946a, “Œil pour œil”, Les Temps Modernes, 1(5): 813–830; reprinted in ESN: 109–143; translated as “An Eye for an Eye”, Kristana Arp (trans.), PhilW: 245–260.
- 1946b, “Littérature et métaphysique”, Les Temps Modernes, 1(7):1153–1163; reprinted in ESN: 89–107; translated as “Literature and Metaphysics”, Véronique Zaytzeff and Frederick M. Morrison (trans.) in PhilW: 269–277.
- 1946c , Tous les homes sont mortels, Paris: Gallimard; translated as All Men Are Mortal, Leonard M. Friedman (trans.), Cleveland, OH: World Publishing, 1955.
- 1947a, “An Existentialist Looks at Americans”, New York Times Magazine, 25 May, pp. 13, 51, 52. Reprinted in PhilW: 307–315.
- 1947b, “Qu’est-ce que l’existentialisme?”, France-Amérique, 29 June 29, pp. 1, 5; translated as , “What is Existentialism?”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), PhilW: 323–326.
- 1947c , Pour une morale de l’ambigüité, Paris: Gallimard; translated as The Ethics of Ambiguity, Bernard Frechtman (trans.), New York: Citadel Press, 1976.
- 1947d, “Femininity, the trap”, Vogue, 15 March, pp. 171, 232, 234, translator unknown. Reprinted with some modifications as “Femininity: The Trap”, in FemW: 42–47.
- 1948, L’Amerique au jour le jour, Paris: Editions Paul Marihein; translated as America Day by Day, P. Dudley [pseud.] (trans.), London: Duckworth, 1952.
- [ESN] 1948, L’Existentialisme et la sagesse des nations, Paris: Nagel. A collection of some of her essays.
- [SS] 1949, Le Deuxième sexe, Paris: Editions
- 1953, The Second Sex, H. M. Pashley (trans.), New York: Knopf.
- 2010, The Second Sex, C. Borde and S. Malovany-Chevallier (trans.), New York: Alfred A. Knopf.
- 1949, Review in Les Temps Modernes, 7(49): 943–949; translated as “A Review of The Elementary Structures of Kinship by Claude Lévi-Strauss”, Véronique Zaytzeff and Frederick Morrison (trans.), in FemW: 58–66.
- 1950, “It’s About Time Women Put a New Face on Love”, Flair, 1, 3, April, 76–77, translator unknown. Reprinted with some modifications in FemW: 76–80
- 1951–52, “Faut-il brûler Sade?” (Must We
- 1951, part 1, Les Temps modernes, 74: 1002–1033.
- 1952, part 2, Les Temps modernes, 75: 1197–1230.
- 1953, English translation, A. Michelson (trans.), London: Peter Neville.
- 2012, English translation, Kim Allen Gleed, Marilyn Gladdis Rose, and Virginia Preston (trans.), PolW: 44–101.
- 1954 , Les Mandarins, Paris: Gallimard; translated as The Mandarins, Leonard M. Friedman (trans.), Cleveland: World , 1956.
- 1955a, “Merleau-Ponty et le pseudo-sartrisme”, Les Temps modernes, 10: 2072–2122; translated in 1989 as “Merleau-Ponty and Pseudo-Sartreanism”, Véronique Zaytzeff and Frederick M. Morrison (trans.), International Studies in Philosophy, 21(3): 3–48; translation reprinted in in PolW: 206–257.
- 1955b, Privilèges, Paris: Gallimard.
- 1955c, “La pensée de droite, aujourd’hui”, Les Temps Modernes, 112–13, (May 1955): 1539–1575; 114–15 (June-July 1955): 2219–2261. Reprinted in Privilèges: 93–200; translated as “Right Wing Thought Today”, Véronique Zaytzeff and Frederick M. Morrison (trans.), in PolW: 113–193.
- 1957 , La Longue marche, essai sur la Chine, Paris: Gallimard; translated as The Long March, Austryn Wainhouse (trans.), Cleveland, OH: World Publishing, 1958.
- 1958 , Mémoires d’une jeune fille rangée, Paris: Gallimard; translated as Memoirs of a Dutiful Daughter, James Kirkup (trans.), Cleveland, OH: World Pub.
- 1959a, “Préface” to Le “planning” familial, Lagroua Weill-Hallé, Paris: Maloine; translated as “Preface to Family Planning”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 81–83.
- 1959b, “Brigitte Bardot and the Lolita Syndrome”, Bernard Frechtman (trans.), Esquire, August 1959. Reprinted with some modifications in FemW: 114–125. A French back translation appeared in Écrits, Claude Rancis and Fernande Gontier (eds.), 363–376.
- 1960a, “Préface” to La grand’peur d’aimer, Marie-Andrée Lagroua Weill-Hallé, Paris: Éditions Julliard-Sequana; translated as “Preface to The Great Fear Of Loving”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 84–87.
- 1960b , La Force de l’âge, Paris: Gallimard; translated as The Prime of Life: The Autobiography of Simone de Beauvoir, Peter Green (trans.), Cleveland, OH: World Publishing, 1962.
- 1961, “La condition féminine”, La NEF (La nouvelle équipe française) 5(January–March): 121–127. Reprinted in Écrits: 401–409; translated as “The Condition Of Women”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.) in FemW: 88–96
- 1962, “Preface”, in Djamila Boupacha, Simone de Beauvoir and Gisile Halimi, Paris: Gallimard; translated as “Preface”, in Djamila Boupacha: The Story of the Torture of a Young Algerian Girl Which Shocked Liberal French Opinion, Patrick Green (trans.), London: Weidenfeld and Nicolson, 1962. Retranslated as “Preface to Djamillia Boupacha”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.) in PolW: 272–282.
- 1963 , La Force des choses, Paris: Gallimard; translated as After the War: Force of Circumstance I and Hard Times: Force of Circumstance II, Richard Howard (trans.), New York: Putnam, 1965.
- 1964a, “Preface”, in La Bâtarde, by Violette Leduc, Paris: Gallimard; translated as “Foreword” in La Bâtarde [The Bastard], Derek Coleman (trans.), New York: Riverhead Books, 1965.
- 1964b, Une Mort très douce, Paris: Gallimard; translated as A Very Easy Death, Patrick O’Brian (trans.), New York: Putnam, 1966.
- 1964c, “Préface”, translator unknown, to The Sexually Responsive Woman, by Phyllis and Eberhard Kronhausen, New York: Grove Press. Reprinted in FemW: 97–98.
- 1965a, “Que peut la littérature?”, Le Monde, 249: 73–92.
- 1965b, “What Love Is—and Isn’t”, McCall’s, translator unknown, August, pp. 71, 133. Reprinted in FemW: 99–102.
- 1966, “Préface” to Treblinka, by Jean-François Steiner, Paris: Fayard; translated as “Preface to Treblinka”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in PolW: 305–310.
- 1966a, Les Belles images, Paris: Gallimard; translated as Les belles images, Patrick O’Brian (trans.), New York: Putnam, 1968.
- 1966b, “Situation de la femme d’aujourd’hui”, lecture 20 September 1966 in Tokyo. Printed in Écrits: 422–439; translated as “The Situation Of Women Today”, Debbie Mann (trans.), in FemW: 132–145.
- 1966c, “La femme et la creation”, lecture 22 September 1966 in Japan. Printed in Écrits: 458–474; translated as “Women and Creativity”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 155–169.
- 1967 , La Femme rompue, Paris: Gallimard; translated as The Woman Destroyed, Patrick O’Brian (trans.), New York: Putnam, 1969.
- 1969, “Amour et politique”, Le nouvel observateur, 222, February 10–16; translated as “Love and Politics”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 103–105.
- 1970 , La Vieillesse, Paris: Gallimard; translated by Patrick O’Brian and printed in the United States as The Coming of Age, (trans.), New York: Putnam, 1972, and in the United Kingdom as Old Age, London: André Deutsch, 1972.
- 1971, “En France aujourd’hui on peut tuer impunément”, J’accuse, 2(February 15): 475–481; in Écrits: 475–481; translated as “In France Today Killing Goes Unpunished”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in PolW: 287–292.
- 1972a , Tout compte fait, Paris: Gallimard; translated as All Said and Done, Patrick O’Brian (trans.), New York: Putnam, 1974.
- 1972b, “La Femme révoltée”, an interview by Alice Schwartzer, Le nouvel observateur, 14 February 1972, 47–54. Reprinted in Écrits: 482–497; translated as “The Rebellious Woman—An Interview by Alice Schwartzer”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 192–208
- 1972c, “Réponse à quelques femmes et à un homme”, Le nouvel observateur, 6 March 1972, 40–42. Reprinted in Écrits: 498–504; translated as “Response to Some Women and a Man”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 209:–215.
- 1972d, “L’avortement des pauvres”, Le nouvel observateur, 414, October 16–22, 57; translated as “Abortion and the Poor”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 216–218.
- 1972e, “Déposition de Simone de Beauvoir au procès de Bobigny”, printed in Écrits: 510–513; translated as “Beauvoir’s Deposition at the Bobigny Trial”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 219–222.
- 1973a, “La Syrie et les prisonniers”, Le monde (December 18). Reprinted in Écrits 254–255; translated as “Syria and Its Prisoners”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in PolW: 311–313.
- 1973b, “Préface” to Avortement: une loi en procès. L’affaire de Bobigny. Sténotypie intégrale des débats du tribunal de Bobigny, 8 novembre 1972 by the Association Choisir (To Choose Association), Paris: Gallimard. Reprinted in Écrits: 505–509; translated as “Preface to Abortion: A Law On Trial The Bobigny Affair”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 223–227.
- 1973c, “Everyday Sexism”, Les Temps Modernes, 329, December. Reprinted in Écrits: 514; translated as “Everyday Sexism”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 240–241.
- 1974a, Promenade au pays de la vieillesse, film by Marianne Ahrne, Simone de Beauvoir, Pépo Angel, and Bertrand Hurault, directed by Marianne Ahrne, Stockholm, Sweden, for Swedish Television; transcription done by Justine Sarrot and Oliver Davis; translated as “A Walk Through the Land of Old Age”, Alexander Hertich (trans.), in PolW: 339–363.
- 1974b, “Presidée par Simone de Beauvoir, ‘La ligue du droit des femmes’ veut abolir la prostitution”, Le monde, 8 March 1974, 36; translated as “League of Women’s Rights Manifesto”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 242–245.
- 1974c, “Préface” to Divorce en France, by Claire Cayron, Paris: Denoël-Gonthier. Reprinted in Écrits: 515–518; translated as “Preface to Divorce In France”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 246–249.
- 1974d, “Présentation” to Les femmes s’entêtent, special issue of Les Temps Modernes, April–May, 1719–1720. Printed in Écrits: 519–521; translated as “Introduction to Women Insist”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 250–252.
- 1975, “Solidaire d’Israël: un soutien critique”, Les Cahiers Bernard Lazare, 51(June 1975). Reprinted in Écrits 522–532; translated as “Solidarity With Israel”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in PolW: 314–323.
- 1976a, “Préface” to Regards féminins, by Anne Ophir, Collection Femmes, Paris: Denoël-Gonthier. Reprinted in Écrits: 577–579; translated as “Preface to Through Womens’ Eyes”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 253–255.
- 1976b, “Quand toutes les femmes du monde…”, Le nouvel observateur, 1 March 1976, 52. Reprinted in Écrits: 566–567; translated as “When All The Women Of The World…”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 256–257.
- 1976c, “Mon point de vue, par Simone de Beauvoir: une affaire scandaleuse”, Marie Claire 286, June, 6; translated as “My Point of View: An Outrageous Affair”, Debbie Mann and Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 258–259.
- 1977a, “Préface”, to Histoires du MLF, by Annie de Pisan and Anne Tristan, Paris: Calmann-Lévy, 7–12; translated as “Preface to Stories from the French Women’s Liberation Movement”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 260–264.
- 1977b, “Foreword” to History: A Novel, English translation of La Storia: Romanzo, by Elsa Morante, Franklin Center, PA: The Franklin Library, only a shortened version appeared here. Full version printed in Écrits: 580–582. Retranslated as “Foreword to History: A Novel”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 176–178.
- 1979a , Quand prime le spirituel, Paris: Gallimard; translated as When Things of The Spirit Come First: Five Early Tales, Patrick O’Brian (trans.), New York: Pantheon Books, 1982.
- 1979b, “Mon expérience d’écrivain (September 1966)”, in Écrits: 439–457.
- 1979c, “De l’urgence d’une loi antisexiste”, Le monde, 18–19 March, 1; translated as “The Urgency of an Anti-Sexist Law”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 265–267.
- 1979d, “Discours d’introduction”, given at a press conference of the International Committee for Women’s Rights, 15 March; translated as “Press Conference Of The International Committee For Women’s Rights”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 268–269.
- 1979e, Les Écrits de Simone de Beauvoir, Claude Francis and Fernande Gontier, Paris: Gallimard.
- 1981a , La Cérémonie des adieux, suivi de Entretiens avec Jean-Paul Sartre, Août-Septembre 1974, Paris: Gallimard; translated as Adieux: A Farewell to Sartre, Patrick O’Brian (trans.), New York: Pantheon Books, 1984.
- 1981b, “Foreword” to Chroniques d’une imposture: du mouvement de libération des femmes à une marque commerciale, Paris: l’Association Mouvement pour les Luttes Féministes; translated as “Forward to Deception Chronicles: From the Women’s Liberation Movement to a Commercial Trademark”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 270–272.
- 1983, “La femme, la pub et la haine”, Le monde, Wednesday, 4 May, 1, 10; translated as “Women, Ads, and Hate”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in FemW: 273–276.
- 1985, “Préface”, in Shoah, Claude Lanzmann, Paris: Fayard; translated as “Preface to Shoah”, Marybeth Timmerman (trans.), in PolW: 324–328.
- 1986, “Préface”, to Mihloud, anonymous, for the French publication, Aix-en-Provence: Alinea; translated as “Preface to Mihloud”, Lillian S. Robinson (trans.), in FemW: 282–285.
- 1990, Lettres à Sartre, Sylvie Le Bon de Beauvoir (ed.), Paris: Gallimard; translated as Letters to Sartre, Quintin Hoare (trans.), New York: Arcade, 1991.
- 1998, A Transatlantic Love Affair: Letters to Nelson Algren, Sylvie Le Bon de Beauvoir (ed.), New York: The New Press. Letters written in English.
- [PhilW] 2004, Philosophical Writings, Margaret A. Simons (ed.) with Marybeth Timmerman, and Mary Beth Mader (eds.), (The Beauvoir Series), Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press.
- 2006, Diary of a Philosophy Student: Volume 1, 1926–27, Barbara Klaw, Sylvie Le Bon de Beauvoir, and Margaret A. Simons (eds.), (The Beauvoir Series), Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press,
- 2009, Wartime Diary, Anne Deing Cordero (trans.), Sylvie Le Bon de Beauvoir, and Margaret Simons (eds.), (The Beauvoir Series), Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press.
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- 2019, Diary of a Philosophy Student: Volume 2, 1926–27, Barbara Klaw, Sylvie Le Bon de Beauvoir, and Margaret A. Simons (eds.), (The Beauvoir Series), Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press.
- 2020, Les Inseparables, Paris: L’Herne; translated as Inseparable, Sandra Smith (trans.), New York: Harper Collins, 2021.
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Secondary Literature: Anthologies
- Bulletin de la Société Américaine de Philosophie de Langue Française, 2003, “Special Issue on Beauvoir’s The Second Sex”, XIII(21).
- Card, Claudia (ed.), 2003, The Cambridge Companion to Simone de Beauvoir, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521790964
- Chaperon, Sylvie and Marine Rouch (eds.), 2020, “Special Issue on Reading and Translating The Second Sex Globally”, Simone de Beauvoir Studies, 31(2): 173–296.
- Daigle, Christine and Jacob Golomb (eds.), 2009, Beauvoir and Sartre: The Riddle of Influence, Bloomington, IN: Indiana Univ Press.
- Evans, Ruth (ed.), 1998, Simone de Beauvoir’s “The Second Sex”: New Interdisciplinary Essays, Manchester and New York: Manchester University Press.
- Fallaize, Elizabeth (ed.), 1998, Simone de Beauvoir: A Critical Reader, London and New York: Routledge.
- Forster, Penny and Imogen Sutton (eds.), 1989, Daughters of de Beauvoir, London: Women’s Press.
- Grosholz, Emily R. (ed.), 2004, The Legacy of Simone de Beauvoir, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Hawthorne, Melanie C. (ed.), 2000, Contingent Loves: Simone de Beauvoir and Sexuality, Charlottesville, VA: University Press of Virginia.
- Hengehold, Laura and Nancy Bauer (eds.), 2017, A Companion to Simone de Beauvoir, New York: Wiley.
- Mann, Bonnie and Martina Ferrari (eds.), 2017, “On ne naît pas femme: on le devient…” The Life of a Sentence, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oso/9780190608811.001.0001
- Marks, Elaine (ed.), 1987, Critical Essays on Simone de Beauvoir, Boston: G. K. Hall.
- Moi, Toril (ed.), 1990, Feminist Theory and Simone de Beauvoir, Oxford: Blackwell.
- Mussett, Shannon M. and William S. Wilkerson (eds.), 2012, Beauvoir and Western Thought from Plato to Butler, Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
- O’Brien, Wendy and Lester Embree (eds.), 2001, The Existential Phenomenology of Simone de Beauvoir, (Contributions to Phenomenology 43), Dordrecht: Springer Netherlands. doi:10.1007/978-94-015-9753-1
- Parker, Emily Anne and Anne van Leeuwen (eds.), 2018, Differences: Re-Reading Beauvoir and Irigaray, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oso/9780190275594.001.0001
- Pettersen, Tove and Annlaug Bjørsnøs (eds), 2015, Simone de Beauvoir: Humanist Thinker, Leiden: Brill Rodopi.
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- Tandy, Charles (ed.), 2006, Death and Anti-Death, Volume 4: Twenty Years after De Beauvoir, Thirty Years after Heidegger, Palo Alto: Ria University Press.
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