First published Thu Jun 8, 2017; substantive revision Thu May 20, 2021

Depiction or pictorial representation was studied less intensively by philosophers than linguistic meaning until the 1960s. The traditional doctrine that pictures represent objects by copying their appearance had been challenged by art theorists since the first quarter of the twentieth century, when what were thought of as illusionistic styles of painting lost favour, due to the growing prestige of so-called “primitive” artistic styles, and the fauvist and cubist experiments of artists at that time. But it took several decades before philosophers became interested in these debates. When they did so, it was largely due to the impact of two books: Ernst Gombrich’s Art and Illusion (1960), and Nelson Goodman’s Languages of Art (1968). Gombrich explored a variety of problems about the nature of depiction, the evolution of style, and the nature of realism, drawing extensively on theories of visual perception advanced since Helmholtz, and on Karl Popper’s falsificationist theory of science. Goodman, by contrast defended a purely conventionalist theory of depiction in general and realistic depiction in particular, which was rooted in the nominalist philosophy he had developed in collaboration with W.V.O. Quine. A large part of the philosophical work on this topic during the past fifty years consists in attempts to develop theories of depiction in general, and realistic depiction in particular, which overcome the objections to their views, while avoiding the simplifications and alleged cultural bias of the traditional ideas they rejected.

1. Resemblance Theories of Depiction

1.1 Resemblance and its Critics

Resemblance theories of depiction are commonly traced to Republic, book X, where Plato suggests that a painting of an object is a mimesis (imitation or representation) of its shape and colour. The idea is intuitively plausible, and it provides the basis for a variety of attempts by philosophers to define or analyse the concept of a picture, or to explain how pictures represent. It is true that pictures represent things that do not have shapes or colours, such as God and Justice, but they do so by depicting things that do have shapes and colours, such as bearded men and blindfolded women carrying scales. Accordingly, the basic thought that underlies resemblance theories of depiction is that pictures are composed of shapes and colours that resemble the shapes and colours of the visible objects they depict. But even if this provides an adequate starting-point, a convincing theory of depiction needs to be elaborated with care, as Nelson Goodman (1968) showed. The simplistic claim that A depicts B if and only if A appreciably resembles B is demonstrably false. According to Goodman “more error could hardly be compressed into so short a formula” (1968: 3–4).

As a matter of fact, the simplistic formula Goodman attacks was never proposed by Charles Sanders Peirce or his followers, such as Suzanne Langer (1942) and John Hospers (1947), whose semiotic theories were Goodman’s immediate target, or by any other philosopher or theorist of art. Peirce described pictures as iconic signs, i.e., signs that signify objects by resembling them, and he contrasted iconic signs with indices, which signify objects by standing in spatial, temporal or causal relations to them, and with symbols, which signify objects by means of conventions (Peirce 1982, Vol. 2: 53–56). But this classification depends on the basic idea of signification, which Peirce holds is a three-termed relation between a sign, its object, and an “interpretant”, i.e., a thought of the object or a translation of the sign. Moreover, Peirce acknowledges that these three categories of sign are not mutually exclusive, and that the signification of a picture can also depend on iconographic conventions, and on its context of use.

Hence, Peirce’s conception of depiction is not captured by the formula Goodman criticizes. But arguably the formula has some heuristic value, because it draws attention to some of the challenges a theory that explains depiction in terms of resemblance will need to address. Thus, according to Goodman, resemblance is a reflexive and symmetric relation, whereas representation is neither: an object resembles itself to the maximum degree but does not normally represent itself, and the object that a picture represents does not represent the picture, although it resembles the picture to exactly the same degree and in exactly the same respects as the picture resembles it. Furthermore, many pictures resemble other pictures, such as copies of them, more closely than they resemble their objects, but they do not represent those pictures. “Plainly” Goodman concludes “resemblance in any degree is no sufficient condition for representation”(1968: 4).

As we have indicated, Goodman’s initial challenge to resemblance theories of depiction does not show that the approach is wrong. For according to philosophers who favour the approach, the idea of resemblance is used to explain what makes a pictorial representation specifically pictorial, rather than what makes it generically representational. The depictive relation between a portrait and its subject is indeed neither reflexive nor symmetric. But resemblance remains a candidate for explaining what makes a representation pictorial or figurative, and therefore how a portrait of an individual differs from a text describing her appearance. For comparison, the referential relation between the indexical “now” and the time it refers to is neither reflexive nor symmetric, but this does not prevent us from explaining how “now” refers to a specific time in terms of simultaneity (between the use of the word and the time referred to), which is both.

However, the example of a portrait brings us to another objection to resemblance theories of depiction, which Goodman mentions in passing (1968: 25), and others have accorded greater weight (Hopkins 1998b; Abell 2009). For if resemblance is a relation, and if the relata of a relation must be existing particulars, then it appears that pictures that represent fictional individuals (Zeus, Pegasus), and genre pictures, which represent kinds of objects without representing any particular instances of them, cannot resemble what they represent. Hence, even if it is plausible that a resemblance theory can explain how a portrait represents a sitter, it cannot provide a general explanation of depiction.

One response to this argument is to claim that fictional characters are abstract entities that actually exist (Kripke 2013: 73). Another is to claim that a fictional character can be a genuine relatum of a relation without existing: it is sufficient that it is capable of being identified, referred to, and described, and meeting these conditions does not require existence (Rundle 1979: 249; Sainsbury 2005: ch. 6). But even if one of these responses is correct, and the objection therefore fails to show that the concept of resemblance is unsuited to explaining how pictures represent fictional characters, the problem of genre pictures remains. However, John Hyman (2012: 129–132) has argued that the verb “resemble” sometimes expresses a relation and sometimes does not. For instance, in the sentence “Darwin resembles Socrates”, “resembles” expresses a relation, whereas in the sentence “Socrates resembles a satyr”, it is a copular (linking) verb. Thus, according to Hyman, “resembles”, “looks like”, “is like”, etc. have the same kind of dual use as “is”, which can either express identity or have a copular function (Russell 1914: 48). If this is right, the objection also fails to show that the concept of resemblance is unsuited to explaining generic depiction (cf. Blumson 2014).

Goodman places more weight on a third objection to resemblance theories of depiction. A theory of this kind, he maintains, would need to specify the visible aspect or aspects of its object that a picture imitates or copies. But every object can be seen in many ways, depending on the experience, interests, and attitudes of the viewer: “the object before me is a man, a swarm of atoms, a complex of cells, a fiddler, a friend, a fool and much more” (1968: 8). Since the artist cannot copy all of these aspects at once, all of the ways the object is or looks, one might assume that her aim is to strip away the varnish of perceptual habit, prejudice or interpretation, and capture the object as seen “under aseptic conditions by the free and innocent eye”. But, Goodman claims, following Ernst Gombrich (1960), “there is no innocent eye”: the idea that we can access some raw visual data by means of “purification rites or by methodical disinterpretation” is a myth. Both “the way we see and the way we depict depends upon and varies with experience, practice, interests, and attitudes” (Goodman 1968: 10).

According to Goodman and Gombrich, resemblance theories of depiction depend on the mistaken assumption that visual perceptions result from a process of interpreting two-dimensional patterns of raw colour, without any intrinsic meaning, which artists are trained to observe and record. Psychologists such as Hermann von Helmholtz, artists such as Claude Monet, and art theorists such as John Ruskin embraced a theory of painting of this kind. For instance, the passage by Ruskin from which Gombrich took the phrase “innocent eye” reads as follows:

The whole technical power of painting depends on our recovery of what may be called the innocence of the eye; that is to say, of a sort of childish perception of these flat stains of colour, merely, as such, without consciousness of what they signify. (Gombrich 1960: 296; quoting Ruskin 1857: 6, note 1)

Goodman and Gombrich associate this conception of painting with resemblance theories of depiction. But it is not an essential part of such a theory. If the depiction of an object depends on the imitation of its form and colour, it follows that an artist must be able to perceive these properties and reproduce them, but it does not follow that we need to conceive of painting in the way Ruskin recommends.

1.2 Recent Resemblance Theories

The principal objections to resemblance theories of depiction may be unconvincing, but the challenge for such a theory is to specify the respect or respects in which pictures resemble their objects, and this is not a simple task. Merely referring to ‘form and colour’ is unsatisfactory. For as Descartes pointed out, it is unclear how the 2-D shape of a mark on the surface of a painting or drawing can resemble the 3-D shape of an object it depicts; and the use of foreshortening shows that rhombuses can represent squares better than squares, ovals can represent circles better than circles, and so on ([1637] 1985: I 165). Furthermore, some pictures (for instance, cubist paintings) do not bear much obvious resemblance to the objects they depict in either form or colour. Hence, the basic idea that depiction depends on resemblances in form and colour will need to be specified in such a way as to meet what Dominic Lopes calls the diversity constraint (Lopes 1996: 32), in other words, it will need to accommodate the wide variety of styles of picture-making. Different resemblance theorists have responded to these challenges in different ways.

John Hyman and Catherine Abell have proposed different theories of depiction in which the idea of resemblance plays a significant role. Hyman rejects the theory that pictures are iconic signs (2012: 127), but he claims that there is a strict and invariable relationship between the shapes and colours on a picture’s surface and the shapes and colours of the objects it represents. Hyman’s theory depends on Gottlob Frege’s distinction between sense and reference (see §3.2 of the entry on Frege). Taking one of Frege’s own examples, the phrases “the morning star” and “the evening star” have the same reference, but different senses, or modes of presentation. Both phrases refer to one and the same object, the planet Venus, but they describe or present it as a star that is visible at different times of day. Similarly, two portraits of the same individual may present him as dark-haired and seated, wearing a black smock (Kramskoy’s 1873 portrait of Tolstoy), or as grey-haired and standing, wearing a white smock (Repin’s 1901 portrait). They portray (refer to) the same individual, but they present him differently (they differ in sense). The distinction matters, Hyman argues, because resemblances do not explain a picture’s reference, they explain its sense. (The claim that A depicts B if and only if A appreciably resembles B, which Goodman criticizes, is about depiction qua portrayal, i.e., pictorial reference, not sense.)

According to Hyman, the sense or mode of presentation of a picture, expressed in the most general terms, is an aspect or view of an object or arrangement of objects, relative to an implicit point (or a variety of points) of view. (An “object” in this sense is not necessarily a “material object”, it might be a shadow, a rainbow, or part of the sky.) Different parts of a picture can present different aspects of an object or its parts, corresponding to different points of view, but nothing can be depicted independently of a point of view. Otherwise, Hyman points out,

[we could] discover different aspects of an object represented in a picture by moving around it and studying it from different angles, as we can in the case of a free-standing sculpture. (2012: 142)

Hyman’s principal claim is that the sense or mode of presentation of a picture is defined by the colours and shapes of the marks on its surface in accordance with definite optical principles concerning colour and shape (2006: ch. 5; see also Hopkins 1998a: 27). We shall concentrate on shape.

Hyman’s shape-principle employs the concept of an object’s occlusion shape, i.e., the 2-D cross-section of the cone of light it subtends to a viewer’s eye. (The concept is similar to Hopkins’s outline shape; see below, §3.2.) For example, the occlusion shape of a circular coin viewed obliquely is an ellipse. This shape, Hyman argues, is a visible property of the coin. It is especially salient when an object is backlit, and appears in silhouette. It is relative to a point of view, and changes as the point of view changes. But Hyman insists that relative does not mean subjective. An object’s occlusion shape “is not merely a feature of the viewer’s experience. It belongs to optics, not psychology” (2012: 143; cf. Peacocke 1987). Hyman’s shape-principle is that the shape of a region on a picture’s surface (or, in the case of anamorphic pictures, its occlusion shape relative to the intended point of view of a spectator) is identical to the occlusion shape of the object it represents, relative to the implicit point of view. In other words, there is an exact resemblance between these shapes (2006: 81).

According to Hyman, this principle captures an exact relationship between the marks on a picture’s surface and the picture’s sense, which does not depend on the artist’s intention, or on the picture’s psychological effect on a spectator, and which applies to pictures regardless of their style or the artistic tradition to which they belong. Together with a principle concerning colour, it is supposed to explain how the colours and shapes on the surface of a picture fix the colours and shapes of the objects it depicts. But Hyman’s optical principles do not imply that a portrait of Tolstoy resembles Tolstoy, since they are only concerned with a picture’s sense, as opposed to its reference. Nor do they imply that a painting of a bearded man resembles a bearded man, since they are only concerned with the shapes and colours of the objects in a picture. Hyman therefore claims that his theory dovetails neatly with the idea that a picture’s reference is normally determined by the artist’s intention, and with the idea that the depiction of objects of specific kinds, such as men and horses, depends on a picture’s propensity to trigger a spectator’s ability to recognize these kinds of objects by their shapes and colours, and the shapes and colours of their parts (see below, §3.2). He explains how these two elements of a theory of depiction can be combined with the example of a silhouette:

the black shapes the silhouettist has cut out fix the occlusion shapes of the objects represented and their parts, relative to an implicit line of sight. And the spectator’s ability to recognize, say, a girl or a cat, enables him to see a girl or a cat depicted in a silhouette by seeing its occlusion shape and the occlusion shapes of its parts. (2012: 113)

Hyman’s theory has been criticised on various grounds. First, and most generally, Michael Podro argues that it expresses a bias in favour of realistic or literal representation (Podro 2010: 457). However, Hyman replies that the optical principles he defines “do not dictate or limit the forms artists create, the models they follow, or the values they embody in their work”, any more than English grammar limits the imagination of English poets (Hyman 2012: 145). Second, it has been alleged that Hyman’s theory cannot explain “the depiction of nonexistent objects” (Abell 2009: 195). However, this objection depends on the questionable assumption that resemblance is invariably a relation between existing particulars (see above §1.1). Third, it has been argued that indeterminacies in the occlusion shapes of objects represented in a picture may not match the indeterminacies in the shapes of the parts of the picture that depict them (Kulvicki 2014: 61–62). Finally, it has been argued more generally that the exact correspondences in shape and colour between the surface of a picture and its content, which Hyman’s theory predicts, sometimes break down; and that the correspondences which do exist depend on contingent features of the human visual system (Newall 2006; Hyman 2007; Newall 2011).

The last objection reflects the most widely accepted reason for rejecting resemblance theories such as Hyman’s, in which the basic mechanism of depiction is defined without reference either to the visual experience of a spectator, or to the changing cultural context in which pictures are made. Catharine Abell has defended a resemblance theory of depiction which differs from Hyman’s in both of these respects, and is designed to avoid the objections mentioned above. It is also a more ambitious theory, both because Abell does not distinguish between the sense and reference of a picture, but aims to explain both at once, and because she explains the depiction of specific kinds of objects, such as men and horses, in terms of resemblance, instead of confining the scope of the theory to the shapes and colours of the objects in a picture. Unlike Hyman, Abell does not specify which particular respects of resemblance are necessary for depiction, beyond the requirement that they should be visible (2009: 199), arguing instead that “different respects of resemblance govern different instances of depiction” (2009: 196), including resemblance in respect of optical properties, such as occlusion shape, and response-dependent properties, such as when painters mimic the effect of simultaneous contrast.

Drawing on Paul Grice’s seminal article “Meaning” (Grice 1957), Abell argues that the respects of resemblance governing a particular picture depend on the artist’s communicative intentions:

A picture’s resemblance to some object O in a given respect(s) is relevant to determining what the picture depicts if its maker intended the picture to resemble O in the relevant respect(s) and thus to bring O to viewers’ minds; and intended that these resemblances have this effect in part because viewers recognize that intention. (2009: 201; cf. Blumson 2009 and 2014)

According to Abell, a picture depicts some object O only if it resembles O in a range of relevant respects, and if it thereby captures O’s “overall appearance”, enabling a spectator to distinguish it from objects for which it would not ordinarily be mistaken (2009: 210). As noted above, Abell regards pictures of objects that do not actually exist as problematic for resemblance theories of depiction. Her solution to the problem combines two ideas: first, a picture of an object that does not actually exist, but could exist, such as a gold mountain, would resemble the object, if it did exist; second, we can make-believe that a fictional character such as Sherlock Holmes exists, and make-believe that a picture resembles him (2009:216).

Abell argues that because she does not specify which particular respects of resemblance are necessary for depiction, her theory is consistent with the diversity constraint, in other words, it accommodates the wide variety of stylistic conventions that have developed in different artistic traditions. However, it can be objected that it fails to accommodate another alleged constraint on an adequate resemblance theory of depiction identified by Lopes, which he calls the independence constraint. According to Lopes, a spectator must be able to perceive the resemblances postulated by a resemblance theory of depiction “without first knowing” what a picture represents (Lopes 2005a: 16–17). In fact, this objection only applies to a theory which implies that a spectator perceives a certain kind of object in a picture by perceiving a resemblance between the marks on its surface and an object of this kind, and a resemblance theory need not have this implication. However, Abell accepts that the objection applies to her own theory, especially since she holds that the “respects of resemblance” that “govern” a picture depend on the artist’s communicative intentions, and that a spectator’s knowledge of these intentions is gained, at least in part, from the picture itself. However, she addresses the objection by highlighting alternative, context-specific sources of information about them (Abell 2005, 2009; cf. Blumson 2014).

2. Conventionalist Theories of Depiction

Resemblance theories of depiction differ from one another in significant ways. But they agree on the following crucial point: the fundamental difference between pictorial and linguistic representation consists in the fact that the former depends on resemblances between representations and the objects they represent, whereas the latter does not. It is widely agreed that linguistic representation depends on conventions that create the vocabulary of a language and the semantically significant structures in which the elements of its vocabulary are combined. But the contribution words and structures make to the meaning of a sentence are hardly ever explained by resemblance. If there are exceptions, such as onomatopoeia, they confirm the rule.

Art theorists such as Roman Jakobson challenged this division between pictorial art and language early in the twentieth century (Jakobson [1921/1971] 1987), reacting against what were thought of as illusionistic styles of painting. Once it was understood that artistic styles are comparable to languages or codes, it was thought, artists would feel freer to abandon academic conventions, to follow “primitive” models, and to participate in the fauvist and cubist experiments of Matisse, Picasso, and Braque (Bois 1987). Conventionalism was well established by the 1950s. For example, the following remark appears in an article by the American art historian Leo Steinberg entitled “The Eye Is a Part of the Mind”, which anticipates Gombrich’s and Goodman’s stance on the “innocent eye” (see above §1.1):

“Technical capacity in the imitation of nature” simply does not exist. What does exist is the skill of reproducing handy graphic symbols for natural appearances, of rendering familiar facts by set professional conventions. (Steinberg [1953] 1972: 198

However, the first attempt to defend a conventionalist theory of art systematically and in detail was made in Goodman’s book Languages of Art.

Goodman accepts that pictures may resemble the objects they depict, but he denies that this explains why they depict them:

A picture that represents—like a passage that describes—an object refers to and, more particularly, denotes it. Denotation is the core of representation and is independent of resemblance. (1968: 5)

Goodman does not define denotation, beyond describing it as a variety of reference, but two features of his conception of denotation should be noted. First, it is supposed to be the relation in which a name stands to its bearer, or a predicate stands to the members of its extension, or a portrait stands to its subject. Hence the controversial doctrine that predicates and names have the same semantic function is implicit in Goodman’s theory of depiction (Geach 1972; Strawson 1976; Hyman 2006: 185–190). Second, Goodman’s nominalist theory of properties excludes the possibility that a symbol denotes an object because it resembles it (Arrell 1987: 42). For he does not merely make the uncontroversial observation that an object is gray if and only if “gray” applies to it, he claims that the properties an object has depends on what predicates apply to it (Goodman 1968: 51, 54–55). In other words, “gray” does not denote an object because it has the property of being gray; on the contrary, it has the property because “gray” denotes it. Equally, the same predicates do not denote different individuals because they resemble each other, or have properties in common. On the contrary, they resemble each other, or have properties in common, because the same predicates denote them. Hence, resemblance is explained by, and therefore cannot itself explain, denotation.

According to Goodman, pictorial symbol systems differ from linguistic ones in being analog and relatively replete, an analog system being one that is syntactically and semantically dense. (For reasons of space we shall not discuss the relationship between analog and dense; see Lewis 1971 and Haugeland 1981.) A pictorial system is syntactically dense because it provides for a dense set of pictorial characters, in other words, a set containing infinitely many pictures “so ordered that between each two there is a third” (Goodman 1968: 136), and it is semantically dense because it provides for a dense set of classes of denotata. (By contrast, the Arabic numeral system for denoting the natural numbers provides for infinitely many characters—“1”, “2”, “3” …, “11”, “12”, “13” …, etc.—but there is a “gap” between each numeral and its successor, and between each of the corresponding natural numbers and its successor: the system is articulate, not dense.) Finally, a pictorial system is relatively replete because relatively many properties of a picture are relevant to its interpretation:

Any thickening or thinning of the line, its colour, its contrast with the background, its size, even the qualities of the paper-none of these is ruled out, none can be ignored. (Goodman 1968: 229)

Thus, whereas different instances of the same written letter, word or sentence can differ widely in appearance, pictures that differ in appearance, in any one of many different ways, and however small the difference is, will also differ in what they represent.

Thus, Goodman’s principal claims are these:

  1. Depictions differ from descriptions in belonging to symbol systems that are analog/dense and relatively replete.
  2. Depictions and descriptions are equally “artificial”, “arbitrary”, or “conventional” (1968: 230–231).
  3. Denotation is the core of representation, including depiction.

All three claims have been contested.

The first difficulty with (1) is that a set is dense only relative to an ordering. For example, the set of natural numbers can be given a dense ordering, but it is not dense in the familiar 1, 2, 3, … ordering. In the first edition of Languages of Art, Goodman does not explain what ordering of pictures he has in mind, but in the revised edition he states that

the ordering in question is understood to be such that any element lying between two others is less discriminable from each of them than they are from each other. (1976: 136)

This raises two questions. First, is an ordering of pictures of this kind possible? Second, Goodman’s ordering appears to depend on degrees of resemblance, albeit between signs as opposed to between signs and denotata. But is this reintroduction of the concept of resemblance compatible with his nominalist theory of properties and his attack on the doctrine of the “innocent eye”?

The second difficulty with (1) is that digital photographs would normally be classified as pictures along with analog ones (Bach 1970; Kulvicki 2006); and some diagrams, which would not normally be classified as pictures, are analog and relatively replete (Peacocke 1987). Furthermore, outline drawings are less replete than diagrams in which not only shape but also colour affects what they represent, but the former would normally be classified as pictures, whereas the latter would not (Schier 1986; Kulvicki 2006). Goodman acknowledges that “some old and vague boundaries are transgressed, some significant new alliances and alienations effected” by the classification of symbol systems he defends (1968: 232), but it is debatable how revisionist his theory can be, without ceasing to be a theory of depiction. For we want to know how pictures, including digital photographs, represent. It is possible to claim, in reply, that depiction is not the unitary phenomenon we naïvely imagine it to be. But this cannot be established merely by showing that Goodman’s theory of symbols precludes a unitary explanation of depiction.

The principal ground on which philosophers have contested (2) is that it is inconsistent with the so-called natural generativity of pictures. The argument is originally due to Flint Schier (1986: 43–55), but it is also advanced by Richard Wollheim:

if I can recognize a picture of a cat, and I know what a dog looks like, then I can be expected to recognize a picture of a dog. But on [Goodman’s] view this ought to be baffling. It should be as baffling as if, knowing that the French word “chat” means a cat, and knowing what dogs look like, I should, on hearing it, be able to understand what the word “chien” means. (1987: 77)

However, there appear to be conventional symbol systems, such as guitar tablature, in which natural generativity occurs. Hence, it is arguable that Schier and Wollheim mistook a disanalogy between pictures and words for a disanalogy between pictures and conventional signs in general.

(3) invites two questions. First, what explains the fact that a picture has a particular denotation, e.g., that Goya’s portrait denotes the Duke of Wellington? Second, denotation is a relation—the relation between a name and its bearer, or between a predicate and the members of its extension. So Goodman’s theory also faces the question raised earlier about resemblance theories of depiction, regarding pictures of fictional individuals (Zeus, Pegasus), and genre pictures. If the relata of a relation must be existing particulars, then it appears that pictures of these kinds cannot denote what they depict. So how do they depict them?

Regarding the first question, Wittgenstein claims that “An obvious, and correct, answer to the question ‘What makes a portrait the portrait of so-and-so?’ is that it is the intention” (1958: 32). But Goodman disagrees. He acknowledges that intentions are “usually involved” in setting up symbol systems, as they are in building bridges, “but in both cases, we can study the results independently of the thoughts of the makers” (1972: 125). He claims that what a painting or drawing denotes pictorially depends solely on the arrangement of colours on its surface, and the semantic and syntactic conventions that define the symbol system to which it belongs (1968: 42). But it seems to follow that few portraits, if any, portray a single individual, as opposed to every member of a class of similar individuals. For if pictures are effectively predicate-like symbols in a pictorial system, then unless X is the sole individual satisfying a portrait, i.e., unless the portrait is a uniquely identifying pictorial “description” of X, X is not the only subject of the portrait, the sole individual it portrays. Furthermore, it is hard to see how one can paint an inaccurate portrait of someone, just as it is hard to see how one can use an inaccurate description to refer to someone (e.g., “The man drinking a martini is my brother”, when he is actually drinking a daiquiri), if whom one refers to depends purely on the syntax and semantics of the phrase (Kripke 1977).

Regarding the second question, concerning pictures of fictional individuals and genre pictures, Goodman argues that the verbs “depict” and “represent” are “highly ambiguous” (1968: 22). In the sentence “Goya’s portrait represents the Duke of Wellington”, “represents” is a two-place predicate, expressing a relation, and the sentence as a whole identifies the denotation of Goya’s portrait; whereas in the sentence “Rubens’ painting represents Pegasus”, “represents” is part of a one-place predicate, and the sentence as a whole classifies or characterizes Rubens’ painting without implying that it denotes anything at all. Thus, pictures with null denotation are comparable to predicates or descriptions with null denotation, such as “flying horse” or “largest prime number”. We can distinguish between a picture of a centaur and a picture of a unicorn, even though they denote exactly the same objects (i.e., none), because they are instances of different characters in a symbol system that we understand. The symbol system consists of rules “correlating symbols with denotata” (1968: 228), but it provides for pictures with null denotation.

Finally, according to Goodman, a pictorial symbol system consists of rules correlating symbols with denotata, but he does not propose a single example of such a rule. He refers to “the traditional Western system of representation” (1968: 226), but he does not begin to formulate its rules. It is uncontroversial that various kinds of customs, rules and conventions are involved in making pictures, including technical procedures, iconographic conventions, rules of composition, and so on. But none of these have the function of correlating symbols with denotata, and it is doubtful whether pictorial rules of this specific kind exist (Hyman 2006: 174–175).

Despite these objections to Goodman’s theory of depiction, it continues to exert an influence on philosophers of art. For example, John Kulvicki has recently defended a theory that is designed to address some of the arguments above, and to incorporate some of the ideas advanced by Goodman’s opponents, while retaining Goodman’s principal ideas. In particular, Kulvicki agrees with Goodman that a picture is a symbol in a denotative system, and that a denotative system is pictorial in virtue of its structure, rather than any resemblance between its symbols and the objects they denote (Kulvicki 2006: 13). But it is difficult to be certain how far he shares Goodman’s approach to the semantics of pictures, and of symbols generally. In particular, Kulvicki relies on the idea that pictures have different kinds of content (see below), but it is unclear whether he agrees with Goodman’s reduction of content to denotation (1968: 27–29), and whether he shares Goodman’s general commitment to extensionalism (see §3.1 of the entry on Nelson Goodman), or whether he agrees with Frege that as well as having a reference or denotation, names and descriptions also express a sense.

According to Kulvicki, the semantic features of a picture are the “features the picture depicts its scene as having”, while its syntactic features are the colour and shape properties that are “relevant to the semantics of the picture” (2014: 92–93). Not all of a picture’s colour and shape properties qualify as syntactic features. For example, the brownish colour of a sepia photograph is merely an “incidental” feature. Kulvicki argues that a pictorial symbol system has four characteristics: (a) repleteness, i.e., a relatively wide range of properties of a picture qualify as syntactic features, e.g., colour, thickness of lines, etc.; (b) sensitivity, i.e., small changes to a picture in respect of any of these properties are syntactically significant (cf. Bach 1970: 128–132); (c) richness, i.e., “there are at least as many possible denotations in the system as there are syntactic types” (Kulvicki 2006: 38); (d) transparency, i.e., if part of a picture X depicts a picture Y, then that part of X has the syntactic features that Y is depicted as having.

Repleteness, sensitivity and richness are explained, and compared with Goodman’s relative repleteness, syntactic density and semantic density, in Kulvicki 2006 (29–46). But Kulvicki explores transparency in most detail, deducing in particular the following consequence: that a picture resembles the scene it represents in respect of a limited range of colour and shape properties, such as “the abstract pattern of light and dark” recorded by a black-and-white photograph (2014: 101). Kulvicki calls this range of properties the picture’s “bare bones content”, following Haugeland 1991. He does not attempt to define the colour- and shape-properties it consists in, but like Hyman, he suggests that the resemblance he postulates between a picture and the scene it represents partially explains how the normal experience of perceiving what a picture represents occurs. A picture’s “fleshed out content” (i.e., the content identified in a normal description of a picture: a horse, a man, etc.) depends on its propensity to trigger a spectator’s ability to recognize kinds of objects by the shape- and colour-properties included in its bare bones content:

Seeing a fleshed out content results from deploying concepts as a result of seeing the picture surface—and thus registering its bare bones content—that do not apply to the picture surface. Which concepts we deploy depends on what recognitionally keyed concepts we have, which determines the perceptual salience of a given fleshed out content. (2006: 173–174)

The main questions critics have raised about Kulvicki’s theory are as follows. First, it is designed to avoid some of the objections to Goodman’s theory, notably the fact that there are digital pictures as well as analog ones, but other objections remain, especially those concerning Goodman’s doctrine that denotation is “the core of representation”. Second, it is unclear what role Kulvicki accords to the artist’s intention in the theory of depiction. The question is ignored in Kulvicki 2006, as it is in Goodman 1968. In Kulvicki 2014, by contrast, he suggests that pictures “represent in virtue of the intentions of their makers” (2014: 156), but he does not discuss the scope of this principle (e.g., whether it applies to the sense or reference of a picture, or to both) or how precisely the role of intention should be defined. Finally, Kulvicki’s explicit disagreement with Goodman focuses on how the relationships between the symbols in a pictorial system should be defined. But it is debatable whether the four conditions he stipulates are in fact necessary and sufficient for depiction. Some alleged counter-examples are discussed in Blumson 2011, Newall 2011, and Kulvicki 2012.

3. Psychological Theories of Depiction

3.1 Experiential Theories

Experiential theories seek to explain depiction in terms of the kind of experience a picture causes in a spectator, rather than the kind of representational system to which a picture allegedly belongs, or the spectator-independent resemblance or isomorphism between a picture and the objects it depicts, or the subpersonal cognitive mechanisms a picture may be thought to engage. It remains an open question whether theories of this kind can avoid the charge of circularity, in other words, whether it is possible to define the experience of seeing what a picture represents without employing the concept of depiction. But even among philosophers who believe that this is possible, the exact nature of the experience has been a matter of debate.

3.1.1 Seeing As and Seeing In

The simplest experiential theory is that a picture depicts an object of a certain kind by causing a spectator to have the visual experience she would normally have if she saw the kind of object it depicts. Descartes’ remarks about depiction in his Optics suggest a theory of this kind:

The problem is to know simply how [pictures] can enable the soul to have sensory perceptions of all the various qualities of the objects to which they correspond—not to know how they can resemble these objects. ([1637] 1985: I, 166)

Michael Newall has recently defended the theory that “pictures occasion non-veridical seeing of their subject-matter” (Newall 2011: 42), which can be interpreted as an endorsement of Descartes’s position. But it is generally thought that Descartes assimilates pictures in general to trompes l’oeil, whose purpose is (or is commonly thought to be) to cause spectators to experience a kind of illusion. The experiential theories philosophers advocate today tend to define the experience caused by pictures differently, for this reason. (Newall distinguishes between his own theory and the theory that pictorial experience is a kind of illusion in Newall 2011: 23–30.)

The most important twentieth-century source of experiential theories is Ernst Gombrich’s book Art and Illusion (1960), based on the Mellon Lectures he delivered in 1956. In this pathbreaking book, Gombrich argues that realistic or naturalistic pictures do approximate to trompes l’oeil. Indeed, as Wollheim points out,

the two sets of terms, “naturalism”, “naturalistic” on the one hand, “illusion”, “illusionistic” on the other, are used interchangeably

in Art and Illusion (Wollheim 1963: 25). However, no general theory of depiction is presented in Art and Illusion, although Gombrich compares the perception of pictorial content with the phenomenon of aspect-switching or “seeing as”. He introduces “seeing as” with the ambiguous drawing of a duck or a rabbit that Wittgenstein’s Philosophical Investigations had made famous (Wittgenstein 1953: 194):

We can see the picture as either a rabbit or a duck. It is easy to discover both readings. It is less easy to describe what happens when we switch from one interpretation to the other. Clearly we do not have the illusion that we are confronted with a “real” duck or rabbit. The shape on the paper resembles neither animal very closely. And yet there is no doubt that the shape transforms itself in some subtle way. (Gombrich 1960: 5)

The significance of the ambiguous image is meant to be that it makes us aware of a process that the perception of pictorial content always involves: the process of making a “tentative projection, a trial shot which transforms the image if it turns out to be a hit.” “Ambiguity—rabbit or duck?—is clearly the key to the whole problem of image reading” (1960: 198). Gombrich is commonly described as proposing an “illusion theory” of depiction (e.g., Lopes 1996: 37; Newall 2011: 2), but he emphatically disavowed any such intention, pointing out that the title of the lectures on which Art and Illusion was based was The Visible World and the Language of Art:

[I] never dreamed that this title [Art and Illusion] would convey to some that I considered illusion, or even deception, the main aim of art. (Gombrich 1973: 195)

Gombrich explores a variety of fertile ideas in Art and Illusion, about the history of style, about realism in the visual arts, and about the relationship between the content of a representation and its use in imaginative play, some of which we shall return to below. But the comparison between seeing pictures and seeing aspects provides the focus of Richard Wollheim’s criticism of Gombrich’s ideas, out of which he develops his own theory of depiction.

Wollheim interprets Gombrich as claiming that a spectator cannot be simultaneously conscious of the marks on a picture’s surface and the scene it represents, and that these can only be objects of alternating perceptions, although Gombrich does not say this explicitly (Wollheim 1963; cf. Bantinaki 2007). But according to Wollheim himself, simultaneous awareness of surface and content is precisely what is distinctive about the experience of seeing a picture. Furthermore, these are two distinguishable but “inseparable” aspects of a single visual experience, and not two experiences somehow combined (Wollheim 1987, 1998, 2003a,b; Wollheim does not attempt to define a criterion of identity for experiences, so this claim is difficult to assess). Thus, the experience of seeing a picture has a sui generis phenomenology, which Wollheim calls “twofoldness”. The two aspects of this experience—its configurational aspect and its recognitional aspect—are held to be psychologically real and to be integrated in a way that also affects the phenomenal character of the experience as a whole.

Wollheim names this twofold visual experience “seeing-in”, but he explains that it is not confined to pictures. For example, it can also occur if we follow Leonardo’s famous advice to discover landscapes, battles and grotesque faces in the stains on an old wall.

Seeing-in is a distinct kind of perception, and it is triggered by the presence within the field of vision of a differentiated surface. […] When the surface is right, then an experience with a certain phenomenology will occur, and it is this phenomenology that is distinctive about seeing-in. […] The distinctive phenomenological feature I call ‘twofoldness’, because, when seeing-in occurs, two things happen: I am visually aware of the surface I look at, and I discern something standing out in front of, or (in certain cases) receding behind, something else. (Wollheim 1987: 46)

According to Wollheim, a genealogical parable reveals how “representation can be explained in terms of seeing-in”:

In a community where seeing-in is firmly established, some member of the community—let us call him (prematurely) an artist—sets about marking a surface with the intention of getting others around him to see some definite thing in it: say, a bison. If the artist’s intention is successful to the extent that a bison can be seen in the surface as he has marked it, then the community closes ranks in that someone who does indeed see a bison in it is now held to see the surface correctly, and anyone is held to see it incorrectly if he sees, as he might, something else in it, or nothing at all. Now the marked surface represents a bison. (Wollheim 1987: 46)

This is not meant to be piece of speculative history. The purpose of the story is to show that depiction occurs when the marks on a surface are successfully designed to make the seeing-in experience occur. It is not enough that this experience should occur. It must, when it occurs, fulfil the intention of the “artist”. Notice that for Wollheim, neither trompe l’oeils nor purely abstract paintings (i.e., abstract paintings that do not solicit the perception of figure-ground relations), are depictions, although they may resemble depictions in certain ways and embody some of the same aesthetic values. Purely abstract paintings do not produce an experience with the “recognitional” aspect of seeing in, whereas trompes l’oeil do not produce an experience with its “configurational” aspect.

Wollheim’s theory has been widely discussed and criticised (see especially van Gerwen 2001; Kemp & Mras 2016; Jagnow 2019). The principal objections to it are the following. First, the implication that trompe l’oeils are not representational has been contested (Lopes 1996: 49–50; Levinson [1998] 2001; Newall 2009: 25–26; for a critical assessment of Wollheim’s conception of abstract painting see Caldarola 2012). Second, the suggestion that the figure-ground relationship is a universal feature of depiction has been challenged (Hyman 2006). Third, Wollheim proposes that the standard of correctness, which determines whether the spectator has correctly perceived the content of a picture, “is set … for each painting by the intentions of the artist in so far as they are fulfilled” (Wollheim 1987: 46). But this appears to oversimplify the relationship between the representational content of a picture and the content intended by the artist. It is well known that the meaning of an uttered sentence can diverge from the intended meaning of the speaker, and hard to see why the same should not apply to a picture (see §4 of the entry on Paul Grice; cf. Terrone forthcoming). Fourth, Wollheim declines to offer a detailed characterisation of seeing in, which explains (a) how the experience of seeing a certain kind of object in a surface is related to the experience of seeing the same kind of object face to face (he describes these experiences as “incommensurable” (1987: 47)); or (b) how the experience of seeing one certain kind of object in a surface differs from the experience of seeing another kind of object in a surface (Budd 2008a; Hopkins 1998a). Fifth, Wollheim’s theory is unable to explain the fact that objects are necessarily depicted from an implicit point of view (Hopkins 1998a). Finally—a development rather than an objection—it has been argued that, at least in the case of pictures that have a reference as well as a sense, the experience of seeing a picture has a third aspect, i.e. it is “threefold” rather than merely “twofold”, as Wollheim suggests (see Brough 2012; Nanay 2018; Mion 2019; cf. Voltolini 2018).

Despite these objections, and the elusive character of his writing, Wollheim’s theory became the key point of reference for subsequent experiential theories of depiction.

3.1.2 Experienced Resemblance and Make-Believe

Experienced resemblance: As noted above, experiential theories explain depiction in terms of the kind of experience a picture causes in a spectator. The two most influential theories that have sought to define this experience more precisely than Wollheim does are due to Christopher Peacocke and Robert Hopkins, and the principal concept both employ is that of experienced resemblance.

Consider the experience of being struck by someone’s resemblance to another person one already knows well, e.g., when one sees the grown-up child of an old friend for the first time in several years. (We might speak here of seeing the parent ‘in’ the child.) No doubt there is a resemblance—in bone-structure, pigmentation, etc.—with a genetic explanation. But we can describe the experience as an experience of a resemblance, independently of whether the resemblance actually exists, in what respects, or why. According to theories that employ the concept of experienced resemblance, this is comparable to (though not exactly like) the experience a spectator has when she sees what a picture represents. Hence, the assumption (made by or attributed to Wollheim inter alia) that the object or scene represented by a picture is itself somehow perceived by the spectator, or present in her experience, is rejected by those who explain depiction in terms of experienced resemblance.

According to Peacocke (1987: 386–388), a design or configuration of marks on a surface depicts a certain kind of object φ if, and only if, it is successfully designed to occupy a region of the spectator’s two-dimensional visual field that she experiences as similar in shape to a region in which a φ could be presented, but without being experienced (as a sculpture representing a φ might be) as occupying a three-dimensional region of physical space similar to one which could be occupied by a φ. The details of Peacocke’s account have been criticized (see Hopkins 1998a; Budd 2008b; Voltolini 2015), but his appeal to experienced resemblance in the explanation of depiction proved influential.

The most widely discussed development of Wollheim’s approach is by Robert Hopkins. Hopkins adopts Wollheim’s term “seeing-in” to refer to the kind of visual experience a picture is allegedly designed to produce. He agrees with Peacocke that seeing-in can be defined in terms of experienced resemblance, but he argues that seeing-in is an experience of resemblance in outline shape between the marks on the surface of a picture and the object or arrangement of objects they represent, rather than shape in the two-dimensional visual field (Hopkins 1998a). Outline shape, Hopkins explains, is “a property of things that we regularly perceive, but rarely articulate” (1998b: §6), a visible property, but one which is relative to a point of view (unlike colour, for example). In fact it appears to be the same property as Hyman’s occlusion shape, i.e., the 2-D cross-section of the cone of light an object subtends to a point of view (see above §1). Unlike Peacocke’s concept of the shape of a region in a spectator’s visual field, it is not defined subjectively, in terms of the experience of a spectator, but objectively, purely in terms of projective geometry. And since seeing-in can be defined in terms of outline shape, so can depiction:

Seeing-in […] is essentially the experience of likeness in respect of outline shape. Depiction may then be understood as that representation which works through the deliberate generation of this experience. (Hopkins 1998b: §6)

Hopkins’ definition of seeing-in addresses several influential objections to Wollheim’s own approach. In particular, it avoids the implication that the figure-ground relationship is a universal feature of depiction; it explains precisely how the experience of seeing a certain kind of object in a surface is related to the experience of seeing the same kind of object face to face, and how the experience of seeing one kind of object in a surface differs from the experience of seeing another kind of object in a surface; and it explains the fact that objects are necessarily depicted from an implicit point of view. But Hopkins does not claim that there is invariably an exact match between the content of a picture and what can be seen in it (Hopkins 1998a: 128; see also Brown 2010; Dilworth 2005, 2010). Drawing on his or her knowledge of pictorial culture and convention, an educated spectator will discount some features of the object seen in a picture—such as deviations from normal human anatomy—attributing them to the prevalent pictorial style, rather than including them in the picture’s intended content. In this way, Hopkins draws a distinction between the content of seeing-in, which is determined by experienced resemblance in outline shape alone, and pictorial content, which also depends on the artist’s intentions (Hopkins 1998a).

However, several difficulties remain. First, it is unclear how Hopkins’s theory can accommodate Lopes’s independence constraint. As we have seen (see above, §1.2), according to Lopes, if a theory implies that a spectator perceives a picture’s content by perceiving a resemblance between the marks on its surface and the kind of object which it represents, then she must be able to perceive this resemblance “without first knowing” what the picture represents. But a spectator’s “experience of likeness in respect of outline shape” may depend on what she sees in a picture, Lopes claims, and “experienced resemblance cannot explain depiction if it is beholden to [i.e., explained by] depiction” (2005a: 16–17). Second, Hopkins agrees with Wollheim that the standard of correctness for a spectator’s perception of the content of a picture, “is set … for each painting by the intentions of the artist in so far as they are fulfilled”, and therefore faces the same Gricean objection (see above, §3.1). Finally, every experiential theory of depiction faces a difficulty in explaining how the shapes (or outline shapes) of the marks on the surface of a picture constrain the shapes (or outline shapes) of the objects they represent. On the one hand, if the only constraint is that they must be such as to generate an experience of the kind the theory postulates, then it is difficult to explain how this experience differs from a hallucination caused by an optical stimulus, such as the mysterious blank canvas described by Flint Schier, which causes the illusory experience of seeing a portrait of Marilyn Monroe, but presumably does not depict anything at all (Schier 1986: 197). On the other hand, if there must be a direct optical or geometrical correspondence between the shapes (or outline shapes) of the marks and the shapes (or outline shapes) of the objects they represent, so that we can perceive the latter by perceiving the former, then the theory is no longer purely experiential, and depends ultimately on the kind of relationship between surface and content postulated (for different reasons) by Hyman, Kulvicki, and Voltolini. (See Hyman 2006, Kulvicki 2014, Voltolini 2015. For Hopkins’ replies to these objections, see Hopkins 2003 and 2005.)

Make-believe: An alternative characterisation of the experience generated by pictures, which refers to the imagination, is proposed by Kendall Walton (1990, 2008a,b, 2011) in the context of a wider theory of artistic representation. Following Gombrich (1963), and drawing on Ryle’s seminal writings on imagination and pretence (Ryle 1949: ch. 8; cf. White 1990), Walton claims that pictures are props in visual games of make-believe, which prescribe visual imaginings with a particular content. When one engages in the right way with a picture of a certain kind of object or scene, one imagines that one is seeing an object or scene of that kind:

Participation in visual games of make-believe using pictures as props is a complex perceptual and imaginative activity. […] At a minimum, one imagines seeing the depicted objects or objects of the kinds that are depicted, as one scans the picture surface. One also imagines one’s actual visual experience of the picture to be a visual experience of these objects or objects of these kinds. […] I claim that this complex experience constitutes, approximately, what Wollheim and others call seeing trees, fields, etc. in the picture. (Walton 2011: 396–397)

Walton’s general theory of make-believe is widely regarded as an important contribution to the philosophy of art. But his theory of depiction faces the same difficulty as other experiential theories in explaining how the shapes (or outline shapes) of the marks on the surface of a picture constrain the shapes (or outline shapes) of the objects they represent, or the imaginative games they invite spectators to engage in. Furthermore, some of Walton’s critics have denied that visual imagination is an essential feature of picture perception (Savile 1986); and others have denied that the concept of a visual game of make-believe can capture the experience of seeing in, on the grounds that Walton fails to integrate the “recognitional” and “configurational” aspects of the experience, or at least fails to integrate them in the right way. However, the force of this objection is blunted to some degree by the disagreement among Wollheim’s followers about the right way of explaining how the experience of seeing in is integrated. (For objections to Walton, see Wollheim 1998, 2003b; Budd 2008a; Nanay 2004. For Walton’s replies to objections, see Walton 2008b,c. For an alternative analysis of seeing in in terms of imagining, see Stock 2008. For different views about the “integration” of seeing in, see Abell & Bantinaki 2010; Newall 2015; Voltolini 2015.)

Inflection: As noted above, the alleged “integration” of seeing in has been a matter of debate. This is especially true with respect to cases where the marks on the surface of a picture are not merely a means by which the spectator perceives its content, but are designed by the artist to contribute to the content of the picture in virtue of their character as marks. For example, in several pastel drawings made in the 1880s, in which Degas depicts a woman drying herself, he trace of the pastel rubbing against the paper’s surface subliminally registers the motion of the towel against the woman’s skin. In this kind of case, as Michael Podro explains,

the recognition of the subject is extended and elaborated by the way its conditions of representation, the medium and the psychological adjustments the painting invites become absorbed into its content. (Podro 1998: 2)

The spectator’s experience of this phenomenon has been called “inflected seeing in”, and both the phenomenon and the experience have received considerable attention, both from philosophers who maintain that depiction can be defined in experiential terms, and from those who doubt or deny this. Lopes (2005a) makes the interesting claim that inflection solves the puzzle of mimesis: in other words, it explains why we value or enjoy seeing pictures of kinds of objects that we do not value or enjoy seeing face-to-face (The seminal treatment of this problem is in Aristotle’s Poetics (Book IV). Noteworthy discussions of inflection include Hopkins 2010, Nanay 2010, and Voltolini 2013. Broader discussions of the kinds of pictorial experience that pictures in different styles can elicit include Lopes 2005a, Cavedon-Taylor 2011, Newall 2011, and Bradley 2014.)

3.2 Recognition-Based Theories

We noted in §3.1 that experiential theories seek to explain depiction in terms of the kind of experience a picture causes in a spectator, rather than the subpersonal cognitive mechanisms a picture is thought to engage. Some philosophers therefore maintain that theories which explain depiction in terms of the propensity of a picture to activate a spectator’s recognitional skills are not experiential theories, on the grounds that recognition can occur without experience (Matthen 2005: 25–26; Newall 2011: 21–23). Others either claim or assume, on the contrary, that recognition is a kind of experience, at least the kind of recognition that is stimulated by a picture (Squires 1969; Schier 1986).

The basic thought that underlies recognition-based theories of depiction is that a picture must be recognisable:

It must be the kind of thing that can be connected up with what the artist had in mind, if looked at in the right way by people with aptitude and experience. […] Ultimately, we establish what is recognisable by reference to what is recognised. (Squires 1969: 203)

The same thought is developed by Schier. As noted above (see §2), Schier claims that our interpretation of pictures, unlike our interpretation of words, is generated naturally:

Once you have succeeded in an initial pictorial interpretation […] you should then be able to interpret novel icons without being privy to additional stipulations given only that you can recognise the object or state of affairs depicted. (Schier 1986: 43)

Accordingly, Schier argues that depiction can be defined in terms of natural generativity and recognition: a picture is the kind of representation that causes naturally generated interpretations in competent spectators by activating their recognitional skills. Thus, “pictures are symbols whose interpretation can be causally explained by relevant recognitional abilities” (Schier 1986: 49). Specifically, “a picture of O is precisely something which can trigger the interpreter’s O-recognising abilities” (Schier 1986: 195).

Schier’s basic thought was subsequently incorporated into an eclectic theory of depiction by Dominic Lopes (1996). Drawing on Gareth Evans’s information-theoretic account of reference (Evans 1982; see §2.3 of the entry on reference) and Kendall Walton’s controversial claim that photographs are “transparent” (Walton 1984), as well as Schier’s recognition-based theory of depiction, Lopes defends the following ideas.

First, pictures belong to “information systems”, and transmit perceptual information from their subjects (Lopes 1996: 107), thereby engaging (and also extending) the recognitional skills spectators exercise in ordinary visual perception. “The ability to work out what pictures depict covaries with the ability to recognize their depicta in the flesh” (2005a: 170). Second, Lopes adopts Walton’s claim that photographs are “transparent”, i.e., spectators literally see the objects that appear in photographs, as if through a pane of glass, and not merely visual records or sources of information about them. However, Lopes extends this claim to encompass every kind of picture: “there is as much reason to believe that we see through paintings and drawings as through photographs” (1996: 181). Third, pictures present aspects of their subjects, by making both “commitments” and “non-commitments” regarding their properties: “Every picture represents its subject as having some property that precludes it from making commitments about some other property” (Lopes 1996: 125). For example, a picture that depicts a man sporting a beard makes a commitment regarding the property of being hirsute, but by the same token is non-commital regarding the property of having a dimpled chin. Explicit “non-commitment” distinguishes depiction from other kinds of representation. (For criticism see Herwitz 2000, Savile 2000, Kulvicki 2006.) Fourth, pictorial styles, or systems of pictorial representation, differ from each other in the kinds of aspects they typically present. Pictorial competence is relative to specific styles or systems: to be able to interpret a picture, one needs to have the recognitional skills corresponding to the system to which it belongs (Lopes 1996: 152–3).

These ideas face various difficulties, some of which we have already considered in connection with other experiential theories. First, Lopes’s ideas about the transmission of perceptual information and the transparency of pictures are difficult to apply to pictures of fictional individuals and genre pictures (Hopkins 1997). Second, the transparency claim has been criticised even in the case of photographs, where the problem of fictional subjects and genre pictures does not normally arise (Currie 1995). Third, the claim that pictures differ from other kinds of representations in that only pictures explicitly “non-commit” to properties has been challenged (Kulvicki 2006). Finally, as we have seen, Walton’s theory that picture are props in games of visual make-believe does not seem capable of explaining how the shapes of the marks on the surface of a picture constrain the shapes of the objects they represent, or the imaginative games they invite spectators to engage in. Recognition-based theories are open to a similar objection. Various theories of depiction are compatible with the claim that pictures activate the same recognitional skills as the kinds of objects they depict. The question on which they differ is why they do so. For example, is it because the shape of a region on a picture’s surface is identical to the occlusion shape of the object it depicts? Or is it because part of a picture’s surface occupies a region of the spectator’s two-dimensional visual field that she experiences as similar in shape to a region in which the kind of object that it depicts could be presented? Or is it for some other reason? Without an answer to this question, the problem of explaining how pictures represent is elaborated by introducing ideas about recognition, natural generativity and transparency, but it is not solved (Newman 1998; cf. Neander 1987, Sartwell 1991).

4. Realism

As we have seen, any plausible theory of depiction will need to accommodate the wide variety of styles of picture-making. Art history contains more sophisticated and fertile treatments of the concept of style than philosophy does, notably by Heinrich Wolfflin (1950), Alois Riegl ([1893] 1992), Erwin Panofsky (1997), Ernst Gombrich (1968), and Meyer Schapiro (1994). However, one topic in the theory of style on which there is a substantial philosophical literature is realism.

The term “realism” and equivalent terms in other European languages were introduced into literary and art criticism during the nineteenth century, and paintings and sculptures are still commonly described as realistic (faithful, true to nature, etc.) by critics and historians of art. However, many philosophers and historians of art since the 1920s have expressed scepticism about the idea that some styles of art represent reality more truthfully or faithfully than others (Jakobson [1921/1971] 1987; Steinberg [1953] 1972; Nochlin 1971; Stewart 1997). The most influential exponent of this view is Goodman, who argues that realism cannot be a matter of fidelity to nature, and cannot be measured by resemblance to reality, because our judgements about fidelity to nature depend on our visual habits, which are shaped in turn by the visual culture we inhabit, and the images we are used to seeing and interpreting. Resemblance cannot be a “constant and independent” standard against which works of art can be measured, because “the criteria of resemblance vary with changes in representational practice” (Goodman 1968: 39). “The literal or realistic or naturalistic system of representation”, Goodman claims, “is simply the customary one”.

Realism is relative, determined by the system of representation standard for a given culture or person at a given time. Newer or older or alien systems are accounted artificial or unskilled. (1968: 37)

Goodman’s argument has been challenged on several grounds. First, the realistic system of representation cannot simply be the standard or customary one, because as an artistic style evolves, spectators are inevitably less accustomed to innovative subjects and techniques than they are to the ones these modify or replace. So if Goodman’s claim were true, an artistic style could never become more realistic, in the eyes of spectators living at the time. But the historical record proves, on the contrary, that it does (Newall 2011: 119–121). Second, Goodman exaggerates the extent to which visual experience is modified by art. Oscar Wilde famously claimed that there had been no fog in London before it appeared in Turner’s paintings. But in fact, writers generally described optical effects long before painters learned to represent them. For example, the spinning highlights on a chariot-wheel were described by the Latin poet Prudentius many centuries before Velazquez captured this effect in paint. Third, even if the art we see does modify our visual habits and influence the resemblances we perceive to some extent, it does not follow that realism cannot consist in resemblance or fidelity to nature. Compare the relationship between theory and observation in science. The growth of scientific knowledge has enabled us to refine our observations of natural phenomena, and these observations have in turn enabled us to test scientific theories. There is nothing suspicious about this interaction between theory and observation, and nothing that should make us wonder whether we possess a “constant and independent” standard, with which scientific theories can be assessed (see §4; of the entry on theory and observation in science and §3 of the entry on Popper).

It is now generally agreed that the concepts of resemblance and fidelity to nature are too vague and metaphorical to explain what realism is, and that “realist” or “realistic” art proceeds from specific values, methods and viewpoints, no less than other kinds of art (Schapiro 1978). Furthermore, confusion about realism is compounded by the fact that the term is used to describe a variety of period styles, including late medieval and early Renaissance art, Dutch painting in the seventeenth century, and French painting in the nineteenth century. But it does not follow that “realism” is merely an honorific term, which we apply to art in a familiar style, or that fidelity to nature is a vacuous idea.

The fundamental distinction we need to draw, in order to clarify the concept of realism, is between realism in subject-matter and realism in technique (Hyman 2005). Realism in subject-matter is about the choice of subject-matter and the manner in which it is treated. Realistic art, in this sense, represents the lower social classes, comic as opposed to tragic material, daily life as opposed to myth. For example, in the paintings of Courbet, Manet and Degas the traditional hierarchy of genres, which promoted the representation of history, myth or allegory, is definitively set aside, and the everyday lives of people belonging to the lower social classes are taken seriously, and placed in a contemporary social setting, as they are in the novels of Balzac and Flaubert.

Realism in technique is a different phenomenon, which can be traced back to the revolutionary developments in Greek art between the sixth and fourth centuries BC, specifically, developments in anatomy and in the representation of space and light. Since philosophers and art theorists abandoned the idea that realism can be defined in terms of fidelity to nature or resemblance, most of those who do not regard realism as a purely ideological concept or a sham (e.g., Stewart 1997; Neer 2002) have defined realism in technique in terms of information: either the quantity of information recorded in a picture (Gombrich 1960; Schier 1986), or the quantity of relevant or visually salient information (Lopes 1996; Sartwell 1994; Abell 2006, 2007; Kulvicki 2006), or the ease with which information issues (Goodman 1968), or the range of information (Hyman 2005), is said to be the, or the principal, measure of realistic art. (See also Walton 1990; Chasid 2007; and Newall 2011 for comparable views.)

According to Hyman, realism in technique can be defined in terms of three characteristics: accuracy, animation, and modality (Hyman 2005: 40–46). Accuracy means the accurate depiction of a kind of material or object or activity, such as water or satin, a palm tree or a dove, sleeping, galloping or making love. Animation combines mobility with the expression of emotion, character or thought (see also Penrose 1973: 268). The term “modality” refers to the expressive potential available to artists during a particular phase in the development of an artistic tradition, in other words, the range of kinds of information that the technical resources available to artists allow them to record:

The technical resources of pictorial art are always limited in their expressive range, as languages are also bound to be; and these technical resources, like languages, can expand in different directions to express new ideas and new observations. The development of realistic techniques is the expansion of the modality of art, in other words, the expansion of what it is possible for art to represent. (Hyman 2009: 497)

The commonest argument debunking the idea of a realistic artistic style depends on the thought that artistic styles are analogous to languages (see above, §2 for references). The comparison is intended to underline the extent to which artists rely on systems of conventions, and to discourage the idea that some styles are more truthful, or closer to reality, than others. For the things we say are not truer or closer to reality if we say them in French, or English, or Chinese. However, the analogy actually supports the claim that expressive potential is the measure of realistic art. For languages are not like codes or scripts. For example, the Hieratic and Hieroglyphic Egyptian scripts do not differ in the range of information they can be used to record, and neither do Semaphore and Morse code. But languages obviously differ widely in their expressive powers, and have expanded rapidly in some periods of history. Thus, the difference between trecento and seicento Italian art is comparable to the difference between the English of Chaucer’s Canterbury Tales and the English of Milton’s Paradise Lost, not to that between Morse Code and Semaphore or between English and French (see Ackerman 1978: 157–160; Hyman 2005: 47).


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