Catharine Macaulay

First published Thu Jul 5, 2012; substantive revision Mon Jun 1, 2020

Catharine Macaulay’s most substantial work was the eight-volume A History of England from the Accession of James I. to that of the Brunswick Line, the first volume of which was published in 1763, but the last not until twenty years later. This history, which began with the accession of James 1, and told the history of the English Civil War as the outcome of the struggle of the Commons to retain their liberties against the absolutist tendencies of the Stuarts, affirmed the right of the people to depose their monarch. She wrote a further history, in letters, covering the period after 1688, as well as political pamphlets, refuting the monarchism of Hobbes, and the political conservatism of Burke. She criticized the policy of the British Government in the lead up to the American War of Independence, and was welcomed by the Americans, after Independence, as an important advocate of the principles on which the United States was founded. In her pamphlets she defended the right to petition and argued for copyright. Her most philosophical work, A Treatise on the Immutability of Moral Truth (1783), developed the doctrine of the will that she called “moral necessity”; this work was partly reproduced in her Letters on Education (1790), which was, in turn, reviewed by, and profoundly influenced, Mary Wollstonecraft.

1. Life and works

Sources for Catharine Macaulay’s early life are scarce, and modern historians have relied on the account published by Mary Hays in her Female Biography (Hays 1803, 5.287–307; Hill 1992, 1–24). Hays represents Macaulay’s childhood as a romance of miraculous self-education. She was born Catharine Sawbridge on April 2, 1731 (March 23, 1730, old style) the second child of John Sawbridge and Dorothy Wanley, at Olantigh in Kent, a property that had been a gift from her grandfather, who had made a fortune, and then lost much of it as well as his reputation, as a result of his position as one of the directors of the South Sea Company. Having given birth to two daughters and two sons, John and Wanley, Catharine’s mother died leaving her and her siblings to the care of their father, who was often absent, while their uncle Jacob, who was married to Anne Brodnax from the neighboring Godmersham, remained at Olantigh. Though Macaulays cousins by this marriage appear to have had a greater claim, Godmersham was later inherited by Jane Austen’s brother, Edward (Green 2017). According to Hays, Macaulay was educated by “an antiquated, well-recommended, but ignorant governess,” who could not satisfy her intellectual curiosity, and “having found her way into her father’s well-furnished library, she became her own purveyor, and rioted in intellectual luxury” (Hays 1803, 5.288–9). It is here, according to Hays, that she first became interested in the history of the Greeks and Romans, “their laws and manners interested her understanding, the spirit of patriotism seized her, and she became an enthusiast in the cause of freedom.” (Hays 1803, 5.289–90) While perhaps exaggerated, this rather romantic account can be accepted as in essence accurate, since Hay’s informant, “Mrs Arnold of Leicester” was the sister of Macaulay’s second husband. It echoes Macaulay’s own assertion, in the introduction to the first volume of her History of England that,

From my early youth I have read with delight those histories which exhibit Liberty in its most exalted state, the annals of the Roman and the Greek republics. Studies like these excite that natural love of Freedom which lies latent in the breast of every rational being. (Macaulay 1763–83, 1.7)

At the age of twenty-six, she spent an afternoon conversing with Elizabeth Carter, who was then soliciting subscriptions for her translation of Epictetus, and subscribed to her translation. This friend and correspondent of the Bluestocking, Elizabeth Montagu, initially represented Macaulay quite favourably as “more deeply learned than becomes a fine lady” who “between the Spartan laws, the Roman politics, the philosophy of Epicurus, and the wit of St Evremond” had formed “a most extraordinary system.” (Carter 1808, 2. 260; Hill 1992, 11)

Although Macaulay has been associated with the Bluestockings, and along with Montagu and Carter, was included in Richard Samuel’s, 1779, painting, “The Nine Living Muses of Great Britain”, she was too radical for their taste (Guest 2002; Eger and Peltz 2008; O’Brien 2009). This, despite the fact that Montagu and her sister, Sarah Scott, were acquainted with the Sawbridges, who were neighbours in Kent. On hearing of the publication of the first volume of Macaulay’s history, Montagu commented dismissively, “If she took her sentiments from her Father, & her language from Mrs Fuzzard it must be an extraordinary performance” (Elizabeth Montagu to Matthew Robinson-Morris, 2nd Baron Rokeby, 4 December 1763, Newcastle. Huntington Library MSS MO 4763). After her second marriage to the twenty-one year old William Graham, even Carter was shocked, dubbing her “a genius of [a] very eccentric a kind” while Sarah Scott wrote to her sister that they, being “pure virgins and virtuous matrons”, should “drown her in the Avon, and try if she can be purified by water” (Carter 1817, 3. 88–9; Sarah Scott to Elizabeth Montagu, 27 November 1778, Bath. Huntington Library, MSS MO 5391).

Macaulay was almost thirty when she married her first husband, a Scottish physician, George Macaulay, on 18 June 1760. Their marriage lasted only six years; he died in 1766. But during these years, Macaulay began to write her histories with his encouragement and with that of their neighbor Thomas Hollis. The first volume of A History of England from the Accession of James I. to that of the Brunswick Line appeared in 1763, the following three volumes were published at regular intervals in 1765, 1767 and 1768; these were printed for the author and sold by various booksellers. There was then a gap in production. Volume five was published by Edward and Charles Dilly in 1771.Volume six and seven did not appear until ten years later, in 1781, and they were published with a slightly different title, A History of England from the Accession of James I. to the Revolution, as was the last volume, which came out in 1783. In 1767 she published her Loose remarks on certain positions to be found in Mr. Hobbes’s Philosophical Rudiments of Government and Society, and in 1770 her first attack on Edmund Burke, Observations on a Pamphlet entitled “Thoughts on the Cause of the Present Discontents”.

Macaulay’s brother John Sawbridge, a member of parliament, who was elected a London Alderman in 1769, became in the same year a founding member of the Society of the Gentleman Supporters of the Bill of Rights. This society was established with John Horne Tooke and others to support John Wilkes, who had been denied the parliamentary seat he had won for Middlesex, as a result of being outlawed for having published articles criticizing the ministry and the King (Hill 1992, 55–62). However, by 1771, Sawbridge and Tooke had left this society because of its too narrow focus on Wilkes’s interests. Macaulay’s early volumes of history constitute a thinly veiled critique of contemporary political events, and set out the broader principles of the Society of the Bill of Rights, by rehearsing the arguments for the rights of the parliament and the liberties of the people that fuelled the English Revolution.

During the decade in which she let her major history lapse, she lived for about two years at Bath in the house of a Reverend Wilson, who adopted her daughter, and had a statue made of the historian as Clio, which was controversially placed in the nave of the church of St Stephen’s Walbrook. During this period her health was not good, and in 1777 she travelled to France with Elizabeth Arnold. While their aim was the South of France, they did not get further than Paris, where Macaulay enjoyed the vibrant cultural life, though she was shocked by the extent of French social inequality (Hays 1803, 5.295–96). She wrote A History of England, from the Revolution to the present time, in a series of letters to the Reverend Doctor Wilson during this period, but the friendship came to an abrupt, bitter end with her second marriage to twenty-one year old William Graham in 1778. Graham was the younger brother of Elizabeth Arnold and Dr James Graham, whose unconventional remedies Macaulay had followed as a cure for her continual ill health. This act brought a storm of gossip and recrimination; she was accused by Wilson and Wilkes of having had an affair with the older Graham, and generally ridiculed for marrying a man who was her inferior in status and twenty-six years her junior.

The years of her second marriage appear to have been happy and fruitful; during this period she completed her History of England and wrote the Treatise on the Immutability of Truth, which was published in 1783. With her husband she toured the United States, made a particular friend of Mercy Otis Warren, and visited George Washington at Mount Vernon. Her last works were The Letters on Education and her response to Burke’s Reflections on the Revolution in France both of which appeared in 1790. She died on 22 June 1791.

2. Republican Liberty and The History of England

Although Macaulay did not write explicitly about the nature of freedom until quite late in life, her histories should be read as a contribution to the theory of republican liberty, though not quite as that idea has been outlined by Quentin Skinner and Philip Pettit (Skinner 1998, 2008; Pettit 1997). Skinner argues that, as a result of his intention of refuting the political doctrines which lay behind the English Civil War, Thomas Hobbes made innovations in the concept of freedom of the will, and introduced the idea that one acts freely whenever one’s act is caused by one’s own deliberations, and is not impeded by some external constraint. Thus Hobbes simultaneously supported the metaphysical view, according to which freedom and causal determinism are compatible, and introduced the political concept of negative liberty, thought of as freedom from external constraint. He overthrew the then dominant metaphysical concept of human freedom—which had descended from Plato via the later Stoics, Seneca, Epictetus and Marcus Aurelius—according to which we are unfree when our acts are caused by the passions, and free only when we act according to reason, as well as the view that political freedom involves freedom from arbitrary domination.

However, the concept of freedom as rational self-government did not disappear, John Locke, in his Two Treatises Concerning Government, accepted that we are politically free only when governed by a rational law. He argued that the reason why a man only attains to the status of a freeman at the age of maturity is that to be free is to be guided by reason (Locke 1689[1967]). Thus political freedom corresponds to being governed by a rational law, which is the law of nature. However, Locke undermined the epistemological basis of his political principles, which require that there is a moral “law of nature” discoverable by reason, when he insisted, as part of his empiricism, that there is no innate knowledge of principles. While Locke himself thought that reason could discover the rational validity of the law of nature, by reflecting on ideas that we have acquired through sensation and reflection, only a few subsequent writers were convinced by his reasoning. Some, such as Shaftesbury and Hutcheson reintroduced a form of innate knowledge, which nevertheless seemed respectably empirical, by developing the idea of a moral sense. Another anonymous “Remarker”, whose identity is unclear, argued that the closest that an empiricist such as Locke could get to a moral doctrine was a form of Epicureanism, which would reduce morality to enlightened self-interest (Burnet 1989; Walmsley 2016). Hume, following the logic of empiricism, would come to essentially the same conclusion, without seeing this as problematic. The Remarker’s critique of Locke was answered by Catharine Trotter Cockburn, whose attempt to defend Locke was praised by him, but not ultimately fully worked out. Nevertheless, the position that Cockburn developed in later works has some similarities with that which Macaulay defends (Cockburn 1702; Green 2014, 34–39, 172–79). According to Macaulay, there is an immutable moral truth that can be discovered by reason, and as Cockburn will come to do, she uses the concept of “fitness” to explain this process of discovery. Macaulay’s language is also very close to Samuel Clarke’s. But, while Cockburn was directly influenced by Clarke (Bolton 1996; Sheridan 2007), Macaulay claims that she did not read his works until after she had completed her Treatise (Macaulay 1783, viii). She proposes that there is a rule of eternal right grounded in,

… a necessary and essential difference of things, a fitness and unfitness, a proportion and disproportion, a moral beauty and a moral deformity, an immutable right and wrong, necessary independent of the will of every being created or uncreated, explained by the philosopher Plato under the form of everlasting intellectual ideas, or moral entities, coeval with eternity, and residing in the divine mind; from whence, by irradiating rays, like the emitting of the sun-beams, they enlighten the understanding of all those intellectual beings, who, disregarding the objects of sense, give themselves up to the contemplation of the Deity; whilst modern philosophers, in a lower strain of reasoning, assert an abstract fitness of things perceived by the mind of God, and so interwoven in the nature of contemplative objects, as to be traced like other abstract truths, by those faculties of the mind which enable us to compare and perceive the agreement and disagreement of our sensitive and reflex ideas. (Macaulay 1783, 30–2)

Thus, a free people will be governed by a law that is not arbitrary, but rather corresponds to what is fit, and is able to be apprehended by reason. Her history is an account of the struggle of the English people to maintain their freedom in this sense, against the pretensions of Stuart absolutism and the imposition of arbitrary sway.

2.1 Macaulay’s republicanism

While it is clear that Macaulay was a supporter of some form of “republican” liberty, it is less clear whether she was an out and out supporter of republicanism, in the constitutional sense, according to which republicans are opposed to monarchy. In the context of James Boswell’s visit to Corsica, and his subsequent support of the leader of the Corsican independence movement, General Paoli, Macaulay outlined a republican constitution for Corsica, in a letter to Paoli, which she published with her reflections on Hobbes (Macaulay 1767). She does not seem to have thought that, in general, monarchical governments are incompatible with republican liberty, so long as the monarch is constrained by a constitution, governed by law, and the liberty of the people is protected by parliament. She was not opposed to the mixed English constitution, but her design for a republic is interesting for the principles on which she thought government should be founded.

Macaulay begins her letter to Paoli with a strong statement in favour of democracy,

Of all the various models of republics, which have been exhibited for the instruction of mankind, it is only the democratical system, rightly balanced, which can secure the virtue, liberty and happiness of society. (Macaulay 1767, 42)

Her use of the phrase “the democratical system, rightly balanced” suggests the influence of James Harrington’s The Commonwealth of Oceana on her thinking, and the Hills have suggested that one might consider her an “aristocratic republican” with similar views to Harrington (Hill and Hill 1967, 398; Hill 1992, 177). This does not, however, sit well with her general opposition to the inequalities of wealth and power consequent on aristocracy, which we will see are at the heart of her opposition to Burke. She is serious when she claims that,

The very nature of slavish dependence and proud superiority are equally baneful to the virtues inherent in mankind: the first, by sedulous attention and mean adulation to please its master, undermines, and at last subdues the innate generous principles of the soul; and the fond delights of superiority extinguish all the virtues which ennoble human nature, such as self-denial, general benevolence, and the exalted passion of sacrificing private views to public happiness.

According to Macaulay, inequality is one of the factors which militates against a populace being motivated to act in accordance with the immutable moral truths. And, she will later call monarchy supported by aristocracy “the very worst species of government” (Macaulay 1778, 311). A democratical system requires not simply constitutional arrangements, but also mechanisms to ensure that the populace are sufficiently virtuous so as not to be motivated to undermine those arrangements. This will lead to her later interest in education. But in the letter to Paoli she suggests only economic and procedural mechanisms in order to protect the democratic constitution from dissolution.

Her model for a democratic constitution is a bicameral government made up of a senate and a house of representatives. The relatively small senate, of about fifty members, debates and proposes laws. The larger house of representatives, elected by the people, from the people, also debates but does not propose, but rather rejects or accepts the proposals of the senate. The members of the senate are elected, by the representatives, from among their number, for three-year terms, with no re-election within a three-year lapse of time. One third of the senate is replaced yearly. Generals, admirals, magistrates and other civil officers are to sit in the Senate and vote, but are elected by the representatives to one-year terms from among those who have achieved senatorial rank. The two houses of Parliament are also to act as courts of appeal for the administration of justice. Two mechanisms are proposed to prevent the corruption of the constitution by the accumulation of power in individual hands: the strict rotation of functions, and the “right balancing” of wealth.

Macaulay argues that it was the failure to guard against the growth of inequalities in wealth that led to the downfall of the Roman republics.

Had the Agrarian been ever fixed on a proper balance, it must have prevented that extreme disproportion in the circumstances of her citizens, which gave such weight of power to the aristocratical party, that it enabled them to subvert the fundamental principles of the government, and introduce those innovations which ended in anarchy. Anarchy produced its natural effect, viz. absolute monarchy (Macaulay 1767, 35).

The right balancing of wealth is to be ensured by estates being equally divided among sons, and if there are none living, between the closest male relatives. She suggests no female inheritance, and the abolition of dowries, though unmarried women are to be supported by annuities provided by their brothers (Macaulay 1767, 37). Since this appears to deprive women of any economic power, and presumably excludes them from parliamentary representation, this feature of her proposals has been disappointing to feminists, and it has been claimed that she was no defender of women’s rights (Staves 1989). Her later works show that she was nevertheless sympathetic to women’s plight, and she might be excused, in a context in which women’s power was closely associated with luxury and aristocratic privilege, for sacrificing women’s apparent interests for the sake of equality.

2.2 Macaulay’s History and her response to Hobbes

Macaulay has been called a “patriot historian” and her history is certainly intended to praise the English “patriots” who stood up for their fundamental rights against the absolutist tendencies of James I and Charles I (Pocock 1998). Her account of the years leading up to the Civil War constitutes a litany of acts of illegal taxation, abuses of power, arbitrary arrest and inhumane punishments. She praises in particular Sir John Elliot, “as the first martyr to the pre-eminent cause of liberty,” mentioning in particular a manuscript by him in which he argues that kings are subject to laws (Macaulay 1763–83, 2.81). But she is not simply a blind defender of the ancient constitution, or committed to English liberty for its own sake. She believes in the possibility of moral progress, and, as is already clear from her letter to Paoli, she sees the maintenance of a just political constitution, and the development of individual virtue, as inseparably intertwined. Thus she asserts in her response to Burke’s Reflections on the Revolution in France that English liberties are not simply grounded in customs associated with the English monarchy.

I have myself always considered the boasted birthright of an Englishman, as an arrogant pretension, built on a beggarly foundation. It is an arrogant pretension, because it intimates a kind of exclusion to the rest of mankind from the same privileges; and it is beggarly, because it rests our legitimate freedom on the alms of our princes. (Macaulay 1790, 31–2)

In her Loose remarks on certain positions to be found in Mr. Hobbes’s Philosophical Rudiments of Government and Society she rebuts Hobbes’s purely political conception of the state, countering it with her own more moralised conception of the nature of political authority, which also informs her account of the Civil War (Gunther-Canada 2006).

She begins with Hobbes’s claim that humans are not sociable by nature, which she renders as his denial of the proposition that “man is a creature born fit for society.” According to Hobbes, as she represents his doctrine,

… man cannot desire society from love, but through hope of gain: therefore, says he, the original of all great and lasting societies consisted, not in the mutual good will men had toward each other, but of the mutual fear they had of each other. (Macaulay 1767, 1)

But she accuses Hobbes of contradicting himself, because, according to what he also accepts, man is a creature fit for society. Hobbes allows that there is a law of nature, which is the law of right reason. This is the same law of nature that Locke recognises, and is fundamentally the Golden Rule, “do unto others as you would have them do unto you.” Humans need only to acquire reason in order to be able to recognise this rule. And while they may not be born with the capacity to reason, just as they are not born with the capacity to walk, they are born with the means to acquire that capacity. Macaulay concludes:

Therefore man, by being born with the necessary means, is born a creature apt for reason; and a creature apt for reason is a creature fit for society. (Macaulay 1767, 3)

Since moral principles are immutable truths grounded in the nature of things, and discoverable by reason, humans as rational creatures are born capable of discovering these truths, and while their natural rationality may need to be developed by education, this potential for rationality is all that is needed for humans to be deemed naturally sociable.

Macaulay moves on to criticize Hobbes’s strange doctrine in relation to contracts, according to which the people contract with each other to be governed by the sword of an absolute monarch. Implicitly relying on the moral conception of a just contract, Macaulay argues that a contract requires at least two parties. If one of those parties were to dissolve after the contract, as Hobbes suggests the sovereign people do, then the contract would be null and void (Macaulay 1767, 6–7). While this response may not satisfy defenders of Hobbes, it allows us to understand Macaulay’s conception of the social contract as an implicit or explicit contract between the people and some individual or assembly, according to which the people transfer a limited power for the sake of the common good, and retain the right to declare the contract null, in case the other party fails to keep up their end of the bargain. It is in this light that she represents the execution of Charles I.

That the government is the ordinance of man; that, being the mere creature of human invention, it may be changed or altered according to the dictates of experience, and the better judgment of men; that it was instituted for the protection of the people, for the end of securing, not overthrowing the rights of nature; that it is a trust either formally admitted or supposed; and that the magistracy is consequently accountable; will meet with little contradiction in a country enlightened with the unobstructed ray of rational learning. (Macaulay 1763–83, 430–1)

Her text at this point is liberally sprinkled with references to Locke, one of her major sources for the doctrine of republican liberty, which underpins the people’s right to overthrow a monarch who has made himself a tyrant, and in effect reinstituted a state of nature.

She objects also to Hobbes’s claim that there are no natural moral rights and obligations which connect parents and children. Parents have an obligation to care for their children which derives from the nature of the relationship between them,

…reason and morality strongly urges the care and preservation of an existence by themselves occasioned as a duty never to be omitted; by the law of justice, therefore, they, being thus bound to this act, cannot have it in their option whether they will do it or not: but Mr. Hobbes will rather advance any absurdity, than own that power has its rights from reasonable causes. (Macaulay 1767, 10)

Children’s obligations to parents, by contrast, are grounded in gratitude, which is appropriate in relation to the benefits conferred, and so are not binding if parents have not fulfilled their duties to their children.

The bulk of the rest of Macaulay’s response to Hobbes consists in arguments against his defence of monarchy. In general these do not add much to the principles that she has already laid down, but they do add some practical reasons for thinking that monarchical governments will nearly always be defective, which are echoed in Macaulay’s histories. She points out that it is almost impossible to give advice to absolute monarchs, and they are likely to be surrounded by favourites, placemen and flatterers. In her histories she provides many examples of the inconveniences that accompany monarchical power. Commenting on the death of Buckingham she points to him as

… an everlasting monument of the contemptible government that magnanimous nations must submit to, who groan under the mean, though oppressive yoke of an arbitrary sway.

For, as a result of the power of individual monarchs, he

… with no other eminent qualities than what were proper to captivate the hearts of the weakest parts of the female sex, had been raised by these qualities to be the scourge of three kingdoms; and, by his pestilent intrigues, the chief cause of that distress which the French protestants at this time languished under. (Macaulay 1763–83, 2.7–8)

Elsewhere she sums up the reign of Queen Anne with the comment that she

… was a glaring example to shew the ticklish state in which society is involved, whose welfare depends on the conduct of an individual; since a high share of virtue and understanding, those choicest gifts of heaven, are dispensed by the Creator with so sparing a hand, that we find a very few individuals in any age whom we can in this respect mark as the favourites of heaven. (Macaulay 1778, 271)

2.3 Macaulay’s History as a response to Hume

It has often been noticed that Macaulay’s history was read as a response to the popular history of the period published by David Hume, and certainly, Macaulay’s understanding of the significance of the English Civil War, the virtues of the republicans, and the grounds of morality, challenge Hume. Their ideas belong to two diametrically opposed strands of Enlightenment thought. Her religious and ethical views belong to the “moderate enlightenment”, as characterised by Jonathan Israel, while her politics are radical. By contrast, Hume is a naturalist and sceptic whose religious views are in line with those that Israel associates with the “radical enlightenment”, yet he is a political conservative (Israel 2010, 2011; Green 2011; Green 2020). As mentioned above, a tension exists in Locke’s philosophy between his political ideals, which propose the existence of a natural law, which can be known by reason, and his general commitment to an empiricist epistemology. Hume develops Locke’s empiricism in the direction of its sceptical implications, resulting in rejection of the existence of God, immutable moral truth and causal necessity. By contrast, Macaulay follows Locke the political philosopher, and accepts the existence of God, and immutable moral truth, without concerning herself too deeply with regard to the question of how it is that an “abstract fitness of things” can “enable us to compare and perceive the agreement and disagreement of our sensitive and reflex ideas”.

Famously, Hume had criticised those moral theorists whose doctrines Macaulay continued to assert,

… who affirm that virtue is nothing but a conformity to reason; that there are eternal fitnesses and unfitnesses of things, which are the same to every rational being that considers them; that the immutable measure of right and wrong impose an obligation, not only on human creatures, but also on the Deity himself: (Hume 1964, 2.234–5)

He goes on to argue that moral injunctions motivate, and that since only the passions can motivate, moral injunctions must be grounded in the passions. Ultimately, for Hume, what is good is what is useful, a modern version of the Epicureanism, which Burnet had argued, follows from empiricism. For Hume, political constitutions are not grounded in immutable truths, but are based in convention. Since the functioning of a set of conventions depends on people agreeing to abide by certain rules, which are in themselves arbitrary, it is important that people revere authority. For him, the execution of Charles I was a tragedy, brought about by deluded enthusiasts. And he comments in relation to this act:

Government is instituted, in order to restrain the fury and injustice of the people; and being always founded on opinion, not on force, it is dangerous, by these speculations, to weaken the reverence, which the multitude owe to authority, and to instruct them before-hand, that the case can ever happen, when they may be free’d from their duty of allegiance. (Hume 1754, 1.470)

Macaulay’s fundamental attitude to Hume’s history is evident in a short correspondence, which took place in 1764, after a copy of the first volume of her history had been sent to him. Here Macaulay succinctly argues that Hume’s conventionalism implies an obligation to conservatism. Hume suggests that he and Macaulay do not differ as to the facts, but rather on the interpretation that they place on them and he continues:

I look upon all kinds of subdivision of power, from the monarchy of France to the freest democracy of some Swiss cantons, to be equally legal, if established by custom and authority. (“Account of the Life” 1783, 331; Macaulay 2019, 38)

Macaulay’s response is:

Your position, that all governments established by custom and authority carry with them obligations to submission and allegiance, does, I am afraid, involve all reformers in unavoidable guilt, since opposition to established error must needs be opposition to authority.

As a serious reformer, she believed in objective universal standards of justice, which were not being upheld in the Great Britain of her day, just as they had not been during the period that led up to the Civil War.

3. The History in Letters and Macaulay as a critic of Burke

Her criticism of contemporary politics is the subject of A History of England, from the Revolution to the present time, in a series of letters to the Reverend Doctor Wilson in which she argues that, far from having been an advance in English constitutional arrangements, the Revolution of 1688 was a missed opportunity. Although

… the power of the Crown was acknowledged to flow from no other fountain than of a contract with the people … the new monarch retained the old regal power over parliaments in its full extent; he was left at liberty to convoke, adjourn, or dissolve them at his pleasure; he was able to influence elections, and oppress corporations; he possessed the right of chusing his own council, of nominating all the great officers of the state, the household, the army, the navy, and the church; the absolute command over the militia was reserved to the crown; and so totally void of improvement was the Revolution system, that the reliques of the star chamber was retained in the office of the Attorney-General, who in the case of libels has the power of lodging a vexatious, and even false information, without being subjected to the penalty of cost or damage. (Macaulay 1778, 4–5)

The argument developed in this history is that without appropriate constraints on the power of the crown, parliament had inevitably become a tool of court policy. In the second volume of her eight-volume history, she had given an extended account of Wentworth’s manipulation of the Irish parliament, during Charles I’s reign, commenting that it showed “that parliaments are noxious things when they become the dupes of ministers” (Macaulay 1763–83, 2.184–5). The relevance of this reflection for contemporary politics would not have been lost on her readers, and she had anticipated the argument developed in A History of England, from the Revolution to the present time in her first response to Burke.

3.1 Response to Thoughts on the Cause of the Present Discontents

Burke’s pamphlet was prompted by two proposed pieces of legislation, which he argued would, if passed, have undermined the independence of Parliament. One, a consequence of the controversy concerning Wilkes, would have allowed Parliament to expel any of its members at its pleasure. The other committed the Parliament to paying the debts accumulated in the Civil List. These bills, he suggested “must establish such a fund of rewards and terrors as will make Parliament the best appendage and support of arbitrary power that ever was invented by the wit of man” (Burke 1770, 94). He looks back with some nostalgia to the time of Queen Anne, when the Whig party had control of the parliament, and argues that it is only through the power of parties, grounded in aristocratic influence, that the parliament can exercise an effective control over the executive (Burke 1770, 109). Macaulay does not disagree with Burkes’ analysis of the contemporary situation, nor that the increasing dominance of the court was in effect making parliament a tool of court policy, but she rounds on Burke for his inadequate analysis of the causes of the contemporary state of affairs. It was in fact the aristocratic factions, jostling for power, which had enabled the court to deprive the parliament of effective means of controlling the monarch. The Whigs had played a more destructive role in this process than the Tories, because they had concealed their desire for power under the rhetoric of liberty.

A system of corruption began at the very period of the Revolution, and growing from its nature with increasing vigor, was the policy of every succeeding administration. To share the plunder of a credulous people, cabals were formed between the representatives and the ministers. Parliament, the great barrier of our much boasted constitution, while it preserved its forms, annihilated its spirit; and, from a controuling power over the executive parts of government, became a mere instrument of regal administration. (Macaulay 1770, 13)

What is required, according to Macaulay, in order to restore some independence and authority to parliament, is triennial elections, in place of the septennial ones, which had been brought in during William’s reign, and which placed parliamentarians in a position to accumulate too much power of patronage, as well as “a more extended and equal power of election” (Macaulay 1770, 28).

3.2 Response to Reflections on the Revolution in France

Macaulay’s last published work goes to the heart of her disagreement with Burke over the source of political legitimacy. Although Burke did not share Hume’s religious scepticism, like Hume he claimed government to be grounded in opinion, tradition, and respectful awe of superiority, and he wrote his Reflections to lament the way in which the French revolutionaries had debased the monarchy, in terms reminiscent of Hume’s accusation that the Civil War levelers had, “weakened the reverence, which the multitude owe to authority”. Burke’s immediate target was a sermon preached by Richard Price at the Old Jewry, on the anniversary of the Glorious Revolution of 1688, in which Price declared that the king of Great Britain owes his crown to the choice of the people (Burke 2004, 96–7). Against this, Burke argues that the intention of the Declaration of Right, which established William II on the throne, was to declare the rights and liberties of the subjects of Great Britain, and to settle the succession of the crown. So, despite a small deviation in the line of succession, British kings continued to owe their crowns to inheritance in the royal line (Burke 2004, 100). He quotes the earlier Petition of Right to show that it is inherited custom that grounds and legitimizes the government.

In the famous law of the 3d of Charles I. called the Petition of Right, the parliament says to the king, “your subjects have inherited this freedom,” claiming their franchises not on abstract principles “as the rights of men,” but as the rights of Englishmen, and as a patrimony derived from their forefathers.

Macaulay responds that, if the rights of Englishmen are not ultimately grounded in abstract right, they are no rights at all. For if they ultimately rest on the weakness or generosity of previous kings, then they can with equal right be overturned by subsequent powerful or less kindly monarchs (Macaulay 1790, 30–1). So, if there are rights they must be grounded in universal rights.

Just as she had done in her earlier response to Burke, Macaulay attacks his claim that an aristocracy is necessary for civilized society, and necessary in order to defend the state. There is no need to have an opulent class for there to be elements in the population who care about the nation, for “every citizen who possesses ever so small a share of property, is equally as tenacious of it as the most opulent member of society” (Macaulay 1790, 40–1). Inequality, she argues, in fact leads to envy, and ultimately civil disturbance. And while she agrees that different classes have different interests she asserts:

… I know of no rational objection; nor can I think of any expedient to remove the well-grounded apprehensions of the different interests which compose a commonwealth, than a fair and equal representation of the whole people; (Macaulay 1790, 48)

The French have moved far closer to this ideal, with a broad franchise, than the English, with their pocket boroughs, which can be bought and sold, and their very limited representation.

Macaulay concludes her pamphlet with a dilemma for all those who claim that authority resides in conventions, which cannot be questioned or overthrown.

For if we say that lawful governments are formed on the authority of conventions, it will be asked, who gave these conventions their authority? If we grant that they derived their authority from the assent of the people, how came the people, it will be said, to exert such an authority at one period of society, and not at another? If we say it was necessity that recovered to the social man the full rights of his nature, it will be asked, who is to be the judge of this necessity? why certainly the people.

Thus, in every light in which we can place the argument, in every possible mode of reasoning, we shall be driven back to elect either the first or the second of these propositions; either that an individual, or some privileged persons, have an inherent and indefeasible right to make laws for the community, or that this authority rests in the unalienable and indefeasible rights of man. (Macaulay 1790, 94–5)

Since she takes it as accepted that the doctrine of the indefeasible right of kings is dead, she is able to conclude that, government, “can have no legitimate force, but in the will of the people” (Macaulay 1790, 95).

4. Macaulay and America

Applying the principle that rights, if they exist at all, are universal, it is not surprising that Macaulay attempted to get her fellow country-men to see that injustice of taxing the colonies, while they were not given any representation in the British Parliament. In her Address to the people of England, Scotland and Ireland on the present important crisis of affairs, she called on the British people to support the rights of the Americans, and to join with them in order to protect themselves from the encroachment of their own liberties. She held out to Britons what a loss it would be if, as a result of a war of Independence they were to be deprived of all the commercial advantages that flowed from the Empire, and were left possessing only their own “foggy islands” (Macaulay 1775, 27). But her fundamental appeal is not to the self-interest of her country-men, who she suspects may think that their own burden of taxation is lightened by that placed on the Americans, but to the principle that it is only by supporting the rights of others that one can in the long run support one’s own rights. For her pains she was represented in the Westminster Magazine as a dagger-wielding hybrid of Roman matron and Indian chief, about to plunge her weapon into Britannia’s breast (Davies 2005, 152).

During this period she corresponded with John and Abigail Adams, James Otis and Mercy Otis Warren, Benjamin Franklin and Sarah Prince-Gill, among numerous other colonists (Davies 2005, 127–9; Letzring 1976; Macaulay 2019). In the second edition of her Loose Remarks she printed an exchange of letters with Benjamin Rush, in which he praised her political principles as well as offering some minor criticisms. Macaulay concludes her response to him by promoting to the Americans “the general principles of the rights of mankind inculcated in my great work” (Macaulay 1769, 35). Indeed, it is clear that the first five volumes of her eight volume history very clearly spell out the principles that justified the War of Independence, and she was feted when she travelled through nine of the thirteen states with her second husband. Despite her support for the Americans, as the actual Constitution was developed, she was not convinced that it would not be corrupted, and in a correspondence with Mary Otis Warren the two women expressed, with some prescience, their concerns that the arrangements did not sufficiently protect against tendencies which would allow aristocratic wealth, and the consequent corruption of the principles of liberty, to re-emerge (Hay 1994, 314).

5. Thoughts on progress, liberty and education

Macaulay believed in the existence of moral truths, which are “interwoven in the nature of contemplative objects” and which exist independently of God or human will. Like other abstract truths, they can be discovered through the use of reason. She defends this intellectualism in her Treatise on the immutability of moral truth, and also sets out to refute the libertarian account of freedom of the will developed by Dr William King in his Concerning the Origin of Evil, as well as the philosophy set out in Bolingbroke’s Philosophical Works.

In The Treatise she also puts forward her objections to all those theories of the source of moral injunctions, which, like Bolingbroke’s account, attempt to reduce them to rules which are in our rational self-interest, arguing that “… those who only regard virtue as a principle, convenient for general use, will discard it whenever that general interest comes in opposition to self” (Macaulay 1783, 77). Against such views she argues that the genuine rational interest of a rational being is to act in accordance with the dictates of reason. Had God intended us simply to maximise our own selfish pleasures in this life, he would have given us appropriate instincts, for

… that power of combining and generalizing his ideas, in such a manner as to apprehend truths of the most abstract nature, with the power of memory in the large extent in which it is found in human existence, are superfluous and mischievous gifts on the principle of human mortallity. (Macaulay 1783, 98)

But the fact that we have reason, and can appreciate the abstract principles of right, implies that our true self-interest is to act in accordance with the principles of reason, which are the principles of moral obligation.

Independent of those pleasurable sensations which attend the refined affections, and the elevated sentiments and passions, there is a principle of rational agency, which corresponds with the precise admeasurement of every action, with a rule of right; although the conduct it directs, militates against natural inclination, against the interest of natural affection, and where every pleasurable sensation is sacrificed to the conviction of judgement, and to the rigid dictates of a well informed understanding. (Macaulay 1783, 129)

She concludes that, by considering what a rational moral being would desire, “we gain an idea of rational interest which must ever attend on rational nature …” (Macaulay 1783, 130).

Rather than solving the problem of evil by allowing that there are uncaused choices, Macaulay attempts two alternative solutions. One involves the thought, which she also attributes to Addison, that since we cannot be assured that virtue is rewarded in this world, we should deduce the existence of a future state of happiness in which the apparent injustices in this world are made good (Macaulay 1783, 94–6). The other rests on her understanding of the circumstances necessary for the perfectibility of humanity. Man, she claims

… is placed on this terrestrial globe, as in a nursery, or soil aptly fitted to give strength and vigour, and a more advanced maturity to his young and infirm reason; that he is placed on this terrestrial globe as in a school adapted to the advantages of a practical experience; and that he is surrounded with difficulties and hostile powers, for the purpose of enlarging his experience, and inducing a state of trial of that virtue which his reason and his experience enables him to acquire. (Macaulay 1783, 234)

However, she is forced ultimately to admit that neither of these doctrines entirely relieves God of the responsibility for evil, and consoles herself with the observation that the believers in arbitrary free will are in no better position than those who accept the doctrine of the will which she calls, “moral necessity” (Macaulay 1783, 232).

5.1 Freedom of the will

Those who have published commentaries on Macaulay’s views on freedom of the will are divided over exactly how the doctrine she develops fits into standard categories. Martina Reuter has argued that what Macaulay offers is a version of rationalist compatibilism, while others have presumed that she is a hard determinist or modern Calvinist (Reuter 2007; Hilton 2007, 67–72; O’Brien 2009, 168; Green and Weekes,2013). Part of the difficulty of understanding Macaulay’s position stems from the fact that she writes in opposition to those who make free choice arbitrary, and so concentrates on establishing that choices are caused by motives, thus seeming to be committed to compatibilism, as is Hobbes, and yet she also wants to accept, with Plato and the Stoics, that we are only truly free when our acts are caused by reason, rather than by ill-conceived passion. She understands individual moral progress as involving the strengthening of reason, so that it can guide the passions, and lead the individual to virtue. Political progress is intertwined with this individual progress. Political structures compatible with the rationally perceptible moral law would be upheld were people virtuous, so education for virtue becomes a necessary means for effecting political progress, yet at the same time, the effects of faulty constitutions militate against the capacity of people to attain virtue, since in circumstances of excessive inequality, or where corruption is endemic, both the poor and the rich are subject to overwhelming temptations to vice.

According to Macaulay the necessitarian takes freedom to reside in,

… those distinctions which the mind frames on the essential difference which lies in those objects which present themselves to her perception, and which form the objects of her volition: else why have schools to train our youth in knowledge and in habits of virtue? (Macaulay 1783, 194)

So education is necessary in order to help people distinguish the essential differences between things, but she argues that it is also necessary in order to counter the development of unhelpful associations, and to train the mind to curb its passions, for Macaulay is heavily influenced by the associationist psychology of Edward Hartley, Joseph Priestley and Jonathan Edwards. These metaphysical and psychological views inform her Letters on Education.

5.2 Thoughts on Education

The Letters on Education is a rather loosely structured work that contains, as well as letters on the appropriate form of education, discussion of vegetarianism, and our duties to animals, a significant portion of the Treatise on the Immutability of Moral Truth, which takes up all of the third part of the later work. In the Letters Macaulay sets out her rather sensible prescriptions for raising robust children, who are neither rendered too timid nor too bold, and she argues that given the differences in individual character, educators may have to take different approaches depending on the temperament of the child. She suggests that, although she has dreamed of schemes of public education, she has come to the conclusion that the government of her time could not be trusted to provide appropriate care, and so she advises a private education in which boys and girls are educated together and taught exactly the same curriculum, with some concessions to sexual difference in the choice of exercise and sports.

The educational advice that Macaulay offers is remarkably practical. She recommends that those who can afford it should have their children taught dancing from a young age, as a means of acquiring grace, but she also observes that in order for the lessons to be effective they should be a pastime, not a task. Similarly, if children are given the impression that being allowed to read is a privilege and entertainment, they will be happy to acquire the skill. While dancing and music are excellent sources of amusement, they should not take up too much time, and there are other amusements that Macaulay considers beneficial, such as needlework for girls and handicrafts for boys. She disapproves of punishments and practices that are intended to terrorize children, such as “shutting up in dark closets”, or being told tales of ghosts and ghouls who are coming to get them. Children should be encouraged to be as independent as possible, since self-sufficiency is a great source of confidence and peace of mind. Her prescriptions for the early education of children concentrate on making them physically and emotionally robust, and on avoiding both the extremes of timidity and cruel insensitivity. Up to the age of twelve formal learning should be made pleasant and involve writing, arithmetic, Latin grammar, geography, French learnt by the simple method of hiring some French domestic servants, and as much physics as can be easily understood by children.

As children mature, Macaulay recommends a more formidable curriculum. Among her recommended reading there is Plutarch’s Lives, Rollin’s Ancient History in French, and Livy, works which were surely early influences on her own thought. She puts off learning Greek until fifteen, and moral philosophy in the form of works by Cicero, Plutarch, Seneca and Epictetus until sixteen, but expects her pupils, by the age of eighteen to be reading Plato, Demosthenes, Sophocles, Euripides and Homer in Greek, as well as Caesar and Cicero in Latin. Among modern philosophical texts she recommends two by James Harris, his Philosophical Arrangements and Hermes an inquiry into universal grammar, Lord Monboddo on language and Epea pteroenta by John Horne Tooke, her and her brother’s friend. Political philosophy in the form of the works of James Harrington, Algernon Sidney, Locke, and Hobbes is left until the age of nineteen. There are two striking omissions from her curriculum; novels and the Scripture. The second she leaves until the student has reached the age of twenty-one and after she or he has been introduced to metaphysics through reading Ralph Cudworth, Plato and more Monboddo. She argues that early reading of the Scripture is likely to lead to scepticism, and it is only after one has appreciated the morality of the ancients that one can truly understand the moral advances of Christianity. To cap off this education she particularly recommends The Light of Nature Pursued by Abraham Tucker.

Macaulay does not approve of the popularity of novels, because of their concentration on the passion of love, and her suspicion that by reading them, young people, who are susceptible to this passion in any case, will be encouraged to pursue it too early. Few novelists, she thinks, really accurately portray human sentiments, and she is particularly critical of Samuel Richardson. But she by no means intends to deny the reading of novels for entertainment. Her position is simply that they do not in general provide a solid moral foundation.

The whole of this educational program is grounded on her understanding of the foundations of morality and moral psychology. Education can teach the moral truths, but it also has to take account of unhelpful associations, and those emotional characteristics which result in weakness of will, in order to form individuals who can act in accordance with the dictates of reason. Macaulay also comments on the need for public education and the abolition of spectacles such as public executions and animal slaughter, which brutalize and corrupt people’s emotional responses.

5.3 Feminism

One reason why Catharine Macaulay’s work has not received as much attention as it arguably deserves, is that contemporary interest in the writings of historical women has tended to be motivated by feminism, and some earlier commentators suggested that Macaulay was uninterested in the rights of women (Staves 1989). More recently, her educational views, commitment to acknowledging the influence of historical women, and recognition of her influence on Wollstonecraft is resulting in a fairer assessment of her importance to the history of English feminism (Gunther-Canada 1998, 2003; Hicks 2002; Hill 1995; Titone 2004; Berges 2013).

In speaking of the education of girls, Macaulay asserts, “my pride and my prejudices lead me to regard my sex in a higher light than as the mere objects of sense” (Macaulay 1790, 62). Indeed, she believes that both sexes ought to aspire to virtue, which, since it involves understanding and acting on moral principles discernible by reason, is the same for both sexes. In order to justify the egalitarian educational program that she proposes, she argues against Rousseau that there are no characteristic differences between the sexes, that most of what is observed is the result of education, and, turning Pope’s words around, that “A perfect man is a woman formed after a courser mold” (Macaulay 1790, 204). Against Rousseau’s attempt to make a single moral person out of the union of the two sexes, she asserts that it outdoes, for contradiction and absurdity, “every metaphysical riddle that was ever formed in the schools” (Macaulay 1790, 206).

Mary Wollstonecraft favourably reviewed Macaulay’s Letters on Education in November 1790, commenting on Macaulay’s chapter titled, “No characteristic difference in sex” that “the observations on this subject might have been carried much farther” (Wollstonecraft 1989, 7.31; Hill 1995; Coffee 2019). Her Vindication of the Rights of Women does exactly that, extending Macaulay’s critique of Rousseau, and adding a great deal of further material criticising other authors who had contributed to rendering women objects of contempt. She echoes in her formulations the arguments which Macaulay had given for providing an equal education, according to which “there is but one rule of right for the conduct of all rational beings … that true wisdom … is as useful to women as men” and that, as in the next world “our state of happiness may possibly depend on the degree of perfection we have attained in this, we cannot justly lessen, in one sex or the other, the means by which perfection … is acquired” (Macaulay 1790, 201–2).

Macaulay’s belief that moral truth is not a matter of mere custom or convention is central to her rejection of the contemporary situation of women. For despite the near universal custom of the subjection of women to the arbitrary power of men, she argues that

… justice, in its more abstract or general sense, should be little considered, or little understood, by those who can believe that it is agreeable to the wisdom and goodness of an all-perfect Being to form two species of creatures of equal intelligence and similar feelings, and consequently capable of an equal degree of suffering under injuries, and should consign one of these species as a kind of property to a different species of their fellow-creatures, not endowed with any qualities of mind sufficient to prevent the enormous abuse of such a power. (Macaulay 1783, 158)

Thus, although feminist rhetoric was not central to her histories and earlier pamphlets, she was fully convinced that the subjection of women to men was not compatible with rational principles of justice. Indeed, her assertion, in her response to Burke, that there should be “a fair and equal representation of the whole people” could be interpreted as implying that she believed in the representation of women, for her choice in this instance of sex-neutral language is surely intentional.

6. Conclusion

Catharine Macaulay was a significant contributor to eighteenth century debates over human rights and republican liberty, who was celebrated and influential during her lifetime, but her histories and political works had fallen into obscurity by the first half of the twentieth century. Interest in her was stimulated by Lucy Donnelly’s pioneering article and research by Florence and William Boos, Christopher and Bridget Hill, and Lynne Withey (Donnelly 1949; Boos 1976; Boos and Boos 1980; Hill and Hill 1967; Hill 1992; Withey 1976). Recognition of the influence of her educational and political ideas has since grown considerably (Hay 1995; Waithe 1987–95, 3.217–22; Looser 2000, 2003; Wiseman 2001; Schnorrenberg 1979, 1990; Hutton 2005, 2007, 2009; Gunther-Canada 1998, 2003; Gardner 1998; Gardner 2000; Hicks 2002; Titone 2004; Hammersley 2010). Nevertheless, although beginning to be better known, she is usually only mentioned in passing in standard accounts of the development of democratic theory and feminism. Her moralised understanding of the grounds of human rights and justification for democracy provide an important counter-balance to Hobbesian versions of the social contract and deserve a far more central place in the history of liberal political theory than is currently the case (Green 2018; Green 2020).


Primary texts

  • “Account of the Life and Writings of Mrs. Catharine Macaulay Graham,” 1783, The European Magazine, 4: 330–4.
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