To forgive is to respond in a particular way to someone who has treated someone badly or wrongly. Forgiveness is therefore a dyadic relation involving a wrongdoer and a wronged party, and is thought to be a way in which victims of wrongdoing alter both their and a wrongdoer’s status by, for instance, acknowledging yet moving past a moral transgression. Commonly, forgiveness is thought to involve the giving up of certain negative emotions towards the wrongdoer, the forbearance of negative reactions against the wrongdoer, and possibly the restoration of the relationship with the wrongdoer. Much philosophical discussion of forgiveness centers on three primary questions: (1) What is the nature of forgiveness—what must one do in order to forgive; (2) Who has standing to forgive—when is one in a position to forgive a wrongdoer; and (3) What are the norms governing forgiveness—when is forgiveness morally good, right, or praiseworthy?
- 1. Forgiveness as a Response to Wrongdoing
- 2. Cognate Phenomena
- 3. The Ends of Forgiveness
- 4. Standing to Forgive
- 5. Theories of Forgiveness
- 6. Self-forgiveness
- 7. Divine Forgiveness
- 8. Political Forgiveness
- 9. The Ethics of Forgiveness
- 10. The Science of Forgiveness
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Forgiveness as a Response to Wrongdoing
An inevitable and unfortunate fact of life is that we are often mistreated by others. Forgiveness concerns one kind of response to those who wrong us. From the ancient Greeks to the present day, forgiveness has typically been regarded as a personal response to having been injured or wronged, or as a condition one seeks or hopes is bestowed upon one for having wronged someone else.
The Oxford English Dictionary defines ‘forgivable’, the first entry under the general term ‘forgive’, as that which “may be forgiven, pardonable, excusable”, referring thereby to the quality of deserving to be forgiven. Notwithstanding the association with excusing conditions, forgiving is not, strictly speaking, equivalent to excusing. For wrongdoing that is excused entirely, there is nothing to forgive, since (as we shall see) agents who are fully excused are not blameworthy or culpable. Moreover, the application of the concept of forgiveness to non-moral behavior, as in the case of a forgivably poor musical performance by a pianist, shows that forgiveness is not always or necessarily a moral term. For this reason, there may be similar practices of forgiveness in non-moral arenas of normative appraisal (Haji 1998). However, we shall focus here on forgiveness as it pertains to moral appraisal and moral responsibility. Further, while most of our discussion will be focused on forgiveness for conduct, we note the possibility that one may also be forgiven for one’s character or the kind of person one is (Bell 2008).
2. Cognate Phenomena
Sometimes we do things that appear to be morally wrong. Suppose I see you, a total stranger, take a pear from a fruit stand and walk off with it. I reproach you for having stolen the pear into which you are now happily chomping. Yet you explain that you own that fruit stand and have not stolen anything. In giving this kind of explanation, you are offering a justification for your action—you are claiming that despite appearances to the contrary, your taking the pear was morally permissible. Offering justifications is commonplace in our moral lives. But justification and forgiveness ought to be distinguished. When conduct is justified, this implies that the conduct was not morally wrong. But when conduct is forgiven, there is no such implication. Indeed, in most cases (if not all), what we are forgiven for are the morally wrong things we do. This is why it can be offensive when someone says that she forgives you when you have done nothing wrong.
Sometimes we do things that are indeed morally bad or impermissible, but for which we are not morally blameworthy. In such cases, so-called excusing conditions render an otherwise blameworthy agent not blameworthy. Recall our pear-taker. Suppose that you take the pear, not from your own fruit stand, but from your neighbor’s. You have done something that you ought not to have done. Even so, there may be facts about you or the context of your action that make it the case that you are not morally responsible and blameworthy. When we draw attention to these facts—that is, when we offer an excuse for our action—we are not claiming that what we did was not morally wrong. Rather, we concede that what we did was morally wrong, but we provide putative reasons for thinking that we are not morally responsible and blameworthy for having done so.
When conduct is excused, this entails that the agent who so acted is not morally responsible and blameworthy for that conduct. But when one is forgiven for one’s conduct, this does not entail that the wrongdoer was not morally responsible and blameworthy for her conduct. It is often claimed that a necessary condition for forgiveness is that the wrongdoer is morally blameworthy for her conduct (see, e.g., Bash 2007: 5; Haber 1991: 33; Murphy 2003; Allais 2008; and Hieronymi 2001). Perhaps this is true (although see Gamlund 2011). But we need not insist, as a matter of conceptual necessity, that forgiveness requires that agents be morally blameworthy in order to show how forgiveness and excuse are distinct. For even if there are certain cases in which one can be forgiven for non-culpably having done wrong (say, in moral dilemma cases), this does not change the fact that forgiven agents can be morally responsible and blameworthy but that agents who are excused are not morally responsible and blameworthy.
There are many ways to respond to wrongdoers who are blameworthy for their conduct. One such way is to condone their conduct (Hughes 1995). “Broadly speaking, to condone”, writes Charles Griswold, “is to collaborate in the lack of censure of an action, and perhaps to enable further wrong-doing by the offender” (2007: 46). What is it to collaborate in the lack of censure of an action? Griswold makes two suggestions:
One may condone in the sense of accepting while not disapproving (by not holding the wrong-doing against its author), or in the sense of tolerating while disapproving (a sort of “look the other way” or “putting up with” strategy). (2007: 46–7)
We can call the first kind of condoning—the one that involves accepting and not disapproving of conduct—A-condonation. We can call the second kind of condonation—the kind that involves disapproving of but tolerating conduct—D-condonation. A brief discussion can help us to see how each differs from forgiveness.
According to Garrard and McNaughton, when
we condone an action, we say in effect that it wasn’t really such a bad thing to do […] Condoning an action amounts to saying (correctly or incorrectly) that the action wasn’t really wrong. (2010: 85)
Jean Hampton also seems to have something like A-condonation in mind:
I will define ‘condonation’ as the acceptance, without moral protest (either inward or outward), of an action which ought to warrant such protest, made possible, first, by ridding oneself of the judgement that the action is wrong, so that its performer cannot be a wrongdoer, and, second, by ridding oneself of any of attendant feelings (such as those which are involved in resentment) which signify one’s protest of the action. (Murphy & Hampton 1988: 40)
In order to forgive, however, the victim must represent the putative recipient of forgiveness as one who did something morally wrong (or bad or vicious).
D-condonation occurs when an agent disapproves of someone’s conduct, but tolerates it. Griswold characterizes it as a sort of “look the other way” or “putting up with” strategy (2007). The forgiver, by contrast, does not paper over wrongdoing—she is prepared to blame, but forgoes it.
Two other considerations help distinguish condoning from forgiving. First, under typical circumstances, we can condone actions that are not wrongs against us (Haber 1991: 59–60). We cannot, however, at least in typical circumstances, forgive others for their wrongs against others. Second, while we forgive agents for their conduct (or perhaps their characters), when we condone, we condone the conduct (or the character). It is infelicitous to say, “I condone you for lying to me” whereas it makes perfect sense to say, “I forgive you for lying to me”.
2.4 Pardon and Mercy
The phrase “pardon me” frequently functions as an apology, which might precede an act of forgiveness, or be a plea or request for forgiveness, or some similar act of forbearance. And to pardon a wrongdoer often seems indistinguishable from forgiveness, perhaps especially in cases of minor wrong. However, the concept of pardon also refers to a familiar and important legal and political power quite unlike forgiveness. Black’s Law Dictionary defines this sense of pardon as “an act or an instance of officially nullifying punishment or other legal consequences of a crime”, ordinarily “granted by the chief executive of a government” (Garner 1999: 1137). In the United States, for example, the President has the authority to grant pardons for federal offenses, and state governors may pardon crimes against the state.
Although reasons for exercising the power of pardon often mimic those given for forgiving wrongdoers, one clear difference between pardon and forgiving is that the former is typically exercised by third-parties as opposed to the victims of wrong. As discussed below, standard philosophical views maintain that there are good reasons for thinking that, with one important exception, third-party forgiveness is impossible, inasmuch as forgiveness is the prerogative or right of the victim of wrong. Another difference is that a central idea in the legal and political concept of pardon is that of an offer that must be accepted in order to accomplish its partial or complete end, such as mitigation of a criminal punishment via commutation of a prison sentence (Bingham 2009). Although on some views forgiveness is also an offer, especially where reconciliation between a victim and wrongdoer is attempted (Tombs 2008), the main sense of forgiveness seems not to involve the idea of an offer at all, let alone an offer that must be accepted by the wrongdoer in order for forgiveness to occur and accomplish at least some of its ends, for example to discharge one’s duty to forgive others as commanded by God, or to move beyond a potentially paralyzing negative emotion.
Furthermore, acts of mercy in general are to be distinguished from acts of forgiveness (Murphy 1988; Murphy & Hampton 1988; Tosi & Warmke 2017). First, manifestations of mercy, but not forgiveness, are essentially overt. To extend or show mercy to someone who has acted badly is to engage in some overt behavior: a parent may lessen a guilty child’s punishment. Forgiveness, however, is not necessarily overt. It is possible to forgive privately; indeed philosophical discussions of forgiveness have focused predominantly on its private manifestations. Second, mercy is third-personal in a way that forgiveness is not. A boss may reprimand an employee for telling an inappropriate joke in the lunchroom even though termination would be justified and the boss herself is not personally offended by it. Here, a third-party shows mercy, and does so (we may presume) justifiably. But forgiveness, if it is ever third-personal, is not third-personal in this way. Barring exceptional circumstances, you cannot forgive me for the offense I caused to a co-worker—you simply lack the standing to forgive me for my offense to her. Mercy is not paradigmatically second-personal in this way. Third, mercy is often (if not always) connected to authority in a way that forgiveness is not. It is natural to think that in order for S to show mercy to P, S must be in some kind of position of authority over P. Interpersonal forgiveness, however, is tied to no such authority structures.
When we are wronged, this typically damages our relationship with the wrongdoer. Minor offenses might put strains on relationships that put burdens on both persons involved; serious offenses might lead the victim to terminate the relationship altogether. Further, when we blame others for their wrongs against us, we often do so at the cost of causing further relational damage. We might withhold expressions of good-will, or alter our behavior in ways that make clear that we no longer trust the other.
Although in many cases forgiveness will be accompanied by reconciliation, it is neither a necessary nor sufficient condition for forgiveness. One reason for thinking that reconciliation is not necessary for forgiveness is that the offending party may be, for whatever reasons, unwilling to reconcile. But the fact that I am unwilling to restore our relationship does not, all by itself, make it impossible for you forgive me for the wrong I did to you. In other cases, reconciliation is practically impossible. Perhaps I have secretly moved to Fiji and you have no way to get in touch with me. You can forgive me whether or not you know I am in Fiji. In still other cases, restoring a relationship would be “morally unwise”, as Jean Hampton puts it (Murphy & Hampton 1988: 42–3, fn. 9). Doing so might expose one to additional psychological damage, for example. Neither does reconciliation appear to be sufficient for forgiveness. Relationships may be restored, at least to some degree, for purely pragmatic reasons.
3. The Ends of Forgiveness
Even if reconciliation is neither necessary nor sufficient for forgiveness, we can still recognize that reconciliation is, as Robert Roberts (1995) puts it, the “teleology of forgiveness”. All things being equal, reconciliation is the goal to which forgiveness points. Although there are reasons that sometimes make reconciliation impossible or unwise, forgiveness is oriented towards promoting pro-sociality and friendly relations (McCullough 2008: 114, 116). In some cases, this might mean that the end of forgiveness is to repair a relationship to its ex ante state. In some cases, however, only partial reconciliation may occur. In such cases, the nature of the restored relationship should be “appropriate to the situation of the parties after they have forgiven one another” (Bash 2007: 25).
Common conceptions of forgiveness make clear that its main purpose is the re-establishment or resumption of a relationship ruptured by wrongdoing. In keeping with the common conceptions of forgiveness, many contemporary philosophers argue that the resumption of relationships disrupted by wrongdoing often requires a moral reassessment of the wrongdoer by the victim, and that such a reassessment involves relinquishing resentment or some other form of morally inflected anger (Murphy & Hampton 1988; Murphy 2001), or behavior such as seeking revenge (Griswold 2007; Zaibert 2009; Govier 2002; Hughes 2016).
Maintaining or perpetuating personal relationships is one of the clearest and most important ends of forgiveness, though not the only important one. Forgiving those who wrong us often helps us move beyond strong negative emotions which, if allowed to fester, could harm us psychologically and physically. Forgiveness benefits wrongdoers, as well, by releasing them from the blame and hard feelings often directed toward them by those they wrong, or helping them transcend the guilt or remorse they suffer from having done wrong, thereby allowing them to move forward in their lives. These ends of forgiveness may be regarded as in general enabling in the sense that they show how forgiveness sometimes helps people move beyond the wrongs they endure or cause and the sometimes debilitating effects those wrongs have on wrongdoers and victims alike. For some, forgiveness has these forward-looking benefits because of the way it transfigures the past. Emmanuel Levinas claims that “forgiveness acts upon the past, somehow repeats the event, purifying it” ( 1969: 283), a notion similar to Hannah Arendt’s view that forgiveness alters the ethical significance of a wrongdoer’s past by keeping it from having a permanent or fixed character (Arendt 1958).
4. Standing to Forgive
It is standard to assume that not just anyone can forgive a wrongdoer for a certain wrong. One must have “standing”. If I lack standing, then forgiving is not on the table for me; I am not a candidate for forgiving. And so to doubt whether someone has standing to forgive is not to doubt whether someone succeeded in forgiving. Nor is it to doubt whether someone’s forgiveness was morally good, right or permissible. Rather, it is to doubt whether that person can forgive in the first place.
Who has standing to forgive? It might be thought that one has standing only if one is the victim of wrongdoing (in some sense of ‘victim’). Jeffrie Murphy expresses such a view when he says that
I do not have standing to resent or forgive you unless I have myself been the victim of your wrongdoing. I may forgive you for embezzling my funds; but it would be ludicrous for me, for example, to claim that I had decided to forgive Hitler for what he did to the Jews. I lack the proper standing for this. Thus, I may legitimately resent (and hence consider forgiving) only wrong done to me. (Murphy & Hampton 1988: 21, emphasis original)
On this view, only those who have been directly wronged have standing to forgive. Suppose Alfred lies to Betty. Betty is thereby directly wronged by Alfred. Though we will not attempt a full account of what it means to be directly wronged by someone, the general idea is that for Betty to be directly wronged by Alfred means that Alfred’s conduct itself constituted a wrong against Betty; he failed Betty, morally speaking. Betty therefore has direct standing to forgive.
Suppose, however, that Alfred lies to Betty and this results in Betty being very late in picking up her brother Todd. Alfred did not lie to Todd, but by lying to Betty, there is a straightforward sense in which this resulted in a wrong being done to Todd. Here, while we can say that Betty was directly wronged and so has direct standing to forgive, it is not true that Todd was directly wronged by Alfred. Rather, it was something Alfred did to Betty that led to Todd’s being wronged indirectly. And because it would be fitting for Todd to blame Alfred, and for Alfred to apologize to Todd, it is plausible to think that Todd also has standing to forgive Alfred. Call this indirect standing.
Though controversial, it may be possible to have standing to forgive while lacking either direct or indirect standing. Such standing is implicated in cases where one person forgives on behalf of someone else who has or would have had direct or indirect standing. Suppose Ted’s adult daughter Maria is assaulted and left unable to communicate for the rest of her life. Supposing that Maria has direct standing to forgive her assailant, if it is possible for Ted to forgive the assailant on behalf of Maria, he is able to do so in virtue of possessing what we may call proxy standing.
Finally, consider third-party standing. What is labeled “third-party” forgiveness in the forgiveness literature is often a source of confusion. Charles Griswold rightly points out that some kinds of cases of standing are misleadingly called “third-party”. For example, he asks us to imagine a case in which the murder of a loved one injures us, and the matter of whether to forgive presents itself to us in light of the loss we’ve sustained. “This sort of case”, he says, “is not a matter of third-party forgiveness” (2007: 117). The standing to forgive that would accrue to such a person, Griswold says, would be (to put it in our above terminology) of the direct or indirect variety, depending on how the case is fleshed out. Griswold’s own view of the matter is that third-party forgiveness involves
a situation in which the question of forgiveness arises in light of your indignation at the loss suffered by another person, thanks to someone else’s actions: here the matter concerns your forgiving their offender on their behalf for the harm done to them (not to you). (2007: 117)
Yet because Griswold has in mind an activity that involves forgiving “on behalf” of the victim, this kind of standing to forgive might be best thought of as proxy standing. Indeed, he argues that in order to engage in what he calls third-party forgiveness, the forgiver can only do so if she has “standing”, and one receives such standing only if one has an “identification with the victim” (119).
We identify as third-party standing what both Glen Pettigrove (2009) and Margaret Urban Walker (2013) have in mind in their recent discussions of third-party forgiveness. Such cases, Walker writes, involve
the scenario in which A forgives the offender B for something B did to the victim C, where A is not plausibly seen as a fellow victim, and where A forgives B on A’s own behalf, not on behalf of C or anyone else who might be a victim of the wrong. (2013: 495)
Such a putative forgiver, she says, is one who “suffered no wrong” by the offender’s actions (2013: 496). This putative standing to forgive, therefore, is not reducible to any of the aforementioned varieties: the forgiver was not wronged by the offender (directly or indirectly), she does not forgive herself, and she does not forgive on behalf of anyone else.
5. Theories of Forgiveness
5.1 Emotion Accounts
It is widely thought that forgiveness is fundamentally a matter of how one feels about another. Jeffrie Murphy, for example, claims that “[f]orgiveness is primarily a matter of how I feel about you (not how I treat you)” (Murphy & Hampton 1988: 21; cf. Hughes 1993: 108). Broadly speaking, emotion accounts of forgiveness claim that forgiveness is best understood as fundamentally a change in emotion. According to such views, were you to be wronged, your forgiving the wrongdoer fundamentally involves your overcoming (or abating, or eliminating, or forswearing) some relevant negative emotion (e.g., resentment, hatred, rancor) that you experience because you were wronged. For example, Kathleen Dean Moore writes, that “the attitude of forgiveness is characterized by the presence of good will and by the lack of personal resentment for the injury” (1989:184). Norvin Richards claims that to “forgive someone for having wronged one is to abandon all negative feelings based on the episode in question” (1988: 79). Stephen Darwall also appears to defend some kind of emotion account when he says that to “forgive is, roughly, to forbear or withdraw resentment” (2006: 72).
Among the various emotion accounts, however, there is significant disagreement on two main points: (1) about which specific emotions are implicated in forgiveness; and (2) about what must be done with those emotions in order to forgive. We survey emotion accounts by taking these two issues in turn.
One way to differentiate between the varieties of emotion accounts is according to the emotion or set of emotions that are thought to be relevant to forgiveness. A cursory survey of the forgiveness literature might give one the impression that there is widespread agreement about which emotion is crucially implicated in forgiveness. That emotion is resentment. The view that forgiveness crucially implicates resentment is usually taken to be “received orthodoxy” (Bash 2007: 161; cf. Kekes 2009: 490; Radzik 2009: 117; and Zaibert 2009: 38). But any impression of wholesale agreement would be mistaken for two reasons. First, some emotion theorists argue that overcoming resentment is neither necessary nor sufficient for forgiveness. Such emotion theorists hold that in forgiving there are other emotions that may or must be overcome. And second, even among those who hold that overcoming resentment is either necessary or sufficient for forgiveness, there is disagreement about what resentment is. Some think of resentment as a “hostile feeling” which aims at inflicting harm on the wrongdoer (Garrard & McNaughton 2002), while others think of it as a kind of “moral protest” (Hieronymi 2001), while still others think of resentment as the paradigmatic sort of “moral anger” (Hughes 1993). Whereas some describe resentment as a “vindictive passion” (Murphy 2003: 16) others claim that resentment “need not entail motivation to retaliate for the wrong” (Holmgren 2012: 31). In recent work, Jeffrey Blustein describes resentment as being a member of a class of attitudes that are “feelings of insult” (2014: 33; cf. Murphy & Hampton 1988: 44–5).
It is difficult to know what exactly these characterizations of resentment amount to, what kinds of relations hold between them, and perhaps most importantly, which view is correct. Indeed, this is one of the more troublesome aspects of the philosophical literature on forgiveness: while it is commonly thought that forgiveness crucially implicates resentment, there is no such consensus about what resentment is (contra Holmgren 2012: 35). And as we have already noted, even though resentment is widely thought to be the central or paradigmatic emotion that forgiveness implicates, not all emotional accounts accept that view.
So here is a rough and ready way of categorizing the various emotion accounts as regards the set of relevant emotions that forgiveness implicates. Let minimal emotionalism be the view that in order to forgive, one must overcome a very narrow set of emotions: only “hostile retributive feelings”, attitudes whose aim is to see the offender suffer for what she has done (Garrard & McNaughton 2002: 44). Examples of such emotions include the feelings of malice, spite, or ill-will that might arise as a response to being wronged. The minimal emotionalist can allow that there are lots of negative emotions that one might experience upon being wronged (e.g., anger, sadness, disappointment, hurt), but they claim that forgiveness requires only that we overcome a small subset of them—those emotions that might be best described as vengeful or hostile.
Alternatively, let moderate emotionalism be the view that in order to forgive, one must overcome both hostile retributive feelings and what we may call moral anger. According to moderate emotionalism, overcoming hostile feelings is not enough for forgiveness. One may harbor moral anger towards a wrongdoer (so the view goes) without thereby wishing that she suffers for what she did. But both moral anger and hostile feelings must be given up in order to forgive. Paul Hughes defends something like moderate emotionalism. An attitude counts as moral anger according to Hughes if it is “partially constituted by the belief that you have been wrongfully harmed by another” (1993: 331). As Hughes notes, not all anger is moral; if you are angry because a bird drops a gift on your head, your anger is non-moral for it is not constituted by a belief that the bird has done you a wrong. But because resentment is, according to Hughes, a paradigm case of moral anger, it must be overcome in order for one to forgive. Charles Griswold also appears to have in mind a kind of moderate emotionalism:
Forswearing resentment does not require giving up every ‘negative’ feeling associated with the injurious event […] Forgiveness does however mean overcoming negative feelings that embody and perpetuate the key features of resentment, feelings that very often accompany resentment—such as contempt and scorn—insofar as they are modulations of the moral hatred in question. (2007: 41)
Although Griswold thinks of resentment as a kind of moral hatred, he does not think of resentment as involving a desire to inflict suffering on the wrongdoer, but rather as a desire to “exact a due measure of punishment” (2007: 26). In this respect his view differs from Garrard and McNaughton, who do target those emotions that involve desires to inflict suffering on the wrongdoer.
Finally, let expansive emotionalism be the view that in order to forgive a wrongdoer, the victim must overcome all negative emotions that the victim has towards the wrongdoer on account of the wrongdoing in question. Norvin Richards is commonly cited as a defender of what we are calling expansive emotionalism: “to forgive someone for having wronged one is to abandon all negative feelings based on the episode in question” (1988: 79). On Richards’ view, not only must one overcome emotions like malice and moral anger in order to forgive, one must also overcome emotions like sadness and disappointment (1988: 77–79). In recent work, Jeffrie Murphy has also endorsed a more expansive emotionalism. Although he once argued that forgiveness ought to be construed narrowly as the overcoming of resentment, Murphy has now, citing the influence of Richards and others, become more ecumenical, writing that we should
think of forgiveness as overcoming a variety of negative feelings that one might have toward a wrongdoer—resentment, yes, but also such feelings as anger, hatred, loathing, contempt, indifference, disappointment, or even sadness. (2003: 59; see also Holmgren 1993: 341 and Blustein 2014)
The set of emotions that victims might possess in response to being wronged by another agent therefore form a large and diverse landscape.
Emotion theorists claim that in order to forgive one must make certain alterations to one’s emotional life. But what kind of changes must occur? Writers on forgiveness often speak of the overcoming of resentment. In doing so we follow precedent (e.g., Murphy 2003: 16; Holmgren 1993: 341). But other writers have claimed that one is to “abandon” (Richards 1988: 184) or “forbear or withdraw” (Darwall 2006: 72) resentment. Still others claim that forgiveness involves “letting go” of (Griswold 2007: 40) or the “elimination of” (Lauritzen 1987: 142) resentment. Rarely is much more said about the machinery of these proposed changes to one’s emotional life (notable exceptions include Hughes 1993, Hieronymi 2001, and Blustein 2014). We therefore want to know what kinds of changes are at issue with respect to each of these claims, and what relations hold between them? Does, for example, overcoming resentment entail that one has totally eliminated it? There are at least two facts about the relevant notion of overcoming about which most emotion theorists seem to agree.
First, emotion theorists have been keen to clarify that it is not just any kind of elimination of resentment that is at issue. Were you accidentally to fall and hit your head on a rock, thereby causing your resentment to be eliminated, you would not have forgiven. Or if your resentment simply withered away over the years via a process outside of your control or ken, it is widely thought that you would not have forgiven (cf. Horsbrugh 1974: 271). Emotion theorists therefore usually require that the forgiver’s resentment be overcome for reasons (e.g., Murphy 2001: 561). What kinds of reasons? Sometimes the right kinds of reasons are claimed to be specifically moral reasons (Murphy 2003: 16; Griswold 2007: 40). Murphy suggests that the fact that the wrongdoer “repented or had a change of heart”, “meant well (his motives were good)”, or “he has suffered enough” are the right kinds of reasons (1988: 24). But here, we should be careful to distinguish between two different questions. One question is a conceptual one, concerning what kinds of motivating reasons make forgiveness possible at all. But another kind of question, a normative one, concerns what motivating reasons make forgiveness, on any given occasion, appropriate (or permissible or praiseworthy). If Murphy is right, then it appears that one cannot forgive because one wanted to win a bet. This raises questions as to how moralized our conception of forgiveness ought to be. Should our account of forgiveness require that in order to forgive, one must do so for (only) moral reasons? Or could one forgive for merely prudential reasons (Ingram 2013)? We will return to this issue below.
Second, it is widely thought that the kind of overcoming of resentment that is implicated in forgiveness involves what Marilyn McCord Adams describes as “agent effort” (1991: 284). Even when one eliminates resentment for (the right) reasons, it is possible to do so using the wrong kind of process. Forgiveness therefore must have the right kind of history. Suppose, for example, that one sought to forgive and that the miracle of modern medicine produced a pill that, if ingested, could immediately eliminate one’s resentment. It has seemed to many that taking the resentment-eliminating pill does not qualify as forgiving (even if one were to take the pill for the right kinds of reasons). Why? It’s hard to say exactly, but many philosophers think of forgiveness as a manifestation of a virtue, a disposition to act and feel in certain ways (Roberts 1995; Pettigrove 2012). On this view, forgiving acts are properly understood as being the kinds of things that must “go through” the agent in a certain sort of way, either by way of an agential “struggle” against resentment or a decision to give up or do without resentment (what is commonly described as “forswearing”).
Still, many questions remain. First, which processes of overcoming the relevant emotions are the right ones? Hieronymi (2001) argues that in paradigmatic cases, resentment is eliminated by revising a specific judgment that rationally supports it, namely the judgment that the wrongdoer’s past action stands as a present threat. For discussions of this judgment-based approach to how forgiveness overcomes resentment see Zaragoza (2012), Nelkin (2013), and Warmke (2015). Blustein (2014) argues that overcoming the relevant emotions should be understood as involving a certain kind of forgetting.
Second: need the relevant emotions be eliminated completely or perhaps only moderated, and what are we to say if the relevant emotions return (perhaps unbidden, perhaps not) at some point in the future? One might, for example, hold that a forgiver must eliminate all traces of the relevant negative emotion(s). It is uncommon to find this view stated explicitly, but Haber has attributed to it to some philosophers (1991: 7). Others have claimed that what is needed is not the total and final elimination of resentment, but rather, some sort of moderation. Margaret Holmgren, for example, allows that resentment can reoccur:
By overcoming her negative feelings at the time she forgives, the victim does not necessarily eliminate these feelings without a trace. They may recur from time to time throughout her life. However, once she has determined that forgiveness is the appropriate attitude towards her offender and has overcome her negative feelings towards him, it will presumably be possible for her to conquer these feelings again if they do recur. Thus we can plausibly say that the victim has forgiven her offender when she first overcomes her resentment towards him. (1993: 341–2)
There is also a strand of discussion in the forgiveness literature that crucially implicates the forswearing of resentment (or some other attitude or behavior). P.F. Strawson claims:
[T]o ask to be forgiven is in part to acknowledge that the attitude displayed in our actions was such as might properly be resented and in part to repudiate that attitude for the future (or at least for the immediate future); and to forgive is to accept the repudiation and to forswear the resentment. (1962: 76)
The difference between overcoming and forswearing (or renouncing) some attitude is not usually made explicit. Sometimes the terms appear to be used interchangeably. Marilyn McCord Adams, however, distinguishes overcoming an attitude (which she suggests involves “agent effort”) from forswearing an attitude, which she describes as a “deliberate act” (1991: 284). The implication is that forswearing (as an act of renunciation) is something one does straightaway, whereas overcoming is not. One may forswear resentment by making a decision or making a commitment, but to decide to give up or commit to eliminate resentment does not imply that one has or will overcome it.
5.2 Butlerian Accounts
Bishop Joseph Butler is commonly cited as the progenitor of emotion accounts. In a way, this is not surprising, for his legacy in the philosophical literature on forgiveness rests on two of his Fifteen Sermons (1726): Sermon VIII (“Upon Resentment”) and Sermon IX (“Upon Forgiveness of Injuries”). Butler does indeed make clear that resentment and forgiveness are importantly related, and his interpreters have often attributed to him the view that forgiveness is the forswearing or overcoming of resentment (Murphy 1988: 15; Haber 1991: 16; Holmgren 1993: 341)
Ernesto Garcia (2011) has called this interpretation of Butler the “Renunciation Model”, according to which Butler holds: (1) that resentment is a “negative vindictive response that is incompatible with goodwill”; and (2) that forgiveness occurs “only insofar as we forswear or renounce our negative feelings of resentment towards our wrongdoers” (2011: 2). Garcia and others have convincingly argued, however, that Butler did not advocate the Renunciation Model, for he advocated neither of these two theses (Garcia 2011; Griswold 2007: 19–37, and Newberry 2001). This is not the place to explore Butler’s view in great detail. However, we can bring into relief enough of Butler’s account of forgiveness to show why he does not advocate the Renunciation Model.
Consider the claim that Butler held that resentment is a response to injury that is incompatible with good-will and therefore forgiveness. What Butler actually says, however, is that forgiveness is perfectly compatible with an attitude of resentment. Butler held that resentment helps us to deal with those who harm us: it motivates us to insulate ourselves from wrongdoers, and it motivates us to deter future wrongdoing via punishment. When resentment has these ends it serves the public good and is therefore compatible with the general obligation to good-will [IX.9]. Indeed, as Butler puts it, resentment is both “natural” [VIII. 11] and “innocent” [VIII.19]. Therefore, resentment as such is compatible with good-will.
Butler does say that resentment can be dangerous, but it is not resentment as such that is the problem. Rather, he claims that when resentment is allowed to become “excessive” it can easily lead an agent to pursue revenge, not as a means to producing some greater social good, but as a self-gratifying exercise that seeks “the misery of our fellow creatures” [IX.10]. But to let resentment carry one this far is to violate a general obligation to benevolence. To forgive, then, is simply to prevent resentment from having this effect on us. The divine command to benevolence is therefore just the command to “prevent [resentment] from having this effect, i.e. to forgive injuries, is the same as to love our enemies” [IX.13.]. Resentment itself is natural and innocent. It is only when it is indulged and allowed to bleed into revenge that a violation of goodwill occurs. But this is the work of forgiveness: to prevent resentment from leading us to seek revenge. Therefore, Butler does not think that forgiveness is the forswearing or overcoming of resentment.
What, then, is forgiveness according to Butler? Griswold claims that Butler’s forgiveness involves two aspects: (1) the forswearing of revenge; and (2) a moderation of resentment to an appropriate level (2007: 36). Yet according to Ernesto Garcia, “Butlerian forgiveness simply amounts to being virtuously resentful by avoiding both excessive and deficient resentment against our wrongdoers” (2011: 17). On Garcia’s interpretation, Butlerian forgiveness seems to require no emotional change at all—one can be virtuously resentful without ever having been viciously resentful. It is unclear whether Griswold thinks that Butler would require emotional change. If all that is required is that resentment be kept in check, this could be done without it ever having been excessive. On the other hand, if the requirement is that one must go through the process of moderating one’s resentment, this would require some kind emotional change (although not one that would require eliminating it entirely or even trying to do so).
5.3 Punishment-forbearance Accounts
Other approaches to forgiveness claim that there is an important connection between forgiving and punishment. The Oxford English Dictionary includes “pardon” in its definition of ‘forgive’, and Hobbes drew a connection between forgiving and the facility to pardon in his sixth Law of Nature: “A sixth law of Nature is this, ‘that, upon caution of the future time, a man ought to pardon the offences past of them that, repenting, desire it’” ( 1969). Remarking on this law, Bernard Gert writes, “This virtue, which Hobbes calls having the facility to pardon, one can also call being forgiving” (2010: 98). In a similar vein, Leo Zaibert has recently argued that “forgiveness is deliberately to refuse to punish” (2009: 368). According to the psychologist Robert Enright and his colleagues, forgiveness involves “the casting off of deserved punishments” (Enright et al. 1992: 88). On these punishment-forbearance views of forgiveness, forgiving crucially implicates the forbearance of punishment.
According to these views, when one forgives one commits not to hold a past wrong against someone and (so the story goes) were one to punish, doing so would be to hold a past wrong against the wrongdoer. Punishment-forbearance accounts may come in a variety of flavors, depending on how one understands the logical relations between forgiving and forbearing punishment (see, e.g., Londey 1986: 4–5; Wolsterstorff 2009: 203; Bash 2015: 53; Russell 2016). One could hold that forbearing punishing is necessary for forgiveness, or sufficient, or both. Alternatively, one could make a normative claim about the relations between forgiveness and punishment: forgiving a wrongdoing makes future punishment for that wrong morally inappropriate (see, e.g., Swinburne 1989: 97).
Some reject these claims about the relationship between the forbearance of punishment, instead finding “no clash between punishment and forgiveness” (Mabbott 1939: 158; cf. Haber 1991, Murphy 2003: 101; O’Shaughnessy 1967). For further discussion of the relationship between punishment and forgiveness see Griswold (2007: 32–33), Pettigrove (2012: 117–121), Russell (2016), Tosi and Warmke (2017); and Warmke (2011, 2013).
5.4 Multiple-Stage Accounts
In an insightful chapter on the relationship between forgiving and hatred, Jean Hampton argued that forgiveness is a two-stage process, the first of which “involves regaining one’s confidence in one’s own worth despite the immoral action challenging it”, which can be accomplished by
overcoming, in the sense of “giving up” or “repudiating”, emotions such as spite and malice, and “overcoming” in the sense of “transcending” resentment. (Murphy & Hampton 1988: 83)
A further stage is required, however, for even after the first stage, one might still hate the wrongdoer and hatred, according to Hampton, is incompatible with forgiveness. Therefore, at the second stage, the forgiver “reapproves” of the wrongdoer (Murphy & Hampton 1988: 83), deciding to see the “wrongdoer in a new, more favorable light” (84), “revising her judgement of the person himself” (85).
This does not mean that the forgiver comes to approve of the wrongdoer’s action or the character trait that precipitated it—that disapproval must remain in order for forgiveness not to collapse into condonation. Rather, by having a change of heart towards the wrongdoer himself, the forgiver frees herself from hatred and indignation, allowing herself to accept the wrongdoer as a decent person worthy of “renewed association” (Murphy & Hampton 1988: 83, 85). On Hampton’s account then, forgiveness requires both a change in emotion towards the wrongdoer, and an intentional alteration of one’s assessments about the wrongdoer as a person, which is why she holds that “forgiveness must be defined so that it involves more than simply effecting certain psychological changes for moral reasons” (1988: 37). Forgiving, therefore, is accomplished when one successfully goes through both stages. For more on Hampton’s account see Radzik (2011).
5.5 Performative Accounts
The views of forgiveness canvassed thus far have, by and large, focused on forgiveness as a private phenomenon, involving, for example, a change in emotion. But another strand of thinking attends to our social and linguistic practices related to forgiveness, most notably, our practice of saying “I forgive you” or some cognate expression. Joram Haber argued that the question “What is forgiveness?” is best answered, “in the context of what speakers mean when they employ the term” (1991: 53), even if there are other ways to forgive besides uttering “‘I forgive you’” (1991: 40). According to Haber, understanding forgiveness requires discovering what one does when one performs the linguistic act of expressing forgiveness, typically by way of the utterance, “I forgive you” (1991: 29).
To see what Haber and his followers have in mind, we need a bit of background. J.L. Austin (1975) called attention to two ways to understand what we do when we speak. In the first instance, we can think of an utterance simply as a locutionary act, which is simply the act of uttering a sentence with a certain sense and reference. But we do not typically utter sentences simply for the sake of uttering sentences. We also ask questions, make demands, warn of threats, persuade detractors, express our preferences, inter alia. Austin suggested that in addition to the performance of the act of uttering a sentence, we may also perform an act in uttering a sentence, what he called illocutionary acts. Consider the sentence “I would like a ham sandwich”. The locutionary act is the utterance of the sentence itself. The illocutionary act might be one of simply communicating a desire, or it might be one of (in a different context) ordering a sandwich at the deli counter.
One way to examine what a speaker does when one says “I forgive you” is therefore to ask what illocutionary acts one performs when one does so. Haber focuses on a class of illocutionary acts that Austin called behabitives,
which include the notion of reaction to other people’s behavior and fortunes and of attitudes and expressions of attitudes to someone else’s past conduct or imminent conduct. (Austin 1975: 160)
Examples of locutions with behabitive force include statements like, “I applaud you” and “I commend you”, which serve to express or exhibit the speaker’s attitude about the conduct of the intended audience. Understood as a behabitive, “I forgive you” functions as an illocutionary act that communicates to the audience that the speaker possesses certain attitudes about her. Haber suggests that for S to say “I forgive you” to X regarding some act A of X’s, S represents (among other things) that (S) has overcome his resentment for X’s doing A, or is at least willing to try to overcome it (1991: 40). Building on Haber’s account, Glen Pettigrove argues that when a speaker says “I forgive you”, she reveals three facts about herself: (1) that the speaker believes that she has been wronged by the one to whom she speaks; (2) that the speaker has an absence of hostile reactive attitudes that might have arisen in response to the wrongdoing; and (3) that the speaker has some degree of positive regard for the one she addresses (2004a: 379).
Speech acts may also function as commissives, which have the illocutionary force of committing the speaker to an action or a course of conduct. One might say, “I promise to buy you a tangerine tomorrow”, or “I will never lie to you again”. In doing so, the speaker places herself under an obligation to do (or not do) what she says she will do (or not do). Pettigrove claims that in addition to functioning as a behabitive, “I forgive you” can also function as a commissive by committing the speaking to forswear hostile reactive attitudes and retaliation toward the wrongdoer and to treat her with an appropriate level of benevolence (2004a: 385).
Used as a declarative, utterances or expressions may have the effect of (to put it crudely) changing reality in various ways. An appropriate authority might, for example, say, “I christen this ship”, or “I hereby find you guilty”. By making such an utterance, one is actually able to make it so that a ship is christened or that one is found guilty. Understood as a declarative, the utterance “I forgive you” (or one of its cognates) makes it the case that one has been forgiven, thereby altering the operative norms governing the interaction between victim and wrongdoer (Warmke 2016a, 2016b). Much like one can declare a debt forgiven (or a criminal pardoned), one can declare that one has been forgiven by sincerely saying something like “I forgive you” (Swinburne 1989). Such a declaration could release a wrongdoer from certain kinds of personal obligations to the victim (such as further apology or restitution, remorse or penance) (Nelkin 2013). It might also function as a way for the victim to relinquish certain rights or permissions to continue blaming the wrongdoer (Warmke 2016b).
Three clarifications about performative accounts are in order. First, one need not think that performative forgiveness possesses only one kind of illocutionary force. Pettigrove (2004a, 2012), for example, argues that “I forgive you” can function as both a behabitive and commissive. Some hold that it can function as a behabitive, commissive, and declarative (Warmke 2016b). Second, defenders of performative accounts need not hold that acts of forgiveness qua performative, must always function in the same way, for it might be that even if “the language of forgiveness is quite often put to a performatory use, and it is not always put to the same performatory use” (Neblett 1974: 269; cf. Pettigrove 2012: 17–8). It may be that sometimes “I forgive you” functions only as a behabitive, and other times also as a commissive. Third, defenders of performative accounts need not think that only speech acts (e.g., utterances of “I forgive you”) can fulfill the performative functions of forgiving. Cognate communicative acts, gestures, and facial expressions may achieve the same result (Swinburne 1989: 85).
5.6 Pluralist Accounts
Some philosophers have argued that forgiveness is just too diverse and diffuse of a practice to be captured by a simple, singular theory. Nick Smith observes that our “notions of forgiveness seem to identify a loose constellation of interrelated meanings among various beliefs, judgments, emotions and actions” (2008: 134). Responding to the view that forgiveness is the same wherever it occurs, William Neblett writes that
if there is anything about forgiveness that is always the same, no matter the context, it is very little, and it is none of the various things that philosophers are prone to say that it is, that it must be (like the wiping away of all resentment and ill-will). (1974: 273, cf. 269)
Marilyn McCord Adams has suggested that forgiveness has two “modalities”, which she labels “performative forgiveness” and “forgiveness from the heart” (1991: 294). Forgiveness from the heart, she writes, “involves a process of letting go of one’s own point of view (regarding the situation, one’s self and/or the victim, and the offender)”, which will typically “involve many changes in feelings, attitudes, judgments and desires” (1991: 294–5, italics original). Performative forgiveness, on the other hand, “focuses on externals (material compensations or behavior) and the formal structures of relationships, not on inner attitudes or feelings” (1991: 294). Examples include “the public acceptance of apologies for small injuries” and cases in which a “civil suit could be pressed but is legally or officially waived”, either of which, she claims, may be accomplished absent any “commitment to change one’s attitudes or feelings” (1991: 294). The key thought to which Adams draws our attention is that the phenomena counting as forgiveness can be understood as possessing an interior dimension or an exterior dimension (and sometimes both) (cf. Zaibert 2009; Warmke & McKenna 2013). Adams’s forgiveness from the heart occurs in this interior dimension insofar as it involves those things that can be roughly described as psychological: judgments, beliefs, emotions, feelings, decisions and intentions are interior aspects of forgiveness. The exterior “performative” dimension involves those things that can be roughly described as bodily. The relevant kinds of bodily conduct might include things like utterances of “I forgive you”, gestures, friendly behaviors, or a written letter or email.
In the recent years, the topic of self-forgiveness has drawn considerable attention (see, e.g., Williston 2012; Milam 2015). Indeed, it does seem a commonplace that people claim to forgive themselves both for wrongs they commit against others, and for self-directed wrongs in the form of some sort of personal failure or shortcoming, such as violating a commitment to another person; or failing to adhere to a diet. Although there seems to be no logical reason to think self-forgiveness as overcoming various forms of self-directed moral reactive attitudes such as disappointment or disgust is fundamentally unlike interpersonal forgiveness, there are significant differences between the two. First, and notwithstanding the fact that people may be angry with themselves, experience self-directed loathing, and struggle to overcome such negative emotional attitudes, it is not clear that the idea of resenting oneself is coherent and, thus, whether forgiveness as overcoming self-referential resentment is possible, at least on certain accounts of forgiveness. This is because resentment in the sense at issue requires such cognitions as that the wrongdoer is a moral agent and the victim a moral subject whose rights are in some way violated by a wrongdoer. That one and the same person is involved simultaneously as agent and subject, wrongdoer and victim, in this drama is often thought incompatible with the idea that resentment is necessarily directed at other people (Arendt 1958).
Nancy Snow (1992) argues that self-forgiveness serves two important self-regarding purposes (though see Hughes 1994). First, it serves the purpose of restoring wrongdoers to full moral agency even in the absence of the victim’s forgiveness. This is similar to Holmgren’s claim (1998) that self-forgiving is a way of restoring or maintaining one’s intrinsic self-worth, which she argues is an extension of her analysis of interpersonal forgiveness. Zenon Szablowinski (2011) concurs, arguing that a failure to self-forgive may be detrimental to a wrongdoer’s moral and psychological well-being, and that such forgiveness is morally appropriate when a wrongdoer’s guilt, shame, or self-loathing reach significantly high levels. Second, it constitutes a second-best alternative to full interpersonal forgiveness, in the sense that when full interpersonal forgiveness is not forthcoming (and there can be many reasons for this), self-forgiving is nevertheless an important and sometimes morally appropriate response to having done wrong.
7. Divine Forgiveness
The topic of God’s relation to human wrongdoing is an important one in mainstream Western theological and philosophical discussions of forgiveness, but it is by no means clear what the relationship is supposed to be between God and forgiveness, and the connection between that and the possibility of forgiveness between persons. This is because there is some question whether the differences between divine and human forgiveness are so significant that any comparison between them is inapt. As one author puts the point,
The difference between the human and the divine should not be underestimated, and it is possible that it would not just be over optimistic but actually dangerous to expect people to model their behavior on God. (Tombs 2008: 592)
The concern expressed in this remark is that whereas God’s forgiveness is supposedly unilateral, unilateral human forgiveness may be irresponsible, as when a victim of wrongdoing forgives a wrongdoer irrespective of any signs of repentance on the part of the wrongdoer. Another writer argues that the gap between human and divine forgiveness is unbridgeable, for God’s forgiveness is grounded in “eschatological divine justice” not, as in human forgiveness, in an awareness of “sinful solidarity with humanity” (Williams 2008: 584–585).
If divine forgiveness is possible, what is its nature? Douglas Drabkin reports that “there is no other way that God can forgive us, as far as I can see, except through a change in emotion” (1993: 237). What kind of emotional changes might be at issue? For many, the obvious candidate will be resentment. And so on this view, when we do wrong, God has resentment towards us. To follow Jonathan Edwards, we are “sinners in the hands of an angry God”. God forgives us by eliminating that resentment (though see Minas 1975).
One need not think that God gives up resentment, however, to adopt an emotion theory of divine forgiveness. Douglas Drabkin has argued that there is a kind of emotional change that is natural to suppose that God experiences and that this change is a good candidate for divine forgiveness. On his view, God, like any loving parent, will “suffer on our account” when we do evil (235). “When we repent”, he says, “God feels our joy and ceases to suffer” (235). He concludes: “This, I am suggesting, is how God forgives us: by rejoicing in our repentance” (235). However, on those theological views according to which God is impassible (i.e., God is unable to suffer or have reactive emotions), these kinds of emotion views will be off the table (see, e.g., Gavrilyuk 2004).
Another approach to divine forgiveness says that God forgives by forbearing punishment. Some philosophical discussions of divine forgiveness have proceeded as if this view (or something very much like it) is the default position. For example, David Londey proceeds to answer this question by operating with a conception of forgiveness that crucially involves the remission of any “penalty or sanction”, including “moral censure” and “more tangible punishments” that a wrongdoer is due (1986: 5). In their respective replies to Londey defending the possibility of divine forgiveness, Andrew Brien and Dean Geuras each assume a punishment-forbearance view according to which forgiveness is the forbearing of any punishment one ought to inflict (Brien 1989: 35) and the remission of a deserved penalty (Geuras 1992: 65). Swinburne argues that God’s forgiveness is akin to the forgiveness of a kind of debt: when God forgives us, the guilt that our wrongdoing incurred is wiped away (1989). See also Bash (2015), Brien (1989), Mackintosh (1927), Minas (1975), and Scheiber (2001).
8. Political Forgiveness
The power of pardon enjoyed by duly established political authorities may be at best a loose cognate of forgiveness, but this is not to say that all legal or political analogues to forgiveness are implausible (for discussion see MacLachlan 2012, cf. Norlock & Veltman 2009). P.E. Digeser (2001) has argued in favor of a conception of political forgiveness that breaks sharply with the standard philosophical accounts of forgiveness as involving the overcoming of resentment or other negative emotional states by victims of wrong. Instead, Digeser seeks to divest political forgiveness of any personal feelings whatsoever in favor of a performative account in which such overt behaviors as pardoning a criminal or waiving a debt signify forgiveness. Digeser claims that separating the action of forgiving from its underlying motive and from the constellation of feelings often thought to accompany interpersonal forgiveness better suits a conception of justice as one in which people get their due. On this performative conception, forgiveness consists in political actors or institutions opting not to get their due, for whatever reasons.
Digeser claims to have created a serviceable political notion of forgiveness shorn of its usual psychological baggage. And surely, as noted earlier, there is a sense of forgiveness in which an action such as waiving a debt or an utterance such as “I forgive you” is sometimes all that forgiveness is about. To this extent and in this sense, debt forgiveness and political pardons may reasonably be regarded as political forms of forgiving, and Digeser identifies four forms such political forgiveness may take (2001: 9). First, political forgiveness takes a many-to-one form when a group forgives an individual. Suppose, for example, the American people could forgive former President Clinton for lying to a grand jury, or that a university community could forgive a dean who embezzled funds. Second, we can recognize one-to-many political forgiveness, whereby an individual forgives a group. One can imagine, for example, exonerated prisoners forgiving police forces or the justice system for wrongly arresting or convicting them (for even if no single member of the police or justice system wronged the exonerated prisoner, their joint action may have done so). Third, in many-to-many political forgiveness, groups or collectives enter into forgiveness relations with other groups or collectives. Examples may include the aforementioned cases of U.S.-Japan and Tutsi-Hutu relations. Finally, one-to-one political forgiveness involves individuals forgiving other individuals. President Gerald Ford, for example, famously issued an executive pardon to former President Richard Nixon after his resignation amidst charges that he broke the law.
The past thirty or so years have seen a rapid increase on the part of political leaders apologizing for and seeking reconciliation between perpetrators and victims of moral atrocities. The ostensible aim of such efforts has not only been to rectify past wrongs and give those who have been wronged their due, but to heal deep and sometimes longstanding wounds caused by such wrongs as well. The South African Truth and Reconciliation Commission (TRC) in the mid 1990s is probably the best-known example of such attempts to achieve reconciliation between perpetrators and victims of intra-national collective wrongs (Tutu 1999). Other instances of political apology, aimed in part at effecting some form of forgiveness or reconciliation, include Australia’s “sorry book”, which records citizens’ remorse over a former government policy mandating the forced removal of aboriginal children from their natural parents in the name of cultural assimilation, President Clinton’s apology to African Americans and subsequent proposals by scholars and policy-makers of reparations for slavery, and Northern Ireland’s 1998 Good Friday Agreement and the peace process initiated thereby (Brooks 2004; Biggar 2008). Understanding forgiveness as roughly synonymous with reconciliation supports the notion that these collective endeavors are institutional forms of forgiveness (Radzik 2009).
9. The Ethics of Forgiveness
9.1 Forgiveness as a Virtue
Within Western traditions, forgiveness has often been regarded as a “high” and “difficult” virtue (Scarre 2004), and its opposite, unwillingness to forgive, as a vice. Yet this poses an immediate problem of interpretation, namely, whether forgiveness is a “high” and “difficult” virtue in the sense that while it is morally laudable it is beyond duty (i.e., supererogatory). Since supererogatory actions are permissible, not obligatory, it follows that a failure to forgive, at least in circumstances where forgiving would be supererogatory, would not, contrary to the aforementioned view, be a vice. However, widespread and persistent disagreement within moral philosophy both about supererogation and the deontic nature of forgiveness have led to conflicting views on the relation between forgiveness and moral obligation (see, e.g., Gamlund 2010; Lauritzen 1987). Some thinkers have argued that forgiveness is a duty (Rashdall 1907) while others have maintained that, like a gift with no strings attached, forgiveness is utterly gratuitous (Heyd 1982). It might also be thought that, similar to the duty of charity in Kant’s moral system, forgiveness is properly regarded as an imperfect duty. Unlike perfect duties such as the obligation to justice or honesty, imperfect duties allow for agential discretion over when and with respect to whom to discharge the duty. In this way, forgiveness may be located in a system of moral duties that allows for no supererogatory deeds at all.
In contrast to duty-based approaches to forgiveness, virtue-based perspectives suggest that the overcoming or forswearing of angry reactive attitudes characteristic of forgiveness must be grounded in or expressive of relatively stable and durable dispositions or character traits (Roberts 1995; Sadler 2008; Radzik 2010). On such views, forgiveness is a virtue, or is at least closely aligned with one or more of the traditional virtues such as magnanimity or sympathy. Within ancient Greek thought the views of Plato and Aristotle on the relationship between anger and living virtuously are noteworthy, as is the Christian traditions’ understanding of forgiveness as love or compassion.
Although forgiveness is not identified as a distinct virtue in Plato’s work, the Platonic perspective on anger illuminates the general emotional landscape in which forgiveness has often been located and from which it derives much of its value. In his discussion on the nature of community and individual morality in Book IV of the Republic, Plato makes clear that demonstrations of anger are generally regarded as manifestations of intemperance, which is a vice, and since angry emotions are ever a threat to overwhelm reason and self-control they must be rationally controlled in the name of a harmonious ordering of the different parts of the soul, which is the essence of a morally good person (Republic, 439–442). By contrast, Aristotle, in his discussion of virtues and vices relative to anger in Book IV of the Nicomachean Ethics, explains that “good temper” is the mean between the extremes of irascibility, an excess of anger, and inirascibility, or what he alternatively calls a “nameless” deficiency of anger, and that the good-tempered person “is not revengeful, but rather tends to forgive” (1126a1). Aristotle’s general perspective on morally appropriate anger is that the person of virtue is “angry at the right things and with the right people, and, further, as he ought, when he ought, and as long as he ought” (1125b32). In general, both Plato’s and Aristotle’s views suggest that anger controlled by or expressive of reason may be seen as manifesting virtue, whereas anger ungoverned by rationality is a vice.
A disposition to too readily forgive may be symptomatic of a lack of self-respect, or indicative of servility, ordinarily viewed as moral infirmities or vices (Novitz 1998). This recalls Aristotle’s idea that the person deficient in appropriate anger is “unlikely to defend himself” and “endure being insulted” and is for this reason a “fool” (Nicomachean Ethics, 1126a5), Kant’s notion that a person who fails to become angry at injustices done to him lacks dignity and self-respect (Kant [c. 1770–1794] 1997, cf. Sussman 2005; Ware 2014), and Hume’s assertion that since anger and hatred are “inherent in our very frame and constitution” the lack of such feelings is sometimes evidence of “weakness and imbecility” ( 1958: 605). That interpersonal forgiveness does not always serve morally laudable aims suggests that a general account of the criteria for justified and morally permissible or even obligatory forgiveness is needed to distinguish appropriate from inappropriate forgiving.
Several virtue-theoretic perspectives contrary both to early Greek notions that anger appropriately mediated by reason is a virtue, and from the Christian view that forgiveness as transcending anger in an act of love is a virtue, should be mentioned. First, Nietzsche’s conception of ressentiment as sublimated anger/envy directed at the noble man suggests that both dispositional and episodic anger may be manifestations of weakness or vice, not strength, self-respect, or virtue (Nietzsche  1967; cf. Griswold 2007; Blustein 2014). This is reminiscent of Plutarch’s view that anger is like a disease, and extreme or abiding anger such as rage or bitterness are unnatural dispositional states (Plutarch [c. 100 CE] 2000). We should add to these views the observation that the negative effects of being angrily obsessed by someone’s wrongdoing is not by itself a justification for blaming or forgiving him. Put differently, though it might be a bad thing to be angrily obsessed with having been wronged, it does not follow from this that a victim of wrong must forgive the wrongdoer. There are, after all, other ways of transcending or purging recalcitrant anger which might be more appropriate than would be forgiving.
Nietzsche’s view suggests the further idea that even episodic angry emotions may be a sign of moral infirmity, insofar as such emotions concede power to others by revealing one’s vulnerability to injury. But the truly noble or strong are thought to have, in some sense, no such vulnerabilities. Second, some recent popular views suggest that the uninhibited expression of anger and rage is a good thing, insofar as such venting is cathartic. But on consequentialist grounds alone it seems clear that controlling intense anger rather than its unfettered expression is closer to what a good life requires, for though anger may sometimes be enabling in motivating constructive solutions to personal or political problems, its indiscriminate expression is more likely to be disabling, both for those expressing it and for those around them. This last remark relates to a third disparaging view of angry reactive attitudes, that of the Stoic Seneca, who maintains that all forms of anger are inconsistent with the moral life because they dispose us to cruelty and vengeance, which passions encourage us to see other people as less than fully human (De Ira, c. 50CE). On this view, the person of virtue is one who strives to extirpate anger in all its forms. These three perspectives seem to imply that since anger is never an appropriate emotion, forgiveness cannot be a virtue, at least in the sense of overcoming justified anger.
What is the connection between forgiveness and another virtue, that of justice? Forgiveness has long been regarded by some as in conflict with justice, if not incompatible with it. Seneca (De Clementia, c. 55CE) claimed that
Pardon is given to a man who ought to be punished; but a wise man does nothing that he ought not to do, omits to do nothing which he ought to do; therefore he does not remit a punishment which he ought to exact.
Mercy, by contrast, is aligned with justice in the sense that “it declares that those who are let off did not deserve any different treatment” (De Clementia). Considering the specific circumstances of individual cases is a matter of mercy, “not of forgiveness”. Mercy, unlike pardon and forgiveness, is an exercise of equity, which is an application of justice in light of the unique circumstances of individual cases. By contrast, the prerogative of pardon associated with such political executives as Presidents, Prime Ministers, and other authorities may be viewed, according to Aristotle, as an exercise of equity in the sense that such duly established authorities are commonly thought to use that power as a way of mitigating the rigors of universal standards of justice in their application to particular cases the specifics of which appear to fall beyond the scope of the universal rule (Wolsterstorff 2009; Bingham 2009).
9.2 Norms Governing Instances of Forgiveness
What about the morality of individual acts of forgiveness? Let us use “positive moral status” as an umbrella term to capture the status of an instance of forgiveness insofar as it is morally good, morally virtuous, morally permissible, morally praiseworthy, morally right, morally obligatory, or morally supererogatory. It is commonplace to think that in order for an act of forgiveness to have positive moral status, certain kinds of conditions must be met. Conditionalism is the view that in order for an act of forgiveness to have positive moral status, certain conditions must be met either by the victim or the wrongdoer (or both). For example, it might be thought that in order for forgiveness to have positive moral status, the victim must forgive for certain kinds of good reasons. If the victim does not forgive for those good kinds of reasons, then she does something morally impermissible (or bad, or blameworthy, etc.) by forgiving. We can call such conditions victim-dependent. Alternatively, it might be thought that in order for forgiveness to have positive moral status, the wrongdoer must, say, apologize to the victim. This is a kind of wrongdoer-dependent condition. If the wrongdoer does not apologize to the victim, then the victim does something morally impermissible (or bad, or blameworthy, etc.) by forgiving.
Notice, however, that this claim is to be distinguished from the view according to which, absent a wrongdoer’s apology, the victim’s “forgiveness” is not actually forgiveness at all, but instead condonation or exculpation. On this latter sort of view, the conditions for positive moral status for an act of forgiveness are built into the very constitutive conditions for forgiveness itself. We can call a view of forgiveness that builds the conditions for positive moral status into the conditions for forgiveness itself a “thick” conception of forgiveness. On this view, forgiveness is, as such, always morally good, morally permissible, or otherwise possesses some other such positive moral status. (This is consistent with an act of forgiveness being all things considered wrong if, say, forgiving in some case would cause the death of innocent millions.) In contrast, a “thin” conception of forgiveness is one that allows that an instance of forgiveness can lack positive moral status. Of course, both thick and thin conceptions of forgiveness can require (or not require) that either (or both) victim-dependent and wrongdoer-dependent conditions were first met. And so here, we will set aside this thick/thin controversy and focus on the conditions for morally positive forgiveness as such.
It is widely thought that in order for an act of forgiveness to have positive moral status, the victim must meet certain conditions. The most commonly cited kind of victim-dependent condition has to do with the victim’s motivating reasons for forgiving. Only some kinds of motivating reasons make forgiveness morally positive. For example, Joram Haber has argued that for an act of forgiveness to be “appropriate” (such that were we to forgive we would not risk “moral reproval”), the victim must forgive for a reason that “preserves self-respect” and that the “only reason that would serve this function is that the wrongdoer has repented the wrong she has done” (1991: 90). For Haber, then, it seems that unless the wrongdoer repents and the victim forgives her (at least in part) for this reason, then that forgiveness is morally inappropriate. Haber therefore has two conditions, one wrongdoer-dependent (to repent for the wrong done), and one victim-dependent (to forgive at least in part because the wrongdoer repented). Jeffrie Murphy articulates a similar view, claiming that
acceptable grounds for forgiveness must be compatible with self-respect, respect for others as moral agents, and respect for the rules of morality and the moral order. (Murphy & Hampton 1988: 24)
Examples of the kinds of moral reasons that Murphy has in mind include: that the wrongdoer repented or had a change of heart, that she has suffered enough, and that she has undergone humiliation, such as “the apology ritual” (24).
There may be other kinds of conditions that a victim must meet in order to effect morally positive forgiveness. Charles Griswold writes that in the “paradigmatic scene”, where forgiveness is “at its best” as the manifestation of virtue (2007: 38), in addition to forswearing revenge, moderating resentment, and committing to give up any lingering resentment, the victim must also: (1) revise her view of the wrongdoer as someone who is reducible to the person who did the wrong; (2) give up any presumption of decisive moral superiority and recognize the shared humanity of both parties; and (3) address the wrongdoer and declare that forgiveness is granted (2007: 54–8).
It is more controversial whether morally positive forgiveness requires wrongdoer-dependent conditions. One of the foremost defenders of such conditions is Charles Griswold, who argues that in the “paradigmatic scene”, there are numerous wrongdoer-dependent conditions on forgiveness. Namely, the wrongdoer must: (1) acknowledge that she was responsible for the wrong in question; (2) repudiate the deeds and disavow the thought that she would do them again; (3) experience and express regret at having caused the particular wrong; (4) commit, by deeds and words, to being the sort of person who doesn’t do wrong; (5) show that she understands, from the victim’s perspective, the damage done by the wrongdoing; and (6) offer some sort of narrative to explain why she did wrong (2007: 47–51).
As noted above, Haber claims that repentance is necessary for morally positive forgiveness, as does Wilson (1988). Swinburne claims that, least in the case of “serious hurt”, “it is both bad and ineffective” to forgive when no atonement has been made (where atonement includes some combination of reparation, repentance, apology, and penance) (1989: 84, 86). Although he remains non-committal about the necessity of wrongdoer-dependent conditions, Jeffrie Murphy thinks that “it is not unreasonable to make forgiveness contingent on sincere repentance” (2003: 36).
Why think that a wrongdoer must apologize, repent, or have a change of heart in order for forgiveness to have positive moral status? Two general reasons have been given. First, it is thought that in the absence of apology and repentance, forgiving constitutes a failure to take the wrongdoing seriously enough. If we give up our resentment or discontinue blame while the wrongdoer continues to “stand by” their mistreatment of us, we are in effect condoning the wrongdoing (see, e.g., Kolnai 1973: 95–6). A second kind of reason is that forgiving in the absence of apology and repentance reveals a lack of self-respect. Forgiving the unapologetic will usually, if not always, mean that the victim will “underestimate their own worth and fail to take their projects and entitlements seriously enough” (Novitz 1998: 299; cf. Murphy 1982: 505; Griswold 2007: 64–5). In reply, Pettigrove (2004b, 2012: ch. 6) and Garrard and McNaughton (2011) take on both the condonation and the self-respect arguments, concluding that neither shows that forgiving unrepentant or unapologetic wrongdoers necessarily puts one at moral risk. For discussion of three other objections to the rejection of wrongdoer-dependent conditions—that it has bad consequences, that it is arbitrary, and that absent repentance resentment is still warranted—see Garrard and McNaughton (2011).
Eve Garrard and David McNaughton originally coined the term “unconditional forgiveness” to refer to morally positive forgiveness that doesn’t depend on the actions or attitudes of the wrongdoer (2002). The term itself may be misleading for the kind of conditions on morally positive forgiveness they rejected are what we are calling the wrongdoer-dependent conditions: they argued that an act of forgiveness need not be lacking in positive moral status just because the wrongdoer did not repent, apologize, or make restitution. They did not mean to claim that all acts of forgiveness as such have positive moral status, and so have recently clarified their position, defending what they call “conditional unconditional forgiveness” (2011; cf. Hoffman 2009). Their view is unconditional insofar as morally positive forgiveness does not require that the wrongdoer repent, apologize, or make restitution. However, a victim’s forgiveness may still be “defectively facile” if she fails to grasp the moral significance of the offense and so overcomes her hostile feelings too “smoothly and easily” (Garrard & McNaughton 2011: 105). Her reasons for forgiving may be bad ones and she may display her forgiveness in an illegitimate manner. The illegitimacy of such forgiveness, however, has nothing to do with the wrongdoer’s actions or state of mind.
Margaret Holmgren articulates a similar view, arguing that once a victim completes a certain kind of process,
forgiveness is always appropriate and desirable from a moral point of view, regardless of whether the wrongdoer repents and regardless of what [the wrongdoer] has done or suffered. (1993: 341)
Absent this process, however, the victim forgives prematurely, and her forgiveness may therefore be incompatible with her own self-respect and therefore inappropriate (1993: 341, 342). Notice that for Holmgren, whether one’s forgiveness is self-respecting depends wholly on whether the victim herself goes through a certain kind of process. On her view, forgiveness that is compatible with self-respect does not depend on the actions or attitudes of the wrongdoer. What kind of process is required? Holmgren identifies six general elements of this process: the victim must (1) recover her self-esteem; (2) come to fully appreciate the nature of the wrongdoing and why it was wrong; (3) acknowledge as basic and legitimate her feelings of anger and grief as a result of being wronged; (4) not withhold something she needs to say or express to the wrongdoer about her beliefs and feelings; (5) reassess the nature of her relationship with the wrongdoer; and (6) determine whether she wants to seek restitution from the wrongdoer (1993: 343–4).
9.3 Skepticism About the Morality of Forgiveness
All of the views canvassed thus far allow that, at least in some circumstances, forgiveness has positive moral status. But some philosophers have expressed skepticism about the morality of forgiveness as such. For example, some “perfectionist” views of morality might see forgiveness, not as having intrinsic moral value, but as having only instrumental or remedial value. A perfectionist view might hold that whatever attitudes or actions we overcome or forbear in forgiveness were not morally good in the first place: to feel resentment, for example, admits of moral error. And so if one is in a position to forgive, this would reveal only that something morally sub-par had already occurred in how a victim responded to being wronged. Forgiveness might be thought then as just the mechanism by which we expunge those already morally mistaken reactions. Griswold argues that something like this perfectionist scheme can be found in the ancients from Plato, Aristotle, the Stoics, and the Epicureans (2007: 2–14). And though his views on what we now call forgiveness are complicated, Nietzsche might be understood as “seeing forgiveness as part of a moral system that must be rejected in toto” (Griswold 2007: 15; cf. Blustein 2014: 23–30).
Modern-day skeptics about moral responsibility and blameworthiness might also be committed to a remedial view of the moral status of forgiveness (see, e.g., Pereboom 2014). If no one is morally responsible and blameworthy for what they do, then morally reactive attitudes like resentment will likely be inappropriate for both epistemic and moral reasons. But if forgiving requires that one hold a wrongdoer morally responsible and blameworthy for what they have done, they are making a kind of moral mistake. Forgiving—understood as giving up one’s morally reactive attitudes or blaming behaviors—might be what is required to reverse that mistake, but the need to forgive itself is evidence that something has already gone wrong as regards one’s reactions to being wronged. According to Martha Nussbaum (2016), another modern critic of forgiveness, not only does forgiveness respond to an already normatively problematic attitude (i.e., resentment), it also takes on in its “transactional” form a kind of morally suspect down-ranking: the victim demands apology and humility from the wrongdoer thereby bringing her low until the victim is ready to move on from her anger.
One contemporary critic of the positive moral status of forgiveness is John Kekes (2009), who argues that the “standard view” (viz. that forgiveness is always or at least sometimes morally good) is “seriously flawed”. The reason is simple: “when blaming wrongdoers is reasonable, there is no reason to forgive them; and when blaming them is unreasonable, there is nothing to forgive” (2009: 488; cf. Kolnai 1973; Zaibert 2009; Hallich 2013). On Kekes’ view, whether blame is reasonable depends on (1) whether the blamer’s belief about having suffered undeserved, unjustified, and non-trivial harm is true; (2) whether the emotion such harm elicits is appropriate; (3) whether the motive (for blaming) is commensurate with the harm; and (4) whether the (blaming) action, if there is one, remains within the limits set by the blamer’s relevant belief, emotion, judgment, and motive (2009: 501). And so if someone has done nothing blameworthy, then “neither blame nor forgiveness is appropriate” (2009: 501). On the other hand, if someone has done something blameworthy, then “blame [of the right kind and degree] is appropriate and forgiveness is not” (2009: 501). Either way, to forgive would be to do something morally inappropriate.
Kekes’ argument relies on at least two crucial assumptions. First, it assumes that forgiveness requires giving up the judgment that one has been the victim of undeserved, unjustified and non-trivial harm, a judgment that is “at the core of blame” (2009: 498, contrast Pettigrove 2012: 6–7, fn. 12). If an account of forgiveness had no such requirement, however, then forgiveness would not be inappropriate simply because it required one to adopt a false belief about the past. Second, the argument assumes that when a wrongdoer is blameworthy, then either blame or forgiveness is appropriate, but not both. Yet if one can forgive while still judging truly that the wrongdoer did wrong, then it may be appropriate either to continue to blame or to instead forgive. Blameworthiness may provide reasons that merely justify blame, even if forgiveness is also justified (Warmke & McKenna 2013).
10. The Science of Forgiveness
For much of the history of modern psychology, the topic of forgiveness was largely ignored. Piaget (1932) discussed the capacity of forgiveness so far as it is related to the development of moral judgment. Litwinski (1945) produced a study on the kind of affective structure that would provide one with a capacity to forgive. Emerson (1964) was the first to explore the association of forgiveness with mental health, and Heider (1958) proposed an early working definition of forgiveness (as the forgoing of vengeful behavior). Rokeach (1973) promoted forgiveness as a valuable form of conduct, but didn’t say much about its nature. Discussions of forgiveness as it relates to Prisoner’s Dilemma situations and tit-for-tat strategies were not uncommon (e.g., Gahagan & Tedeschi 1968)—the idea being that forgiveness could be likened to a cooperative move following a competitive move.
In the recent decades, forgiveness has enjoyed a significant increase in empirical attention (McCullough, et al. 2000: 6, 7). Important early work during this time included papers by Boon and Sulsky (1997), Darby and Schlenker (1982), and Weiner, et al. (1991). Yet even after decades of sustained empirical enquiry, psychologists remain divided about how forgiveness ought to be defined. The “major issue characterizing this new science of forgiveness”, Everett Worthington writes, “has been how forgiveness ought to be defined” (2005: 3).
Some psychologists forward interpersonal models of forgiveness. According to these approaches, forgiveness is an activity involving communication (perhaps verbal, perhaps not) between agents. Reconciliation-based models of forgiveness developed out of research in evolutionary psychology and evolutionary ethics (Sapolsky & Share 2004; de Waal & Pokorny 2005; Axelrod 1980a,b). According to these views, forgiveness evolved as a mechanism for affirming mutual cooperation between agents after an act of defection.
Others have sought to define forgiveness by way of intrapersonal models. According to these models, forgiveness occurs within one’s skin, as it were. DiBlasio’s (1998) decision-based model views forgiveness “as an act of the will, a choice to let go or hold onto” resentment, bitterness and the need for vengeance (1998: 76). McCullough and various colleagues have posited a motivational model that understands forgiveness as a process involving a decrease in motivations to avoid or seek revenge, and an increase in benevolent and conciliatory motivations (e.g., McCullough, Fincham, & Tsang 2003). Cognitive models conceive of forgiveness as a reframing of the narrative about the transgression, the transgressor and the forgiver (e.g., Gordon, Baucom, & Snyder 2000; Thompson, et al. 2005). One forgives by changing one’s assumptions, beliefs, standards, or perceptions about the wrongdoer and the wrongdoing. Emotion-based models see forgiveness as being accomplished by the replacement of negative, unforgiving emotions (e.g., anger, hatred) with positive, other-oriented emotions (e.g., empathy) (Worthington 2003; Malcolm & Greenberg 2000).
Still others have suggested mixed models, according to which forgiveness has both interpersonal and intrapersonal modes or aspects. Baumeister, Exline, and Sommer (1998) suggest that when one feels forgiving towards an offender but does not communicate as much, one has silently forgiven. Alternatively, when one does not feel forgiving but tells the offender that she is forgiving her, she accomplishes hollow forgiveness. When one both feels forgiving and tells the offender so, she has accomplished full forgiveness. Enright and Fitzgibbons (2000) have argued that in order to forgive, cognitive, affective, and behavioral changes must be made.
As it should be clear, there is significant disagreement about the nature of forgiveness in the psychological sciences, leading one prominent psychologist of forgiveness to write that “no consensual definition of forgiveness exists” (McCullough, et al. 2000: 7).
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Forgiveness, The John Templeton Foundation.
- The Forgiveness Project.
- Philosophy Bites Program on Forgiveness, interview with Lucy Allais (UC-San Diego).
- Philosophy Bites Program on Derrida and Forgiveness, interview with Robert Rowland Smith.
- Chronological bibliography of philosophical work on forgiveness, maintained by Brandon Warmke (Bowling Green State University).