Huayan Buddhism

First published Tue Nov 5, 2019

Huayan is one of the most philosophically interesting and historically influential Buddhist schools. The distinctive contributions of Huayan include the doctrines that “one is all, and all is one,” that ultimate reality is ontologically identical with the illusory world of common sense, and that realizing these facts leads to universal compassion. Huayan is known also for the incisive nature of its arguments, particularly in Fazang’s “Rafter Dialogue” and Zongmi’s On the Origin of Humanity.

The Chinese term “Huayan” means “Flower Garland” and comes from the Avatamsaka Sutra (Flower Garland Sutra), an Indian Sanskrit text. Huayan also shows the influence of the Madhyamaka doctrine of Nagarjuna, the Yogacara School, and the teachings of Awakening of Faith in Mahayana. However, Huayan is a distinctively Chinese form of Buddhism, particularly for the way that it interprets “emptiness” in terms of “interdependence” and treats the natural world as possessing intrinsic value. Huayan spread to Korea (where it was known as “Hwaeom”) and to Japan (where it was called “Kegon”). Like other forms of Chinese Buddhism, Huayan identified a series of patriarchs who allegedly transmitted the orthodox teachings of the tradition from master to disciple. Of these, the two most important are Fazang and Zongmi.

Although the vitality of the school in China lapsed after the persecution of Buddhism by Emperor Wuzong (842–846 CE), its doctrines, metaphors, and vocabulary had a significant influence on Chan (Zen) Buddhism and the Neo-Confucianism of the Song and Ming dynasties.

1. Basic Concepts

1.1 Indian Background

Buddhism was founded some time between the 6th and 4th centuries BCE in South Asia. The fundamental teachings of Buddhism are that ordinary life is suffused with (Skt.) dukkha (often translated as “suffering”), and that dukkha is caused by the illusory belief in persistent individual selves. The belief in selves leads to endless craving (Skt. tanha) which is unsatisfiable, because it is a longing by one illusory entity (the personal self) to permanently possess other equally illusory things. Escape from craving (and hence dukkha) is only possible by achieving enlightenment, which is fully believing the truth of no-self (Skt. anatman). Enlightenment leads to universal compassion: dukkha is seen to belong to no one, so there is no reason to prefer the elimination of what would conventionally be described as “my suffering” to “your suffering” or “their suffering.” The illusory world of independent selves is referred to as (Skt.) “samsara,” and the state achieved through enlightenment is (Skt.) “nirvana.”

The two major sects of the Buddhist religion are Theravada and Mahayana. These sects have a great variety of philosophical formulations, but three of the more influential schools are Abhidharma (Theravada), Madhyamaka (Mahayana), and Yogacara (Mahayana). Each of these schools interprets the key concepts of Buddhism in different ways. Abhidharma Buddhists argue that the things that are taken to be independent, persistent selves by common sense (such as particular monks like “Nagasena” and objects like chariots) exist only by convention. However, these conventionally existing entities are ontologically grounded in other, genuinely existing (Skt.) dharmas (entities such as instantaneous configurations of matter, or temporary mental states). Although these dharmas are transient and causally dependent on one another, they also possess a self-nature (Skt. svabhava).

In contrast, Madhyamaka Buddhists (like Nagarjuna) argue that, because all dharmas are causally dependent, nothing is ultimately grounded. They describe this by saying that reality is characterized by “emptiness” (Skt. sunyata), in the sense that everything is “empty” of self-nature and an independent, persistent self. The doctrine of emptiness is easy to misunderstand, and is sometimes mistakenly conflated with metaphysical nihilism. However, Buddhists distinguish their view from both Annihilationism (Skt. uccheda-drsti) and Eternalism (Skt. sasvata-drsti). Annihilationism is the view that nothing exists in any sense, while Eternalism is the view that something exists that is eternal, unchanging, and unconditioned by anything else. Madhyamaka denies both extremes, and holds that while dharmas do exist, each dharma’s existence is “conditioned” (causally or conceptually dependent) on something else, without any ultimate ground.

Yogacara offers a third alternative: everything is “empty” of a mind-independent self. All that exists are mental states. Consistent with the doctrine of “no-self,” Yogacara Buddhists deny that there is a substantial entity that has, thinks, or experiences the mental states. However, in order to explain why there are correlations among experiences (for example, why the apparent experience of “my starting a fire” is correlated with the apparent experience of “you feeling warmth”), Yogacara posits a repository consciousness (Skt. alayavijnana) which metaphorically contains the “seeds” of previous experiences that bear fruit in later experiences.

1.2 Chinese Developments

Buddhism was brought to China by missionaries some time during the first century CE. Indian scriptures and expositions arrived in China piecemeal, with the result that early Chinese adherents to Buddhism did not perceive contributions from different Indian traditions as fundamentally inconsistent. Chinese Buddhism is thus eclectic in its use of concepts from what were originally distinct Indian Buddhist schools. This, in turn, led to the practice of (Ch.) panjiao (doctrinal classification), according to which different philosophical systems are treated not as exclusive, but as partial conceptions of the truth, which can be arranged hierarchically in terms of how complete (literally, “rounded,” Ch. yuan) their grasp of the truth is. To use Western terminology, one might say that panjiao is a form of inference to the best explanation, since the more comprehensive teachings are shown to offer a more plausible and comprehensive interpretation of the relevant ethical, metaphysical, and empirical assumptions.

Upon gradually growing in influence, Buddhism became one of the “Three Teachings” (Ch. San jiao) of the Chinese tradition, along with Confucianism and Daoism. In fact, at times Buddhism has been the dominant religious and philosophical movement in China (among both intellectuals and commoners). However, there have been several periods of Buddhist persecution in Chinese history. In 567 CE, Wei Yuansong (n.d.), having left the Buddhist order, argued to Emperor Wu of the Northern Zhou (543–578, ruled 561–578) that Buddhism should be de-institutionalized. He argued that Buddhism is responsible for social instability because its various institutions—monastic living, internal hierarchies, and freedom from political control—undermine harmony-facilitating Chinese culture and tradition by virtue of facilitating corruption among monks and by isolating Buddhism from practical affairs (Ch. shi).

Emperor Wu’s subsequent persecutions of Buddhism, in 574 and 577, disrupted Buddhist institutions. Many monks fled to rural areas, seeking forms of Buddhism better suited to a Chinese context. Searching for ways to make Buddhism more accessible to laity, for more amenable practices and more achievable ideals, they also began exploring in earnest scriptures that receive little if any attention in the well-established schools of Indian Buddhism. The lack of definitive commentaries on these scriptures from established Indian traditions, together with political disruptions to the inertia of extant scholarly traditions of Buddhism, permitted a freedom of creative appropriation and innovation that resulted in traditions of Buddhism unique to the Chinese context.

Huayan is one of these traditions. Chief among the scriptures responsible for its distinctive teachings are the Avatamsaka (Flower Garland) Sutra and Awakening of Faith in Mahayana. Huayan takes its name from the Avatamsaka Sutra (Ch. Huayan jing), which presents a dizzyingly complex and intricate vision of reality as thoroughly “interpenetrating,” of Buddhahood as coextensive with all there is, and of the features of reality as completely dependent upon the mind and deeds of sentient beings. Awakening of Faith in Mahayana develops the theory of the tathagatagarbha, (Skt. for “Buddha-embryo” or “Buddha-womb”), the potentiality of Buddhahood. It posits One Mind as the foundation of reality. It also ascribes to One Mind two aspects, tathata (Skt. for “suchness” or “thusness”) and samsara. Tathata refers to reality as experienced without dukkha; it is generally taken to be non-conceptual and hence incapable of being expressed in words. Samsara is reality as experienced with dukkha. Awakening of Faith in Mahayana presents these aspects as mutually inclusive and inseparable.

1.3 Basic Arguments

Through the fusion of the ideas of the Avatamsaka Sutra and Awakening of Faith in Mahayana, Huayan Buddhism developed a distinctive interpretation of the concepts of “emptiness” and “no-self.” The original Indian Buddhist view that there are no selves transformed into the Chinese Buddhist view that there is no individual self, but there is a sort of transpersonal self (One Mind) of which all the transient and ontologically interdependent aspects of reality are parts. The fundamental human vice is selfishness, which is caused by the illusory belief in individual selves, and the fundamental human virtue is universal compassion, which is caused by the recognition that we are all parts of one, transpersonal reality. To fail to have compassion for another person is like ignoring a wound to my own limb because it is temporarily numb.

Huayan inherits from Madhyamaka the view that all entities are conditioned. To be conditioned is for an entity to be causally or conceptually dependent for its existence and its identity on something else. However, Huayan takes the additional steps of arguing that, because the identity of any one thing is dependent on the identities of other things, “one is all,” and because the whole is dependent for its identity on its parts, “all is one.” Huayan adopts from Yogacara the terms “repository consciousness” (alayavijnana) and “womb of the Buddha” (tathagatagarbha), which it uses to describe the reality of the world in itself. The Third Patriarch Fazang (discussed more below) illustrates how “one is all and all is one” with the relationship between a rafter and the building of which it is a part. He argues that the building is the rafter, because the building is nothing more than the sum of its parts, so each part is essential to its identity. Conversely, the rafter is the building, because what makes the rafter a rafter is its role as a part of the building. (Intuitively, if the rafter were removed from the building, its identity could change to being a bench, or a teeter-totter, or simply kindling.)

One of the metaphors from the Avatamsaka Sutra that is frequently used to illustrate mutual interdependence is Indra’s net (or “Indra’s web”). According to pre-Buddhist myth, the god Indra has a net with a jewel at the intersection of every two strands. Each jewel is so bright that it reflects every other jewel in the net. This is adopted as a metaphor for the manner in which each thing that exists is dependent for both its existence and its identity upon every other thing that exists.

Since the only thing that exists is this reality, the world of illusion (samsara) is no different ontologically from nirvana. (The slogan “Nirvana is samsara” is antecedently present in Madhyamaka.) In other words, samsara is simply a mistaken perception of the same ultimate reality experienced in enlightenment. Fazang illustrates this with the metaphor of a statue of a golden lion (Fazang 2014a). We should not deny or fail to perceive the conventional fact that the statue appears to be a lion. However, we must realize that there is no sense in which a lion is actually there, and even the appearance of the lion is not a separate entity beyond the gold that is present. The gold can take on different forms (ore, ingots, coins, etc.), but in itself it is ultimately unchanging. Similarly, we should not deny or fail to perceive that ordinary reality appears to consist of distinct, persistent individuals. However, we must realize that there are not actually distinct, persistent individuals. All that really exists is the complete network of mutually interdependent entities (dharmas), and this network (extended through all of time and space) is eternal and unchanging.

2. Dushun (557–640)

Dushun holds the posthumous honor of being known as the first patriarch of the Huayan School. He was active as a monk during the Sui (581–618) and early Tang (618–907) dynasties. We know very little about his life. He had no sectarian affiliation, and he seems to have been relatively unconcerned with scholarly controversies. We know that he was keenly interested in the Avatamsaka Sutra, and that he was renowned as a meditation master. For a time, he served as leader of the Zhixiang Temple on Zhongnan Mountain, which was a center for studying the Avatamsaka Sutra. His main interest seems to have been ministering to rural laity for the sake of making Buddhist practice relevant to their lives—by hosting common meals, distributing food to the poor, chanting scriptural passages, and offering edifying homilies.

Dushun authored only a handful of texts. Chief among these is Discernments of the Dharmadhatu of Avatamsaka (Ch. Huayan fajie guanmen, trans. Gimello 1976b, 457–510). This no longer exists as an independent text. But it is interspersed within several commentaries, most notably those by Chengguan (T45.1883; trans. Cleary 1993, 71–124) and Zongmi (T45.1884, trans. King 1976). The text itself is quite unusual. It is not a commentary on the Avatamsaka Sutra. Nor does it offer exegesis of the Avatamsaka Sutra. There are no paraphrases, no explanations of passages, no definitions or technical terminology. Instead, the text distils the central insights available through studying the Avatamsaka Sutra. Its apparent goal is making the Avatamsaka Sutra relevant to meditative practice and accessible to the laity.

Discernments of the Dharmadhatu divides into three sections, each of which corresponds to a “discernment” or meditation on the content of the Avatamsaka Sutra. The first discernment reviews the equivalence between form (Skt. rupa) and emptiness. This is a well-known equivalence from the Heart Sutra and other literature from the Indian Mahayana tradition. Nothing in this discernment should be unfamiliar to students of the history of Indian Buddhism. The second discernment, by contrast, contains two innovations that are critical for understanding the Chinese appropriation of Buddhism—and thereby renders the text especially significant from a philosophical perspective.

The first innovation is Dushun’s decision to use the Chinese term li (principle/pattern) to characterize the nature of ultimate reality. Indian Mahayana typically characterizes the nature of ultimate reality as emptiness (Skt. sunyata) or suchness (Skt. tathata). Both of these terms connote something that defies conceptualization. Dushun imbues li with an epistemological connotation: li is that which is present to those who achieve nirvana. Nirvanic experience, as Dushun understands it, reveals neither emptiness nor an undifferentiated manifold but, instead, boundless and ceaseless activity that has a patterned coherence to it (see Jiang 2001, 466–467; for a contrary interpretation, see Gimello 1976a, 125).

By discussing li—the boundless and ceaseless activity present during nirvanic experience—rather than emptiness, Dushun forestalls any conflation between li and total voidness. Whatever else it might be, li is far from nothing at all. By discussing li rather than tathata, Dushun affords the possibility of saying something about ultimate reality. Conceptualizing nirvanic experience as encountering suchness presents those experiences as something other than “such,” but conceptualizing nirvanic experience as encountering li does not present activity as something other than activity. Dushun’s first innovation thereby opens the way to developing a metaphysical theory (conceptualization) about reality as encountered during nirvanic experience.

The second innovation in Discernments of the Dharmadhatu is Dushun’s decision to use the Chinese term shi (thing/events/phenomena) to refer to the myriad things that appear in our experiences of reality. Indian Mahayana prefers to oppose emptiness to form, where form stands in as one of the myriad dharmas that constitute reality. Strictly speaking, then, the equivalence “emptiness is form, form is emptiness” is a claim only about the relation between the dharmas and the notion of emptiness: it is the claim that all dharmas are empty. This equivalence says nothing about whether composite realities—such as persons and chariots—are empty.

The distinction between dharmas and composite realities makes sense in the Abhidharma tradition: dharmas are real, composites are empty. But all Mahayana traditions claim that dharmas are empty as well. So Dushun’s second innovation makes Mahayana metaphysics more efficient: absent a reason to distinguish dharmas from the constituents built therefrom, everything is on an ontological par, dharma and non-dharma alike.

Dushun titles the second discernment the “mutual non-obstruction between li and shi.” He divides the discernment into ten themes, which naturally group into five pairs:

  • 1/2 Li and shi pervade each other.
  • 3/4 Li and shi make each other manifest.
  • 5/6 Li and shi hide each other.
  • 7/8 Li and shi are identical with each other.
  • 9/10 Li and shi are distinct from each other.

These five mutual relationships specify the meaning of “mutual non-obstruction.” Since the first is fundamental to the remaining four, we focus on understanding the “pervasion” relation between li and shi.

The mutual pervasion of li and shi presents itself as paradoxical. Li is boundless and ceaseless. Shi are limited and impermanent. Pervade means “to spread through and be totally in every part of.” The paradox is that it is not at all clear how the limited and the unlimited can pervade each other. Would not the boundless become bounded by virtue of being contained within something limited? Would not the limited, by virtue of being limited, need to become unlimited in order to spread through every part of the boundless? The first pairing in Dushun’s second discernment seems to violate two quite plausible constraints, namely: nothing limited contains anything boundless; and nothing limited appears throughout anything boundless.

Dushun admits that his claim of mutual pervasion “transcends conventional sensibilities.” However, he offers a metaphor for clarification, comparing li to water and shi to waves. This metaphor, originating with the Lankavatara Sutra, posits that each wave contains the entire ocean, and that each wave appears in every part of the ocean. These posits are not entirely implausible. Individual waves extend across the entire ocean, insofar as waves lack natural borders for extension; and waves extend beneath the surface of ocean waters, insofar as waves also lack natural borders for thickness. But, regardless of plausibility, the metaphor suggests that the mutual pervasion of li and shi amounts to the claim that none of the myriad things has natural borders even though they appear to have them (by virtue of presenting to us as discrete individuals that are separate from and independent of each other).

The third discernment in Discernment of the Dharmadhatu is “total pervasion and accommodation.” This discernment concerns the nature of and relations among individual shi. Dushun observes that each shi is nothing other than li and yet, in its individuality, distinct from li; that each shi includes, and is included within, all other shi; that this mutual inclusivity makes each shi somehow omnipresent, albeit in ways that preserve differences among shi; that each shi contains, and is contained by, all other shi; that this mutual containment, while preserving differences among shi, is fractal, such that even the smallest mote of dust contains the entirety of everything else, which in turn contains the same mote of dust containing everything else, on and on ad infinitum; and that mutual inclusion and containment is simultaneous and, somehow, a matter of perspective. These claims are, somehow, consequences of the mutual pervasion of li and shi. It remains for subsequent contributors to the Huayan School to explain and elaborate upon Dushun’s final discernment.

3. Zhiyan (602–668)

Tradition identifies Zhiyan as the second patriarch of the Huayan School. Zhiyan entered the Buddhist sangha under the tutelage of Dushun, who exposed him to the Avatamsaka Sutra at Zhixiang Temple. But the youthful Zhiyan was also keenly interested in doctrinal matters, and he studied a wide variety of texts and learned from masters of other schools. His encyclopedic scholarly knowledge of Buddhism, paired with uncertainty about how the many doctrines of the many Buddhist schools cohere with each other and an abiding concern with the charge that Buddhism neglects practical matters, led the young Zhiyan to become disheartened and confused.

Rather than follow the more typical path of monk-scholars, Zhiyan left public life, spending some 20 years wandering the countryside and preaching to the laity. He returned to Chang’an in the late 640s, whereupon he attracted many disciples—chief among them Fazang (who would later become the Third Patriarch) and the Korean monk Uisang (625–702), who took Huayan to Korea. In 661, Prince Pei, son of Emperor Gaozu and Empress Wu, appointed Zhiyan as a chief lecturer. (This appointment may have been a factor in granting Fazang the access to the royal court that was so important in his later career.) Zhiyan spent his remaining years teaching and refining his earlier work with scholarly detail.

Perhaps the most significant of Zhiyan’s later works is his Essays on Sundry Topics in the Huayan Sutra (Ch. Huayan Jing Nei Zhang Men Deng Za Kong Mu Zhang; T45.1870). Here Zhiyan introduced a five-tiered panjiao. Lowest in rank for this panjiao are Abhidharma teachings that posit the existence of dharmas with self-natures (svabhava). The second and third ranks then encompass the sectarian Mahayana teachings responsible for Zhiyan’s early confusions. These teachings acknowledge that everything, dharmas as well as constructions thereof, is empty of self-nature. But they do so in different ways. Some, such as Madhyamaka, take universal and thoroughgoing emptiness to preclude the possibility of experiencing or knowing a reality that is free of conceptual construction. Others, such as the tathagatagarbha theory of Yogacara, ground universal and thoroughgoing emptiness upon a pure and untainted consciousness. Zhiyan classifies teachings without a pure and untainted ground for emptiness as “elementary” and those with such a ground as “advanced,” ranking them second and third in his panjiao, respectively.

The second tier of Zhiyan’s panjiao stands to the third tier as Dushun’s first discernment stands to his second. In both cases, the latter makes claim to a more penetrating insight into the significance of dependent arising, by virtue of applying not only to dharmas but also to constructions thereof. For both Zhiyan and Dushun, the more penetrating insight seems to reveal a preference for kataphatic accounts—focusing on the positive import of dependent arising, as manifest with doctrines about tathata—over apophatic accounts that focus on the connections between dependent arising and emptiness.

Similarly, the third tier of Zhiyan’s panjiao stands to subsequent tiers as Dushun’s second discernment stands to his third, delving further into the nature of and relations among individual shi. But Zhiyan’s panjiao, unlike Dushun’s discernments, offers a doctrinal motivation for proceeding to higher stages. The motivation, in brief, is that no Mahayana teaching, elementary or advanced, explains both the origins of enlightenment and the origins of ignorance (as the main cause of barriers to enlightenment). Some Mahayana teachings ground the emptiness of reality upon something impure and tainted, laden with hindrances and defilements. These teachings accommodate ignorance. Yet they struggle to explain how enlightenment—pure and untainted—arises from the impure and tainted. Other Mahayana teachings ground the emptiness of reality upon something pure and untainted. Yet they struggle to explain how such a ground gives rise to hindrance and defilement.

Zhiyan claims that the teachings of the Avatamsaka Sutra overcome the limitations of the “elementary” and “advanced” Mahayana. (He claims this virtue for the teachings of the Lotus Sutra as well.) For Zhiyan, the Avatamsaka Sutra reveals an unmediated vision of ultimate reality that resolves all conflict among opposites. He calls this a vision of the “dharma-realm of dependent arising.” This realm stands in contrast, conceptually, with the realm of “dependent origination” (Skt. pratitya-samutpada) familiar from earlier Buddhist teaching. The realm of dependent origination concerns relations of dependence among conditioned and illusory dharmas, and in particular relations that help to sustain or extinguish samsaric modes of experience. By contrast, the dharma-realm of dependent arising concerns relations that pertain to nirvanic modes of experience. The most pertinent of these relations, for Zhiyan’s panjiao, is the relation between the unmediated vision of ultimate reality and nirvanic experience itself. According to Zhiyan, these stand to each other as cause and result, respectively. He calls the teaching that pertains to the first (cause) the “sudden” teaching; and the teaching that pertains to the second (result), the “round” teaching. Ranking result as superior to cause thereby completes his five-tiered panjiao.

Zhiyan endeavors to explain the Avatamsaka Sutra’s vision of reality in his Ten Mysteries of the One Vehicle of Huayan (Ch. Huayan Yicheng Shixuan Men; trans. Cleary 1993, 125–146). He does so with his doctrine of the ten mysteries (Ch. shi xuan) of the dharma-realm of dependent arising. Each mystery is meant to reveal some aspect of the Avatamsaka Sutra’s vision of reality. These aspects do not quite correspond with Dushun’s ten claims about the “total pervasion and accommodation” of each shi with all others (in his third discernment). But subsequent contributors to the Huayan School understand Zhiyan’s mysteries as an effort to elaborate upon these claims.

Zhiyan intends for the ten mysteries to apply to ten categories of dharmas. He presents each category as a pairing among contraries: doctrine and meaning, li and shi, understanding and practice, cause and result, person and dharma, realms and stages, teacher and disciple, chief and attendants, substance and function, response and stimulus. But there is no apparent pattern or system to the order in which Zhiyan presents the ten mysteries, nor does Zhiyan explain how each category applies to each mystery.

For the sake of illustration, consider each mystery as it pertains to the category of shi. (1) Each shi simultaneously causes, and results from, all other shi. (2) Each relates to all other shi in a manner that might be described as “fractal”: reflecting all others, being reflected by those others, reflecting those reflections, being reflected in reflections of those reflections, and so on ad infinitum, akin to a jewel of Indra’s net. (3) The arising of each shi is simultaneous with its cessation, and each shi’s revealing itself to nirvanic awareness coincides with the concealment of its dependence upon other shi. (4) Each is endowed with the qualities of all others and so, for example, manifests as simultaneously the smallest particle of dust and the great Mount Sumeru. (5) Each shi, appearing in a single instant of thought, is simultaneously past, present, and future; and each of these times has its own past, present, and future. (6) Each shi is simultaneously pure, insofar as it is identical with all other shi, and mixed, insofar as it contains all other shi within itself. (7) Each shi simultaneously includes, and is included within, all other shi, yet without losing its distinctness from those others. (8) Each is identical with all others, in the sense that each determines the identity and power of all others—and has its identity and power determined by those others—without losing its distinctness. (9) Each shi is nothing more than a creation of mind. (10) Each shi reveals the round teaching of the Avatamsaka Sutra and fosters understanding of the nature of ultimate reality.

Many of Zhiyan’s mysteries have a paradoxical flavor, presenting shi with apparently contrary characteristics. But Zhiyan finds mystery rather than contradiction. His insight seems to involve a sort of aspectualism, whereby contrary characteristics are ascribed to different aspects of one and the same shi, and where opposition among these aspects is a matter of perspectival limitation rather than inherent contradiction. This perspectival aspectualism supports, as a corollary, Zhiyan’s doctrine of the six characteristics. According to this doctrine, each shi creates all others while retaining its particularity, includes all others within itself while retaining its difference from them, and integrates others into a whole without cooperating with those others to do so. But Zhiyan provides little by way of explanation for these characteristics. Nor does he provide explanatory detail for locating the full diversity of experience in a common foundational source of mind. These tasks fall to his successors.

4. Fazang (643–712)

Fazang is Zhiyan’s most accomplished and influential student, and became the third patriarch of Huayan. He is responsible for systematizing and extending Zhiyan’s teaching, and for securing the prominence of Huayan-style Buddhism at the imperial court. He is known especially for his definitive commentaries on the Avatamsaka Sutra and Awakening of Faith in Mahayana, and for making Huayan doctrines accessible to laity with familiar technologies such as mirror halls and wood-block printing. These contributions support the traditional regard for Fazang as the third patriarch of the Huayan School.

Fazang’s ancestors came from Sogdiana (a center for trade along the Silk Road, located in what is now parts of Uzbekistan and Tajikestan), but he was born in the Tang dynasty capital of Chang’an (now Xi’an), where his family had become culturally Chinese. Fazang was a fervently religious adolescent. Following a then-popular custom that took self-immolation as a sign of religious devotion, Fazang burned his fingers before a stupa at the age of 16. After becoming a monk, he assisted Xuanzang—famous for his pilgrimage to India—in translating Buddhist works from Sanskrit into Chinese. Fazang had doctrinal differences with Xuanzang, though, so he later became a disciple of Zhiyan, probably around 663 CE.

Zhiyan’s access to the imperial court gave Fazang access to Empress Wu, with whom he quickly gained favor. He undertook a variety of public services, such as performing rain-prayer rituals and collaborating in various translation projects. He traveled throughout northern China, teaching the Avatamsaka Sutra and debating Daoists. He intervened in a 697 military confrontation with the Khitans, gaining further favor when Empress Wu ascribed to his ritual services an instrumental role in suppressing the rebellion. In addition, Fazang provided information to undermine plots by some of the empress’ advisors to secure power after her death. This secured Fazang’s status—and the prominence of Huayan teachings—with subsequent rulers.

4.1 Three Nature Theory

The tenth and final chapter of Treatise on the Five Teachings of Huayan (Ch. Huayan Wujiao Zhang; T45.1866, trans. Cook 1970) contains many of Fazang’s most distinctive and important doctrines. In the first section, Fazang develops his theory of the three natures. The original theory was developed in Yogacara Buddhism, and posits three “realities”: first, that there is nothing but ineffable, inexpressible reality that resembles space, gold, and water in its absolute natural purity; second, that this reality appears as an unreal imaginative construction; and third, that this unreal construction is the basis for error, which arises through confusing the construction for reality.

In his Three Natures Treatise, the Yogacara philosopher Vasubandhu names the natures for each of these three “realities.” He says that inexpressible and ineffable reality has the nature of “consummation” (or perfection): this reality is perfect, and its nature is nothing other than emptiness. He says that unreal imaginative constructions, appearances appearing as nothing other than appearances, have the nature of “other-dependence,” which is synonymous with dependent arising (pratitya-samutpada). He says, finally, that confusions about unreal imaginative constructions have the nature of “fabrication” (or imagination, or discrimination).

The Madhyamaka tradition eventually endorsed a version of the three nature theory, albeit with some significant differences from the Yogacara version. According to the Yogacara theory, while the fabricated nature is empty, the other-dependent and consummate natures are real. The imaginative constructions associated with the other-dependent nature—the karmic seeds in the repository consciousness—must have some aspect that is real, according to Yogacarins, lest there be nowhere for them to await their future actualization; and the ineffable reality associated with the consummate nature also must have some aspect that is real, for the sake of avoiding the error of annihilationism. Madhyamakins reject the Yogacarin reasoning as fallacious, preferring an epistemological rather than an ontological interpretation of the three natures. The challenge with the epistemological interpretation, however, is making sense of how (delusional) appearances are possible in the absence of anything real.

Fazang’s strategy for resolving this debate involves adapting the perspective-taking tactic of the Awakening of Faith in Mahayana to the three nature theory, ascribing two aspects to each nature. According to Fazang’s theory, one of the two aspects associated with each nature is fundamental, the other is derivative. The fundamental aspects are, respectively: pure and unchanging, lacking self-nature (svabhava), and non-existence from the standpoint of reality—that is, being nothing more than convention. The derivative aspects are: confluence to conditions, apparent existence as thoroughly interdependent, and common-sense existence (which involves a capacity to appear as if possessed of self-nature).

Yogacarins and Madhyamkins both endorse the derivative aspect for each nature. So Fazang’s technique for justifying his theory is twofold: first, argue that the fundamental aspects associated with the three natures are compatible with each other; second, argue that each nature has its fundamental aspect if and only if it has its derivative aspect. Since everyone accepts that the derivative aspects are legitimate and correct, it should then follow that the fundamental aspects are legitimate and correct as well. Fazang’s view thereby aims to include everything that is correct in the Yogacarin and Madyamakin views, while avoiding objections that each of those more limited views lodges against the other.

Fazang’s three-nature theory foregrounds the other-dependent nature of reality—how reality appears when conceptualized by those lacking delusion and ignorance. This introduces the possibility of developing a metaphysical theory about reality as it appears to those who are enlightened. Fazang endorses two complementary analyses of this reality. One analysis focuses on dharmas insofar as they are results, investigating the nondual relationality of One Mind (as cause) and the entirety of dharmas (as result). The other analysis focuses on dharmas insofar as they are causes, investigating the mutual inclusion and identity among each individual dharma and all remaining dharmas.

4.2 Analysis of One Mind

In his Commentary on Awakening of Faith in Mahayana (Ch. Dasheng qixin lun yiji; T44.1846, trans. Vorenkamp 2004a), Fazang identifies One Mind with tathagatagarbha. Tathagatagarbha, as Fazang understands it, is neither an individual consciousness nor something that stands apart from or opposed to matter. It is, instead, the one and only source of all that exists, creating and sustaining the dharma-realm of dependent arising—albeit without separation from that realm. One Mind, for Fazang, is reality prior to any individual consciousness and prior to the objects of consciousness (whether mental or material). This priority is ontological, tracking the order with respect to which reality is structured into more or less fundamental components.

Fazang posits that One Mind has two aspects, Suchness Mind and Samsara Mind. Suchness Mind is free from discerning cognition, neither produced nor destroyed. It witnesses that which is neither “this” nor “that” and yet is also not empty. Samsara Mind, by contrast, arises and ceases in accordance with conditions, transforming into purity and impurity.

Fazang explains the relation between these two aspects of One Mind by positing a distinction between Suchness and Ignorance. Suchness is the true nature of reality. Fazang posits that Suchness has two aspects, one unchanging, the other accompanying change. Suchness as unchanging is calm and quiescent. Suchness as accompanying change, by contrast, is dynamic, embedded within the ebb and flow of conditioned dharmas. Because Suchness is available for encounter only to witnessing consciousness that lacks a sense of self, Fazang characterizes it as empty. Ignorance, by contrast, is that which initiates dukkha. Fazang posits that it, too, has two aspects. As empty, Ignorance renders its results illusory. As actively functioning and completing affairs, it perfumes conditioned dharmas with hindrances and defilements. Because it is responsible for the appearance of illusory objects, Fazang characterizes this aspect as existing.

Suchness and Ignorance, on Fazang’s account, are the two fundamental aspects of One Mind. The aspects of Suchness as unchanging and Ignorance as empty correspond to Suchness Mind. This correspondence positions Suchness Mind as the witnessing of unconditioned dharmas. Similarly, the aspects of Suchness as accompanying change and Ignorance as actively functioning correspond to Samsara Mind. This correspondence positions Samsara Mind as the witnessing of conditioned dharmas. (Fazang provides an elaborate analysis of Samsara Mind, inspired by the Yijing [Classic of Changes]. The gist of his analysis explains that, because Suchness is present to Samsara Mind, right practice for the cessation of dukkha involves attending to the Suchness aspect of conditioned dharmas rather than causing those dharmas to cease.)

4.3 Analysis of Dharmas

In the third section of the tenth chapter of Treatise on the Five Teachings of Huayan, Fazang offers eight theses on dharmas as dependently-arisen causes. Four theses concern dharmas with respect to their different substance (dharmas as they relate to all other dharmas): each dharma includes all others, is included within all others, determines the identity of all others, and has its identity determined by all others. The remaining four concern dharmas with respect to their same substance (dharmas as they relate to the totality of the dharma-realm of dependent arising): each dharma includes the totality of dharmas, is included within the totality, determines the identity of the totality, and has its identity determined by the totality.

Fazang’s theses involve two salient posits. The first is that every dharma simultaneously has the aspects of existing and being empty. As existing, each dharma appears as an individual that is (numerically) distinct from others. As empty, each dharma lacks any sort of self-nature that would render it invulnerable to others. Fazang’s second posit is that every dharma also simultaneously has the aspects of having power and lacking power. As powerful, each dharma affects others in ways beyond their control and despite their resistance. As powerless, each dharma is vulnerable to others, affected by them in ways beyond its own control and despite its resistance. Fazang uses these posits to argue that insofar as one dharma exists or has power, the others are empty and lack power; and that insofar as one dharma is empty or lacking power, the others exist and have power. His theses about mutual inclusion and identity follow as corollaries.

Fazang offers several metaphors to elucidate his claims about mutual inclusion and identity, such as the metaphor of Indra’s net and the metaphor of counting ten coins. The most developed metaphor occurs in the fourth and final section of the tenth chapter of Treatise on the Five Teachings of Huayan, where Fazang uses a metaphor of a framed building to explain six characteristics of dharmas as dependently-arisen causes (Fazang 2014b). Fazang labels the six characteristics as wholeness, particularity, identity, difference, integration, and disintegration. Each of these pertains to some characteristic an individual dharma has as a part of some integrated whole, akin to the relation a rafter bears to a building. Fazang’s explanations are notoriously dense. Roughly speaking, it seems that a dharma has wholeness insofar as it creates some whole; particularity insofar as it is numerically distinct from that whole; identity insofar as it includes all other parts of the whole; difference insofar as it is numerically distinct from those others; integration insofar as its creating the whole does not interfere with every other dharma of the whole doing the same; and disintegration insofar as its creative success does not depend upon the cooperation of other dharmas in the whole.

4.4 Panjiao

The first nine chapters of Fazang’s Treatise on the Five Teachings of Huayan provide, in effect, an encyclopedic argument for a panjiao system that positions Fazang’s views as surpassing the limitations of all prior Buddhist traditions, but Fazang provides no convenient summary. With some minor exceptions, the basic outline follows Zhiyan’s panjiao.

The first teaching in Fazang’s panjiao—the one he ranks as conveying the least truth, as being the most limited in its skillful means—is what he calls Hinayana (and what we now call Abhidharma). Fazang offers three criticisms of this teaching. First, he claims that the Abhidharmic analysis of consciousness is incomplete, because it does not provide a thorough analysis of repository consciousness (alayavijnana)—that occurs only with the Yogacara branch of the Mahayana tradition. Second, he claims that the Abhidharmic analysis of dharmas is incomplete, because no school within the tradition manages to establish a list of dharmas that contains all the dharmas contained by all other lists, and because the tradition cannot seem to resolve disagreements on the status of certain putative dharmas. Third, and most importantly, he claims that the Abhidharmic tradition remains committed to the error of Eternalism by virtue of denying that dharmas are empty.

The second teaching in Fazang’s panjiao is what he calls Elementary Teaching of the Mahayana. These are the teachings of Madhyamaka and Yogacara, represented by figures such as Nagarjuna and Vasubandhu in India, and by Jizang and Xuanzang in China. Fazang ranks this teaching as superior to the first because it teaches that everything, dharma or not, is empty, and because the Yogacara tradition provides a thorough analysis of repository consciousness. But, according to Fazang, the Yogacarin analysis of consciousness is erroneous because it mistakes the repository consciousness for some sort of ultimate reality. The repository consciousness, according to Yogacara tradition, contains impurities and defilements. Yet ultimate reality, as Fazang understands it, is free of such imperfections.

The third teaching in Fazang’s panjiao is what he calls the Final Teaching of the Mahayana. Fazang has in mind teachings associated with tathagatagarbha theory, as present in texts such as Awakening of Faith in Mahayana. According to Fazang, the Final Teaching improves upon the Elementary Teaching by virtue of correctly understanding ultimate reality as pure and undefiled—not as repository consciousness, but as tathagatagarbha. The Final Teaching also transcends the limitations of the prior two teachings—each of which focuses on one of the pair “existence” and “emptiness” to the exclusion of the other—by treating ultimate reality as having two aspects: an aspect of existing, and an aspect of being empty.

There is a latent tension within tathagatagarbha theory, as Fazang understands it. This is the tension between conceptualizing ultimate reality as tathagatagarbha and conceptualizing tathagatagarbha as ineffable. This is why Fazang ranks the Final Teaching of the Mahayana as inferior to a fourth teaching, which he calls the Sudden Teaching. This is the teaching of Vimalakirti, from the Vimalakirti Sutra, who, in responding to a request to characterize ultimate reality, answers with silence. This is superior to the Final Teaching of Mahayana, according to Fazang, because the only way to succeed at conceptualizing the ultimate nature of reality is to refuse to conceptualize in the first place.

The fifth and final teaching in Fazang’s panjiao—the pinnacle of Buddhist teaching, in his view—is what he calls the Round Teaching. Here Fazang refers to his own teaching, which he positions as developing the teachings of his master, Zhiyan, and which he locates in fetal form among the writings of Dushun and amidst the many verses of the Avatamsaka Sutra. While the first teaching in Fazang’s panjiao focuses on the fabricated nature of reality, and while the three intermediate teachings focus on the consummate nature of reality, Fazang claims that only the Round Teaching accommodates all three natures of reality. For, according to the Round Teaching, everything is empty, and so the teaching correctly understands the “fabricated” nature of what seems to be not-empty; but the consummate nature of ultimate reality is ineffable, and so the teaching manages to avoid the limitations of the Elementary and Final Teachings of Mahayana. Since, in Fazang’s view, only the Round Teaching understands the other-dependent nature of ultimate reality—a nature ignored by other Buddhist traditions—he concludes that the Round Teaching, as expressed by his metaphysics, is superior to all other Buddhist teachings.

5. Li Tongxuan (635–730)

Li Tongxuan is a contemporary of Fazang’s who remained relatively unknown during his lifetime, and so he lacks the honor of being considered one of the patriarchs of Huayan Buddhism. However, Li’s work came to exert substantial influence upon subsequent Buddhist tradition, through its impact on the Korean monk Chinul (1158–1210), the Japanese monk Moye (1173–1232), and the Linji Chan masters Juefan Huihong (1071–1128) and Dahui Zonggao (1089–1163). We know little about Li’s life. He lived as a reclusive lay exegete of Buddhism, leading an austere lifestyle involving a daily meal of only seven rice cakes made with dates and cypress. He also seems to have had extensive knowledge of the Book of Changes (Ch. Yijing), presumably due to his being an offspring of the Tang royal family. Li influenced the Huayan tradition through a handful of writings: a commentary on the Avatamsaka Sutra (Ch. Xin huayan jing lun; T36.1739), a summary of that commentary, and a chapter-by-chapter summary of the Avatamsaka Sutra itself. His writings are notable for using the theory of yin-yang and the Five Phases, as well as appealing to correlative reasoning, to discern soteriological significance in minor details such as geographical directions, numbers, and the names of bodhisattvas.

Li’s central contribution to Huayan tradition is his teaching of the one true dharma-realm (Ch. yi zhen fajie). According to this teaching, all places and objects in the world are true just as they are. There is no real ontological separation between the sacred and the secular, enlightenment and ignorance, or the Buddha and sentient beings. Li’s teaching of the one true dharma-realm supports a subitist approach to enlightenment, whereby sentient beings attain Buddhahood suddenly rather than gradually. It supports, as well, his decision to explicate Buddhist ideas using classical Chinese texts, as manifested in his frequent appeal to the Book of Changes in his commentary on the Avatamsaka Sutra. According to Li, Chinese sages such as Kongzi (Confucius) and Laozi (the traditional founder of Daoism), and Chinese classics, offer instructions from bodhisattvas by virtue of their endeavoring to edify sentient beings—and because, according to Li’s teaching, the ordinary human condition is the foundation for enlightenment in this lifetime.

Li justifies his teaching of the one true dharma-realm with a distinctive and non-temporal approach to existence. According to Li, existence is not only subject to change but also entirely complete at each moment. Past, present, and future co-exist at every moment. This non-temporality of existence resolves several problems Li identifies with the notions of cause and effect. The first problem pertains to conceptual relation. If cause and effect are not simultaneous (arising at one and the same moment), Li argues, then because causes are not considered causes until their effects arise, effects precede their causes. If, by contrast, cause and effect are simultaneous, causes become causes exactly when effects arise. The second problem pertains to temporal relation. If cause and effect are not simultaneous, Li argues, there is an inexplicable gap between the time at which a cause arises and the time at which the effect of that cause arises. If, by contrast, cause and effect are simultaneous, there is no such gap.

If past, present, and future intermingle, then insofar as sentient beings who are now ignorant subsequently gain enlightenment, there is no ontological difference between being a sentient being and being a Buddha: sentient beings are simultaneously Buddhas. Li here diverges from Fazang’s more canonical Huayan teaching, whereby ignorance and enlightenment are different ontological aspects of the same one reality. On Li’s account, the difference between sentient beings and Buddhas, and between ignorance and enlightenment, is merely epistemological, a matter of confusion about the nature and conditions of dukkha.

Li finds scriptural support for his non-temporal approach to existence, and his associated teaching of the one true dharma-realm, in two tales. The first, the tale of the dragon girl, occurs in the Lotus Sutra, where the dragon girl attains enlightenment in a single moment. The second, the tale of Sudhana, occurs in the Avatamsaka Sutra, where Sudhana attains enlightenment in a single lifetime. Li interprets both tales as examples illustrating that the moment in which the mind arises to practice the Buddhist path is the same as the moment in which one attains perfect enlightenment. Insofar as practice is the cause of the effect that is enlightenment, it follows that cause and effect are simultaneous—and so all times coexist in one moment. (For Li, the tale of the dragon girl is less perfect than the tale of Sudhana, because the dragon girl, unlike Sudhana, changes her body and geographical location upon attaining enlightenment.)

6. Chengguan (738–839)

Chengguan’s life was marked by continual encounter with difference. He lived through the reigns of nine Tang emperors, and his studies ranged widely—including Buddhist doctrines and meditation practices, classic works indigenous to China, as well as the Indian Vedas and works on Indian science. Tradition identifies Chengguan as the fourth patriarch of the Huayan School, because he studied under Fashen (718–778), who was a student of Fazang’s student Huiyuan (673–743).

Chengguan was a voluminous writer. He authored a commentary (with an accompanying subcommentary) on the Avatamsaka Sutra that displaced Fazang’s with respect to authority and influence, as well as an influential commentary on Dushun’s Discernments of the Dharmadhatu (Ch. Huayan fajie xuan jing; T45.1883, trans. Cleary 1983, 71–124). He gave frequent lectures to imperial officials, and he wrote many essays at their request. Chengguan’s writings are notable for quoting frequently from Chinese classics, borrowing words but not meanings for the sake of making his teaching accessible to educated literati. This style is likely a response to the weakened political status of Buddhism following the An Lushan rebellion (755–763), which increased Chinese suspicions of foreign traditions such as Buddhism and thereby heightened a need to show how Buddhist teachings harmonize with native Chinese traditions.

Chengguan’s most distinctive contribution to Huayan tradition is his theory of the fourfold dharma-realm. This theory identifies four ways of encountering the dharma-realm of dependent arising. Chengguan calls the first the dharma-realm of shi. Shi, for Chengguan, refers to form, mind, and other characteristics. Chengguan characterizes this realm as conditioned, akin to an illusion by virtue of lacking true substance and nature, and containing unreal characteristics. It is the dharma-realm encountered as particularized into innumerably many distinct individuals. Chengguan calls the second dharma-realm the dharma-realm of li. Chengguan understands li to refer to substance, nature, emptiness, quiescence, the immutable nature of all dharmas. He characterizes this realm as identical with true nature. It is the dharma-realm encountered as originally pure and free from defilement.

Chengguan groups the remaining two dharma-realms together as dharma-realms of non-obstruction. The third, the dharma-realm of non-obstruction among shi and li, correlates with the second discernment from Dushun’s Discernments of the Dharmadhatu. The fourth, the dharma-realm of non-obstruction among shi and shi, correlates with the third discernment from Dushun’s Discernments of the Dharmadhatu. Chengguan endorses Dushun’s analysis of these realms. He adds, to Dushun’s insights, the claim that the non-obstruction of li and shi is the foundation for the non-obstruction among shi. His meaning is twofold. From a practical perspective, he means that meditative insight into li is a prerequisite for meditative insight into shi. From a theoretical perspective, he means that shi are mutually identical and inclusive by virtue of their common penetration by li: since each shi is identical with and includes li, and since li is identical with and includes all shi, each shi is identical with and includes all other shi.

Chengguan further develops Huayan tradition by subsuming Chan teachings under the perfect teaching of Huayan. Huiyuan, Fazang’s disciple, had criticized Fazang’s panjiao for including the Sudden Teaching. His criticism was twofold. First, the Sudden Teaching does not belong, because Fazang’s panjiao ranks teachings with respect to their content but the sudden teaching—as inexpressible—lacks content. Second, if one ranks teachings with respect to how well they express truth about ultimate reality, then the Sudden Teaching, by virtue of teaching the inexpressibility of ultimate truth, is distinct from neither the Final Teaching of Mahayana nor the Round Teaching.

Chengguan presents Huiyuan’s panjiao as an artifact of his impoverished understanding of Chan meditation practice. In response, and in an effort to defend Fazang’s panjiao, Chengguan develops his own panjiao. He identifies the Sudden Teaching with the teachings of various Chan traditions. These teachings, as Chengguan understands them, use words to express the identity of mind and Buddha; and the direct mind-to-mind transmission of this truth suffices to distinguish Chan from other Buddhist traditions—with respect to practice if not content.

Despite Chengguan’s unfavorable evaluations of Huiyuan’s teachings, Chengguan followed Huiyuan in explicitly criticizing indigenous Chinese teachings of the ru (Confucians) and the Daoists. He identifies the cardinal teaching of the ru tradition as the five constant virtues—benevolence, righteousness, propriety, wisdom, sincerity; the cardinal teaching of Daoism as spontaneity (Ch. ziran); and the cardinal teaching of Buddhism as causality (Ch. yinyuan). Chengguan’s criticisms center upon the claim that non-Buddhist teachings endorse a kind of pseudo-causality that abnegates responsibility for actions and denigrates the role of wisdom. Against the Yijing (associated with Confucians), he argues that locating the source of the myriad things in the transformations of yin and yang ascribes responsibility for wisdom or stupidity to the impersonal workings of heaven, thereby denying the role of consciousness in creating reality. He develops a similar criticism against the Daodejing, which locates the source of the myriad things in Dao and denigrates practices of cultivation as superfluous. Against the Zhuangzi, finally, he argues that the emphasis upon spontaneity as fundamental means that enlightenment arises without cause rather than through careful practice, and that this is erroneous by virtue of ignoring the way ignorance and enlightenment depend upon prior conditions.

7. Guifeng Zongmi (780–841)

Tradition identifies Zongmi as the fifth patriarch of Huayan. Zongmi spent his early years studying Confucian classics and Buddhism before training with the Chan (Zen) master Suizhou Daoyuan (750–820). Then, following a brief period of studying the Avatamsaka Sutra with Chengguan, Zongmi began an extensive period of writing. His efforts focused, at first, on gathering commentaries on various sutras and writing his own. In time, he focused on compiling Chan texts to create a canon for the Chan tradition. These efforts resulted in his achieving status as a patriarch for the Heze school of Chan. Although Zongmi’s Collected Writings on the Source of Chan (Ch. Chanyuan zhuquanji) is no longer extant, its preface, Prolegomena to the Collected Writings on the Source of Chan (Ch. Chanyuan zhuquanji duxu; T48.2015, trans. Broughton 2004), survives.

Zongmi’s major philosophical work is Inquiry into the Origin of Humanity (Ch. Yuanren lun; T45.1886, trans. Gregory 1995). The title of this book might be a play on Inquiry into the Origin of the Way, an influential anti-Buddhist essay by the Confucian philosopher Han Yu (768–824). Zongmi’s book offers, in effect, an innovative panjiao system. The central innovation is its inclusion of Daoism and Confucianism. Zongmi’s discussion of the strengths and weaknesses of each view are detailed, and here we present only some of his arguments.

Zongmi states that Kongzi and Laozi are both great sages, and that their ethical teachings are extremely beneficial to the common people. However, Confucians and Daoists claim that humans, animals, and inanimate objects all come into existence from the same underlying “vital force” (Ch. qi, roughly similar to the “boundless” of Anaximander). Zongmi argues that this creates an insoluble problem. Since vital force is originally without consciousness, then since we receive this force in the same way grasses and trees do, either we should lack consciousness or else grasses and trees should be conscious. In addition, Confucians and Daoists believe that fate is governed by Heaven (Ch. tian, an impersonal higher power), which acts in accordance with the moral Way. Zongmi argues that they cannot explain why a moral Heaven allows the virtuous to suffer and the vicious to flourish. Since some who lack virtue flourish, while others with virtue suffer, the distribution of rewards and punishments is unjust.

Zongmi argues that Buddhists can resolve both dilemmas. Regarding the problem of evil, Zongmi appeals to the Buddhist doctrine of reincarnation to explain how the distribution of rewards and punishments in the universe is ultimately just. According to this doctrine, the distribution of rewards and punishments is determined not only by one’s actions in one’s current life but also by one’s actions in previous lives. So the flourishing of the vicious, and the suffering of the virtuous, is attributable to karma from their past lives.

According to Zongmi, the only plausible solution to the problem of consciousness is that fundamental reality is mental, and non-consciousness is the result of a kind of self-deception, where the mind fails to realize its objects as manifestations of itself.

8. Later Developments and Influence

8.1 Neo-Confucianism

Competition for power, prestige, and wealth led to sectarian conflicts among Buddhists, Daoists, and Confucians. In addition, some aspects of institutional Buddhism were socially problematic, including the vast amounts of tax-exempt wealth controlled by monasteries and extreme religious practices such as self-immolation and self-mutilation, which were endorsed even by leading figures like Zhiyan and Fazang. Eventually, Daoists encouraged the Tang Emperor Wuzong to launch the Great Anti-Buddhist Persecution (Ch. huichang huifo) of 842–846. During this period, Buddhist monks and nuns were forcibly defrocked, temples and shrines were destroyed, and their property seized. Although the persecution only lasted until the emperor’s death and was reversed by the next emperor, Buddhism never fully recovered from the damage to its social influence and intellectual prestige.

Following the decline of Buddhism, the movement known in the West as “Neo-Confucianism” became increasingly influential. Neo-Confucianism presents itself as a revival of the original teachings of Confucianism against the mistaken doctrines of Daoism and Buddhism. However, after centuries of Buddhist dominance in philosophy, it was almost inevitable that Neo-Confucian thinkers would unconsciously reinterpret their tradition in the light of Buddhist concepts. For example, we saw how the Chinese term li (principle/pattern) is central to Huayan metaphysics. It is also central to Neo-Confucian metaphysics, even though the term is of peripheral importance in the Confucian classics. For example, of the Four Books of the Confucian canon, “li” occurs precisely zero times in all of the Analects of Confucius and the Great Learning, only twice in the Mean, and a mere seven times in the Mengzi. In none of the passages where it does occur is there any suggestion that the term has any deep metaphysical importance. (A typical use is in a dialogue in which someone asks Mengzi for help with his lack of eloquence, describing himself as “not patterned (li) in regard to my mouth.”) Nonetheless, Neo-Confucian philosophers like Zhu Xi (1130–1200) repeatedly use the term to explain what they take to be the underlying meaning of the classics, and give it a metaphysical meaning very reminiscent of Indra’s net. Similarly, the Neo-Confucian emphasis on the dangers of “selfish desires” (Ch. siyu) and “selfish thoughts” (Ch. siyi) is not characteristic of ancient Confucianism, but rather reflects the centrality of selfishness in Buddhist accounts of human wrongdoing.

8.2 Contemporary Huayan

Huayan Buddhism has largely died out as a distinct religious movement in China, Korea, and Japan; however, Huayan texts continue to be studied and have been particularly influential on Chan Buddhism (Jap. Zen). Huayan has also had a substantial influence on other philosophies. The so-called “New Confucian Manifesto” advocates the “rounded and spiritual wisdom” of the East as opposed to the “square” wisdom of the West (see Harris (trans.), Part 11, Other Internet Resources). Although they identify the ultimate source of this distinction as the Classic of Changes, their description of it is reminiscent of the “round” wisdom advocated by panjiao theorists. In addition, Mou Zongsan, one of the co-authors of the “Manifesto,” wrote extensively and sympathetically about Huayan. Among contemporary philosophers, Graham Priest (2015) has shown how to formalize the ontology of Huayan using non-standard set theory.


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