Joseph Butler’s Moral Philosophy

First published Wed Oct 17, 2012; substantive revision Mon Nov 27, 2023

Joseph Butler is best known for his criticisms of the hedonic and egoistic “selfish” theories associated with Hobbes and Bernard Mandeville and for his positive arguments that self-love and conscience are not at odds if properly understood (and indeed promote and sanction the same actions). In addition to his importance as a moral philosopher Butler was also an influential Anglican theologian. Unsurprisingly his theology and philosophy were connected — his main writings in moral philosophy were published sermons, a work of natural theology, and a brief dissertation attached to that work. Although most of Butler’s moral arguments make rich use of passages from scripture and familiar Christian stories and concepts, they make little reference to — and depend little on the reader having — any particular religious commitments. Indeed many of his arguments do not rest on the reader having any religious commitments at all. His Analogy of Religion was aimed to convince deists of the truth of core doctrines of natural and revealed theology but the argument only assumes the premises Butler shared with them. This has led to his philosophy being of interest to both secular and Christian moralists, and to debate as to how much and what of his ethics rests on his Christian commitments.

1. Life, Works, and General Overview

Butler was born in 1692 and attended a dissenting academy where he read current philosophy — including up to date logic, and works of John Locke and Samuel Clarke. While a student there Butler wrote a letter to Clarke pointing out two problems in Clarke’s arguments for God’s unicity and God’s omnipresence in Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God. Butler’s criticisms led to a mutually admiring correspondence. Clarke arranged to have the correspondence published in 1716, although Butler’s letters appeared anonymously. Shortly thereafter Butler joined the Church of England, attended Oxford, and was ordained. This led to his appointment as preacher at Rolls Chapel, the chapel associated with the London equity courts, where he served until 1726. During this period he also earned a law degree. In 1726 he published a selection of his sermons as Fifteen Sermons Preached at the Rolls Chapel. It appeared in a second edition in 1729 with corrections and with the addition of an important synoptic “Preface.” In 1736 Butler published his major work of natural theology, the Analogy of Religion, the work for which he was best known in his lifetime, with two brief but important dissertations: “Of Personal Identity” and “Of the Nature of Virtue” (hence “Dissertation on Virtue”). In the same year he was appointed Queen Caroline’s cleric, and after her death the following year he rose to become Bishop of Bristol (1738) and eventually Bishop of Durham (1750). A number of his sermons from the latter part of his career were published individually. Some of them were collected as Six Sermons on Public Occasions and published in 1749. This was followed by the “Durham Charge” (a work exhorting the clergy of his diocese) published a year before Butler’s death in 1752 (For more on Butler’s life see Cunliffe 2008, from which most of the above information is derived; see also Cunliffe 1992 and Tennant 2011).

Butler’s moral philosophy is characterized by a very high degree of analytic rigor and argumentative care. This is all the more surprising for the fact that many of these rigorous arguments are presented in sermons (and particularly in footnotes to sermons). The manner in which Butler argues, and the details of the particular arguments, are indeed what many philosophers who have engaged with him have found most inspiring, even when they have rejected his conclusions whole-heartedly. Butler’s first three sermons provide a general framework for his moral philosophy via a teleological account of human nature. On the basis of this account of human nature Butler argues that self-love and benevolence or virtue -- principles that other moral philosophers have seen as in tension — are not only not in tension but mutually supporting when properly understood. The remaining sermons consider a number of key features of moral psychology — self-deception, benevolence, forgiveness, compassion — and further develop the discussions of self-love and virtue initiated in the first three sermons. They make manifest that Butler thought that the details of moral psychology when carefully presented and rigorously sorted ruled out many questionable commitments that looser philosophers took them to warrant. These particular moral psychological inquiries are followed by a discussion of love of God. For Butler this was a central and unifying sentiment that showed the continuity between morals and natural religion. Butler concluded the Sermons with a discussion of human ignorance, which in conjunction with his discussions of self-deceit underscored one of his central themes: the limits of human self-knowledge and knowledge of divine design, limits that had to be continuously in mind when making moral arguments. Butler’s later sermons, the “Dissertation on Virtue,” and the sections of the Analogy of Religion that concern moral philosophy, also continue to develop many of these themes.

2. Moral Science

In his “Preface” to the 2nd edition of his Sermons Butler sketched his vision of “Morals, considered as a Science,” (“Preface,” §6) — i.e. speculative moral philosophy in need of defense from speculative objections as opposed to practical moral counsel or revealed religion. Morals considered as a science proceeds either from abstract relations of things or from matters of fact (“Preface,” §12). Clarke and William Wollaston were influential philosophers who argued primarily from abstract relations to moral obligations, duties, virtues, etc. in their moral systems. Clarke in particular had argued that we have a priori access to the eternal “fitnesses” of things through certain, abstract, and necessary quasi-mathematical arguments (Clarke 1706) that entail necessary moral obligations and duties insofar as actions accord with or fail to accord with eternal and immutable realities. In his correspondence with Clarke, the young Butler noted his discovery of a new method for establishing truths in morals (Butler/Clarke 1716, §1). Although the correspondence took place a few years before Butler delivered the Sermons, it seems likely that the method he alluded to in the correspondence was the nascent method that he would deploy in the first three sermons (which Butler stressed were argued strictly from matters of fact) (“Preface” §13).

Butler had little doubt that arguments from abstract relations and arguments from matters of fact were complementary, but he held that the latter had major advantages over the former as a method in ethics. First it was in “a peculiar Manner adapted to satisfie a fair Mind; and is more easily applicable to the several particular Relations and Circumstances in Life” (“Preface,” §12). In other words, arguments from matters of fact allowed us to discern moral standards in human actions and for the standards to be accessible to and motivating for ordinary reflecting agents (to be discussed in 3.). Whereas the abstract relations of things might establish for Clarke or Wollaston that “Vice is contrary to the Nature and Reasons of Things” (“Preface,” §12), arguments of matter of fact established that vice is “a violation or breaking in upon our own Nature,” (“Preface,” §12). These fitnesses or proportions were to be discovered in our nature and although they might be consistent with a priori metaphysical relations, the norms and values that they determined were obliging and motivating in absence of access to said relations. As such they were relativized to human nature, authoritative for it, and accessible via reflection on and observation of our actions and those of others

But one might still worry that moral judgments that rested on probable matters of fact were less secure than those found to be in accordance with eternal fitnesses, even with the aforementioned advantages. Seven years later, Butler offered a methodological argument in the “Introduction” to the Analogy that might respond to this objection if applied to morals (although Butler framed the point more generally). Although deductive arguments like those championed by Clarke were secure when considered abstractly, they were open to doubt when applied to matters of fact about actions or characters. This was because one needed a hypothesis of how to apply the abstract demonstrative truths to observed facts (“Introduction” §7) — how to fit the fitnesses to actions so to speak — and this hypothesis itself was not deductively secure. Butler offered the analogy of Cartesian physiology. Cartesian physiology applies Cartesian geometry to living bodies. But one needs a probable hypothesis to move from the abstract truths of Cartesian geometry to actual bodies and diseases. For example, “this spleen is roughly an oval and the way it interacts with the liver roughly results in this sort of mechanism.” The mechanism itself as represented abstractly is a certain geometrical relationship. But in order to apply the mechanism to blood and guts, one needs to have a probable, i.e. not certain, hypothesis about how the ideal mechanism fits with the facts on the ground — that this arrangement of blood and guts is best captured by this mechanism not that one. A similar problem arises when applying eternal and abstract relations to particular moral circumstances and actions. The need for a hypothesis as to how the relations might fit actual actions rendered the evaluation of the action merely probable even though the rightness and wrongness to which the action was to conform — the eternal fitness — was known certainly.

Since both Clarke’s method and Butler’s method were probable, Clarke’s probable in application to actions and Butler’s in relying on matters of fact about human nature in establishing facts about vice and virtue, one might conclude skeptically that both failed. But Butler argued that a probable course of action could still be morally obligatory. He claimed that probable reasoning could result in sufficient certainty for moral action when an action could be shown to be more probably good than either inaction or an opposed action. Lacking further evidence the more probably good action is morally obligatory. This suggested a way in which probable evidence, for example probable evidence for the existence of an afterlife, could be obliging on us and was crucial to his arguments for the reasonableness of basic Christian teachings in the Analogy.

3. Human Nature

Because of the absence of a priori demonstrative premises, a moral philosopher arguing from matters of fact had to have detailed knowledge of the principles of action in human nature and of moral psychology as well as arguments to show how these principles had bearing on virtue and vice. Human beings, according to Butler, had within their nature various instincts and principles of action: desires for particular pleasures, benevolence, self-love, and conscience. The practitioner of moral science aimed to discover what these principles are and the ways in which these desires, reasons, and motivations fit together. This is difficult in practice since the actions that we observe in ourselves and in others almost always draw on more than one principle. For example both self-love and the particular passions often go into the motivation or justification for particular actions. Consequently the moral scientist could be said to bring a version of Locke’s negative program of underbrush clearing in the theory of knowledge to moral philosophy, by analyzing and disambiguating principles, motivations, and passions which give rise to actions which we judge to be virtuous and vicious. At the same time Butler’s way of thinking about morality as dictated by nature had strong resonances with the Stoics and other ancient moralists.

In order to show how these principles, motivations, and passions bear on virtue and vice Butler distinguished between three senses of “nature” (Sermon 2). Nature (N1) can refer to any principle or element that belongs to or motivates human beings. It can also refer (N2) to the strongest among a group of principles, i.e., it is in our nature to get angry, not to giggle, when unjustly accused. Finally it can refer (N3) to natural supremacy, i.e., that a principle acts as a law, guide, or authority to other principles or passions. Butler suggests that whatever is naturally supreme unites various principles in a teleological system. Consequently Butler can be seen to be arguing that when we take a survey of all that belongs to human nature (N1) we discover that conscience has natural supremacy (N3) in a united hierarchy (although see Section Five for Butler’s claim that self-love is also a supreme principle). N1 principles can be identified piecemeal, particular passions that belong to the human frame. N2 principles are relational, i.e. the strongest of a group of principles. N3 principles are relational as well but they are also rational and they unify other sorts of principles. By educing a hierarchy in the principles of human nature, and by showing that the hierarchy is independent of the strength (N2) of the principles as motivations for action, we can demonstrate that what we ought to do morally (N3) may differ from what we are most strongly motivated to do (N2) without reflection.

Butler’s best-known arguments for the natural hierarchy of principles draw on a number of analogies: to a watch (“Preface”), to a civil constitution (Sermon III), to a tree, and to a machine (Sermon 3 Note 1). Just as a clock is not an individual gear, or a pile of gears, but is what it is due to the ways in which the gears move together towards an end, so too human nature is not a particular principle of action, or a bundle of principles, but the interaction of principles, desires, and reasons, as a system towards ends. That our nature is structured towards ends, which Butler takes to be empirically evident, gives evidence of a hierarchy of principles to attain the ends, a hierarchy where some principles must be naturally subordinate to others (N3). This shows that there is something natural to us in the sense of N3, in addition to N1 and N2 (both of which are a matter of observed fact). “A civil constitution implies in it united strength, various subordinates under one direction … a superior faculty whose office it is to adjust, manage, and preside over them” (Sermon III §2). The governing faculty has authority. When a civil constitution is violated or overthrown by “meer power” this goes against the nature of the constitution. When a machine’s or a tree’s parts no longer bear proportionate relations among themselves and are no longer guided by superior principles, it is broken or sick. By analogy, when forceful principles and passions (N2) go against authoritative principles (N3), or when the principles and passions no longer bear the same relations or are in conflict this goes against our nature and is unnatural.

The analogy suggests that it is unnatural when a N2 principle overpowers a N3 principle. The subordination of N2 principles to N3 principles is natural and preserves and guides our natures. N3 principles are what we ought to act on or act in accordance with. Deciding whether Butler holds that we ought to act on them just because they are in accordance with our nature or we ought to act on them because they are morally right and in accordance with our nature has led to some of the most salient objections to Butler’s moral philosophy (see Section 4).

The supremacy of conscience in human nature can also be shown by a comparison of the constitutions and natures of animals with human nature. Animals are driven by principles similar to (or identical to) those that give rise to human actions: they share many of our passions and they too are driven by self-interest. When animals act according to these principles they act appropriately to their natures (in senses N1 and N2). But humans have a principle, conscience, which animals lack. This suggests that when humans act only from those principles that they share with animals and not according to conscience they do not act suitably to what is distinctive to their whole nature, and in particular suitable to that end which draws on many of the principles of human nature .

Interpreters of Butler have disagreed about the degree to which Butler’s teleological and hierarchical account of human nature relies on theological premises, and on what sort of teleology is at play. Some interpreters hold that Butler’s arguments that there are N3 principles only go through if we assume that God created human beings for a purpose and in accordance with providence (Darwall 1995; Penelhum 1985). On this account what human beings ought to be or ought to do follows from what they were designed for. Humans were designed for virtue and so they ought to be virtuous. Others suggest that the argument has support without recourse to theological arguments, and that the teleological facts about human nature imply norms and values that are obliging without reference to design (Wedgwood 2007; Irwin 2008).

4. Conscience and the principles of human nature

Like Shaftesbury, Butler held that conscience is a reflective principle. Shaftesbury asserted that “every reasoning or reflecting Creature is, by his Nature, forc’d to endure the Review of his own Mind, and Actions; and to have Representations of himself, and his inward Affairs, constantly passing before him, obvious to him, and revolving in his Mind” (Shaftesbury 1699 II.1 [119]). For Butler conscience is more specifically a reflection on prospective or retrospective actions of oneself and others according to moral principles. When we judge characters we reflect on actions in relation to the capacities of agents (“Dissertation on Virtue” §5). Butler presumes that all ordinary human beings have a sense of right and wrong in presuming that the moral principles are accessible for reflection, and that the many ways of describing this sense of right and wrong all point to one and the same capacity: “Conscience, moral Reason, moral sense, or divine Reason… as a Sentiment of the Understanding, or as a Perception of the Heart” (“Dissertation on Virtue” §1). There are a number of elements in the natural supremacy of conscience that help us to understand the nature of its authority.

First, according to Butler conscience has a unique authority among the principles belonging to human nature. As evidenced in the civil constitution analogy, we recognize that it should direct other principles and not vice-versa and that the authority is proper to conscience and no other principle. Further we recognize that any ordinary reasonable person has a conscience and ought to obey it. The term “conscience” was commonly employed in both theological and philosophical contexts (Shaftesbury identified it with reflective reason) but was also a legal term of art among the equity lawyers to whom Butler preached his sermons. In the legal context it had the sense of acting minimally as an ordinary reasonable person would and maximally as a fully informed, ideal reasoner would (see Garrett 2012).

Next, conscience is closely connected to autonomy: when we act according to conscience we act as a law unto ourselves or according to a law of our own nature. By being a law unto oneself Butler seemed to mean being motivated by our inner sense of moral rightness and wrongness and not being motivated by considerations external to the rightness or wrongness of acting or not acting (Sermon III §6). For Butler, like Clarke, moral law, duty, obligation, or virtue, is right or wrong, morally good or bad independent of any punishment or reward (“Preface” § 29; “Dissertation on Virtue” §8). Butler criticized those forms of natural law and Hobbesian accounts of motivation that held that I am morally motivated and given an authoritative reason for acting by a law sanctioned with rewards and punishments by a divine or civil legislator. He argued that insofar as sanctions are superadded to the moral rightness or wrongness of the act there is no connection between the sanction and the rightness or wrongness of the action beyond the arbitrary will of the legislator. This connection is insufficient for moral motivation. When I act primarily or only due to an external sanction I am not acting from a law unto myself (see Darwall 1992).

This law of conscience is readily accessible to us — “the most near and intimate, the most certain and known” (“Preface,” § 26) — in a way that probable consequences of prudential or interested actions are not. That an authoritative principle dictates that we ought to intend a good action does not depend on external factors that might prevent or mitigate the desired prudential outcome (but see McNaughton 2012). Relatedly, ends may vary but conscience is “fixed, steady, and immovable.”

Butler argued in the Sermons that conscience was a principle superior to and governing of the particular passions, affections, and instincts and established a hierarchy among them (Sermon XIII §7). As previously discussed the hierarchy is natural. But due to ambiguities in Butler’s presentation, in particular due to differences in the aims of individual sermons, there are a number of ways to understand the relation between conscience and the other principles. On one reading conscience is authoritative over the other main principles discussed by Butler — self-love and benevolence (if it is a principle — see Section 5) — and all when properly understood promote the same actions in accordance with our nature. When we seek our own goods and those of others in accordance with conscience or reflection we act virtuously and we also promote our private happiness. But, there are also passages that suggest that Butler held self-love to be a principle on par with conscience (Sidgwick III.12 §2) or even above it (Sermon IX §15). And there are passages where Butler suggests that benevolence contains all the virtues, and consequently this too seems to be a principle on par with or identical with conscience. Consequently there are multiple plausible hierarchies. Interpreters who advocate hierarchies which place self-love or benevolence on par with (or even above) conscience normally either argue that they are still consistent with the supremacy of conscience or see this as showing a serious problem in Butler’s arguments.

Here are few of the problems. If it is reasonable to obey conscience, then “the rules that Conscience lays down” are either reasonable in and of themselves or they are “the dictates of an arbitrary authority” (Sidgwick, III.13 §2). If the latter, then it is hard to see what justifies this arbitrary authority. But if the former, then Sidgwick argues that there is no independent moral authority for conscience — a conclusion which Sidgwick thought perfectly reasonable — and Butler is caught in the same justificatory circle that the Stoic arguments for life according to nature were: “it is reasonable to live according to Nature, and it is natural to live according to Reason” (ibid.). A related objection is that since both conscience and self-love are rational principles and in general cannot be in conflict, conscience just dictates whatever self-love dictates and vice-versa. Consequently conscience cannot have a distinctive authority. Sturgeon identified a different circularity connected with the justification of the supremacy of conscience. Since Butler held that virtuous actions are those in conformity to the nature of the agent and vicious ones not in conformity, according to Sturgeon “the doctrine of natural authority of conscience is entirely superfluous” (Sturgeon, 316). This is because if conscience points to the wrongness of an action the wrongness must be due to the action’s conformity or non-conformity with our nature — i.e. due to a conflict among principles. Conscience can’t be pointing to a conflict with itself since that would be circular. So it must be a conflict with the next highest principle: self-interest. But then conscience just asserts what self-interest dictates, and so the testimony of conscience is redundant and has no special authority. Put differently, Butler assumes that his argument that virtue is natural entails an argument for the supremacy of conscience. But there is no good reason to assume the entailment — in fact the two are not only independent, but in conflict. There have been a number of responses to Sturgeon. Penelhum, notably, denied that Butler was committed to the “Full Naturalistic Thesis” and argued that Butler instead held “the independent existence of the judgments of right and wrong” from judgments of “naturalness and unnaturalness” (Penelhum 1990, 68; see also Irwin 2008 §707 and McNaughton 2012).

5. Self-Love and Benevolence

As previously noted, Butler discusses two other important constituents of human nature in addition to conscience and the particular passions: self-love and benevolence. Butler’s extremely influential dismissal of psychological egoism was central to his analysis of self-love. C. D. Broad claimed that “he killed the theory so thoroughly that he sometimes seems to the modern reader to be flogging dead horses” (Broad 1930, 55). For Butler the kind of egoism exemplified by Hobbes — “the selfish theory” in eighteenth-century parlance — rests on a failure to distinguish principles from passions (for context see Maurer 2019). There is a trivial sense in which all of our passions are our own and the pleasure we have in discharging or pursuing any passion is “self” love. But it is also uninteresting: we can’t conclude much from the fact that every passion we take pleasure in is our passion. We certainly can’t conclude that human beings are always motivated by selfishness. That selfish theorists thought we could was due in part to their confusing the “ownership of an impulse with its object” (Broad 1930, 65)—the inference from that the passions are ours to that we are the objects of the passions. Although the passions belong to us it does not therefore follow that our “self,” or our self-gratification, is the object of the passion.

One of the most discussed passages from the Sermons, the so-called “stone argument” (Sober 1992) has often been taken as an argument against psychological hedonism. In the passage Butler purports to establish that “all particular appetites and passions are towards external things themselves, distinct from the pleasure arising from them” due to the fact “that there could not be this pleasure, were it not for that prior suitableness between the object and the passion” (Sermon XI §6). Butler then concludes were this not the case then “there could be no enjoyment or delight from one thing more than another, from eating food more than from swallowing a stone, if there were not an affection or appetite to one thing more than another” (Sermon XI §6). The upshot of the stone argument seems to be that appetites and passions must have something more than, or other than, pleasure as their object. That said not everyone has seen Butler’s argument as valid (Penelhum 1985; Henson 1988; Sober 1992; Tilley 2018) and there is disagreement on what exactly it is an argument against.

These mistakes are connected to another: confusing the principle of self-love, which has the happiness of the self as its object, with particular passions and desires. Once we recognize that “the pain of hunger and shame, and the delight from esteem, are no more self-love than they are any thing in the world” (Sermon I, Note 3) — they are particular passions and desires with particular objects — we see that from the fact that we take pleasure in our passions and that they are our passions it does not follow that we are guided by selfish principles. Passions do make us happy or unhappy. But that we have an interest in being happy or unhappy is distinct from the particular passions, their objects, or the happiness arising from the passions — although it may be a reason to prefer one passion over another. This was connected to Butler’s belief that passions are not interested in themselves. They have particular ends whereas self-love is our general interest in securing our happiness.

Like Shaftesbury and Francis Hutcheson, Butler thought it prima facie evident that human beings had benevolent motivations, and he thought it obvious that these benevolent motivations could make us happy and be consistent with self-interest. The onus was on advocates of the selfish theory to provide a compelling case against. Butler placed more stress on the exceptions than Shaftesbury had and stressed that they are “naturally” consistent, i.e. that they are consistent in our nature and the natural course of things although the unnatural and intemperate actions of others might interfere locally (Analogy III §5; §27). He saw Hobbes’ reduction of all other-directed motivations -- such as compassion -- to selfish motivations in disguise to deny an evident matter of fact for theoretical reasons, i.e. in order to reconcile benevolence and compassion with Hobbes’ general hypothesis about human nature. But once a compassionate motivation is recast as a selfish motivation, for Hobbes as a type of fear, it conflicts with the sense of the term being explained to the point that it engenders contradiction. For example: we feel compassion strongly towards our friends. If compassion were a fear then we would fear our friends strongly, which seems to conflict with the agreed use of the word “compassion.”

Which was not to deny of course that people act from selfishness, self-partiality, and confused self-interest. Selfishness and self-partiality often mix with benevolent motivations to give rise to benevolent and even compassionate actions (Sermon V Note 1). Unlike Shaftesbury and Hutcheson, Butler stressed that human beings often act from mixed and opaque motives (as will be discussed in Section 6). But the existence of mixed motivations presumes non-interested motivations with which selfishness is mixed, not the reducibility of all motivations to selfishness or self-partiality. This also has the virtue of being a simpler explanation than the more complicated selfish motivations offered by Hobbes’ theory.

According to Butler, once clarified self-love is properly understood as “regard to our own Interest, Happiness, and private Good” (Sermon IX §8). Butler further suggests that self-love can be pursued better and worse, and that it is best reflected on via reason in a cool and impartial way. By “cool” Butler understood “impartial” in the sense of not being swayed away from the truth by particular loves and hates or by self-partiality. And by “reason” Butler understood the faculty of discerning truth (Sermon XIII §5). Self-love worked best and our interest was best served when we impartially seek what is truly in our interest. When understood in this way it can clearly suggest actions that conflict with selfishness. Conversely resolute selfishness and self-partiality are not the best course for self-love. To satisfy a particular desire may or may not make us happy in either the short or long-term and may not educe to our private good. And although satisfying a desire may make us happy, and all of our happiness may be the result of particular passions, no particular passion has happiness in general as its object.

Conversely we might fruitlessly seek our interest but have no particular object in mind. Or we might obsess over our interest to such a degree that we would continually be exercising the principle of self-love but not actually satisfying our particular passions and consequently not be happy. “Happiness consists in the Gratification of certain Affections, Appetites, Passions, with Objects which are by Nature adapted to them,” (Sermon IX §16). Self-love is a principle governing actions leading to the satisfaction or avoidance of the particular passions. Both self-love and the particular passions are necessary for the proper natural functioning of human beings.

Once self-love is distinguished from selfishness, self-partiality and the particular passions it becomes clearer that the conflict between self-love and benevolence is mostly an illusion when considered in the long term. Particular passions like compassion are perfectly consistent with self-love, indeed Butler held that to take pleasure in benevolent and virtuous acts and view them as part of one’s happiness is “itself the Temper of Satisfaction and Enjoyment.” In the Analogy, Butler provided further arguments that the natural tendency of virtue was the reward of happiness, and the natural punishment for vice, misery. We often fail to see this natural tendency because we focus on accidents or a limited range of examples to the detriment of the consistent long-term tendencies. Butler suggested a thought experiment of a monarchy run on virtuous principles (Analogy III §20) and argued that it would tend to be happier and more powerful than other regimes if allowed to flourish, eventually becoming a universal monarchy. The natural tendency of happiness, power, and virtue all coincide in its flourishing, growth, and moral governance. And happiness as coupled to virtue in this life points to happiness as the consistent reward for virtue in the next when accidents do not threaten to derail the natural tendency.

Which is not to suggest that conscience, virtue, and self-love are identical, although Butler connected them very deeply (Frey 1992 and n.p.). Although virtue tends to coincide with interest it tends to coincide because a virtuous life is a life with the right balance of benevolent passions and dispositions to make one happy and a life which responds to the unchanging and immediate moral authority of conscience – although they are approved of and motivated by self-love as well.

Butler uses benevolence mainly to refer to a particular passion or a cluster of passions (McNaughton 1992), although sometimes he also refers to it and cognate terms (“love of thy neighbor”) as principles that might have particular passions as their objects. There is still a fair amount of scholarly disagreement as to which sense is more central in Butler’s arguments (nicely summarized in Irwin 2008). Benevolence as a particular passion, like ambition or revenge, is never interested or disinterested in and of itself. It is only interested or disinterested in so far as it is guided by or in accordance with our self-love. Acting in a benevolent manner might make us happy. Indeed it seems to be the case that benevolent actions and affections often do make people happy. And we might initially decide to gratify the passions of benevolence from self-love. But the passions themselves have no more or less connection to interest than any other passion does.

Not being made happy by benevolent actions would point to a defect of temper or a lack of balance in one’s nature if the result was diminished happiness and going against the dictates of conscience. As noted, for both Butler and Shaftesbury, self-love and virtue converge when properly understood. But importantly according to Butler, Shaftesbury erred in not recognizing that they could conflict in particular cases, and if they did conflict the distinctive authority of conscience would trump our apparent prudential motivations. This did not mean that our general interest conflicted with conscience, but rather that local prudential information could give reasons for particular reasons for action that conflicted with conscience.

There is also some (more contested) evidence that Butler thought of benevolence as a ruling principle (Rorty 1978). Butler referred to the general principle of charity or “love of our neighbor as thyself” as a virtuous principle or as the reason-guided endeavor to promote the happiness of proximate others to the same degree that one attempts to promote one’s own good (although he also identified “love of neighbor” with the particular passion of compassion). This was a regulating principle of action, perhaps distinct from benevolent passions. Butler suggested in Sermon IX that we have a fundamental obligation to the happiness of sensible creatures other than ourselves insofar as they are capable of pleasure and pain, an obligation that can only be ignored in order to bring about greater happiness (to be further discussed in Section 6). Although this appears to be a fundamental moral obligation to maximize welfare a few years later Butler strongly criticized theories on which the overall happiness is what makes an action good or evil and argued that our conscience holds actions to be morally good or bad independent of the expected or actual consequences for happiness (“Dissertation,” §5). Most of the secondary literature takes Butler to generally be an anti-utilitarian (but see Louden 1995 and in a different way see Frey 1992, for a historical overview of interpretations see Garrett 2019), but there is disagreement as to whether Butler held a consistent position or changed his mind (see McPherson 1948–9). Some even argue that he might be able to embrace a form of consequentialism (see McNaughton 2017).

Finally, Butler claimed that benevolence is the whole of virtue in Sermon XII, although he qualified the claim later in Sermon XII and qualified it even more strongly in the “Dissertation on Virtue.” Butler did not mean that to act benevolently in each and every action was the entirety of virtue, for example as we shall see in the next section moral resentment was an appropriate attitude for a virtuous agent. Rather he meant that to act according to and to be motivated by the principle of loving one’s neighbor generally leads to virtuous and morally approved actions. Although self-partiality tends in the opposite direction, benevolence offsets this tendency and brings benevolent and self-partial affections in proper proportion. Conversely self-partiality brings benevolence in line with self-love such that it balances properly in our nature.

According to Butler when we approve of virtue in an agent this gives rise to benevolence towards the agent. The ultimate object of this love of benevolent moral agents is our love of God, the most benevolent agent. In stressing the continuity between love of neighbor and love of God, Butler also stressed the continuity between our approval of moral agents and natural theology. Finally, to have a character such that benevolent actions make one happy is normally to have a character that encompasses all of the virtues.

6. Compassion, Resentment, and Forgiveness

Compassion was besides the love of God the most important of the particular passions involving benevolence for Butler. He defined compassion as “real sorrow and concern for the misery of our fellow creatures” giving rise to the desire to relieve their distress (Sermon V Note 1). The passion of compassion arose from the imaginative ability to substitute another for oneself and thereby to be affected by the distresses of that other with whom one compassionates as towards oneself (Sermon V Note 1). Butler readily admitted that the psychological process that gives rise to compassion included both pleasure in the fact that we were not suffering the distress as well and awareness of our own susceptibility to the ills prompting distress in the object of our compassion. But although the process of giving rise to compassion also gives rise to and even includes self-partial thoughts, “compassion” refers strictly to a “real sorrow and concern for the misery of our fellow creatures” (Sermon V Note 1). To identify it with a self-partial pleasure in the fact that we were not in distress or with the desire to alleviate distress in order to no longer be annoyed by it was to be confused about the meaning of word. Although according to Butler compassion, like any affection, must be governed by reason, the motivation to virtuous actions that compassion gives rise to would not be given rise to by reason alone. Consequently the passion of compassion has a central role in our moral actions. Moreover, the principle of private self-love is not sufficient to serve our welfare without compassion, i.e., compassion is an important ingredient in our well being in addition to being an important moral passion. Its importance for our well being can be seen, according to Butler, in the fact that those who lack compassion, who have “hardness of heart,” tend to have diminished happiness due to “hardness of heart” (Sermon X, §7) blocking the scope and degree of their happiness.

Resentment or anger was somewhat more difficult for Butler to deal with insofar as it was ubiquitous to human beings but conflicted with the Christian command to love our enemies. Butler made two distinctions, between settled (or deliberate) and hasty (or sudden) resentment and between resentment raised by non-moral harm or resentment raised by moral injury. He further distinguished between resentment and the negative passion of malice (although he denies the existence of disinterested, cool, direct ill-will or malice). Hasty resentment is an immediate response to “mere harm without appearance of wrong or injustice” (Sermon VIII, §6). It can be excessive and misguided, and one can be morally culpable for excessive and misguided expressions of it, but hasty resentment serves an important end of self-preservation and care of one’s near and dear. Settled resentment is an affection that has moral evil or injustice as its object. Although moral evil gives rise to pain which can strengthen this settled resentment, the object of the resentment is not the pain or harm done but instead the design or intention to morally injure, harm, do wrong and injustice. And the goal of resentment is to cause appropriate injury in a wrongdoer, not malign injury or revenge that are distinguished from resentment. For Butler, settled resentment has an important moral end in drawing men together to pursue justice, in making them fear engendering resentment in mankind due to their actions, and to extirpate moral wickedness: it is “one of the common bonds by which society is held together; a fellow-feeling, which each Individual has in behalf of the whole species, as well as of himself” (Sermon VIII, §8). Indeed Butler goes so far as to suggest that communal moral resentment and the justice it gives rise to is what separates us from the state of nature where each man is arbiter of his own punishment which quickly devolves into revenge (a point developed further in Six Sermons).

This raises a central problem for resentment as a moral sentiment or passion: unless kept strictly within bounds it devolves into revenge and conflicts with benevolence and virtue. Part of the answer is that however extreme an injury done, and however settled the resentment rising in response, the execution of justice does not supersede the prior obligation of good will we have to all humans insofar as they are capable of happiness and misery. Rather we harm wrong doers to preserve “the quiet and happiness of the world” and this “general and more enlarged obligation destroys a more particular and confined one of the same kind, inconsistent with it. Guilt and injury then does not dispense with or supersede the duty of goodwill,” (Sermon IX §15). Another part of the answer is that since the proper object is the injustice, to resent someone’s whole character as opposed to the particular aspect of character that gave rise to the harm, i.e. to portray them as wholly monstrous, is to move beyond the appropriate bounds. This pitfall is easier to avoid when we recognize our own mixed characters and flaws. Relatedly, and perhaps most importantly one must recognize that self-partiality is often fueling a desire for revenge against those we resent insofar as they have injured us. We ought to attempt to view injuries to us from as distant and unprejudiced a human viewpoint as possible — with full awareness of our own future non-existence and final judgment – and when we do we will be able to recognize that our enemies are as often as not mistaken or acting inadvertently.

The awareness of our own flaws, and our acceptance of the non-existence of cool, disinterested and malign wills as well as our recognition of the ubiquity of mixed characters also gives rise to compassion and the desire to forgive. But notably for Butler forgiveness does not entail giving up resentment for moral wrongs (Griswold 2008; Garcia 2011). Rather it entails checking inappropriate resentment, anger, and revenge, being aware when what appears to be a moral harm is in fact an inadvertent injury whose putative moral injustice is inflated by our own partiality, and treating others who harm us with the same compassion that we hold all humans due good-will should be treated (Radzik 2014).

7. Self-Deceit and Ignorance

Butler devoted three of his Sermons to issues connected with self-deceit (IV, VI, X). The focus on the pervasiveness of self-deceit as a serious moral problem is an important difference between Butler and his more optimistic confreres Hutcheson and Shaftesbury. For Butler we are often self-deceived even when we think we are doing what is morally right (in fact if we think we are wholly in the right we are almost always deceived (Sermon X §13)) and we often only recognize our self-deception — if at all — upon later reflection. That we are so prone to self-deception is mainly due to a lack of reflection when acting prompted by self-partiality.

According to Butler, most of us can access what the right thing is to do in most circumstances, and most of us often wish to do the right thing when it doesn’t conflict with our self-partiality. But we are also susceptible to engage in self-deceit in order to justify acting on self-partial motives even when it conflicts with what is morally right. Butler illustrated this sort of self-deceit by reference to the example of Balaam, a prophet who had been asked to curse the Israelites by the Moabites. Even though God expressly forbade Balaam, he still considered cursing the Israelites when greater rewards were offered by Moabite ambassadors. The puzzle was how could Balaam know what was right but still be motivated to do what was wrong? Butler’s answer was not so much to try to solve the problem of akrasia as to describe the moral psychology of self-deceit.

Balaam’s moral failure was effected by his avoiding reflecting on his actions, by a pervasive asymmetry in how we view ourselves and how we view others due to native self-partiality that can only be corrected by reflection, and by a difficulty in discerning the exact degree to which we are obliged to act morally. The three are interconnected. We are normally happy to unreflectively cut more slack for ourselves than we are willing to cut for others due to self-partiality or an “overfondness for ourselves” (Sermon X §6). When a morally right action is a matter of degree, it is easy and common to avoid reflection and to err on the side of self-partiality in the degree in which the moral action is undertaken. This allows one to engage in more and more immoral acts while convincing oneself that each undermining of the rule is justified and reasonable. In the story of Balaam, Balaam invites the ambassadors to stay the night under the aegis of hospitality. By analogy for Butler we undermine rules under the aegis of ordinary sociability and civility — for example we engage in self-serving malicious gossip under the aegis of being sociable — and gradually undermine our capacity to act from the dictate of conscience when called upon to do so.

Since conscience is authoritative and proximate for Butler, and since the dictates of conscience coincide with our self-love, self-deceit only gets off the ground if we avoid reflection or if we reflect poorly. In addition to the oversimplifying and bad faith just described, we give self-deceit a foothold by refusing to look at or avoiding the facts of the matter when we feel these facts will go against our self-partial desires — Butler gives the example of profligate spenders not looking at the state of their finances (Sermon X §11) — and by relying piecemeal on the counsel of others when these counsels serve our interest.

In one of his less read sermons (Sermon IV) Butler suggests that careful government of the tongue is important to one’s moral well being. The role of others — both our oppositions to and agreements with others — and its relation to self-governance is particularly crucial for Butler in explaining this sort of self-deceit. Our tendency to paint the characters of others in black and white allows us to justify our immoral actions by virtue of the fact that we self-deceptively (and self-righteously) cast ourselves and our motivations as wholly good in opposition to our opponent who is wholly evil, and so we can treat them however we see fit. We also draw on the idle comments of others that conform with our self-partial desires to serve as external justification of our immoral actions.

The problem then is given human beings’ great capacity for self-deceit, how can it be prevented? Is not the attempt to prevent self-deceit as prone to self-deceit as anything else? Butler’s answer is that habitual and systematic self-reflection and self-governance by rigid rules are the best response. In a manner reminiscent of Epictetus’ famous maxim one must watch oneself as an enemy lying in ambush, and view one’s actions as an enemy would judging them harshly, Butler suggests a two part rule to this end “One is, to substitute another for yourself, when you take a survey of any part of your behavior, or consider what is proper and fit and reasonable for you to do on any occasion: the other part is, that you… consider yourself as the person affected by such a behavior,” (Sermon X §15). The rule “itself may be dishonestly applied” but even the misguided attempt to apply it may reveal more truth than not applying it at all. In the Analogy Butler argued that one of the central moral purposes of this life is as a probationary period in the acquisition of habits of self-governance (Analogy V). That these habits are not fool-proof is a consequence of the fact that our ability to apply them seriously to ourselves is one of the bases for our ultimate punishment and reward.

The problem of self-deceit is connected to another of Butler’s abiding themes, human ignorance of the larger design of God. In Sermon XV “Upon Human Ignorance” (notably the final sermon of the collection), the Analogy and the “Dissertation on Virtue,” Butler stressed that our knowledge of design is probable at best. Sermon XV concludes with an exhortation reminiscent of Locke. Since we have such limited knowledge of providence and of God’s design, we should turn our attention to that which we can have knowledge of: our nature insofar as it bears on our moral governance and conduct.

The argument of the Analogy and the “Dissertation on Virtue” were both premised on this. In the Analogy, Butler argued that we have probable evidence that our morally right and wrong actions will be judged and rewarded and punished by God and that this life is a probationary period where we act in ways that will ultimately be judged.

8. Influence

Butler’s Sermons were read in the eighteenth century, in particular after the publication of the Analogy, and went through multiple editions. The Analogy was reprinted many times in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, as were Butler’s works. His initial influence seems to have been greatest on Scottish philosophers, including (perhaps) his contemporary Francis Hutcheson, George Turnbull, David Fordyce, David Hume, Adam Smith, Thomas Reid, and their fellow travellers — notably Edmund Burke. Hume sought to meet Butler and emended the manuscript copy of A Treatise on Human Nature he gave to him for fear it would cause offense. Hume’s and Smith’s accounts of sympathy, compassion, resentment, justice, and their empirical attitude towards moral psychology (and to the centrality of moral psychology for ethics) and the limits of metaphysical explanations in morals bear Butler’s influence. Hume’s discussion of induction in his Treatise has also been seen as a criticism of Butler’s procedure in the Analogy (Russell 2008). Butler was also widely read in Germany. Solomon Maimon, for example, quotes Butler’s “Dissertation on Virtue” in the Preface to his Autobiography. In the late nineteenth and early twentieth century Butler’s Sermons became more influential than the Analogy, due to their influence at Oxford and Cambridge and particularly on William Whewell (see Tennant 195–199) and Sidgwick. Throughout the later nineteenth century and the twentieth century they were discussed by and had great impact on many of the central moral philosophers of the Anglo-American tradition — G. E. Moore, H. A. Pritchard, and particularly W. D. Ross, among many. Butler’s influence and importance has persisted (see, for example, the section on Butlerian Accounts in the entry on forgiveness).


Primary Literature

There is currently no up to date, complete, critical edition of Butler’s works. The relevant editions of Butler’s works discussed in this article are:

  • Butler, J. and Clarke, S., 1716, Several Letters from a Gentleman in Glocestershire, London, J. Knapton.
  • Butler, J., 1726, Fifteen Sermons Preached at the Rolls Chapel, London: J. and J. Knapton.
  • Butler, J., 1729, Fifteen Sermons Preached at Rolls Chapel, London: J. and J. Knapton, 2nd edition. [Revised and with the addition of a “Preface”.]
  • Butler, J., 1736, The Analogy of Religion, Natural and Revealed, to the Constitution and Course of Nature, London: J. and P. Knapton, 2nd corrected edition. [This was the corrected edition that appeared in the same year as the initial imprint. The two dissertations — “Of Personal Identity” and “Of the Nature of Virtue” were appended to it.]
  • Butler, J., 1749, Fifteen Sermons Preached at the Rolls Chapel… To which are added Six Sermons, Preached on Publick Occasions, London: J. and P. Knapton, 4th edition. [This edition marked the appearance of the Six Sermons.]

I have cited these works from the most complete current edition, although the citations should allow for passages to be easily identified in other editions:

  • White, D. (ed.), 2006, The Works of Bishop Butler, Rochester, NY: University of Rochester Press.

I have cited the “Preface” to the 2nd edition of the Sermons as “Preface,” the Sermons by number (i.e. “Sermon VI”), the “Introduction” to the Analogy of Religion as “Introduction,” the main contents of the work by “Analogy” and chapter, the Dissertation of Virtue as “Dissertation,” the Six Sermons as “Six Sermons” and the Clarke/Butler correspondence as “Clarke/Butler.” All references are by paragraph, corresponding to the paragraphs in the White edition above.

There is now an excellent and extremely informative reader’s edition of Butler’s Sermons and Dissertation on Virtue with the addition of A Sermon Preached Before the House of Lords and a selection from Butler’s correspondence with Clarke:

  • McNaughton, D. (ed.), 2017, Joseph Butler: Fifteen Sermons & other writings on ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Secondary Literature

  • Broad, C. D, 1930, Five Types of Ethical Theory, London: Kegan Paul.
  • Clarke, S., 1706, A Discourse Concerning the Unchangeable Obligations of Natural Religion, and the Truth and Certainty of Christian Revelation, London: J. Knapton.
  • Cunliffe, C., (ed.), 1992, Joseph Butler’s Moral and Religious Thought: Tercentenary Essays, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2008, “Butler, Joseph (1692–1752),” in the Oxford Dictionary of National Biography, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Darwall, S., 1992, “Conscience as Self-Authorizing in Butler’s Ethics,” in C. Cunliffe (ed.) 1992, pp. 209–241.
  • –––, 1995, The British Moralists and the Internal ‘Ought’: 1640–1740, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Dick, David, 2017, “Constitutivism, Error, and Moral Responsibility in Bishop Butler’s Ethics,” Southern Journal of Philosophy, 55(4): 415–438.
  • Frey, R. G., 1992, “Butler on Self-Love and Benevolence,” in C. Cunliffe (ed.), 1992, pp. 243–68.
  • Garcia, Ernesto V., 2011, “Bishop Butler on Forgiveness and Resentment,” Philosophers’ Imprint, 11(10): 1–19.
  • Garrett, A., 2012, “Reasoning about morals from Butler to Hume,” in Ruth Savage, (ed.), Philosophy and Religion in Enlightenment Britain, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 169–186.
  • –––, 2019, “The History of the History of Ethics and Emblematic Passages,” in I. Hunter and R. Whatmore (eds.), Philosophy, Rights, and Natural Law: Essays in Honour of Knud Haakonssen, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • Griswold, C., 2007, Forgiveness, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, I.ii.
  • Henson, R., 1988, “Butler on Selfishness and Self-Love,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 49(1): 31–57.
  • Irwin, T. H., 2008, The Development of Ethics: Volume II: From Suarez to Rousseau, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 476–557.
  • Louden, R., 1995, “Butler’s Divine Utilitarianism,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 12(3): 265–280.
  • Maurer, C., 2019, Self-love, Egoism and the Selfish Hypothesis: Key Debates from Eighteenth-Century British Moral Philosophy, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • McNaughton, D., 1992, “Butler on Benevolence,” in C. Cunliffe (ed.), 1992, pp. 269–291.
  • –––, 2013, “Butler’s Ethics” in Crisp, Roger, (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of the History of Ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 377–392.
  • McPherson, T. H., 1948, “The Development of Bishop Butler’s Ethics — Part I,” Philosophy, 23(87): 317–331.
  • –––, 1949, “The Development of Bishop Butler’s Ethics – Part II,” Philosophy, 24(88): 3–22.
  • Penelhum, T., 1986, Butler, Boston: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • –––, 1992, “Butler and Human Ignorance,” in C. Cunliffe (ed.), 1992, pp. 117–40.
  • Radzik, L., 2014, “Joseph Butler on Forgiveness,” in Johannes Brachtendorf and Stephan Herzberg (eds.), Vergebung: Philosophische Perspektiven auf ein Problemfeld der Ethik, Munster: Mentis, pp. 139–147.
  • Rorty, A., 1978, “Butler on Benevolence and Conscience,” Philosophy, 53(204): 171–184.
  • Russell, P., 2008, The Riddle of Hume’s Treatise: Skepticism, Naturalism, and Irreligion, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Shaftesbury, Lord (Anthony Ashley Cooper), 1711, Characteristicks, in Den Uyl, D., (ed.), Anthony, Third Earl of Shaftesbury: Characteristicks of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times, Indianapolis: Liberty Fund, 2001, 3 volumes.
  • Sidgwick, H., 1901, Methods of Ethics, London: Macmillan, 6th ed.
  • Sober, E., 1992, “Hedonism and Butler’s Stone,” Ethics, 103(1): 97–103.
  • Tennant, B., 2011, Conscience, Consciousness, and Ethics in Joseph Butler’s Philosophy and Ministry, Suffolk: Boydell & Brewer.
  • Tilley, J., 2018, “Butler’s Stone,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 99(4): 891–909.
  • Wedgwood, R., 2008, “Butler on Virtue, Self-Interest and Human Nature,” in Paul Bloomfield (ed.), Morality and Self-Interest, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 177–204.

Other Internet Resources

  • The Bishop Butler Society Ltd., an online website devoted to Butler, maintained by David and Linda White. On the website are extensive and useful bibliographies and the proofs from White’s edition of Butler’s works.


Thanks to Ian Blaustein, Roger Crisp, Charles Griswold, Knud Haakonssen, James Harris, Colin Heydt, David McNaughton, Amelie Rorty, Daniel Star, and Bob Tennant for extremely helpful comments and suggestions. Thanks to Stephen Darwall for suggesting the article, to Ray Frey for initiating my interest in Butler, and to the students in my Butler seminar for helping me think through the issues discussed in the article.

Copyright © 2023 by
Aaron Garrett <>

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