Philosophy of Cell Biology

First published Tue Oct 15, 2019

Among biological entities, cells are regarded as of special importance since they are widely viewed as the simplest organized systems that are unambiguously alive. Although one can debate about entities such as viruses, there is little debate that cells are living. Cells perform all the activities critical to life, from metabolism to reproduction. All cells alive today maintain themselves far from thermodynamic equilibrium with their environment and are part of a continuous lineage of cell division that goes back approximately 4 billion years. The study of cells has required developing means of materially manipulating them and our contemporary understanding of cellular phenomena integrates results from a wide range of material interventions. In introducing a special issue of Studies in History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences on the cell, O’Malley and Müller-Wille assert

The cell, we suggest, is a nexus: a connection point between disciplines, methods, technologies, concepts, structures and processes. Its importance to life, and to the life sciences and beyond, is because of this remarkable position as a nexus, and because of the cell’s apparently inexhaustible potential to be found in such connective relationships. (2010: 169)

The examination of cell biology, in turn, is a potent nexus for productive interactions between philosophers, historians, and social scientists, each of whom raises questions about the study of cells relevant to the others.

During the period when philosophy of science focused primarily on laws, cell biology was largely neglected. Although it is important to cell biologists to discover useful generalizations, these are seldom characterized as laws. Once philosophers of science turned their attention from laws to mechanisms, from representational realism to models and their functionality, and from concepts and theories to experiments and instrumentation, more philosophers of science have turned their attention to the practices of cell biology. These practices are epistemically challenging. Due to the fact that cells are mostly microscopic, they raise traditional philosophical issues concerning the status of unobservables and the trustworthiness of evidence. Since a major concern of cell biology is to relate functions (e.g., biochemical reactions) to cell structures, cell biologists need not just to observe but also to physically manipulate cells and their constituent structures and to develop informative representations. Their activities thus provide rich examples for philosophers. Although a great deal of cell biology has yet to be tapped for philosophical analysis, we provide examples in which philosophers (as well as historians) have investigated and analyzed material practices in cell biology. We start, however, closer to theoretical interests, examining how the discipline of cell biology developed and how metaphors have played crucial roles in shaping how scientists have conceptualized cells. Subsequently we turn to controversies over whether cells can be understood mechanistically or require a vitalist or holist perspective. After that, we turn to questions of epistemology, including strategies for representing cells visually and for developing mechanistic accounts of cell functioning.

1. What is Cell Biology?

It is sometimes assumed that scientific disciplines are sharply-delineated and can be defined by their subject matter. In fact, however, they are dynamically changing, shaped in large part by scientists, their research tools, and academic and research institutions. This is clearly true in the case of cell biology. Scientists began investigating cells in the seventeenth century after Hooke and van Leeuwenhoek reported what they saw with newly invented microscopes. Hooke (1665) gave cells their name. But the cell did not become a focal unit for studying biological processes until Schleiden (1838) and Schwann (1839) advanced the cell theory according to which cells are the basic living units. The term cytology was widely used for the studies that ensued, which focused mainly on describing cells as seen under the light microscope. Although Wilson used the phrase cellular biology in his introduction to Cowdry’s General Cytology (Cowdry 1924), and many of its contributors aspired to integrate disciplines studying cells, the term cell biology was only introduced in the years immediately after World War II. Those adopting the term cell biology advocated complementing new higher-resolution images created with the electron microscope with results from biochemical, biophysical, and molecular approaches to cells. This transition is exemplified in the naming of what would become the flagship journal in the field. The working title used in discussions about founding a new journal was Journal of Cytology. By the time of the first issue in 1955, it was called the Journal of Biophysical and Biochemical Cytology, a title chosen to emphasize the integration of multiple approaches to the study of cells. In 1962 it was re-christened The Journal of Cell Biology, by which time the International Society for Cell Biology and the American Society for Cell Biology had also been established and the term cell biology had acquired general currency for an integrated approach to cells. (Bechtel 2006: chapter 7, examines the establishment and renaming of the journal as well as the creation of the American Society for Cell Biology.)

The introduction of new research techniques, especially cell fractionation and electron microscopy, figured centrally in the efforts to establish cell biology as a distinct discipline in the post-World War II period as they enabled constructing what Palade (1987) termed a bridge between morphological observations and biochemistry. Cell fractionation employs the ultracentrifuge to separate cell contents into fractions that contain the enzymes responsible for distinct cell activities while electron microscopy enables these fractions to be linked to organelles identifiable in cells. Matlin (2018) describes how Claude employed centrifugation to identify microsomes which exhibited high concentrations of RNA. Porter’s (1953) complementary micrographs of these particles in fractions and tissue slices (Figure 1) linked microsomes to the intracellular structure he had named the endoplasmic reticulum. As Matlin describes, this cycling between cell fractionation to establish function and electron microscopy to localize it to a structure was pursued repeatedly in cell biology.

micrograph of a fraction containing microsome, see caption below micrograph of a thin-sliced preparation from a cell showing the endoplasmic reticulum, see caption below

Figure 1: Micrographs of a fraction containing microsome and of a thin-sliced preparation from a cell showing the endoplasmic reticulum (marked as er). From Porter (1953), plate 48.

In terms of content, however, the break between cytology and cell biology was nowhere near as sharp as the founders of cell biology portrayed. Cowdry’s General Cytology (1924) clearly had similar aspirations of linking studies of morphology and studies of cellular chemistry (see discussions by historians, philosophers, and biologists of Cowdry’s project in Matlin, Maienschein, & Laubichler 2018). But in terms of the institutions in which scientists conducted their research, the break was quite significant. With the creation of professional societies using the name “cell biology”, biologists began to self-identify as cell biologists. Laboratories and academic departments adopted the name cell biology and funding agencies recognized cell biology as a supported field of research.

Although cell biologists actively courted biochemists and to some degree biophysicists to join their new discipline, these efforts largely failed. The most enduring connections were with molecular biology, which was established as a new discipline in the same period (see the entry on molecular biology). While molecular biology began with a focus on bacterial phage (viruses that infect bacteria) and cell biology with eukaryotic cells from mammals and plants, by the 1970s each discipline had broadened its focus and soon many cell biologists were adopting a molecular approach to cell structure and function. (A continuing point of difference between cell biology and molecular biology is that cell biology placed high value on linking chemical and molecular processes to cell structure; see Matlin 2016). Academic departments began to include both cell and molecular in their names. In November 1989 the American Society for Cell Biology created a new journal, Cell Regulation, but with its third volume in January 1992, the name was changed to Molecular Biology of the Cell. Although there are textbooks that reference just cell biology in their title, several of the most prominent textbooks feature both cell and molecular. These include Alberts’ Molecular Biology of the Cell (Alberts, Johnson, Lewis et al. 2015) , Cooper and Hausman’s The Cell: A Molecular Approach (2007), and Iwasa and Marshall’s Karp’s Cell and Molecular Biology (2016). The first edition of Alberts’ Molecular Biology of the Cell (Alberts, Bray, Lewis et al. 1983) was modeled in part on Watson’s Molecular Biology of the Gene (1976) and included Watson as a co-editor. Alberts attributes the vision of integrating cell and molecular biology to Watson (see interview with Alberts in the Oral History Collection at Cold Springs Harbor Laboratory linked in Other Internet Resources below)

2. Ontological Issues I: What is a Cell?

Not only have the disciplines studying cells undergone historical transformations, so has the understanding of what cells are. As Hesse (1966) argued, in many fields the objects of study are characterized through metaphors to more familiar objects. In examining the different metaphors that have been invoked for cells, Reynolds argues that the choice of metaphor has consequences for how cells are understood:

Metaphorical language … has been essential not only to the activity of describing cells but also to seeing and understanding them, and has played no less a fundamental role than the literal and material lenses of the microscope. (2018: 4)

Reynolds distinguishes two fundamental classes of metaphors: cells as human artifacts and cells as organisms. Each has taken on a variety of more specific forms. Among artifacts, cells have been characterized as spaces enclosed by solid walls, building blocks, factories, various types of machines, and electronic computers. The organismal metaphors have suggested a conceptualization of cells as elementary organisms (like unicellular amoebae) or citizens in a state or society in which there is a division of labor and in which cells make decisions that determine their own developmental ‘fates’, including the ultimate decision to initiate programmed cell death (Reynolds 2014).[1] These metaphors have given rise to distinctive research agendas that focus on specific aspects of cells and their relationship to other cells and their environment.

When Hooke introduced the term cell in Micrographia in 1665 to describe the microscopic structure of cork that he observed using a compound microscope (Figure 2A), he was comparing cells to the polygonal cells of beeswax and the small rooms occupied by monks in a monastery. (Hooke 1665: 116, also commented on the fluid content of cells, labeling them “succus nutritus, or appropriate juices of vegetables”. As discussed below, the fluid content of cells took on new importance with the advent of the protoplasm theories in the mid-nineteenth century.) Although researchers who focused on plants tended to find Hooke’s metaphor appropriate, since plant cells have clearly observable walls, others, beginning with van Leeuwenhoek, who examined spermatozoa (Figure 2B), animal tissues, and bacteria, tended to adopt other terms such as corpuscle or globule.

two drawings on a black background, the left of dozens of small distorted white outlined rectangles all connected; the right of dozens of small distorted white outlined circles all connected.

A. Hooke’s (1665: Schem: XI, fig. 1 facing page 115) drawing of his observations of cells in cork.

drawing of 8 cells laid out vertically. Each cell consists of a long tail and a head with the head varying from cell to cell (up to three letter labels might be attached to various parts of a head).

B.Van Leeuwenhoek’s drawing of spermatozoa from his Letter to Nehemiah Grew, 18 March 1678.

Figure 2: Hooke’s drawing clearly shows cells as areas enclosed by walls whereas van Leeuwenhoek’s presents what we call cells as simple organisms.

Most of these early investigators focused on describing what they saw in the microscope. But some, such as Buffon (1749), began to view cells as basic living units. Nicholson characterizes this as the beginning of an atomist tradition in biology that identified

a basic indivisible unit of life and [sought] to explain the morphological constitution and physiological operation of all living beings in terms of these fundamental units. (2010: 203)

This more theoretically committed conception of cells is exemplified in the publications of Schleiden (1838) and Schwann (1839), who are generally credited with establishing the cell theory, the fundamental tenet of which is that cells are the basic units of living things.

Focusing exclusively on plants, Schleiden asserted that “… every plant … is an aggregate of fully individualized, independent, separate beings, the cells themselves” (1838 [1847: 231–2]). In addition to their walls, Schleiden appealed to the nucleus, which had been identified with improved microscopes by Brown (1833), to identify plant cells. The nucleus figured centrally in Schleiden’s account of cell formation according to which a new cell formed through a process like crystal formation—one type of material is deposited around the nucleolus to form the nucleus and then other material was deposited to form the cell body. The metaphor comparing cell formation to crystal formation played a yet larger role when Schwann confronted the challenge that animal cells differ vastly in their appearance. Schwann argued that they were nonetheless all cells since they all formed through a process analogous to crystal formation:

The elementary parts of all tissues are formed of cells in an analogous, though very diversified manner, so that it may be asserted that there is one universal principle of development for the elementary parts of organisms, however different, and that this principle is the formation of cells. (Schwann 1839 [1847: 165])

(For discussion of this and other uses of the crystal metaphor in biology, see Haraway 1976.)

Given that Schwann and Schleiden were masters of microscopy (as witnessed by their drawings based on their microscopic observations), and that other equally competent microscopists reported cells dividing, their claim that cells form like crystals seems anomalous. Bechtel (1984) argues that Schwann’s strong commitment to developing mechanistic accounts of vital processes may have played a major role in how he interpreted what he saw—the crystal formation metaphor provided a mechanistic model whereas at the time there were no mechanical models for cell division. In any case, Schleiden’s and Schwann’s accounts of cell formation were soon set aside as more researchers reported on cell division and Schwann’s concerns with mechanism were supplanted by other concerns. Virchow (1855), a pathologist, offered a theoretic argument that only a process like cell division could explain the transmission of disease and coined the oft-cited dictum “omnis cellula e cellula” (all cells come from cells).

Schwann’s “theory of the cell”, however, was much richer than his soon rejected view of cell formation. He argued that cells were the basic units in which the processes of life (he coined the term metabolism) occurred. He viewed metabolic processes as catalyzed by the specific materials that were deposited in cells as they formed. Schwann (1836) had himself recently discovered pepsin, a catalyst that breaks down egg albumin. (Pepsin operates, however, not within cells but after being secreted into digestive fluid.) When a year later he argued that fermentation could not occur without the involvement of a whole living yeast cell (Schwann 1837), some critics took Schwann to be claiming that living systems exhibited mysterious vital properties. But for Schwann this was consistent with his mechanist approach—the metabolic processes only occurred when the responsible catalysts were brought together in cells.

In the mid- to late-nineteenth century theorizing about cells went in a number of directions. One direction focused even more than Schwann on the material stuff constituting the cell. In the same period as Schwann was advancing his theory of the cell, von Mohl (1835), a plant researcher, introduced the name protoplasm for the fluid material in cells. Animal researchers such as Dujardin (1835) called the fluid seen in animal cells sarcode. Remak (1852) proposed the protoplasm theory according to which the basic material of plants and animal was identical and T. H. Huxley (1869) took this a step further, arguing that protoplasm was the “physical basis of life”. As discussed by Reynolds, protoplasm theory offered a different fundamental biological theory—whereas Schleiden and Schwann

sought to unify all the various forms of life through a common morphological type and developmental principle, the protoplasm theory attempted to achieve this through the identification of a common substance or material. (2018: 32)

Accordingly, some supporters of protoplasm sought to dislodge the cell as a basic living unit. The botanist Julius Sachs (1892), for example, asserted “to call the protoplasm unit a cell was about as appropriate as calling a live bee in a honeycomb a cell” (as translated by Welch & Clegg 2010: C1281). Since protoplasm appears as a viscous substance that is only artificially constrained by cell boundaries, some protoplasm theorists viewed it as supplanting the cell as an organizing unit. Where Schwann understood the cell to be the fundamental unit of biological development, protoplasm theorists understood protoplasm to drive ontogeny and cells to be merely secondary structures deposited in the course of this primary substance’s development. Recently a few biologists (Welch & Clegg 2010, 2012) and philosophers (Nicholson, 2010) have argued for reviving protoplasm theory. Their argument is that protoplasm theory presents a more holistic systems or organismal perspective. (We discuss holism and organicism in Section 3.)

The characterization of protoplasm as just a viscous substance existing on its own was complicated by the identification of the cell membrane as a structure distinct from the cell wall and, as discussed below, of membrane-bound organelles. In the end, most biologists acquiesced in some version of Schultze’s (1861: 11; as translated by Hall, 1951: 451) compromise position that raised protoplasm to be one defining feature of cells when he defined a cell as “a lump of protoplasm inside of which lies a nucleus”. Those who adopted such a compromise position often invoked a metaphor, originating with Raspail, according to which the cell is “a kind of laboratory within which all tissues organize and grow” (1843: 28; as translated by Harris, 1999: 32). The laboratory metaphor encouraged attempts to develop chemical explanations for all the reactions occurring in cells. There were a number of variants on this theme. Unger analogized the plant cell with a “mächtige chemische Werkstätte” (powerful chemical workshop) (1851: 23) and Virchow stated that “starch is transformed into sugar in the plant and animal just as it is in a factory” (1858: 107).

Embracing this chemical perspective, several chemists sought to identify the chemical catalysts needed for the reactions to occur. Fermentation was a common focus and Kühne (1877) coined the term enzyme (Greek for “in yeast”) for the putative catalyst operative in yeast. Enthusiasm for this effort was temporarily dampened by Pasteur (1860). A noted chemist, he nonetheless maintained that fermentation could only be carried out in whole living cells. This reflects a conception of the cell as an explanatorily irreducible unit of life—a conception associated with vitalism (discussed in more detail below). Enthusiasm for the factory conception, though, was rekindled by Buchner (1897). Guided by Pasteur’s contention that fermentation could not occur in the absence of cells, he added sugar to an extract he prepared by destroying all whole cells, thinking it would serve as a preservative. When he observed the emission of bubbles, indicating fermentation in the absence of living cells, he changed course and galvanized the pursuit of chemical investigations of metabolism that resulted in the establishment of modern biochemistry in the first decades of the twentieth century (Kohler 1971; Cornish-Bowden 1997). One of its early successes was the characterization in the 1930s of a pathway of enzyme catalyzed reactions responsible for fermentation (Bechtel 1986).

At first the factory metaphor simply identified the cell as the place in which chemical reactions occur, but over time researchers began to focus on the different machines within the factory. The focus on separate machines in the factory was promoted in the late nineteenth and early twentieth century when, using improved microscopes and applying stains to enhance contrast, investigators began to identify structures within cells and theorize about their functional significance. Researchers were particularly successful in characterizing the nuclear events in cell division and fertilization. Flemming (1879, 1882) described in detail how the threads that he called chromatin (due to their absorption of dye), later named chromosomes, divided longitudinally, with the two halves moving apart so that one of each would end up in each daughter cell (Figure 3). Soon after researchers such as Weismann and Correns pointed to links between chromosome transmission and heredity, but it was Boveri (1902) and Sutton (1903) who provided the compelling evidence that Mendel’s factors (what would soon be called genes) are in or on chromosomes. Darden and Maull (1977) analyze the linking of genes to chromosomes as a major example of what they termed interfield theories, theories that do not try to reduce one account to another but integrate the findings of different fields in a theory that bridges them.

13 drawings of the various stages of mitosis

Figure 3: Flemming’s (1882) drawings of the stages of mitosis that highlights the formation of spindles and their role in segregating chromosomes. Images 1–3 are from Tafel IIIa; 4–7 from Tafel IIIb. (Figure from wiki commons.)

Late in the nineteenth century cytologists also succeeded in identifying membrane-enclosed structures in the cytoplasm that came to be known as organelles. Altmann (1890), using new stains he developed, observed filaments within cells that he took to be elementary organisms (a view he explicitly set in opposition to the protoplasm theory). Although many researchers challenged Altmann’s observations, Benda (1899) confirmed the existence of filaments using a different stain and gave them the name mitochondria (Greek for “thread” and “granule”). Because of their reactivity with oxidative stains, Michaelis (1899) proposed that they figured in oxidative reactions in cells. Yet other researchers identified other organelles such as the Golgi apparatus (Golgi 1898) and ergastoplasm (Garnier 1897), which was ultimately identified as the endoplasmic reticulum.

In the early decades in the twentieth century biochemists and cytologists developed their own research techniques and pursued their investigations independently of the other. Most biochemists implicitly embraced the assumption that the cell was a bag of chemicals that could be studied in the extracts remaining after cell structure was destroyed whereas those pursuing cytological inquiries tended to embrace the factory metaphor in which organelles were distinct machines. As witnessed by Cowdry’s (1924) General Cytology and Bourne’s (1942) Cytology and Cell Physiology, there were researchers who desired to build bridges between biochemistry and cytology. There were some techniques, albeit limited, for determining the chemical composition of organelles (essentially, those of cytochemistry and histochemistry, which relied on determining to which chemicals various stains bound). The nearly simultaneous introduction of cell fractionation and electron microscopy in the late 1940s provided the needed research techniques and, as noted in Section 1, helped establish modern cell biology (Bechtel 2006; Matlin 2018). In addition to the linkage of microsomes to the endoplasmic reticulum, described above, researchers linked oxidative metabolism to the inner membrane of the mitochondrion. New structures were also discovered and connected to functions, such as the lysosome which was linked to the breakdown and recycling of disrupted cell components (de Duve 1958).

The process of advancing new conceptions of cells continues. We note just one example here. The pioneers of cell biology in the 1940s and 1950s embraced the machines in a factory metaphor, treating cell organelles as compartments in which different chemical reactions were catalyzed by the enzymes housed there. Once formed, the compartments, on this view, did not change—the crucial activities occurred within them. Over time, however, some researchers within cell biology began to identify cell structures that executed mechanical movements, as anticipated by Flemming’s (1882) characterization of the cell spindle as pulling chromosomes apart in mitosis. Of particular importance was research on the cytoskeleton (consisting of actin fibres and microtubules). The term cytoskeleton was invoked in the 1930s and 1940s to denote a rigid structure, and indeed it does help give cells their shape. But it was soon found to be the locus of movement. H. E. Huxley (1969) advanced an account of muscle contraction as resulting from myosin molecules forming bridges that pull on actin filaments. Both actin filaments and microtubules were found to continually extend themselves at one end by incorporating new proteins while removing them from the other, a process characterized as treadmilling (Cleveland 1982). Video observations of organelles moving along microtubules (R. Allen et al. 1982) led to the discovery of kinesins (Vale, Reese, & Sheetz 1985), molecular motors that walk along microtubules carrying cargo. It also focused new attention on dyneins (Paschal & Vallee 1987), previously only known for their roles in cilia and flagella, as carrying cargo in the opposite direction. Recognition of this continual movement of material within cells gave rise to a new metaphor of the cell as a city with bustling traffic (Vale & Milligan 2000).

3. Ontological Issues II: Mechanists Vs. Vitalists and Holists

Almost all of those pursuing the various metaphors discussed in the previous section embraced a view that had its origins in Descartes, who maintained both non-living and living systems (with the exception of the human mind) operated like machines. But a significant number of researchers rejected this perspective and maintained that living organisms, including cells, are fundamentally different from ordinary physical, mechanical systems. They argued that in one way or another composition from material components is insufficient to account for the phenomena associated with cells. We begin with these opponents of mechanistic conceptions of cells and then examine how those advocating mechanistic approaches responded.

In the eighteenth and nineteenth century the opponents of mechanism were typically referred to as vitalists. The various vitalists all rejected mechanism, taken as the view that organisms are composed of physical parts that operate in accord with the same principles as processes in the non-living world. Their positive views varied. Some vitalists adopted a position much like that of substance dualists with respect to the mind, arguing that some non-material component—a vital force (vis vitalis)—operates in living beings and accounts for their distinctive activities. Others avoided positing an extra component but maintained that different laws apply in living organisms than in non-living systems (for discussions of these different versions of vitalism, see contributions in Normandin & Wolfe 2013). Regardless of how they expressed their positive views, vitalists commonly pointed to activities of living organisms that they claimed could not be accounted for in the same manner as physical processes. This is well illustrated in Bichat (1805), who focused first on the apparent lack of determinism in the behavior of biological organisms and second on the fact that organisms seemed to oppose physical processes that threatened to destroy them (in his words, they resist death). As noted above, Schwann and Pasteur both claimed that living yeast are needed to produce fermentation. While for Schwann this only entailed that fermentation depended on the specific combination of materials found in cells, for vitalists it entailed that living cells perform activities that could not be performed by the collection of component molecules. Bichat and Pasteur, as well as other prominent vitalists such as Müller (1837–1840), embraced empirical and experimental research, but drew limits with respect to what could be explained by appeal to the material components of an organism alone.

In many cases, mechanists did not explicitly respond to vitalists but simply moved forward with their research. Bernard (1865), was an exception. He addressed Bichat’s challenges by introducing a distinction between an organism’s internal and external environment. Mechanistic operations within organisms are carried out in the internal environment and jointly serve to maintain that environment in a constant state. Because mechanistic operations respond to conditions in the internal environment, they appear indeterminate when considered only in relation to external stimuli. Moreover, because these mechanisms work to maintain a constant internal environment, one could explain the ability of organisms to resist physical processes that might otherwise destroy them (for discussions of Bernard see Holmes 1974 and LaFollette & Shanks 1994). Bernard’s approach was the foundation for Cannon’s later well-known work on homeostasis (1929).

By the beginning of the twentieth century few biologists investigating cells (Driesch, 1914, being a notable exception) espoused vital forces and vitalism per se ceased to be regarded as a tenable position. But many biologists were still concerned to account for differences between living cells and ordinary material systems. A prominent position adopted by many investigators (Haldane 1929, 1931; Lillie 1934; Needham 1936; Russell 1945, 1930; Von Bertalanffy 1952; Weiss 1963; Woodger 1929) was holism, sometimes referred to as organicism. (See Nicholson and Gawne 2015, for a discussion of how the organicists differentiated their position from both vitalism and mechanism.) Holists accepted that living systems were built out of material parts. They insisted, however, that the activities performed by components of living systems depended not just on those components and their composition but on their organization. Accordingly, one cannot just add together the activities of the components to account for the whole (“the whole is not just the sum of its parts”). The organized whole in part determines how the parts behave. This attitude is manifest, for example, in J. S. Haldane’s opposition to investigating the origins of life from non-living matter: “There is and can be no origin of life out of mechanical conditions. Such an origin is inconceivable” (Haldane 1930: 12).

The organization of cellular systems plays a central role in the dialectic between mechanistic biologists and holists. Holists often construe mechanistic biologists as downplaying the importance of organization, but many mechanistic biologists deny this. Bernard had emphasized the role of organization in allowing components to maintain the constancy of the internal environment and those seeking to explain homeostasis appealed to feedback loops. Recognizing that mechanistic accounts are not limited to a simple, additive view of organization, J. S. Haldane’s son, J. B. S. Haldane, abandoned his father’s commitment to holism and embraced a mechanistic framework that emphasized how biological components are affected by being incorporated within organized systems. In making this break with his father he was heavily influenced by working with the biochemist Hopkins (1913), who likewise made organization central to his accounts of biochemical processes. Accordingly, J. B. S. Haldane became one of the pioneers in formulating biological inquiry into the origins of life while still insisting that complex organization figured centrally in activities of living organisms (Martin 2010).

Philosophers and scientists often invoke the word emergent for phenomena that are different from the phenomena generated by their components (see the entry on emergent properties). Sometimes emergent phenomena are viewed as incapable of being explained in terms of their constituents. In the context of characterizing systems biological accounts of cell phenomena, Boogerd et al. (2005) develop an account according to which emergent phenomena are ones that are fully explicable in terms of how their constituents behave in the organized system, but not in terms of how they behave in simpler (less complexly organized) systems. This recognizes that many cellular constituents behave differently when incorporated into particular systems in which they receive distinctive inputs. For other recent treatments of emergence and its applications to cell biology, see (Hooker 2011a; S. Mitchell 2012; Mossio, Bich, & Moreno 2013; Winning & Bechtel 2019).

The desire to understand how the organization in cells and multicellular organisms differs from that found in most naturally occurring systems or human-made artifacts motivated a body of research in theoretical biology in the 1970s and 1980s. Among the most prominent contributors to theoretical biology were Pattee (many of his most important papers have been collected in Pattee 2012), Rosen (1985, 1991), Polanyi (1968), and Waddington (1961). Philosophy of biology, as it developed as a specialty in philosophy of science in the 1970s and 1980s, largely ignored this tradition. Today however a number of philosophers concerned with cell biology are drawing upon its insights. Here we focus on one key conceptual tool theoretical biologists provide for understanding the distinctive activities of living systems such as cells: constraints. The notion of constraint is drawn from classical mechanics, where constraints serve to constitute macro-scale objects from their micro-scale particles. Constraints thus account for why macro-scale objects exhibit different properties than their constituents. Constraints are not explained by laws but rather serve as boundary conditions that must be ascertained empirically. Accordingly, to the degree constraints explain biological activities of cells, these activities cannot be reduced, in the sense of being derived from the principles of chemistry or physics. Instead, researchers must, on the basis of empirical inquiry, identify the constraints actually realized in living cells.

The importance of constraints for understanding cellular and other biological phenomena has been developed recently by Hooker (2011b, 2013) and Moreno and Mossio (2015). Hooker makes clear that, although the term constraint suggests limitations, constraints also extend possibilities—to offer a cellular example, microtubules that run from the cell center to the periphery restrict the movement of the kinesin and dynein motors that move on them but also provide a possibility for transport of organelles to distant locations. Moreno and Mossio in particular develop a perspective that links the focus on constraints to the idea that living cells are autopoietic. Drawing upon Maturana and Varela’s (1980) conception of living systems as autopoietic machines—machines that provide a network of production that enables the construction of the living system—Moreno and Mossio add a focus on the thermodynamic requirements of cells. Cells, as highly organized systems, are far from equilibrium and require a continual source of free energy to carry out the operations required to synthesize new components and resist the tendency towards equilibrium. What constraints do in organisms, on their account, is direct flows of free energy to perform the work of building, repairing, and reproducing the organism.

Some constraints are flexible, and these make possible an important feature of living systems—the ability of organisms to control production mechanisms (such as those involve in fermentation or muscle contraction) through the actions of control mechanisms. On Pattee’s account, control mechanisms change the flexible constraints in production mechanisms in light of information that is procured by making measurements. Negative feedback control mechanisms, such as thermostats, are simple examples: the thermostat makes a measurement of a variable (temperature in the room) that is affected by the operation of the production mechanisms—the furnace—and based on the measurement executes action on the constraints in the furnace mechanism. Examples of feedback control mechanisms are widespread in cells. Some of the best-known examples are the lac operon (Jacob & Monod 1961) and feedback control of glycolysis by ATP (Ghosh & Chance 1964). The measurements used by control systems need not be restricted to states affected by the activity of the production mechanism; they can also measure states in the organism or states in its environment. Using such measurements, production mechanisms can be controlled so as to operate only in particular circumstances, enabling the organism, for example, to navigate to a food source or avoid a predator as needed.

Moreno and Mossio (2015) offer an account in which appropriately organized productive and control mechanisms enable cells, and by extension multi-cellular organisms, to achieve what they refer to as biological autonomy:

a distinctive regime of causation, able not only of producing and maintaining the parts that contribute to the functioning of the system as an integrated, operational, and topologically distinct whole but also able to promote the conditions of its own existence through its interaction with the environment. (2015: xvi–xvii)

Note that mechanisms, on this view, are contained within cells and that it is cells, not mechanisms that are autonomous. What becomes crucial for understanding the autonomy of cells is the organization of control mechanisms that orchestrate the activities of various productive mechanisms so as to maintain the cell (or the multicellular organism). One notable feature of this focus on the organization needed to maintain autonomy is that it is compatible with the more traditional philosophical accounts of mechanism (discussed in section 5) but emphasizes a feature not prominent in them—that production mechanisms are subject to control mechanisms. To understand the behavior of cellular mechanisms, researchers must not only look inside mechanisms to their organized parts and operations but outside to how they are situated in cells and organisms in such a way that they can be controlled by other mechanisms (Winning & Bechtel 2018; Bechtel in press). Such an ontological framework for understanding cells (as well as multicellular organisms) integrates insights from traditional mechanists in biology and their vitalist/organicist/holist critics, capturing what is distinctive of living organisms within a framework that accepts them as consisting of mechanisms, but mechanisms organized in appropriate ways.

4. Epistemic issues I: Representing cells

We turn now from questions about the ontological status of cells to epistemic questions about how scientists study them. We begin with how scientists represent cells and information about them. Traditionally, philosophy of science has focused on linguistic representations of scientific knowledge. But in many fields of biology and especially in cell biology, information is often presented in images. Scientists’ very familiarity with cells results from visual representations generated using microscopes. Developing microscopes and techniques for using them to produce interpretable images presented a number of challenges. We begin in section 4.1 with the challenges in generating images (micrographs) at all and in section 4.2 consider challenges in evaluating the reliability of the resulting images. Beyond these replete (highly detailed) representations, cell biologists rely on a variety of less replete diagrams. (The characterization of images as “replete” is due to Perini, 2013. Drawing on Goodman, she uses relative repleteness to differentiate diagrams from pictures.) In particular, as discussed in section 4.3, when they are developing mechanistic hypotheses about cells, cell biologists rely on cell diagrams that represent types of cell components and mechanism diagrams that represent select components within cells that are hypothesized to constitute parts of the mechanism responsible for a given phenomenon (Downes 1992).

4.1 Micrographs

As discussed above, in the seventeenth century both Hooke and van Leeuwenhoek pioneered the use of light microscopes to observe cells. Subsequent investigators often designed their own microscopes. The variations in these designs contributed to variability in the resulting images. (Before photography, microscopists drew what they saw using the microscope, introducing another source of variation.) The variability of the images different researchers produced was one factor that led biologists in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries to examine more carefully the processes through which microscopes generate images (Schickore 2001, 2007). In his theoretical studies of lenses, Newton (1704) characterized two types of aberrations created by lenses: spherical aberrations, resulting from light rays coming into focus at different points, and chromatic aberrations, resulting from light of different wavelengths being refracted at different angles. Schickore (2007) describes the many efforts by microscope developers to correct for these aberrations and the creation of test objects for evaluating the reliability of particular microscopes. During the same time enthusiasts were advancing many claims about what they saw, some of which were shown later to be artifacts. For example, both Milne-Edwards (1823) and Dutrochet (1824) reported round structures of a constant size similar to that reported for cells, which they termed globules. (See Schickore 2009 for a detailed examination of the reports of globules and an argument that it was the variability in these reports that contributed to the growing sense that something was amiss in the practices of the microscopists.) Globules were, however, soon shown to be the products of spherical aberrations. In the early nineteenth century several lens makers developed strategies for eliminating spherical aberrations and greatly limiting chromatic aberration (chromatic aberrations were not fully eliminated until the introduction of the apochromatic lenses in mid-century). As a result, the observations by Schleiden, Schwann, and others discussed above were largely free of these distortions.

Light microscopes faced another limit, that on magnification (a limitation imposed by the wave length of light). For cell researchers to obtain higher-resolution images that could reveal constituents of cells, a microscope relying on different physical principles was required. The most important alternative to the light microscope for studying cells was the (transmission) electron microscope, which employs beams of electrons to create images in a manner comparable to photography: locations on the photographic plate hit by many electrons are black in the negative and white in the positive image. When structures in the cell scatter electrons, the location in the negative remains white and appears dark in the positive image. Although electron microscopes were available in the early 1930s, only in the years just before and during World War II did biologists begin to explore their potential. One difficulty they confronted is that most eukaryotic cells are too thick to be penetrated by the 50kV electron beam available in the first electron microscopes. Microtomes had been developed for cutting slices of cells for light microscopy, but new approaches to microtome design were required to slice cells sufficiently thinly without creating distortions. This problem was not solved until the early 1950s (Porter & Blum 1953). Accordingly, some of the first electron micrograph studies focused on fibrous material such as collagen (Schmitt, Hall, & Jakus 1942) or on bacteria (Stanley & Anderson 1941). Porter, Claude, and Fullam (1945) created the first electron micrograph of a eukaryotic cell by culturing it under conditions where the periphery spread very thinly, allowing electrons to penetrate. They generated an image (Figure 4) that showed at the periphery

filamentous mitochondria of various lengths and fairly constant width; scattered, small elements of high density especially abundant around the nucleus and presumably representing Golgi bodies; and a delicate lace-work extending throughout the cytoplasm. (1945: 246)

see caption, shows that the electron microscope image gives much finer detail than the light microscope

Figure 4: Comparison of images of fibroblast from a tissue cultured chick embryo as seen with electron microscope (left) and light microscope (right). From Porter, Claude, and Fullam (1945: plate 10).

Besides the challenge of creating preparations sufficiently thin to be penetrated by the electron beam, researchers confronted a number of other challenges in preparing biological material for electron microscopy. For example, specimens must be placed in vacuum, and this requires first removing all water, the primary constituent of cells, without inducing to many distortions. Several historians and philosophers (Rheinberger 1995, Rasmussen 1997, and Bechtel 2006) have examined how biologists confronted these challenges and evaluated the reliability of the resulting micrographs. How they addressed one challenge—that of creating sufficient contrast in the images—greatly affected the images that were produced. This was already a challenge with light microscopy: cell material is mostly translucent so that the light transmitted is mostly of the same wavelength, making it hard to differentiate the various structures in the image. To address the challenge, light microscopists in the mid-nineteenth century began experimenting with dyes used for fabrics. As noted in Section 2, Flemming named the nuclear structures he observed chromatin since they bound the aniline dye he was using. The problem for electron microscopy was similar—cell components differ little in their ability to block electron transmission. Electron microscopists found that several of the fixatives used in light microscopy, especially those involving heavy metals, enhanced the ability to block electrons, and accordingly the contrast in the resulting images. Given that there was little knowledge about what given chemicals would bind to within the cell, the investigation of these stains was mostly pursued by researchers trying out different compounds and procedures for applying them (exemplified in Palade’s 1952, study of osmium tetroxide) to see what images they could generate. Indeed, different stains (osmium tetroxide, glutaraldehyde, etc.) did yield different images.

4.2 The Artifact Challenge

Since there was little understanding about what stains bound to, skeptics often raised doubts that they were revealing actual structures in cells. Bechtel (2000, 2006) highlights three considerations that often figured in scientists’ evaluation of whether micrographs were informative about cells or only artifacts of the methods of preparation: (1) the quality of the micrographs themselves—do they exhibit distinct patterns? (2) the robustness of the results—can comparable results be generated with different techniques (e.g., with light and electron microscopy or with multiple stains)? and (3) the theoretical plausibility of the results—do they fit into a coherent theoretical account? While the first is seldom commented on in philosophical accounts, it is notable that scientists are inclined to assume that if an image reveals a distinct, replicable pattern, it reflects something in the source (although this assessment may be retracted if, for example, a researcher shows how the pattern could be generated by other means). There has been extensive philosophical discussion of the second—the inference that when the same result is generated by independent means, it reflects a preexisting entity in the world (Hacking 1983; Culp 1995; Stegenga & Menon 2017). However, this criterion proves insufficient at just the point at which results with new techniques, such as the electron microscope, are most controversial—when the images contain structures beyond those that can be detected with other existing techniques. In these cases, the distinctness of the patterns together with considerations as to the theoretical plausibility of the findings are the criteria researchers can use. Appeal to theoretical plausibility, however, would seem to be circular since in traditional philosophical accounts, theories are tested by the evidence generated by the technique. But developing a plausible theory that fits with an experimental finding and other evidence is not easy and when they are able to do so, scientists view it as buttressing their judgments that the images reflect real structures. To illustrate how these considerations have been invoked in in cell biology, we present two examples philosophers have examined of conflicts over whether the structure shown in microscopic images was real or an artifact. The cases ended differently, one with the acceptance of the structure, one with its rejection.

The first case involves the Golgi apparatus, first described by Golgi (1898) in light microscope studies using the silver nitrate stain he had introduced. Palade and Claude (1949a,b), two of the pioneers of modern cell biology, who would ultimately share the Nobel Prize, argued that it was an artifact of staining, including with osmium tetroxide (which Palade helped establish as a primary stain for electron microscopy). They appealed not only to the variable appearance of the Golgi bodies, as had some earlier skeptics (Strangeways & Canti 1927; Parat 1928; Baker 1944), but also to their own ability to create myelin figures similar in appearance to the Golgi bodies by adding osmium to egg white. As discussed by Bechtel (2006), this is compelling evidence for the claim that the Golgi apparatus is an artifact, but in this case the evidence was eventually set aside without being refuted. Although Palade remained a skeptic about the Golgi apparatus for 15 years (researchers in his lab reported that they were not allowed to mention it during that interval), he finally accepted its reality when researchers in his laboratory demonstrated that many newly synthesized proteins pass through the region of the cell where the Golgi apparatus appeared on their way to being secreted. He did not, however, explain why he changed his mind. This later research on the Golgi apparatus, but not his earlier skepticism about the existence of the Golgi apparatus, was noted in Palade’s Nobel Prize citation in 1974. Palade himself later contributed to two reviews (Farquhar & Palade 1981, 1998) that discuss earlier researchers who cast doubts on the reality of the Golgi apparatus, but he never mentions his own claims that it was an artifact. What seems particularly salient is that, as a result of research in his laboratory, the Golgi apparatus was associated with a function in the cell in a manner that it had not been previously. It now fit into a plausible theory in which it figured in packaging proteins for export from the cell. Bechtel argues that this is often a major factor in researchers’ acceptance of the reality of entities identified through new techniques.

The second example stems from early electron microscopy of bacterial cells. Chapman and Hillier (1953) observed invaginations of the plasma membrane in gram-negative bacteria, which they called peripheral bodies. Robertson (1958) renamed them mesosomes and they were implicated by many researchers in a variety of cell functions before being rejected as artifacts in the 1970s (Silva et al. 1976). Analyzing this example, Rasmussen (1993) argues that philosophical criteria for distinguishing real entities from artifacts, such as robustness, are insufficient to explain scientists’ changing judgments about the mesosome. When Chapman and Hillier first made their case for the existence of mesosomes, they had to explain away differences between their micrographs and the observations of light microscopists by arguing that a membrane that only appeared in images with the light microscope was in fact due to the mesosomes being imaged under low resolution. Rasmussen contends they offered this convoluted argument rather than treating the mesosomes as an artifact because they were promoting the new electron microscopes. He further describes how their claims motivated research programs aimed at purifying and biochemically characterizing the mesosome so as to evaluate proposals regarding their function. This initially supported claims to the mesosome’s reality, but other biochemists offered conflicting evidence. In addition, another new technique for preparing specimens for electron microscopy by freezing them, which had its own passionate advocates, generated micrographs that did not show mesosomes. According to Rasmussen, these competing findings, not robustness, determined scientists’ judgments about mesosomes.

The case of the mesosome has attracted substantial interest from other philosophers of science. Culp (1994) challenged Rasmussen’s interpretation of the history of mesosomes, contending that the rejection of mesosomes as an artifact is in fact best explained on grounds of robustness. In particular, she points to the combined data from biochemists that revealed few differences between cytoplasmic membranes and specimens supposedly from mesosomes and from a new generation of electron microscopists that suggested that mesosomes resulted from the fixative, glutaraldehyde, used to generate the micrographs purporting to show them. These robustness considerations, she claims, sufficed to lead the community to reject mesosomes. In a later paper, Rasmussen responds to Culp’s analysis, continuing to maintain that local details, not principles like robustness, determine scientists’ judgments about artifacts:

general principles like robustness are too vague to warrant anything whatsoever, because when described in sufficient detail it emerges that the way such principles are instantiated is in flux—and the devil is in the details. (2001: 643)

Several other philosophers have also taken up the case of the mesosome. Allchin (2000) characterizes the initial evidence for the mesosome as robust and describes how subsequent research showing how particles were generated by degeneration of the membrane in preparation for electron microscopy led to a reassessment, culminating in mesosomes being recognized as artifacts. Weber (2005) argues that the process of evaluating claims about artifacts employs causal reasoning of the same sort as used in testing theoretical hypotheses. According to him, mesosomes were judged to be artifacts when evidence supported the claim that they were produced by chemical fixation. Hudson (2014: chapter 2) advances yet another alternative: according to which what mattered most to researchers was whether they regarded the process for generating evidence for or against mesosomes as a reliable process.

4.3 Diagrams in Cell Biology

Microscopic images, whether hand-drawn, as they were in the nineteenth century, or captured in photographs, are highly detailed. However, the knowledge cytologists and cell biologists seek to develop is more abstract and general—they seek to identify the types of structures found in cells, not all their instances. Accordingly, cell biologists frequently generate diagrams that leave out details. Maienschein (1991) examines the origin of this practice in Wilson’s (1896) classic text, The Cell in Development and Inheritance. Early in the book Wilson provided a diagram (Figure 5A) which abstracts from the much more replete photographs he had presented just a year earlier (Wilson 1895). Instead of showing all the instances of different organelles, he presents just a few instances of each type. Organelles are shown using icons that are suggestive of their shapes. Such diagrams serve to convey the types of organelles found in cells and their typical location, but falsely suggest that most of the space in the cell is empty. Maienschein contends that this transition from photographs to abstract diagrams reflects Wilson’s growing confidence in the correctness of his interpretation of what he was seeing through the microscope and a transition “from presenting data to representing theory” (Maienschein 1991: 252). A sign of their theoretical status is that such figures, unlike micrographs or data plots, often undergo numerous revisions as scientists develop their account. Revising these diagrams is a means, in fact, of developing theory. With the development of biochemical and molecular accounts of cell phenomena, researchers often make what Serpente (2011) characterizes as a transition from the iconic to the symbolic. He presents protein-protein interaction maps and gene regulatory diagrams as examples of symbolic representations.

cell diagram, see caption

A. Wilson’s (1896: 14, figure 5) cell diagram that leaves out much of the detail that would be seen through the microscope to focus on

mechanism diagram, see caption

B. A mechanism diagram of the processes of heterophagy and autophagy from de Duve and Wattiaux (1966: 468, figure 6).

Figure 5

Similar points also apply to another type of diagram that appears frequently in cell biology—diagrams of hypothesized mechanisms that are taken to be responsible for a particular phenomenon (Sheredos et al. 2013; Abrahamsen, Sheredos, & Bechtel 2018). Such diagrams do not try to show all the organelle types but, as in Figure 5B, only those thought to be involved in generating a particular phenomenon—in this case, the breakdown of materials taken into the cell (heterophagy) or of cell components themselves (autophagy). One challenge with mechanism diagrams is that they are static whereas mechanisms are engaged in change (the digestion of organelles and the expulsion of the remaining material). One common strategy is to use arrows to represent activities, although often within the same diagram arrows may have multiple different meanings. Ultimately, however, it is up to the viewer to animate a mechanism diagram (Hegarty 1992)—to rehearse mentally the different activities that are represented and to imagine the changes that are being produced by different parts.

One might think that diagrams are only important as a means of illustrating results that are presented textually. But examination of the practices of scientists reveals that they are far more central to their reasoning. Early in the development of a mechanistic hypothesis scientists sketch their ideas. Often mechanism diagrams (as well as the other figures that show data or the workflow of the research) are crafted long before text is drafted. Diagrams are commonly presented in lab meetings and revised multiple times as scientists are refining their claims. Researchers often generate the text of the paper only at the end of this process. Taking advantage of access to the draft figures and text for two research projects, Sheredos and Bechtel (2017, in press) examined the process of interactive engagement in which the investigators modified diagrams, changed text, and then further modified the diagram. What this process suggests is that sketching and resketching mechanisms plays a central role as researchers seek to identify what they can conclude from their experimental studies. In one of the cases they examined, an early version of a diagram serves to pose a question that was addressed through the experimental studies, resulting in a final diagram that offers an answer to the question posed. Beyond supporting the empirical claims of a research project, Jones and Wolkenhauer (2012) provide an illuminating discussion of how diagrams serve to locate information required for a computational model in a representation of the cellular mechanism that is being modeled,

5. Epistemic Issues II: Strategies for Explaining Cell Activities Mechanistically

Historically prominent philosophers of science such as Popper and Reichenbach rejected inquiries into how scientific theories are discovered as not philosophical (see the entry on scientific discovery). Beginning with Hanson (1958), though, discovery has attracted the interest of many philosophers of science. Investigations into discovery in cell biology (and related fields such as biochemistry, molecular biology, and neuroscience) inspired Bechtel and Richardson (1993 [2010]) to argue that the goal in these fields was not to construct nomological explanation (Hempel 1965) but rather to identify the mechanism responsible for a phenomenon and determine how it worked. Examples from cell biology have also figured prominently in accounts of mechanistic explanation by Machamer, Darden, and Craver (2000), Craver and Darden (2013), Bechtel (2006), and others (see Glennan & Illari, 2018, for a compendium of contemporary accounts of mechanisms and mechanistic explanation, and the entry mechanisms in science). The concept mechanism figures both in discussion of ontological issues and epistemic issues, but the two uses can be distinguished in the manner proposed by G. Allen (2005). In this section we are concerned with what he called “operative or explanatory mechanism” (2005: 261; the thesis that for explanatory purposes components of cells should be conceived to function as if they were machines); Section 3 concerned “philosophical mechanism” (2005: 261; the ontological thesis that organisms are or are constituted by machines).

One of the central objectives of many philosophers of science focused on mechanistic explanations is to characterize reasoning strategies or heuristics that scientists use to develop mechanistic explanations (Bechtel & Richardson 1993 [2010]; Craver & Darden 2013; Gross 2018). We discuss reasoning strategies that figure in different phases of developing mechanistic explanations in cell biology: delineating phenomena and situating them in responsible mechanisms, identifying and characterizing the components of mechanisms (a reductionistic phase), and determining the organization within mechanisms and between mechanisms and their contexts (a more holistic phase).

5.1 Delineating Cell Phenomena and Associating Them with Responsible Mechanisms

Challenging the common characterization of explanations as explaining data, Bogen and Woodward advanced the claim that scientific explanations are targeted at phenomena. Instead of defining what phenomena are, they give examples: “weak neutral currents, the decay of the proton, and chunking and recency effects in human memory” (1988: 306). From these examples, it is clear that Bogen and Woodward understand phenomena to be repeatable processes that can be observationally or experimentally detected in multiple ways. On this characterization, cell activities such as protein synthesis or cell division count as cellular phenomena. Although phenomena are often construed as the starting point of research, Craver and Darden (2013: Chapter 4) identify some of the experimental tasks involved in characterizing phenomena such as identifying precipitating conditions, manifestations, inhibiting conditions, modulating conditions, and nonstandard conditions that alter the manifestation of the phenomenon. They also emphasize the role of multiple experimental techniques in specifying features of phenomena. A good deal of research in cell biology is devoted to determining conditions under which cell phenomena such as programmed cell death are initiated or inhibited and cell biologists have been inventive in developing experimental techniques needed to produce these phenomena. Bechtel (forthcoming) points out that phenomena that are the target of explanation range from highly specific (protein synthesis in liver cells under low oxygen conditions) to much more general (protein synthesis generically). Individual research projects often address highly specific phenomena whereas textbooks or review articles discuss more general phenomena.

While some account of the phenomenon under study is generally adopted before researchers set out to identify the responsible mechanism, the characterization often changes radically as research on the responsible mechanism proceeds (Bechtel & Richardson 1993 [2010], refer to researchers reconstituting the phenomenon). This is illustrated with an example from the study of cells. A starting point for early inquiries into how animals store energy for their activities focused on the heat generated by metabolizing foodstuffs. This heat was assumed to power other activities and approximately a hundred years of research was devoted to explaining animal heat (see Mendelsohn 1964). However, after Lohmann (1929) and Fiske and Subbarow (1929) had identified adenosine triphosphate (ATP) and demonstrated that when hydrolyzed it would release considerable energy, heat was determined to be just a waste product of metabolism and researchers instead focused on the synthesis and hydrolysis of ATP. This became the reconstituted phenomenon to which much of the older research was now applied.

5.2 Reductionist Strategies: Decomposition and Localization

What is distinctive of mechanistic explanations is that they decompose mechanisms into parts or entities and the operations or activities that contribute to realizing the phenomenon. Although sometimes researchers can proceed by reasoning a priori about what component activities would be required to produce a given phenomenon, most often the decomposition is developed on the basis of experiments. While the goal is to identify both parts and operations and to link them, a given group of researchers may only have research techniques that allow them to identify one or the other. This was the case in cell biology. As discussed in Section 1, microscopic research enabled researchers to identify component parts (organelles) of cells, but except for indirect clues such as shape or the ability of an organelle to take up a stain, these researchers were unable to procure information about the functions they performed. Biochemists on the other hand were able to identify reactions involved in many cell activities, but since they studied these in chemical soups made by grinding up the cell, they were not able to link these to cell structures. Cell biology developed with the introduction of new techniques such as cell fractionation and electron microscopy that opened up the possibility of localizing biochemical reactions in organelles.

It is worth emphasizing that the sense in which decomposition is reductionistic is very different from that involved in more traditional philosophical accounts of theory reduction, which involves the derivation of one theory from another (Nagel 1961; see the entries on scientific reduction and reductionism in biology). Researchers pursue decomposition without assuming the existence of full theories at either level or that a theory at one level can be derived from one at a lower level. Moreover, in pursuing decomposition researchers typically do not assume that knowledge of the lower-level components is sufficient for explaining the phenomena—at a minimum, they recognize that how the components are organized is also important. The association of a cell process with a specific enzyme is not the end of the explanatory process—the activity of enzymes is often affected by the context in which the enzyme exists, for example, in a membrane. For this reason, researchers value in vitro reconstitution experiments in establishing that they have correctly accounted for a phenomenon.

Allchin (1996, 2007) and Weber (2002), analyze an important reconstitution experiment at the interface of cell biology and biochemistry that played a major role in resolving a conflict between two opposing accounts of the synthesis of ATP in oxidative metabolism. Biochemists spent a couple decades trying to identify a purely chemical pathway that used the energy released in oxidative metabolism to synthesize ATP (as happens in glycolysis). P. Mitchell (1961) advanced an alternative, chemiosmotic hypothesis according to which energy was transferred via the creation of a proton gradient over a membrane. Kagawa and Racker (1966) had already linked ATP synthase to small knobs on the inner mitochondrial membrane but it was an in vitro chimeric system combining fragments from bacteria, plants, and animals created by Racker and Stoeckenius (1974) that demonstrated that energy could first be captured in a proton gradient and then used in mitochondria to synthesize ATP. Unlike purely biochemical accounts that discounted cell structure, this research showed the importance of not just enzymes but how they are situated with respect to cell structures in explaining cellular phenomena.

5.3 Holistic Strategies: Characterizing Organization

Even in chemical soups individual molecules are arranged in a particular pattern. This pattern affects, for example, which molecule encounters another. When analyzing such soups, however, chemists do not try to decipher the arrangement but instead rely on statistical measures about the likelihood of encounters. But cells are different—different molecules are segregated in different locations and how they are organized affects the resulting behavior (this is true even in prokaryotic cells that lack internal membranes, with molecules segregated in different parts of the cell, sometimes changing location over the course of a day; see Cohen, Erb, Selimkhanov, et al., 2014). Organization is also important in manufactured products. If the parts of your computer were distributed on your desk, and each part was provided with some input so that it was performing an operation, the parts would still not carry out the same activities as they do when they are in their proper arrangement. Organization ensures that the outputs of one component are passed to the appropriate others as inputs. The importance of organization is further recognized when one considers that what human designers do is impose new organization on existing components to achieve novel desired effects. Evolution often does the same in biology.

Organization is especially important for attempts to understand the activities of cells but, until recently, cell biologists have had limited tools for determining organization. At a coarse-grained level, the combination of cell fractionation and electron microscopy provided information about organization and this provided insight into how cells perform their activities. For example, recognizing that enzymes that can break apart cell components are segregated from the rest of the cell within the lysosome explains why they only carry out their activities on structures that are first transported into the lysosome. And knowing that a collection of enzymes is localized in an adjacent membrane explains how products of one reaction are readily taken up in another. In these cases the organization realized in cells and its consequences can be characterized qualitatively and presented in a mechanism diagram, as discussed in section 4.3. In other cases, however, the organization is more complex than can be described in such qualitative terms. Especially when components are organized into feedback loops, and the individual operations are characterized in nonlinear functions, cell biologists turn to computational models to understand their behavior. Bechtel and Abrahamsen (2010) and Brigandt (2013) describe a number of examples from recent research on cell phenomena that require computational models and refer to the resulting explanations that apply dynamical analysis to mechanistic accounts as “dynamical mechanistic explanations”. Using computational modeling of spindle formation in cell division as an example, Gross (2018) shows how computational models can go beyond what has been established experimentally and serve as heuristics guiding further research.

In recent years cell biologists have acquired new tools for studying organization, many of these advanced in systems biology (Green 2017; see the entry on philosophy of systems and synthetic biology). One approach in systems biology seeks to develop comprehensive detailed models of the numerous components identified as involved in specific phenomena (Gross & Green 2017). High-throughput data about, for example, which proteins in a cell can bind to each other or which pairs of genes, when mutated together, are lethal, has massively increased the number of cell components associated with any given phenomenon. To make sense of this cell researchers often seek abstract models by constructing networks in which nodes stand for entities and edges for interactions between entities (Green et al. 2018). The challenge researchers face is to make sense of these networks—given the large number of entities involved and their many interactions, these networks can often appear as hairballs. We briefly consider two strategies for analyzing networks in cell biology that philosophers have analyzed.

Alon and his collaborators, focusing on gene transcription networks and metabolic networks in bacteria and yeast, identified “recurring, significant patterns of interconnections” involving two, three, or four nodes, which they called motifs (Milo et al., 2002: 824). One example, occurring in “hundreds of non-homologous gene systems” (Mangan, Zaslaver, & Alon 2003: 197) in the transcription network of E. coli, is the feedforward loop. In a feedforward loop (Figure 6), one unit sends inputs to two other units, the first of which also sends an input to the other, which serves as the final output unit. Using Boolean models, Alon and his colleagues demonstrated that depending on whether the connections are excitatory or inhibitory, such a motif can perform a number of different functions. For example, if all the connections are excitatory and the final output unit is only active when it receives input from both of the other units (the connections to it constitute an AND-gate, as shown on the left in Figure 6), then the feedforward loop functions as a persistence detector—the output unit only becomes active when the input to the first unit endures at least until the second unit becomes active. This, as Mangan et al. explain, protects the output (which might serve to start the transcription of a gene) from being generated in response to random noise presented to the input unit. The feedforward loop and Alon’s other motifs are characterized abstractly without specific reference to what entities and interactions correspond to the nodes and edges. Philosophers who have examined this research refer to these organizational patterns as design principles (Green 2015; Green, Levy, & Bechtel 2015; Levy & Bechtel 2013).

see text above, 3 diagrams, 2 coherent feedforward loops and 1 incoherent feedforward loop with 'and' and 'or' gates and 'activation' and 'repression' links.

Figure 6: Three examples of feedforward loops studied by Alon and his colleagues

The second strategy employs computational tools such as cluster analysis to find collections of nodes that are especially highly interconnected. To interpret these clusters in terms of mechanisms operative in the cell, researchers often align them with Gene Ontology (GO), a resource that was developed to represent published information about cell components, molecular functions, and biological processes in directed acyclic graphs so as to facilitate communication between researchers working on different species (Ashburner et al. 2000). Leonelli (2016) examines many of the epistemic issues the developers of GO confronted in developing such a resource. Beyond its original function, GO is now widely used to interpret network graphs mechanistically. By annotating nodes in cellular networks with information from GO when it is available researchers interpret these clusters as corresponding to known mechanisms or sometimes as constituting previously unknown mechanisms. Researchers make inferences about nodes for which such information is lacking using principles such as guilt by association—the entity is inferred to occur in the same location or to contribute to the same process as those with which it clusters (Bechtel 2017 analyzes several examples).

As a result of computational models and analyses of large networks, cell biology in the twenty-first century is much more focused on organization and appears much less reductionistic than it did in the mid twentieth century. For some philosophers, this reliance on network analyses represents a move away from mechanistic explanations towards a process view (Théry 2015; Nicholson 2018; Dupré 2012). Huneman (2010, 2018) construes the explanations resulting from network analysis as a distinct type of explanation he labels topological explanation. Others, however, argue that since these analyses still draw upon the components constituting the system and the biologists developing them continue to think of them as mechanistic, we should extend the conception of mechanistic explanation to include the holistic focus on organization developed in computational and network analyses (Baetu 2015; Bechtel 2015; Levy 2014).

6. Specialized Domains in Cell Biology

We have focused on core domains of cell biology, concerned with explaining the basic activities of cells. There are, though, many specialized fields concerned with cells. Some of these have become active areas for philosophical inquiry in their own right. Here we merely identify some of these and point readers to relevant work by philosophers, including in several cases entries in the SEP. One such domain is microbiology, concerned with single-cell organisms, whether prokaryotic (lacking a nucleus and other organelles) or eukaryotic. O’Malley (2014) has identified distinctive features of microorganisms (e.g., lateral gene transfer) and explores how features of microorganismal life challenge major assumptions about living organisms that have resulted from focusing predominantly on multi-cellular organisms. In other work (O’Malley 2010), she has examined from a philosophical perspective the competing hypotheses about the origin of eukaryotic cells from prokaryotic cells. Much of cell biology has focused on mature cells of specific types and has attended less to the processes by which cells in multi-cellular organisms differentiate from a common cell, known as a stem cell. Fagan (2013) has pioneered the philosophical examination of stem-cell research, including the advent of techniques to revert mature cells to stem cells. Cells are not only transformed in developmental processes in multi-cell organisms, but also in diseases such as cancer in which cells not only proliferate in uncontrolled ways but also defeat many normally operating cellular mechanisms that normally prevent proliferation. Plutynski (2018) has identified many of the philosophical challenges arising in the efforts to explain cancer (see the entry on cancer). An important capability of many multicell organisms is the ability to detect pathogens, viruses, and other threats and defend against them. Such immune responses require, among other things, the capacity to distinguish cells that belong to the organism itself from others (see the entry on philosophy of immunology). A fundamental issue that arises in many of these contexts as well as topics raised above is whether and how one should conceptualize cells as individuals or agents (see the entry on the biological notion of individual).

In addition to approaching cells as objects of scientific study, contemporary researchers often adopt an engineering approach to cells. One context is in the domain of synthetic biology in which researchers engineer cells, sometimes for research ends but other times to generate products society finds useful (see the entry on philosophy of systems and synthetic biology). The recent development of gene editing tools such as CRISPR opens up both epistemic and ethical issues (for the ethical issues, see the entry on neuroethics). One context in which attempts to synthesize cells has played a central role is in the attempt to understand the origins of life. Much of the research on origins of life involves the development of protocells—self-organized, spherical systems composed of lipids (Rasmussen et al. 2009). This has become a prominent topic of inquiry for both theoretically minded biologists and philosophers of biology (see the entry on life; Bedau 2012; Moreno 2016; Dunér, Malaterre, and Geppert 2016).


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We are most grateful for the helpful comments provided on earlier drafts of this manuscript by Douglas Allchin, Sara Green, Arnon Levy, Alan Love, Jane Maienschein, Karl Matlin, Maureen O’Malley, Anya Plutynski, Andrew Reynolds, Hans-Jörg Rheinberger, James Tabery, and Marcel Weber.

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