Chan Buddhism

First published Wed Apr 1, 2015; substantive revision Sat Mar 2, 2019

The Chan School (Chan zong, 禪宗) is an indigenous form of Chinese Buddhism that developed beginning in the sixth century CE and subsequently spread to the rest of East Asia (Japanese: Zen; Korean: Sôn; Vietnamese; Thiền). Although the Sinograph “chan” (禪) transliterates the Sanskrit dhyāna or “meditation”, and Chan zong can thus be translated as the “Meditation School”, Chan was not distinctive within Chinese Buddhism in its use of meditative techniques. What distinguished Chan were its novel use of language, its development of new narrative forms, and its valorization of the direct and embodied realization of Buddhist awakening. In contrast with the epistemic, hermeneutical and metaphysical concerns that shaped other schools of Chinese Buddhism, Chan’s defining concerns were experiential and relational—concerns that fit most comfortably, perhaps, within the horizons of philosophical anthropology. Appreciating the philosophical dimensions of Chan thus requires some familiarity with Buddhist thought and practice, and the dynamics of their infusion into Chinese culture.

1. Introduction

Buddhist thought and practice are said to have emerged out of sustained practical commitment to discovering and nullifying the roots of human suffering. Canonical accounts of the liberation of Buddhism’s founding figure, Siddhartha Gautama, make it clear that becoming one awakened (buddha) to the origins and ending of suffering was not a process of rational distillation, but rather of one of embodied conduct (see, e.g., Majjhima Nikāya 26). The pivotal insights afforded by such conduct are, first, that all things arise and pass away in dynamic interdependence (paticca-samuppāda), and, secondly, that conflict and suffering (dukkha) are relational distortions marking the troubling inflection of interdependence as a function of ignorance (avijjā); corporeal, perceptual, cognitive, and emotional habits (sankhāra); and craving forms of desire (tanhā).

Chan Buddhism developed in China as a radical reaffirmation of the primacy of embodied practice, the signal achievement of which came to be envisioned as unwavering attentiveness and responsive virtuosity. In the words of the founder of the Hongzhou lineage of Chan, Mazu Daoyi (709–788), the fruition of Chan practice is a fluid

harmony of body and mind that reaches out through all four limbs…benefiting what cannot be benefited and doing what can’t be done. (Xu zangjing, Vol. 119, 408b)

Building on the prevalent Chinese Buddhist conviction that all beings have/are Buddha-nature (fo-xing, 佛性), however, practice was not advocated in Chan as a means to enlightenment, but rather as the meaning of demonstrating it. It is only in denial or ignorance of our own true nature that enlightenment can be regarded as something to seek, a destination at which we might one day arrive.

In sharp contrast with more scholastically-inclined schools of Buddhism, Chan did not see dispelling ignorance of our own true nature as something to be accomplished by studying canonical texts and commentaries. On the contrary, in keeping with the Buddha’s claim that the wise “do not hang onto anything, anywhere” and “do not enter into the mud of conceptual thinking” (Sabhiya Sutta, Sutta Nipāta III.6), Chan came to insist that we cannot read or reason our way out of conflict, trouble and suffering. And, in contrast with more ritually-defined schools of Buddhism, Chan also came to deny the merit of seeking help from supramundane sources. Dispelling ignorance of our own Buddha-nature does not involve cultivating or acquiring anything; we need only end the relational paralysis that prevents us from conducting ourselves as enlightening beings. This does not require special conditions or implements. It does not require extensive study or training. It can be accomplished here and now, in the midst of our own day-to-day lives.

This description might suggest that Chan originated in and actively propagated what could easily be viewed as anti-philosophical sentiments—a view arguably supported by the apparent illogic of many of the “encounter dialogues” that purported to record the interactions of Chan masters and their students, and by the four-fold phrasing that came to be used in Song dynasty China to characterize Chan distinctiveness:

a special transmission outside the scriptures (jiaowai biechuan, 教外別傳); not established upon words and letters (buli wenzi, 不立文字); directly pointing to the human heartmind (zhizhi renxin, 直指人心); seeing nature and becoming a Buddha (jianxing chengfo, 見性成佛).

In both, there are appeals to the importance of immediacy, rather than reflection, and assertions about the limits of language and the ultimate irrelevance of thinking to the realization of truth. Indeed, the Sixth Chan Patriarch, Huineng (638–713), famously proclaimed that throughout Buddhist history, those transmitting the true Dharma established “without-thinking” (wunian, 無念) as the core doctrine. For many of those involved in the first generation of “globalizing” Chan and Zen in the first half of the twentieth century, Chan’s apparent anti-rationality was central to its promotion as a distinctively East Asian humanism and an antidote to heartless and humorless scientism.

It is, however, possible to view Chan differently. The body of Chan literature is ironically perhaps the most voluminous of any in Chinese Buddhism. And while one would be hard-pressed to find therein arguments of the kind that are now widely regarded as essential tools of the (especially analytic) philosophical trade, it is a body of literature that I think can be very productively be engaged as enacting insights and inferences of considerable philosophical significance—a body of philosophical evidence rather than exposition and explanation.

A major difficulty in attempting to engage philosophical perspectives originating from beyond the horizons of European and American traditions is the tendency to assume default status for Western philosophical categories and questions. This leads, for example, to expending considerable energy considering whether Confucian or Buddhist ethics are best seen as species of consequentialism, deontology or virtue ethics, rather than trying to understand them as much as possible in their own terms. Doing so risks overwriting the philosophical distinctiveness of so-called “non-Western” traditions and tacitly justifying the continued definition of academic philosophy in terms of exclusively Western defaults. Being aware of these risks, however, I think it is nevertheless possible to make provisional use of Western categories to initiate exploration of philosophical terrains shaped by very different forces than those with which we are most familiar. That, at least, is the approach taken here with the aim of making it easier for students and teachers of philosophy to find some places from which they might enter into productive dialogue with Chan.

2. History

Chan coalesced over the course of several centuries of sustained and reflexive engagement with the meaning of being both Chinese and Buddhist. That is, it took shape over the period from roughly 500 to 1000 CE in the context of negotiations taking place within what the anthropologist James Clifford (1988) has referred to as the “predicament of culture”—the feeling of pervasive off-centeredness that occurs when we are confronted with an unavoidable and unprecedented overlay of distinct meaning systems and compelled to choose among or reconcile different and often contrary sources of personal and cultural identity.

Buddhism first entered China in the latter part of the Han dynasty (206 BCE to 220 CE) along with growing trans-Eurasian trade. Early records of Buddhist presence in China depict the arrival of this foreign religion as at once intriguing and unsettling—a confrontation with cultural difference, not as an objectively observable fact, but as a subjectively troubling experience of failing common sense (Sakai 1997). Monastic Buddhist missionaries were visibly alien with their monochrome robes, their shaved heads and eyebrows, and their restricted diets. Along with strikingly novel votive statues and paintings—the first term for Buddhism was, in fact, the “teaching of the images” (xiangjiao)—they brought with them new meditative techniques, new ritual technologies, and, most importantly, new forms of writing.

Since very early times in China, writing had been understood as intimately tied to spiritual, political and cultural authority (Lewis 1999)—an association manifest in the Chinese term for culture (wenhua, 文化), which combines characters for literature (文) and transformation (化). The arrival of Buddhist texts were evidence that there were peoples in “the West” who, unlike any other peoples the Chinese had encountered, not only had their own customs, but also their own literary culture and thus their own claims to authority. Buddhist texts held out the promise of alternative ways of understanding the world and the place of humanity in it, but also new forms of subjectivity and imagination, new personal ideals, and new visions of the interrelatedness of the spiritual and the political.

Buddhist practices of meditative discipline, image worship and ritual devotion spread rapidly through Chinese society in the period of disunity after the fall of the Han dynasty. By the early fourth century, for example, regular, multi-week Buddhist retreats of up to 5,000 people were being held, and by the sixth century over two million people—roughly one out of every twenty-five people in China—were ordained as monks and nuns. Buddhism played crucial roles in the unification of nomadic peoples under the Northern Wei (386–534) and in the eventual restoration of the Chinese empire with the founding of the Sui dynasty (581–618). A sense of the importance of Buddhism in shaping the political and cultural imaginaire of medieval China can be gleaned by considering the investment needed to build the monumental cave complexes at Yungang Grottoes and Longmen Grottoes—each with tens of thousands of Buddhist images carved out of live rock, some as large as sixty feet in height with faces originally clad in gold.

But it was through collaborative projects of translation and textual exegesis that Buddhism came to be woven so thoroughly into the fabric of Chinese culture that the emperor of Song China, Song Xiaozong (r. 1162–89), would compare the three teachings of Confucianism, Daoism and Buddhism to the legs of a bronze ding: a ceremonial vessel associated with political unity and power and cultural authority that would be useless if any one of the three were to be removed. Indian and Central Asian Buddhist texts offered new visions of the cosmos, new narrative structures, and new concepts that made obvious the boundaries and biases of Chinese literary and philosophical thought and practice. Engaging these texts required improvising linguistic and conceptual bridges, but ultimately also building new kinds of cultural consciousness and identity.

At the time that the great Central Asian translator, Kumārajīva (334–413), was working with a multi-ethnic translation team in the Chinese capital of Chang’an (a city of between 300,000 and 500,000 people at the time), Buddhism had undergone nearly a thousand years of adaptive evolution and several hundred texts were catalogued as part of the Buddhist canon. By the seventh century, that number had grown to over a thousand. These texts all purported to be authentic renderings of Buddhist teaching. But in actuality they often had quite disparate historical and cultural origins, and this presented Chinese Buddhist scholars with immense hermeneutical challenges. Drawing on evidence internal to key Buddhist scriptures, different systems were devised for classifying and ranking Buddhist teachings and texts, and these became the basis of competing, textually-defined schools of Buddhism, the foremost being the Consciousness-Only (Weishizong, 唯識宗), Tiantai or Heavenly Terrace (Tiantai zong, 天台宗 ), Pure Land (Jingtu zong, 淨土宗) and Huayan or Flower Ornament (Huayan zong, 華嚴宗) schools.

Chan traces its origins to a radical break from this scholastic approach—an explicit rejection of the ultimate authority of writing combined with an insistence that authentic Buddhist teachings are not to be found in books or memorized liturgies but only in the immediate, face-to-face encounters of Buddhist masters and their students. The iconic precedent for this break is the moment of transmission said to have occurred when, in the middle of preaching to a gathering of some 10,000 people on Vulture Peak, the Buddha held up a single flower and elicited a smile of shared realization from his disciple, Mahākāśyapa. Nearly a thousand years later, the purported 28th lineage holder in this line of direct transmission—an Indian monk named Bodhidharma—is said to have arrived in southeast China by sea, made his way to north China, and eventually offered the “skin”, “flesh”, “bone” and “marrow” of his teaching to his four closest disciples, one of whom, Huike (487–593), came to be regarded as the second Chan Patriarch in China.

This account of Chan origins was well-established by the tenth century, and its rudiments were already circulating by the late 6th and early 7th centuries. Contemporary scholars now regard this account and much of what Chan eventually came to regard as the particulars of its own history as inventions of tradition (see, e.g., McRae 2003 and Faure 1991). But for present purposes, the traditional story of Chan’s origins affords a useful way of introducing the philosophical concerns that shaped the consolidation of Chan identity.

In the earliest strata of texts reliably attributed to Bodhidharma and other early Chan teachers (see Broughton 1999), we find Bodhidharma claiming that there are two points of entry to Buddhism: via li (理), an “informing impetus” or “principle”; and via xing (行), “practice”. Entry by li consists in realizing that all sentient beings have the same true nature; entry by xing consists in making good on wrongs done; corresponding with conditions; seeking nothing; and acting in accordance with the realization that all beings have the same true nature. Buddhist truth, in other words, is not something attained through practice, but rather an aspect and achievement of it. Moreover, Bodhidharma affirms that this is possible anywhere, whether one is walking, lying down, sitting or standing. Successful Buddhist practice is not based on being in some specific place or posture. Neither is it dependent on textual study. In fact, it is claimed that whoever obtains understanding through reading will have weak vital energy (qi, 氣) and that to have the energy needed to truly enact the Buddhist path one must obtain understanding in the medium of circumstances and events by never losing mindfulness anywhere.

These claims eventually become conventional elements of Chan identity. But they were profoundly iconoclastic given Chinese associations of writing with authority and the institutional ramifications of Buddhist scholasticism. They were also philosophically pregnant claims when seen in the light of the hermeneutical challenges with which Chinese Buddhists were grappling in the seventh and eighth centuries.

One of the signal debates of the seventh century centered on whether or not there were people who had committed such heinous crimes—for example, killing their own parents or an enlightened being—that they had absolutely no prospect of ever realizing enlightenment. One could find textual evidence, in the highly influential Lotus Sutra, for example, that even beings like Devadatta, the cousin of the Buddha who had tried to murder him out of jealousy, are already doing the work of bodhisattvas and will eventually reach Buddhahood. Other texts forwarded the controversial but supportive thesis that what guaranteed this was the fact that all sentient beings already have/are Buddha-nature. Since we are all originally enlightened (benjue, 本覺) practice is not a process of acquisition, but one of restoration. Not everyone agreed. The Chinese monk, Xuanzang (602–664) was not convinced by such texts and went on a sixteen-year sojourn through Central Asia to India to put an end to the debate. He returned laden with more than six hundred new Buddhist texts and confirmation of the heterodox nature of the idea that all beings have Buddha-nature. In spite of being treated to an imperial welcome and granted lavish support for his translation work, his report on the state of Buddhist teaching in the birthplace of the Buddha ironically seems to have buoyed the confidence of Chinese Buddhists committed to the Buddha-nature thesis and the teachings about nonduality and the bodhisattva ideal that were presented in such key texts as the Nirvāṇa, Vimalakīrti and Huayan sutras. Interest in Indian Buddhism waned and Chinese Buddhists, including early proponents of Chan, began seeing themselves as the true inheritors of the Buddha Dharma with a mandate to demonstrate the skillful means (upāya) needed to present Buddhism in ways suited to Chinese audiences.

A striking, symbolic turning point in the confidence of Chinese Buddhists occurs less than fifty years after Xuanzang’s return from India when Huineng, an illiterate manual laborer, is made the sixth Chinese Chan lineage holder and given the unprecedented treatment of having his transcribed teachings titled the Platform Sutra (Tanjing). Since “sutra” is traditionally reserved solely for the recorded teachings of the historical Buddha, this effectively proclaimed that Huineng was China’s first “homegrown” Buddha. It is hard to imagine a more dramatic affirmation of the Buddha-nature teachings in China, or a more pointed rejection of the identification of Buddhist authority with Buddhist literacy.

Over the next two centuries, Chan identity crystalized around the teachings of nonduality and Buddha-nature. In the aftermath of a devastating purge of Buddhism during the Huichang era (841–846), during which more than a quarter million monks and nuns were forcibly returned to lay life and over 5,000 temples, monasteries and Buddhist libraries were destroyed, Linji Yixuan (d. 866), one of the most influential teachers in Chan history, took these teachings to their iconoclastic extreme, dismissing the great Buddhist scriptures as “hitching posts for donkeys” and encouraging anyone who happened to see “the Buddha” on the road to kill him.

Whereas the metropolitan, text-based schools of Chinese Buddhism were devastated by the mid-ninth century purge, rural Chan communities flourished, resulting in the so-called “five houses” or Linji, Caodong, Fayan, Yunmen and Guiyang lineages. Collections of “encounter dialogues” between Chan masters and their students began circulating and resonated well with Chinese literati. With the collapse of the Tang dynasty (618–907) and the founding of the Song (960–1279), Chan fortunes continued to swell as a “homegrown” form of Chinese Buddhism that fit well into the literati mission of using ancestral cultural traditions (guwen) to craft a new imperial identity for China. By the twelfth century, Chan had both religious and political prestige and the vast majority of public monasteries supported by the Song court were devoted to the practice of Chan (see Welter 2006).

3. Chan and the Nature of Reality

Chan iconoclasm seems to have been largely rhetorical insofar as the targets of Chan invective shifted from teacher to teacher and from generation to generation, and insofar as Chan teachings and practices did not generally evidence anything like the radical breaks from Buddhist tradition that famous Chan texts like the thirteenth-century Gateless Barrier (Wumenguan, 無門關) might suggest. On the contrary, daily life in Chan communities followed standard Chinese monastic precedents and even in the writings associated with the Hongzhou lineage of Mazu, renowned for his use of physical “shock tactics” like kicking and punching, references to works in the Buddhist canon are quite common. Among the key texts frequently invoked by Chan teachers were the Vimalakīrti Sutra, the Nirvāṇa Sutra, the Flower Ornament Sutra, the Lotus Sutra, the Lankāvatarā Sutra, and various Prajñāpāramitā texts like the Diamond Sutra.

The nature of reality as depicted in these texts, and for the most part assumed as valid in Chan circles, does not fit comfortably into such customary Western philosophical categories as idealism, materialism and dualism. Common to all Buddhist traditions are the teachings of interdependence and karma. Strongly interpreted, to claim that all things arise and abide interdependently is to claim that relationality is ontologically more basic than “things-being-related”. That is, interdependence is not a contingent, external relation among essentially separate entities; it is internal or constitutive. As it came to be understood in China, interdependence entails interpenetration and individual existents are thus abstractions from already ongoing relational dynamics. Existence is relationality.

This strong reading was reinforced in China by indigenous Confucian and Daoist conceptions of a thing’s nature (xing, 性) as dispositional and of the world as an auto-poetic or self-creating (ziran, 自然) system of continually-evolving relational patterns (dao, 道)—not a divine creation, an objective determinant of universal physical laws, or a material expression of transcendent principles. These indigenous Chinese conceptions of reality resonated well with Buddhist notions of interdependence and impermanence. But Buddhism added to them the teaching of karma, directing attention to the dramatic character of phenomenal reality.

Stated as a conditional, the Buddhist teaching of karma is that if we pay close and sustained enough attention to the dynamics of our experience, a meticulous consonance becomes manifest between the complexion of our own values, intentions and actions, and the patterns of outcomes and opportunities we are experiencing. In short, all experienced realities imply responsibility. But because our values, intentions and actions are always open to revision, all experienced realities also express opportunities for responsively altering the character and disposition of the relational dynamics that constitute us as persons and as communities.

One objection to this view of reality is that, if the world is self-generating and without any specific point or moment of origin, if we are truly relational and thus ultimately intergenerational beings, and if experience is karmically-conditioned, how is enlightenment or liberation from conflict, trouble and suffering possible? If we have had an infinite amount of time to act with ill intent or in accord with misguided and perhaps conflicting values, do we not have an infinite amount of troubling experiential consequences to work through—an infinite burden of “bad” karma to bear and eventually suffer and make good on?

For the historical Buddha, the answer was quite simple: it is karma itself that makes the realization of liberation possible. We may not be able to change what we have done in the past, but at this very moment we can change the meaning of what we have done, establishing a new dramatic trajectory that carries us beyond the reach of much of what we otherwise would have been “destined” to experience. Thus, although the serial killer Angulimāla did experience some violence from villagers affected by his prior rampages after having met the Buddha, become a monk, and practiced well enough to realize liberation, being pummeled with small stones and rotten fruit was minor suffering in comparison to what otherwise was due him based on his ruthless and proud slaughter of dozens of people (Majjhima Nikāya, no. 86).

As Xuanzang’s arduous journey to India and the controversy motivating it make clear, however, not all Buddhists were satisfied by this explanation. After all, the Buddha was the greatest of all teachers and this was clearly a factor in his disciples’ abilities to realize liberation under his guidance. Indeed, the body of literature detailing the Buddha’s prior lives (the Jataka Tales) portrays the Buddha’s closest disciples as having traveled with him over time as members of an ensemble of “characters” in a drama of liberation playing out over dozens of lifetimes. What of less karmically fortunate people living a hundred or a thousand years after the Buddha had died? If all beings have “no-self” or abiding essence, if all things are characterized by emptiness (śūnyatā) or the absence of any intrinsic nature—basic teachings of both early and later Buddhist traditions—and if we have been living the ignorance-biased lives of “sinners” rather than “saints”, how is liberation ever possible? Without the live guidance of a teacher like the Buddha, the possibility of enlightenment would seem to be purely theoretical.

One response to this—variously expressed in a range of Mahāyāna texts and variously understood by those interpreting them as Buddhism spread from India through Central Asia and into China—was that all sentient beings have “within” them a “seed” or “embryo” (garbha) of enlightenment: the innate capacity to be like the Buddha himself, a “thus come one” (tāthagatha). Texts espousing some version of this tāthagatha-garbha thesis—the Nirvāṇa, Śrimālādevimhanāda and Lankāvatarā sutras, for example, and the apocryphal commentary, the Awakening of Mahayana Faith—became some of the most influential Buddhist texts in China, and especially in the development of Chan. Many of these texts also drew connections between tāthagatha-garbha teachings and the notion of buddhadhātu, literally “buddha-element”, “buddha-substance” or “buddha-realm”. This concept seems to have developed through a merger of justifications for relic veneration practices and assertions about the originally luminous nature of the mind that are found in both very early Pali-language and Mahayana Buddhist texts. These texts maintain that mind is originally pure and that it only appears impure because of experiential pollutants (kleśas) caused by actions undertaken in ignorance or out of anger, hatred and greed. This idea of the original luminosity of mind was seemingly grafted onto the idea of an ineradicable “element” or “substance” (dhātu) of enlightened being, eventually resulting in claims that all sentient beings have already within them a seed of enlightenment—a luminous capacity for awakening (budh).

For some Buddhists, the “substantial” character of this capacity seemed to imply the presence in each of us of a “true self”—not the egoistic self that appears as a function of ignorance, habit formations and craving forms of desire, and that is dissolved through Buddhist training and the realization of no-self (anatman), but rather an unassailably aware core of being-present. In China, however, the term that was used to translate buddhadhātu—佛性 or fo-xing—opened other interpretative possibilities. In contrast with the connotations of the Sanskrit dhātu, which has connotations ranging from an individual component of existence to a realm of existents, fo-xing literally means “Buddha-nature” and carries with it dispositional or relational accents deriving from the indigenous Chinese notion of “nature” (xing, 性). Thus, Buddha-nature could be seen as a propensity for entering into enlightening forms of conduct and relationship, rather than as a substantial essence. Buddha-nature is not something hidden “in” each of us, but rather something that manifests as a distinctive pattern and quality of interactive conduct. Chan strenuously endorsed this interpretation, and illustrating it became the distinctive feature of the gong’an (公案) or “public case” literature of master-student encounters expressing the “bone” and “marrow” of Chan: communicating the meaning of enlightenment is not a matter of saying, but of showing.

Just as significantly, the Buddha-nature thesis also came to be allied with teachings about nonduality that were found both in key tāthagatha-garbha texts and in the profoundly influential Vimalakīrti Sutra. The key figure of this sutra is a layman, Vimalakīrti, who feigns illness as a pretext for being visited by the Buddha’s key disciples and other eminent Buddhist figures—each of whom he engages and surpasses in sophisticated debate about core Mahayana concepts and practices. The sutra climaxes both dramatically and philosophically when the bodhisattva of wisdom, Mañjuśrī, asks Vimalakīrti to explain the meaning of nonduality and Vimalakīrti responds by simply remaining silently and unwaveringly present.

In the history of Western and certain branches of Indian philosophy, claims about nonduality have often taken the form of monistic challenges to metaphysical dualisms asserting the incommensurability of, for example, mind and body or spirit and matter. Nondualism denies the presence of the implied ontological gap separating these constituents of reality, asserting instead that everything is (ultimately) one or the same. Buddhist nondualism, as it came to be understood in China, does not involve an erasure of difference or a denial of its reality, but rather a restoration of the otherwise “excluded ground” between “being” and “nonbeing”.

The great Indian Buddhist thinker, Nāgārjuna (c. 150–250 CE), set the stage for this conception of nonduality by famously pointing out the logical inconsistencies of reality claims about being; nonbeing; both being and nonbeing; and neither being nor nonbeing. Blending early Buddhist insights into interdependence and the Mahayana conception of emptiness (śūnyatā), Nāgārjuna’s Madhyamaka philosophy stressed the unreality of svabhāva or “own being” to advance what he described as a “middle path” between existence and non-existence that offered an alternative to both dualism and monism, but also to any pluralisms affirming the ultimate reality of some (perhaps indefinite) number of independent existents. This logical approach to the Middle Way had powerful impacts on the development of Chinese Buddhism. But it was seen by some as offering an apophatic or negative nonduality that, while successful in undermining metaphysical foundationalism, did little to address ethical and more broadly karmic concerns or to support the bodhisattva ideal of resolutely compassionate wisdom. Conceptually linking emptiness and Buddha-nature opened possibilities for a relationally positive nondualism consistent with the valorization of meaning-generating mutual responsiveness.

With great impact on the development of Chan, this was the approach taken by the Chinese Huayan thinker, Fazang (643–712). Although proponents of Chan often stressed its distinctiveness, Chan monastics lived in community with monks and nuns who had allegiances to other Buddhist traditions. Indeed, rather than being a source of doctrinal schisms, the scriptural commentaries and philosophical essays being produced by thinkers from the full range of Buddhist traditions can be thought of as constituting a shared scaffolding for engagement in “Buddhist studies”. Fazang was among the most respected Buddhist intellectuals of his time. In contrast with those who understood the Mahāyāna assertion of the emptiness (śūnyatā) of all things as an assertion about the absence or negation of identity—an assertion that denied ultimate actuality to things as individual existents—Fazang linked realizing the emptiness of all things to realizing that interdependence is an internal or constitutive relationship. That is, interdependence consists in dynamic interpenetration. In a move that paralleled the description in the Awakening of Faith of the “one mind” (yixin, 一心) of ultimate reality as having two aspects—ti (體), “embodied structure” and yong (用) “function”—Fazang held that the dharmadhātu or realm of truth/ultimate reality should be seen nondualistically in terms of both informing principles (li, 理) and phenomenal experiences (shi, 事). That is the dharmadhātu or realm of truth/ultimate reality is at once a realm of shi or experiential matters (事法界, shi fajie); a realm of li or informing patterns/principles (理法界, li fajie); a realm of the mutual non-obstruction of li and shi (理事無礙法界, li-shi wuai fajie); and a realm of the mutual non-obstruction of shi and shi (事事無礙法界, shi-shi wuai fajie). Thus, very much in keeping with the fact that the Sanskrit term, “dharma”, can mean a specific existent, a phenomenal unit or a teaching, the nonduality of the dharmadhātu implies a relationship of mutual determination between the domains of metaphysics and epistemology.

To help clarify the significance of this, Fazang made metaphorical use of a traditional, timber-framed building that is held together without any fasteners by the compressing force of gravity on all of its parts (Huayan wujiao zhang, in Taishō shinshō daizūkyu, Vol. 45, no. 1866). Removing the clay roofing tiles and their immense weight would destabilize such a building, eventually causing it to collapse. But the roofing tiles are placed on top of purlins that are placed perpendicularly on rafters resting on a central ridge beam and on rim joists that are themselves resting on columns placed atop individual foundation stones. Since removing the roofing tiles of such a structure would cause the entire building to collapse, the tiles can be said to be the cause of the totality of the building. But the same is true for all of the other parts of the building. Similarly, each particular in the world (shi) consists at once in causing and being caused by the dynamic patterning (li) of the totality of all things. Each thing ultimately is what it means for all others.

It can be said, then, that all things are the same, but this is true only insofar as each thing differs meaningfully from and for one another. Nonduality does not mean that all things are reducible to some common essence or substance, but rather that each thing or being is part of an emergent ecological matrix through which the functioning of each thing or being serves as a distinctive cause of the totality of the real. Reality ultimately consists in dynamically evolving mutual contribution. The dharmadhātu is not something we have in common, a foundational essence; it is something in which we each have a distinct and indispensable contributory share. Thus, Buddha-nature is not an adamantine and ineradicable element of who we are; it consists in the uninterrupted expression of enlightened and enlightening relationality.

Chan embraced this account of nonduality and Buddha-nature, but distinctively used it to qualify the meaning of Buddhist practice and the personal ideal of the bodhisattva. In the Platform Sutra attributed to Huineng, he insists that

meditation is the embodiment (ti) of wisdom, and wisdom is the functioning (yong) of meditation.

The point of Chan is to see one’s own “original nature” (benxing, 本性) and realize “authentic heartmind” (zhenxin, 眞心), and in doing so the dualities of thought and reality, of passion and enlightenment, and of the impure and pure all dissolve. Then,

true suchness (zhenru, 真如) is the embodied structure (ti) of thinking, while thinking is the functioning (yong) of true suchness. (Platform Sutra, 13–17)

To see our own original nature is to see that true suchness and thinking are as intimately related as the bodily structure of a horse and its customary activities. Just as the bodily structure of the horse establishes the conditions of possibility for grazing and galloping, it is only the proven evolutionary advantage of grazing and galloping in horse-like ways that have made this bodily structure possible. True suchness or ultimate reality is not a preexistent something “out there” that can be grasped intellectually or accessed through some mystical vision; it can only be enacted.

Huangbo Xiyun (d. 850) describes this as demonstrating no-“mind” (wuxin, 無心) or freedom from conceptual impositions that would define or limit reality. But this is not a lapse into mental blankness or indiscriminate presence. Realizing no-“mind” restores our originally whole mind (yixin, 一心) that Huangbo qualifies as the “silent bond” (moqi, 默契) of “conducting oneself as all Buddhas have” (in Taishō shinshō daizūkyu, Vol.48, 2012.380b to 383c). Significantly, the term “qi” originally referred to notches or tally marks on a strip of bamboo that record the terms of a trade agreement and the bonding that Huangbo invokes is thus one of mutually entrusted obligation and responsibility. True suchness consists in the personification of the bodhisattva ideal of realizing liberating forms of relationality. Ultimate reality consists in enacting the morally-inflected nonduality of wisdom and compassion.

Regarding reality as a dynamically-manifested relational quality rather than as something to be “known” or “attained” disposed Chan to valorize responsiveness as an index of liberating presence. Thus, while Mazu iconoclastically proclaimed that “ordinary, everyday mind is Buddha” (Xu zangjing, 119.406), he also identified this with “responding to situational dynamics and dealing with people as they come”, no matter where one is or with whom one is interacting (Xu zangjing, 119.406). And Linji, founder of one of the two Chan lineages that have remained continuous to the present day, urged his students to become “true persons of no rank” (zhenren wuwei, 真人無位) who refrain from taking any fixed position, improvising as needed in any situation to contribute to the emergence of enlightening relational dynamics.

4. Truth and the Nature of Knowledge and Language in Chan

Chan’s identification of ultimate reality or true suchness (Ch. zhenru; Skt. bhūtatathatā) with liberation-enacting responsive virtuosity implies that reality is both personal and communicative. Given this, it is not surprising that “public cases” (Ch. gong’an; J. kōan) purportedly recording the encounters of Chan masters and their students came to be the premier Chan literary form and by the mid-Song dynasty constituted a kind of core curriculum for Chan training. But, as noted earlier, Chan also came to represent itself as

a special transmission outside the teachings (jiaowai biechuan); not established upon words and letters (buli wenzi); directly pointing to the human heartmind (zhizhi renxin); seeing nature and becoming a Buddha (jianxing chengfo).

And this suggests that the relationship among truth, language and communication in Chan may confound some common Western philosophical expectations.

As is suggested by the abundant references to canonical texts found in Chan master discourse records, announcing that Chan involves a special transmission (biechuan) beyond the scope of scriptural teachings (jiaowai) does not necessarily call the value of textual transmission into question. But it does point to the possibility of a form of communication that directly indexes or indicates (zhi) the human heartmind without either standing upon or erecting (li) words and letters as conveyances for knowledge.

The term chuan, translated here as “transmission”, has the connotation of publishing or putting into circulation and is thus compatible with imagining Buddhist understanding as being transferred from person-to-person, from place-to-place and from generation-to-generation by means of textually-manifested teachings. But chuan also has the connotation of spreading through a process of conduction. Heat can be transferred from one place to another by convection as high energy particles or objects move into a space of lower energy ones. But heat can also spread without any particles or objects changing location. Conduction is energy flowing as a function of vibrational resonances among adjacent particles or objects and is measured not in terms of amounts of energy transferred, but rather rates of transfer. Something analogous seems to be at the heart of Chan claims of a “special transmission” and of the repeated denials by Tang and Song dynasty Chan masters that they have anything—like a robe or bowl— to give or that there is ultimately anything for their students to seek and attain.

The textual transmission of Buddhism signals a process of “knowledge convection” that can easily result in energy dissipation—a possibility that seems to have informed speculations about the eventual demise of the effectiveness of the Dharma that were widely prevalent during the period of Chan’s emergence and maturation. It is in keeping with this insight that Bodhidharma warned that Buddhist realization attained through the medium of words results in weak qi (氣) or energy, and that Huineng broke with Chinese scholastic tradition to deny the value of classifying teachings and texts having “sudden” or “gradual” content and directed attention instead to seeing “sudden enlightenment” (dunwu, 頓 悟) as a function of personal readiness (a root meaning of the term, dun) to engage in enlightened/enlightening conduct—a function of the keenness or dullness with which one enters into liberating resonance with others.

Consistent with seeing knowledge transfer as a process of conduction, the paradigmatic Chan term for records of intergenerational transmission is denglu (燈錄) or “lamp records”—a term that invites imagining a series of lamps being restored to their natural luminosity as teachers and students enter into effective resonance with one another. In Chan, knowledge is not something that can be bequeathed. Truth is not a function of propositional coherence or of a correspondence between propositions and reality. Truth is the enactment of liberating relationality—a truing of relational dynamics.

This understanding of truth is crucial to the evolution of Chan teachings, and to the apparent embrace of such contradictory claims—sometimes made by the same teacher—as that Chan involves the realization of “one mind” or “ordinary mind” or “no-mind”. Chan teachings are—at least ideally—improvised in effective and always situated response to actual needs and concerns. That is, they are exemplifications of the bodhisattva exercise of upāya or responsive virtuosity, not final expressions of eternally or universally valid insights.

Mazu, for example, was once asked by a monk, “Why do you say that ‘mind is Buddha’?” Mazu replied, “To end the crying of small children”. The monk then asked, “So what do you say when the tears have dried up?” Mazu answered, “It is neither mind nor Buddha”. The monk continued probing. “Then what if people come along who don’t fit into either of these categories? How do you teach them?” Mazu said, “Then I tell them that it’s not a thing”. Still not giving up, the monk finally asked, “But what about if you come across someone who is truly present?” To this Mazu replied, “I teach such a person to realize the great Way” (Xu zangjing, Vol. 119.408b).

The provisional nature of Chan declarations exemplified in this encounter and even more apparent in some Chan teachers’ use of physical gestures like raising a finger, wiggling eyebrows or killing a cat in response to students’ questions was a lightning rod for criticism. If Chan teachings can include contradictory statements and such gruesome acts as killing a cat, what is to prevent the truth of nondualism from spurring an antinomian erasure of the boundaries not only between sense and nonsense, but also between the moral and immoral? This was a concern for even such eminent Buddhist thinkers as Guifeng Zongmi (780–841), a lineage holder in both the Huayan School and the Heze Chan lineage, who argued that if any kind of speech or action can be the functioning of Buddha-nature, then what is to stop hatred and gratuitous violence from being seen as “liberating” (Xu zangjing, Vol. 110.435d)?

Here it is useful to place Zongmi’s concerns in the context of Chinese appropriations of the distinction between conventional truth (saṃvṛti-satya) and ultimate truth (paramārtha-satya)—a distinction that had roots in both Nikāya and Mahāyāna Buddhism, and that was given perhaps its most developed expression in the work of the Indian thinker, Candrakīrti (570–650). In China, while the “two truths” distinction became a philosophical mainstay, it was also seen as being in tension with the teachings of nonduality since it implies two separate levels of reality or at the very least a contrast of reality and illusion. One of the most influential responses to this seeming inconsistency was put forward by Zhiyi (538–597), one of the founding figures of Chinese Tiantai Buddhism, who forwarded a “three truths” approach that embraced such apparent opposites as existence and nonexistence, enlightenment and delusion, and the sacred and the profane as equal partners of the “Middle Way”. According to Zhiyi, conventional realities/truths (based on day-to-day experience) and ultimate realities/truths (based on the realization of emptiness) are equally involved in bringing about the end of suffering (the Middle Path). And this implies that, in fact, all things and statements can be true as mutually inclusive aspects of a single reality/truth.

The more radical streams of Chan teaching—for example, Huineng’s claim that passions are not an obstruction to enlightenment, or Linji’s use of hitting and shouting—are consistent with this approach. But both in Zhiyi’s Tiantai and in Chan it arguably was not held that all things are doing the Buddha work of enlightenment, but rather that they can function in this way. Whether or not raising a finger actually brings about a liberating turn in a teacher-student encounter is not a function of the action or the intention behind it, but of what it means relationally. Case 19 of the Blue Cliff Record (see, Cleary 1977) recounts how Chan master Juzhi was fond of responding to students’ queries simply by raising his index finger. One day, Juzhi was away and his teenaged attendant greeted some visitors inquiring as to the master’s whereabouts by mimicking his master’s trademark gesture. When Juzhi returned, the boy informed him how things had gone while he was away and Juzhi asked him to demonstrate how he had responded to the visitors. The boy raised his finger, which Juzhi promptly severed with a knife. As his attendant fled in pain, Juzhi called out his name. When the boy stopped and turned, Juzhi raised his finger. The boy’s mind opened and realization blossomed. Chan teaching is not something conveyed by words or gestures; it consists in direct relational transformation.

It still can be asked, of course, how one knows what direction of relational transformation is truly liberating or what interventions are appropriate in any given situation. This epistemological concern is not one, however, that Chan endorsed. On the contrary, the general Chan view has been that asking the epistemological question is perhaps the single most pernicious form of distraction from embarking wholly upon the path of Chan practice. Huineng insisted that from the ancients down to his day, without-thinking (wunian 無念) had always been the core teaching (Platform Sutra, 17). But he also noted that being without-thinking can be sustained even as thoughts are arising and passing away so long as one refrains from forming attachments, calculating outcomes and taking up fixed positions. In short, being without-thinking is being single-mindedly present in unwavering attentiveness. Deliberating about whether an action is right or wrong is already to have departed from such presence and to have fallen into doubt or being of “two minds”.

In an iconic encounter between Mazu and his teacher, Nanyue Huairang (677–744), Mazu has an awakening after pointing out to Huairang that he cannot make a mirror by rubbing together a stone and a clay roofing tile, only to be asked why he then thinks it is possible to make himself into a Buddha by sitting on a meditation cushion. To become a Buddha, Huairang avers, simply act as a Buddha. This opens Mazu’s mind, but then it swiftly closes as he wonders how he will know when he is acting like a Buddha. Huairang’s reply to this question triggers a still deeper awakening: “You cannot see the Path, you can only see from it”. Epistemological worries are potentially endless detours of often fervently justified disengagement—detours predicated on the separating out of a questioning subject and a questioned object or environment. Seeing from the Chan path is seeing completely.

5. Ethical Dimensions of Chan

From the perspective of Chan practice, the merits of cutting off conceptual craving and calculation are immediately evident. But claiming no-thought and unquestioning participation as norms can be seen as promoting unreflective and potentially uncaring and unjust actions, as well as generating liabilities for authoritarian abuse. Given that ethics seemingly requires reasoned reflection on how to realize the good life as persons and as communities, is Chan finally un-ethical or anti-ethical? If there is really nothing to seek or attain, as so many Chan masters have averred, and if enlightenment is not so much a substantive change as it is a gestalt shift, is this not to simply leave untreated and likely worsening all of the ills and injustices plaguing us?

There is little in Chan literature that could plausibly warrant positioning Chan wholly within any one of the standard Western categories of consequentialist, deontological and virtue ethics, or, for that matter, within such alternatives as communitarian or care ethics. Chan literature is notoriously silent about the kinds of questions to which ethics typically offers answers. Indeed, the recurrent valorizations of non-thinking (wunian), non-abiding (wuzhu, 無住) and non-reliance (wuyi, 無依) in the context of Chan’s nondualistic metaphysics and its idealization of responsive virtuosity suggest that if there is such a thing as Chan ethics it is an ethics of relational improvisation.

The mainstream of Western ethics takes the individual, decision-making agent as the basic unit of concern, and a primary concern is to develop a universally applicable method of arbitrating among the often disparate interests of individual agents, establishing rationally-guided means to determining and practically realizing the meaning of the good life. Chan nonduality shifts concern from individual agents to relationality, and in particular to the kind of relationality that fully manifests our original Buddha-nature. In this sense, the basic method of Chan ethics might be thought to be emulation—a method of deliberately acting as the Buddha did. But this would imply a goal orientation that is entirely at odds with Chan’s cautions against objectifying enlightened/enlightening conduct or making Buddha-hood a goal or destination. As the example of Juzhi and his attendant makes strikingly evident, the method of Chan is not to imitate or mimic the behavior of either past or present exemplars. Rather, it is to exemplify ourselves the dramatic clarity and relational virtuosity of bodhisattvas who are able, in any situation whatsoever to bring about a liberating inflection of ongoing relational dynamics. If Chan ethics involves emulation, it is emulation of something like an improvisational style rather than mastery of a specific deliberative or behavioral repertoire.

It can be said, then, that freedom is a primary ethical value in Chan. But Chan freedom is not identified with the exercise of control or choice; neither is it rooted in rational determinations of whether a given course of action is good or will have good results. That is, freedom is not associated with independence (which is imaginable only in ignorance of the interdependence and interpenetration of all things), nor is it conceived essentially as a property of individual agency. In keeping with the bodhisattva ideal, freedom consists in embodying superlative capacities-for and commitments-to realizing the conditions for relating freely: the improvisational expression of relational virtuosity oriented toward the resolution of conflict, trouble and suffering. Chan ethics is not a function of living in accord with predetermined means-to and meanings-of the good, but rather of improvisational genius—a creative marriage of fluid vigilance and unwavering care: an ethics of ever-intensifying appreciative and contributory virtuosity.

This, of course, is a distillation of Chan ideals. Extant evidence is that life within Chan monastic communities was conducted in adherence with the disciplining precepts of Buddhist ordination, and that interactions with the lay community were for the most part consistent with prevailing moral and social norms. Chan rhetoric notwithstanding, Chan practice seems to have been more norm-respecting rather than norm-eliding. In keeping with this, when the famous Tang poet, Bai Juyi (772–846) asked Chan master Niaoke (741–824) about the true meaning of Chan, Niaoke responded, “As for doing evil, avoid it; as for the good, practice sharing it”. When Bai Juyi derisively dismissed this as the kind of advice given to three-year-old children, Niaoke didn’t disagree, but simply added that although it was advice that rolled easily off the tongue, it was also advice that most eighty-year-olds failed to put into practice.

Yet, when Niaoke extols sharing the good, he is not referring to some fixed or predetermined ideal or attribute. Like the Sanskrit kuśala for which it served as a translation, the Chinese word he uses, shan (善), connotes the superlative: “good” in the sense of being expert or virtuosic. Moreover, he does not advocate “being” good or even “doing” good, but rather sharing it. Chan ethics is thus not a knowing-that something is or will be good, but rather knowing-how to extend the horizons of virtuosity in ways deemed valuable by others (on this distinction, see Varela 1999). And this knowing-how is not an intellectually-attained method, but rather the result of embodied, relationship-attuning practice.

With this in mind, it is interesting to note that among its signal achievements Chan came to include the Chan Rules of Purity (Chan jinggui), attributed to Baizhang (749–814), which established a comprehensive code of conduct for Chan monastics. Even in the radical Hongzhou lineage, living in accordance with these rules was seen as essential to holding open the circuit of mutual contribution that made the privilege of monastic life possible. Weishan Lingyou (771–853), for example, explicitly urges monks in his community gratefully and with a lofty and peaceful spirit to repay the kindnesses of their parents, their donors, the emperor and the Buddha, without whose offerings they would not have the opportunity to realize Chan awakening (Weishan jingce, T. 48:1042b-43c), primarily by adhering to established rules of comportment for those embracing the bodhisattva ideal. The emphasis on bodily comportment is crucial.

As the Pali and Sanskrit texts of the Vinaya division of the Buddhist canon make clear, the norms of Buddhist monastic life were not arrived at in an a priori or purely rational fashion, but rather in situated response to tensions arising within the early monastic community and in its interactions with the rest of society. This situational approach to the development of norms for conduct and demeanor resonated well with indigenous Chinese approaches to ethics. The moral and ethical norms of the Confucian tradition around which social relations have been structured throughout much of China’s history do not consist in rationally-derived principles and virtues, but rather in standards of ritual performance (li, 禮) within the roles—as fathers, mothers, sons, daughters, friends and societal participants—that are the constitutive means-to and meanings-of being authentic and valued persons-in-community (see Ames 2011). These standards are, of course, behavioral. They provide a social grammar to which recourse is made in shaping one’s relationships in meaningful and situationally appropriate ways. But more importantly, these standards are also qualitative—standards of intention, attitude and energy as they pertain to relational enhancement. Although any grammar is by nature restrictive, the purpose of Confucian norms is to provide a structure for the progressive personification of consummate conduct (ren, 仁). Ethics is ultimately inseparable from aesthetics.

Understood in this context, monastic discipline provides a basic grammar for living as persons-in-Buddhist-community. Abiding by monastic rules of behavior and comportment are a kind of “basic training” on the way of developing relational virtuosity. That said, Chan virtuosity involves much more than “grammatical” proficiency. An intimation of what this means is presented in this beautifully crafted passage in the discourse records of Mazu.

Buddhas are capable of authoritative personhood (ren). Having realized kind wisdom and the excellent nature of opportunities and dangers, you can break through the net of doubts snaring all sentient beings. Departing from “is” and “is-not” and other such bondages….leaping over quantity and calculation, you will be without obstruction in whatever you do. When your situation and its pattern are penetrated, [your actions] are like the sky giving rise to clouds; suddenly they exist, and then they don’t. Not leaving behind any obstructing traces, they are like phrases written on water. (Xu zangjing, Vol. 119.406b)

The Chan ethical ideal is liberating intimacy and efficacy without agency.

6. Conclusion

Chan’s iconoclastic rhetoric and its fondness for using such apparently negative terms as no-thought, no-mind and no-cultivation as cardinal points of liberating practice might suggest seeing Chan as a premodern form of deconstructivism. But given its affirmation of Buddhist teachings about karma and the role of values and intentionality in shaping experience, Chan might just as well be seen as constructivist. The humor and apparent absurdity of Chan’s premier literary form—vernacular encounter dialogues—might alternatively suggest existentialist leanings, while its celebrations of everyday life, embodied action and doing what works now rather than following past precedents can be seen as pragmatic. Philosophically, Chan presents itself as an enigma.

At the same time, Chan had profound impacts culturally. In China, Chan ideals of personal vitality and responsive virtuosity found ongoing visual expression in calligraphy and painting, and literary expression in poetry. And as Chan spread to other parts of East Asia, these ideals came also to be infused into the performance arts of music, tea ceremony and drama. The distinctive ways in which Chan wedded nonduality or metaphysical ambiguity with a moral aesthetics of improvisation opened real possibilities for imagining presence as already liberating.

The nature of the relationship between the enigmas that Chan presents philosophically and the cultural productivity of its personal and aesthetic ideals remains open. In East Asia, exploring that openness historically proved to be a powerful means of addressing the predicament of culture and the discomforts of cultural difference. Similar explorations are now ongoing elsewhere as Chan, Zen, Sôn and Thiền traditions of thought and practice have begun taking root in other parts of the world. In this new global context, engaging in philosophical conversation with Chan signals distinctive opportunities for exploring the means-to and meanings-of truly intercultural philosophy.


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