Dewey’s Moral Philosophy

First published Thu Jan 20, 2005; substantive revision Sat Jan 28, 2023

John Dewey (1859–1952) lived from the Civil War to the Cold War, a period of extraordinary social, economic, demographic, political and technological change. During his lifetime the United States changed from a rural to an urban society, from an agricultural to an industrial economy, from a regional to a world power. It absorbed millions of immigrants from Europe and Asia, but faced wrenching conflicts between capital and labor as they were integrated into the urban industrial economy. As the face-to-face communal life of small villages and towns waned, it confronted the need to create new forms of community life capable of sustaining democracy on urban and national scales. Dewey believed that neither traditional moral norms nor traditional philosophical ethics were able to cope with the problems raised by these dramatic transformations. Traditional morality was adapted to conditions that no longer existed. Hidebound and unreflective, it was incapable of changing to address the problems raised by new circumstances. Traditional philosophical ethics sought to discover and justify fixed moral goals and principles by dogmatic methods. Its preoccupation with reducing the diverse sources of moral insight to a single fixed principle subordinated practical service to ordinary people to the futile search for certainty, stability, and simplicity. In practice, both traditional morality and philosophical ethics served the interests of elites at the expense of most people. To address the problems raised by social change, moral practice needed to acquire the disposition to respond intelligently to new circumstances. Dewey saw his reconstruction of philosophical ethics as a means to effect this practical reconstruction.

Dewey’s ethics replaces the goal of identifying an ultimate end or supreme ethical principle with the goal of identifying a method for improving our value judgments. Dewey argued that ethical inquiry is the use of reflective intelligence to revise our judgments in light of the consequences of acting on them. Value judgments are tools for satisfactorily redirecting conduct when habits fail. As tools, they can be evaluated instrumentally. We test our value judgments by putting them into practice and seeing whether the results are satisfactory — whether they solve our problems with acceptable side-effects, whether they enable successful responses to novel problems, whether living in accordance with alternative value judgments yields more satisfactory results. We make moral progress by adopting habits of reflectively revising our value judgments in response to the widest consequences for everyone of following them. The conditions of warrant for value judgments lie in human conduct, not in any a priori fixed reference point outside of conduct, such as God’s commands, Platonic Forms, pure reason, or nature. Dewey offers a naturalistic metaethic of value judgments, grounded in developmental and social psychology.

1. Developmental and Social Psychology

Dewey argues that the function of value judgments is to guide human conduct, understood broadly to include conscious and unconscious bodily motion, observation, reflection, imagination, judgment, and affective responses. There are three levels of conduct: impulse, habit, and reflective action. These differ according to how far they are guided by ideas of what one is doing.

1.1 Impulse

Humans begin life endowed only with impulses as motor sources of activity. Impulses include drives, appetites, instincts, and reflexes. They are “affective-motor responses”: primitive tendencies of movement toward some things (eyes toward human faces, hand to grasping whatever is within reach), away from others (spitting out bitter food, averting eyes from too bright light, brushing off pesky flies), and even activity with no particular orientation toward external objects (stretching, rolling over, crying, fidgeting). Impulsive activity is not purposive. It involves no idea of an end to be achieved by the activity. When a newborn sucks on its mother’s nipple, it obtains food and thereby satisfies its hunger. But it has no idea that this will be a consequence of its sucking, and does not suck with the end in view of obtaining food (HNC 65–69).

Dewey’s choice of impulse as the original motor source of conduct contrasts with conventional desire-based psychology in two ways. First, it takes activity rather than rest as the default state of human beings. Desires are defined by the states of affairs they aim to achieve. On this model, action needs to be inspired by an idea of some deficit. Once the deficit is repaired, the desire is fulfilled, and the organism returns to a state of rest. Dewey observed that this model does not fit what we know about children. They are constantly in motion even when they achieve no particular purpose in moving. They don’t need any end in view or perception of external lack to move them (HNC 118–9). Second, impulse psychology stresses the plasticity of the sources of conduct. Desires are fixed by their ends. Impulses can be directed and shaped toward various ends. Children’s primitive impulses to move their bodies energetically can be directed, through education, toward the development of socially valued skills and interpersonally coordinated activity (HNC 69–75).

Desires or ends in view arise from the child’s experiences of the consequences of its impulsive activity. A newborn infant cries when it is hungry, at first with no end in view. It observes that crying results in a feeding, which relieves its hunger. It gets the idea that by crying, it can get relief. When crying is prompted by this idea, the child sees it as a means to a further end, and acts for the first time on a desire (that is, with an end in view) (TV 197–8). What desires the child acquires are shaped by others’ responses to its original impulsive activity, by the results that others permit such activity to achieve. Parents who respond indiscriminately to their children’s crying end up with spoiled children whose desires proliferate without consideration for others’ interests. Parents who respond selectively shape both their children’s use of means (crying) and their ends, which are modulated in response to the resistance and claims of others. This plasticity of ends and means is possible because the original source of activity is impulse, not desire. Impulses demand some outlet, but what ends they seek depends on the environment, especially others’ responses to the child.

1.2 Habit

Habits are socially shaped dispositions to particular forms of activity or modes of response to the environment. They channel impulses in specified directions, toward certain outcomes, by entrenching particular uses of means, prescribing certain conduct in particular circumstances. While individuals may have idiosyncratic habits, the most important habits are customs, shared habits of a group that are passed on to children through socialization. Customs originate in purposive activity. Every society must devise means for the satisfaction of basic human needs for food, shelter, clothing, and affiliation, for coping with interpersonal conflict within the group and treatment of outsiders, for dealing with critical events such as birth, coming of age, and death. Customary ways of satisfying needs shape the direction of impulse in the socialized individual. A young child just starting on solid food may be open to eating nearly anything. But every society limits what it counts as edible. Certain foods become freighted with social meaning —as suitable for celebrating birthdays, good for serving to guests, reserved for sacrifice to the gods, or fit only for animals. The child’s hunger becomes refined into a taste for certain foods on particular occasions. She may recoil in disgust or horror from certain edibles deemed taboo or unclean. There may have been a rationale for the original selection of foods. Perhaps some food was deemed taboo when its consumption was followed by a natural disaster, and people concluded that the gods were angry at them for consuming it. But the habit of avoiding it may persist long after its original rationale is forgotten (E 39–48, HNC 15–21, 43–7).

While habits incorporate purposes and socially meaningful ideas, they operate beneath the actor’s consciousness. Once people have learned how to achieve some purpose through habit or skill, they no longer need to tend to what they are doing. Habits, by receding from awareness, conserve people’s reflective resources, make their activity fluid, and enable them to reliably produce results in stable environments. People’s habits embody their characters (HNC 33–43, 50–2).

Because they operate subconsciously, habits may continue after their original rationale has been forgotten or repudiated. Because they entrench modes of conduct rather than ends in view, they may produce unintended results when the environment changes. We can reliably produce alternative results only by acquiring a new habit. Discovering the means required to change habits requires psychological and sociological inquiry, not just conscientiousness and willpower. It is magical thinking to suppose that we can change habits through conscious willing, when we lack knowledge of the means of change. Nor can we check their operation through monitoring, since they operate behind our backs. (HNC 21–32).

Habits tend to be difficult to modify because people form emotional attachments to them, and prevailing ideologies represent current customs as right. Dewey placed his hopes for change in the education of youth. Because children have impulses not yet channeled into rigid habits, they are better able to open up opportunities for change, provided their education instills habits of independent thought, critical inquiry, experimentation, and imagination, including sympathy with others (DE; HNC 127–8). Such education can make habits themselves more intelligent — flexible and responsive to change.

1.3 Intelligent Conduct

The need to reflect intelligently on one’s conduct arises when the usual operation of habit or impulse is blocked. Customary means may be lacking; changed circumstances may make habits misfire, producing disturbing consequences; the social interaction of groups of people with different customs may produce practical conflicts that require mutual adjustment. Blocked habits lead people to deliberate on the problem posed by their situation. Deliberation is a thought experiment that aims to arrive at a practical judgment, action upon which is expected to resolve one’s predicament. Deliberation is more intelligent, the more articulate the definition of one’s problem in light of more observant uptake of its relevant features, the more imaginative and feasible are proposed solutions, the more comprehensive and accurate the estimate of the consequences of implementing them, and the more responsive is the choice to its expected consequences. As the individual gets more practice in intelligent conduct, the dispositions that make it up become habits (HWT 196–220).

2. Metaethics of Value Judgments

Dewey held that value judgments guide conduct by way of propositions subject to empirical testing. Value judgments can be both action-guiding and empirically warranted because they have an instrumental form. They say that if something were done, then certain consequences would follow, which would be valued. The point of asserting such propositions is to intelligently guide the design and selection of a course of action that will solve a problem, where the assertion is part of the means by which the action is brought about (LJP 16–17). Value judgments figure in Dewey’s psychology in relation to the distinction between valuing and evaluation, and Dewey’s notions of desire, taste, and interest.

2.1 Valuing vs. Evaluation

Dewey’s metaethics is grounded in the distinction between valuing and evaluation (also denoted as “prizing” vs. “appraising”, or “esteeming” vs. “estimating,”). Dewey’s term “valuation” covers both valuing and evaluation. Valuing, prizing, and esteeming denote “affective-motor attitudes,”, with more emphasis on “motor” than “affective.” Valuing is a matter of loving or hating, liking or disliking something, where these attitudes involve tendencies to act (LJP 23–27). In his later work, Dewey embraced a more uncompromising behavioristic view of valuing that questioned the attribution of inner emotional aspects to valuing (TV 199, 202–3).

At the most primitive level, valuings are tendencies to move toward, acquire, or ingest certain things, or, on the negative side, to avoid, reject, spew out other things. One need not have any idea of what one is valuing in order to value it. Hence, they are less sophisticated than desires, which have propositional content (an end in view) and arise from practical reflection (TV 207). In the first instance, valuings denote impulses toward or away from objects, as when an infant turns toward human voices, or swats away a fly. Valuings of objects as useful can also be immediate — that is, not mediated by cognition or awareness of what one is doing. One uses a fork to pick up food, without thinking about it. Habits, then, are also a species of valuing.

Dewey contrasted valuings, which are mostly behavioral, from the philosophical idea of a pleasure or enjoyment, understood as an isolated and passive experience. Dewey criticized that idea as arising from philosophical demands not grounded in experience (LJP 40–1). In reality, when we enjoy something, as when we savor an ice cream cone, we are actively engaged with it: we roll the ice cream around on our tongues, chew the cone, taking note of its texture and flavor, explore it on all sides. These activities, not just passive experiences, are part of the pleasure of eating an ice cream cone.

Valuings may be expressed in ejaculations. A child may jump up and down, saying “ goody! ” at an ice cream cone. As a spontaneous and uncalculated ejaculation, “ goody ” does not express a value judgment. The child may say the same thing with self-awareness, as if to say “I like ice cream.” Such a subjective report of a valuing still does not express a value judgment.

Value judgments arise when valuings are subjected to evaluation or appraisal, when one asks the question whether (one ought) to value (seek, cherish, consume, etc.) something (TV 208–9; VORC 84–6).

Thus, value judgments are practical judgments. Although they may have a descriptive form (“x is good,” “x is right”), the constitutive point of making them is to alter or guide our valuings. The need to question our valuings arises when immediate action on them is not possible or yields unsatisfactory consequences. There is no more ice cream in the refrigerator; is it worthwhile to go to the store to buy some more? Or, the lactose-intolerant person may observe that she gets a stomach ache after eating ice cream, and discover that ice cream is the cause. Should she just give up ice cream, can she take something that avoids the symptoms, or are there lactose-free substitutes? Having sketched out some alternative solutions to her predicament, she imaginatively fills out the details of acting on them, including their projected consequences (Do the pills have side effects? Does the lactose-free ice cream taste good?). The consequences are the objects of valuings, which guide the formation of a new end-in-view, a new valuing — say, to go for lactose-free ice cream, because taking pills would be bothersome, and the lactose-free ice cream tastes just as good. The comparative value judgment (“eating lactose-free ice cream is better than taking pills with regular ice cream, or eating regular ice cream alone”) is practical because its function is to guide conduct toward the best solution to the person’s problem.

Thus, value judgments or appraisals result in new valuings. This fact has two implications, one for the nature of valuing, the other for the assessment of value judgments. First, when valuings change in response to value judgments, they become desires, interests, or tastes. Second, because the function of value judgments is to constitute new valuings that solve the individual’s predicament, they can be assessed instrumentally, in terms of how well they perform that function.

2.2 Desires, Interests, and Tastes.

In the ice cream case just described, the lactose-intolerant person was initially consuming ice cream out of impulse or habit, without thinking about it. Her conduct was caused by unreflective valuings. (In reality, Dewey stressed, hardly any of the valuings of adults are wholly primitive, as the valuings of infants are. So the illustration is only of a relatively unreflective valuing, one that incorporates a relatively low level of understanding of the consequences of acting on it.) When she became aware of the fact that her consumption of ice cream was causing a problem, she investigated the problem, articulating its contours, with the aim of solving it, of finding some alternative that would “work,” in the sense of enabling the satisfactory resumption of activity. “Working” need not mean finding an alternative means to resuming the same valued activity. Her activity has changed: now she aims to consume lactose-free ice cream. Her valuation activity has changed both in the object toward which it is directed, and in its cognitive character: it embodies an articulate understanding of what she is going after, which reflects her appraisals of its merits.

The result of such appraisal is the adoption of an end-in-view, the institution of a desire. Dewey’s term “desire” is closer to our “intention” or “purpose” or even “plan” (TV 238) in denoting a tendency toward action that the agent has adopted, rather than simply a motive clamoring for our attention or moving us behind our backs. Desire denotes a reflective, conscious valuing, not a mere “affective-motor” attitude, but an “affective-ideational-motor activity,” a “union of prizing and appraising” (TV 218). It is a cognitive state. As the individual engages this new valuation, she experiences the consequences of acting on it. Reflection upon these consequences is then incorporated into more intelligent valuations, by way of further appraisals. The result of criticism is the refinement of taste — that is, a “rational liking” (VEK 15), a “liking for a reason” (VORC 95). The novice and the connoisseur may both value (like) the same object. But the latter has a reflective and articulate grasp of the features of the object that are liked, plus enough experience with valuations of objects of that type to have warranted confidence that these features merit liking. That is, the connoisseur has enough experience to warrant confidence that there are not further features of the object or consequences of valuing it which, once appreciated, would reverse or detract from the liking. Desires (ends-in-view) do not exist in isolation from each other. We reflect on the consequences of attempting to jointly satisfy our desires. Appraisals of such consequences serve to modify desires so that they are coordinated with one another. Dewey called such systematically coordinated desires “interests” (TV 207).

2.3 Value Judgments as Instruments

Dewey characterized value judgments as instrumental in three senses that he did not explicitly distinguish. The first we may call the constitutive function of value judgments. The point of appraisal, of making a value judgment, is to bring about the resumption of unified activity, when the normal course of activity has been interrupted by a problematic situation (TV 221–2). This situation incites hesitation and doubt about what to do. Dewey’s point is that value judgments are essentially practical judgments. They aim to guide action, not just to passively describe things as they are. Making the judgment is the necessary means to deciding on a new course of action that will solve the problem (LJP 14–16).

Second, the content of value judgments is about the value of actions and objects as means — that is, their value in relation to their consequences, or the consequences of valuing them in the situation at hand. Value judgments have the form: if one acted in a particular way (or valued this object), then certain consequences would ensue, which would be valued (VEK 11). The difference between an apparent and a real good, between an unreflectively and a reflectively valued good, is captured by its value not just as immediately experienced in isolation, but in view of its wider consequences and how they are valued. The ice cream seems good to the lactose-intolerant person; it is immediately prized by her. But it is judged to be not really good in view of the intolerable consequence of consuming it. Value judgments place things in their wider context and judge them in relation to their consequences, more fully considered (TV 209–213).

Third, while the proximate and constitutive end of a value judgment is the resumption of activity that has been interrupted by a problematic situation, judgment has a remoter end, of using the action decided upon as a means for uncovering new evidence about what to value. Intelligently made value judgments are held provisionally and hypothetically, with an eye toward revising them if the consequences of acting on them are not found valuable. So viewed, value judgments are tools for discovering how to live a better life, just as scientific hypotheses are tools for uncovering new information about the world (VEK 19–26; VORC 88–9).

2.4 Experimental Confirmation of Value Judgments

Dewey’s pragmatist moral epistemology follows from his instrumental account of value judgments. It is uncontroversial that instrumental judgments are subject to empirical testing and confirmation, since they involve empirical claims about causation. We test scientific hypotheses by bringing about their antecedents and seeing if the results are as they predicted. Similarly, we test value judgments by acting on them and seeing if we value the consequences in the way the judgment predicted. Acting on our value judgments — putting them into practice — supplies the data for confirming or disconfirming them. Roughly speaking, a value judgment hypothesizes “try it, you’ll like it” — a statement easily subject to empirical verification and refutation. Intelligent value judgments proceed not by random trial-and-error, but from skilled projection of prior confirmed “try-like” regularities to analogous novel situations, which are continuously modified in light of experiences of the wider consequences of trying in these new situations.

Dewey derived several unsettling implications for traditional morality and traditional philosophical ethics from his moral epistemology. Traditional or conventional morality tries to enforce unquestioning obedience to its precepts. Dewey argued that this was a formula for perpetual immaturity, because it cut off all possibility of learning better ways to live by experimenting with them. Pragmatist moral epistemology also rejects philosophy’s a priori, dialectical methods for determining the good and the right. One cannot prove that something is valuable by mere argument. Arguments, at best, make certain value judgments plausible as hypotheses — and even then, only if grounded in experience and reflection on the wider consequences of acting on them. Ultimately, the hypotheses must be tested, by seeing how one values the actual results of putting them into practice. It follows that the dogmatism of traditional philosophical ethics is folly. It hobbles progress in life. Even the best confirmed value judgments can hold only provisionally. Circumstances change, thereby modifying the consequences of acting on particular evaluations. Change requires us to revisit our original appraisals with an eye toward modifying them in light of these new consequences (RP). Moreover, we don’t know the consequences of trials not performed. It is therefore always possible that we are missing out on better modes of conduct that we haven’t tested, or even imagined (VEK 25–6).

2.5 Contextualism

Dewey’s moral epistemology is contextualist. The form of a contextual standard of value is: it solves the problem encountered in this situation (better than other imagined or tested solutions). A person may articulate the problematic features of her situation in various ways: as obstacles, confusions, conflicts, unmet needs, dangers, and so on. The test of a value judgment — whether it “works” — is whether it successfully identifies an action that overcomes the obstacles, clears up the confusions, resolves the conflicts, satisfies the needs, avoids or eliminates the dangers, and so on. The standard of success for value judgments is thus developed internally to the practices at hand, relative to people’s descriptions of their problems (HNC 199, 208; RP 173–4). Of course, hypothesized solutions may fail in practice. This may lead agents to revise their understandings of their problems, rather than just trying alternative solutions to the same problems. For example, the failure of a course of therapy may lead a doctor to reconsider the original diagnosis. The problematic features of situations are not given. Identification of the problem begins in often inchoate experiences of doubt, confusion, apprehension, frustration, distress, anger, conflict, and so forth, which call for articulate diagnosis. Such diagnoses or descriptions of problems are open to further refinement and even radical revision in light of experimental testing in tandem with proposed solutions.

In upholding contextualism, Dewey rejected the idea that standards of correctness for valuing could be devised external to practice. He rejected any conception of intrinsic value as some kind of existence or property that has value in itself, regardless of context, which is the object of practice to bring about, realize, or conform to. Asserting the existence of such values tears the practice of making value judgments out of the contexts that give them meaning and point. This does not mean that one cannot make meaningful general value judgments. Some problems and solutions are of a generalized sort, encountered in many situations that vary widely in their details. Abstract, general value judgments may therefore be useful in a wide range of situations. But this does not mean that they point to values that exist outside of practice (TV 230).

3. Means and Ends

The standard objection to Dewey’s instrumental theory of value judgments is that it concerns the value of things as means only, and not as ends. It fails to fix on what is ultimately important: intrinsic values or final ends. Some ultimate end outside of practice must be postulated as given, as the standard against which the value of acts as means can be judged, lest we fall into an infinite regress. We either need some conception of a summum bonum, justified apart from practical reasoning, toward which acts must aim, or Dewey’s theory reduces to a form of Humean instrumentalism, in which ends are given by our desires or immediate likings, and the only question is how to satisfy them.

Dewey’s reply to this objection goes to the heart of his moral philosophy. He argued that the character and value of means and ends was reciprocally determined. We do not first already have an end in view, with the only question how to achieve it. We lack a complete conception of our end until we have a complete grasp of the course of action that will take us there. Moreover, a judgment of the value of ends apart from the means needed to get there, and apart from the value of ends as means — as things that have consequences of their own — cannot provide the basis for rational action. Acting on such radically truncated judgments would be crazy. Our judgments of the worth of an end are inextricably tied up with our judgments of the costs of achieving it, both in terms of the means needed to get there and the unintended consequences of getting there. Practical judgment is creative: it institutes new ends-in-view. It is transformative: appraisals affect our immediate valuings of things.

3.1 Reciprocal Determination of Means and Ends

The occasion for making value judgments is a problematic situation, in which one’s activity is blocked and one does not know what to do. At first, the problem is experienced as uneasiness and hesitation. Reflection is needed to articulate what experience signals as a problem. A complete description of the problem to be solved is simultaneously the articulation of a complete solution, a unified course of action identifying a series of steps (means) resulting in an end, which the judger predicts will be found valuable as a complete package. A person is walking to a lake but stops upon reaching a deep ditch. She entertains possible courses of action, which are simultaneously preliminary descriptions of problems and solutions. (“I need to jump across”; “I need to build a bridge”). These incomplete descriptions prompt the gathering of new data to articulate them further (“Can I jump that far?” “Is there a log around?”). A complete investigation yields a joint description of the problem and its solution (“I need to drag this log across here, the narrowest part of the ditch, and walk across.”) (HWT 200–6).

The value of the end depends on the costs and benefits of the means, and the costs and benefits of the further consequences to which the end is judged as a means or cause. In the preceding example, it might appear that a certain final end — getting to the lake — is governing deliberation. But this is so only provisionally. A full inquiry into the means needed to achieve the end may lead to a re-evaluation of the end itself. (“The only log able to bridge the ditch is narrow at the end; I have bad balance; I would be seriously injured if I fell off the log. Getting to the lake isn’t so attractive after all ….”). Furthermore, reaching the end has anticipated consequences of its own (“That bear on the other side of the ditch looks hungry….”) that may modify the valuation of the end (“It’s better if I stay on this side.”). It is irrational to take one’s end as fixed before investigating the costs of the means and the consequences of achieving the end (TV 214). Thus, the standard model of instrumental reasoning, which takes ends as fixed and inquires solely into the means needed to satisfy them, is inadequate. The point of inquiring into means, and into ends considered as means or causes of further consequences, is not merely to determine how to achieve an end, but to appraise the value of the end itself (TV 210–19; VEK 4–7).

3.2 Practical Judgment is Creative

The preceding considerations show that practical judgment is creative: it institutes new ends-in-view, new desires. Against Dewey’s claim of creativity, it might be objected that Dewey’s theory of practical reasoning still presupposes certain values. In the ditch case, the original end would not have been rejected but for the agent’s fear of injury. Dewey agrees that “judgment at some point runs against the brute act of holding something dear as its limit” (LJP 46). Without some prizings that are not themselves subject to appraisal at the time of deliberation, there is nothing to guide practical reasoning. Yet these very prizings may be subject to appraisal at some other time, perhaps even as a consequence of acting on them on this occasion.

One might still object that this is not enough to show that practical judgment is genuinely creative. Perhaps it just takes given prizings and determines the end through some kind of vector addition, taking their weights as given. If a man is out to buy a suit, for instance, he approaches the problem with a given set of habitual priorities — for example, that durability and cheapness are more important than style. The man’s choice of suit thus merely reflects the weights of the man’s already given priorities. But if this were all there was to choice, then deliberation would hardly be necessary. He would simply inspect the prized qualities of the available suits, and let impulse determine his choice from there. In fact, Dewey argued, deliberation assigns weights to different prized qualities in the context of choice, rather than taking them as given. We can’t really tell how much weight to put on this or that prized quality until we see it instantiated in combination with the other qualities in the set of alternatives, and consider further how the suit with its qualities will function as a means in the future. Although the man may be used to prizing durability in a cheap suit, and placing little weight on style, this suit is to be used for job interviews, which are expected to land him a much higher paying job. This use of the suit gives him several reasons to alter the habitual weights he assigns to suit qualities. Anticipating that he will soon come to prize style more, once he is able to afford it, he may decide to borrow against the future and go for the expensive stylish suit now, so that he will still prize it after he lands the job. Or he may decide that he needs to make an especially good impression in order to land the job, so that he must weight style more heavily than cheapness now. Or he may decide that he’ll only need to use this suit once, to get a job, and after that his tastes will change commensurately with his income, but in ways he can’t know ahead of time. Hence, he should not count durability as an important value here. Evaluation remains creative even granting that it presupposes certain prizings, because it is still up to us to assign weights to prized qualities in light of the novel features of the context. Prior weightings cannot determine current ones, since the former may be maladapted to the new situation (LJP 30–5; VEK 10–20).

3.3 Practical Judgment is Transformative

Practical reasoning does not merely generate new appraisals; it transforms our prizings. This is the point of Dewey’s theory of criticism and taste. Judgments of the merits of prizings feed back onto our primitive prizings and transform them. They not only make these prizings more articulate (a union of prizing and appraising); in making us more vividly aware of the features of the object that we prize, they alter the directions of our prizings (VEK 4–9). As a result of deliberation, the man who needs the suit comes to prize style, say, more than he did before, and cheapness less. Nor is this possibility of transformation limited to what are conventionally understood to be “instrumental” values. Whether a quality such as style is “intrinsic” or “instrumental” is not built into the nature of the quality itself, but a function of how it is regarded by the individual at the time. Instruments may be prized in themselves (as when we admire a particularly finely balanced tool). More importantly, stylishness may immediately attract — be immediately prized — but it also has its uses in impressing some prospective employers, and its unintended consequence of turning off others (who may think it important in an employee not to show off).

3.4 Practical Judgment and Character

Against Dewey’s instrumental theory of value judgments, one might object that sometimes we appraise valuings as intrinsically good or bad. We might judge that prizing another’s suffering is despicable, apart from its consequences. Dewey rejected the sharp distinction between character and action, motive and consequence, that this picture presupposes. A character trait is a tendency to pursue certain ends, and so must be appraised in terms of its typical (intended) results. Thus, we condemn schadenfreude primarily because it leads to cruelty. At the same time, conduct has among its consequences a tendency to reinforce the character traits that caused them, or to consolidate into a character trait its direction of impulse. Conduct constitutes the moral self. So, we properly condemn a single manifestation of schadenfreude — say, laughing at suffering caused by a natural disaster — even if it, in itself, did nothing to increase anyone’s suffering. This is the truth that moralities of intention grasp, which narrowly consequentialist theories do not (E 173–5, 286–9).

One who holds that evil attitudes can be bad in themselves, apart from their consequences, would want to say more than this. Dewey can say more, too. He would agree that we do not value attitudes only instrumentally. We immediately prize some attitudes and despise others, in the sense that we directly prize and despise them without first appraising them instrumentally. A sympathetic person immediately hates expressions of schadenfreude without first checking whether they actually caused anyone to suffer. Such valuings can themselves be subject to appraisal. If we endorse them upon reflection on their consequences, we judge that they are merited (see the section on Virtue Theories below). Among the most important consequences of such second-order valuings are their impact on our characters: they tend to reinforce the attitudes that are prized, and make us recoil from the attitudes that are despised, leading us to seek means to change those attitudes. Dewey denies that there is any sensible way to appraise character traits apart from their typical consequences. So there is no getting away from consequences altogether. However, his theory has the resources to (a) condemn particular manifestations of bad attitudes, even when they do not have their typically bad direct consequences, (b) immediately (“intrinsically”) despise them, (c) judge that such immediate condemnations are warranted, and thereby (d) constitute new, reflective and cognitively loaded affective-ideational-motor attitudes of condemnation. His theory can make parallel claims for prizings and appraisals of good attitudes.

Thus, we begin with immediate valuings or prizings of things. Such prizings have no cognitive content. When we ask whether something ought to be valued, we enter the domain of appraisal or value judgments. To appraise something is to judge it in relation to the means required to attain it, and as a means or cause of further consequences. Appraisal, then, is fundamentally about means. However, such appraisals transform our original prizings. If we discover that the cost of attaining something prized is too high, we prize it less (reduce or eliminate our tendency to go after it). If we discover that attaining it has further, disvalued, consequences, we also prize it less. If attaining it has further, prized consequences, or if the means to attain it are themselves prized, we value it even more. Now the valuing has cognitive content, and is articulately directed to that content. Now we value or disvalue something under a description (the ice cream as cause of stomach ailment, the suit as stylish and impressive to prospective employers, the schadenfreude as despicable). The appraisal of things as means feeds back into our prizing of things as ends.

4. Moral Theories: the Good, the Right, the Virtuous

Traditional normative moral theories generally fall into three types. Teleological theories seek to identify some supreme end or best way of life, and reduce the right and the virtuous to the promotion of this good. Deontological theories seek to identify a supreme principle or laws of morality independent of the good, and subordinate the pursuit of the good to conformity with the moral law. Virtue theories take phenomena of approval and disapproval to be fundamental, and derive the right and the good from them. Dewey declined to offer substantive answers to the traditional questions posed by these theories, arguing that no fixed ends or moral rules could be adequate in a world of constant change and plural and conflicting values. In place of fixed goals and rules of action, Dewey offered his method of experimental inquiry, which he argued was shared between theoretical and practical reason (RP 174). He drew insight from traditional moral theories by recasting their substantive answers to traditional moral questions in methodological terms.

Dewey also rejected the reductionist tendencies of these theories, arguing that each drew from an independent source of evidence about what one ought to do. Teleological theories draw from the efforts of the individual agent to distinguish the real from the apparent good, and to harmonize conflicting impulses by subsuming them under a comprehensive conception of the good. Deontological theories draw from the efforts of groups of people to harmonize and adjudicate the conflicting claims they make on one another by means of impartial laws. Virtue theories draw from the praise and blame people accord to each others’ conduct. Resisting the tendency of philosophical ethics to represent the grounds of these theories in metaphysical terms, Dewey insisted that the sources of evidence for these three types of theory were empirical. Teleological theories are based on the reflective desires of the individual; deontological theories on the socially authorized demands of interested others; virtue theories on the spontaneous tendencies of observers to approve and disapprove of people’s conduct. These sources of evidence for different sorts of moral claims are independent from the others. None carries automatic or conclusive authority. Hence, the tension among the three types of moral consideration is permanent and cannot be resolved by reducing one to another or insisting that one automatically overrides the others (TIF). Resolution of conflicts among these considerations depends on the context in which they arise.

4.1 Theories of the Good (Teleological Theories)

We have already seen that Dewey casts the distinction between the apparent and the real good in terms of what is valued immediately in impulse and unreflective habit, and what is valued reflectively as an object of intelligent desire. Dewey insisted on the primacy of the reflective method of inquiry over settling on fixed answers to questions about the good. This can be seen in his critiques and methodological reinterpretations of the three types of theory of goodness dominant today: hedonism, ideal (objective list) theories, and informed desire theory.

Hedonism supposes that the value of acts can be reduced to the quantity of pleasure and pain they produce. Estimating such values requires that we be able to break down the pleasures and pains of different activities and experiences into simple identical units, and then sum them up again. This theoretical demand outruns the holistic and complex character of our experiences of pleasure and pain (LJP 40–1). Pleasures and pains in reflective individuals are inextricably bound up with what Dewey called “ideational” factors — that is, with articulate conceptions of what they are taking pleasure in. They are therefore not pure sensory units but already contain elements of judgment or appraisal. Critical among these are considerations of the consequences of prizing certain things for one’s own moral character. Since we form our character by cultivating habits of valuing some things over others, and we prize and appraise character itself, we cannot simply take current pleasures as given (E 193–4; LJP 41–2). Good and bad people take pleasure in different things. Such facts can give us reason to cultivate different tastes from those we currently have.

Although hedonism fails as a theory that gives us a fixed end, it does contain a methodological insight. Nothing is good that cannot be desired. All desire contains an element of enjoyment or liking. Hence, pleasure can be seen as a sign of the good, as evidence of what is valuable. Nevertheless, what makes desire a sound guide to the good is the fact that it incorporates foresight and reflection on the wider consequences of acting on it, not just that it incorporates a liking of its object (E 195–6).

Ideal or objective list theories attempt to harmonize conflicting desires not, as hedonism does, by reducing them all to a common denominator, but by systematically fitting them together into an ideal or plan of life. Dewey argued that people construct ideals that make sense in view of their particular social circumstances. For example, ideals of material or political advancement make sense of the strivings of business people and politicians. Such ideals have, at best, only contextual validity and cannot be prescribed as fixed ends for all people. There can no more be a single best way of life than there can be an ideal house for all times and places. To suppose that there is forecloses the possibility of imagination inventing something even better. Yet, ideals serve a highly important function for individuals, if they are considered as hypotheses about how one should live that one can test in experiences of living in accordance with them. So understood, ideals are tools for discovering evidence about the good (LE 59–68, 229–30; E 185, 189–91, 202–210).

Informed desire theories of the good, which define the good in terms of what an individual would desire if fully informed, come closest to Dewey’s own account. Dewey spoke of the good as the object of desires of which we approve in calm, informed reflection (E 208, 212). Yet Dewey’s aims differ from that of most of today’s informed desire theorists. The latter tend to accept as fixed the character of the individual whose good is being judged, and alter only the individual’s cognitive capacities and beliefs so as to read off the good for the individual from what his cognitively enhanced self wants. This commits the same error that Dewey charged against hedonism, of omitting critical appraisal of one’s own character as an important factor in determining what one ought to desire. In identifying the good with the objects of approved desires, Dewey highlighted the importance of character to identifying the good. Before we can endorse a desire, we need to ask whether we, or an impartial observer, could approve of someone who had it (E 239–47). The good is what good people — those possessing foresight and wide sympathies — desire. Dewey also resisted the conversion of a method of inquiry into a fixed criterion of value. There is never an end to inquiry — no such thing as complete information — because circumstances are always changing and imagination constructs new possibilities for living (E 213). Nor does the projection of desires we would have if we reached an end to inquiry offer a recognizable vision of human life. Fully informed people do not desire more information. But education, inquiry, and individual development in light of new discoveries are constitutive goods of human life. The desire to skip to the end to see what is ultimately valuable is a desire to skip human life, as if the process of learning through living were merely a means and not prized in itself (HNC 194–202). What, in light of inquiry, we reflectively desire, and approve of desiring, is evidence of what is good. But it is always defeasible in light of further inquiry.

4.2 Theories of Right (Deontological Theories)

Pragmatism in ethics is often regarded as a form of teleology or consequentialism. Yet Dewey rejected accounts of the right that defined it in terms of promoting the good (E 214–216). The concept of the right contains an element not contained in the good — namely, that of an authoritative demand. The phenomenology of claims of good and right are also distinct: the good attracts or appeals, whereas claims of right appear to command authority. The demands of the right often conflict with individual desire, since they arise from the conflicting, socially authorized claims of other people. The right arises from the need to harmonize the claims of people with distinct interests and conceptions of the good by means of reasonable principles that all can accept. Thus, although claims of right are grounded in people’s interests in gaining the assistance and cooperation of others, and in protection against others’ encroachments, the right cannot be defined in terms of promoting the good of any individual. Nor can it be defined in terms of promoting some independent conception of the good of society as a whole, since any such conception must already persuade the individual that it accords a reasonable place for her own claims, and thus already incorporate a notion of right (E 215–7; TIF 284–5).

The deontological thought that the right is independent of the good reflects the reality that the claims of others, even when reasonable and authoritative, do not automatically harmonize with the desires of the individual upon whom the claims are made. However, Dewey rejected the further deontological claim that there is a sharp distinction between the moral and nonmoral good, where the former is identified with conformity to the right, and the latter with satisfying individual desires. After all, claims of right are designed to protect and advance the interests of individuals that are considered important enough to warrant social support. Moreover, they are constitutive features of social relationships that people find good. The authority of these claims draws on the appeal of these relationships and on the motives of love, respect, and loyalty cultivated within them (E 218–219).

Deontological theories tend to identify the right either with fixed laws or rules of conduct, such as the Ten Commandments, or with a single supreme principle of morality, such as the Categorical Imperative, understood as supplying a decision procedure in ethics. The attempt to specify substantive rules of right conduct for all cases founders on the need to make exceptions for different circumstances. “Thou shalt not kill” cannot be taken at face value, given the justifiability of killing in self-defense. Yet it is impossible to specify in advance all of the circumstances that could justify killing even in self-defense, given the complications that arise in, say, defensive warfare (e.g., problems of collateral damage). As social conditions change — for example, the technology and tactics of warfare, and our ability to affect the interests of distant others — rules of conduct that had been accepted in the past must be subject to revision, lest learning cease and people remain mired in dysfunctional habits (E 275–9). A method of moral inquiry is needed that can revise given rules, laws, and habits in light of new problems and circumstances. This method would take current and past customs and laws as starting points for moral theory, in conjunction with the history and anthropology of custom, the history of systematic theoretical reflection on morality, and the social sciences, which inform us of the nature of current problems, and the probable consequences of attempting to institute this or that new law or custom (E 178–9). Intelligent moral inquiry, while it begins with current customs and convictions about the right, treats them as hypotheses to be tested in experience.

The attempt to identify a decision procedure for the right independent of considerations of the consequences of following certain principles is also bound to fail. Dewey endorsed the “empty formalism” critique of Kant’s Categorical Imperative, insofar as it aspires to reach moral conclusions without presupposing anything to be good. Yet, reinterpreted as tools of moral inquiry, as standpoints from which to identify and analyze morally relevant considerations, principles such as the Golden Rule and the Categorical imperative offer sound advice: they are designed to ensure that the interests of all have been fairly considered in formulating concrete principles of conduct proposed as general laws or customs to be generally enforced (E 223–5, 280–3).

4.3 Virtue Theories

Virtue theories take approval and disapproval, praise and blame, as the fundamental bases for morality. Customary morality relies heavily on acts of praise and blame to perpetuate itself. Critical reflection seeks a standard by which people’s approvals and disapprovals can be appraised. Dewey argued that the British utilitarians carried this inquiry most deeply with their ideal observer theory of morality, which identified the standard with that by which an informed impartial and benevolent observer appraises conduct — namely, its tendency to promote everyone’s welfare. But, given that the content of people’s welfare is not fixed, but open to imaginative expansion, this standard can no more be applied in algorithmic fashion than moral principles can be. Like moral principles, the utilitarian standard of approval sets up a general standpoint for the appraisal of conduct, and revision of ends in light of such appraisal, rather than a fixed criterion that can be mechanically applied (E 237–47).

Dewey argued that praise and blame function to make individuals conscious of and responsive to the wider consequences of their actions for others. This forward-looking view of praise and blame enabled Dewey to avoid the problem of free will in its connection with responsibility. Praise and blame are tools for enabling people to assume responsibility for their conduct — to enable them to regulate their conduct in view of their consequences for others. Hence, the presupposition of praise and blame is not that the individual held to account could have done otherwise at the time of acting. It is rather that praise and blame can induce people to be more conscientious — to govern their conduct in light of the responsibilities ascribed to them, to act out of a sense of their own responsibility, and thereby to take notice and mastery of the motives by which they act — in the future. This fact is most evident in our practices of praising and blaming children. Young children are not autonomous agents and lack free will in any sense relevant to the debates about responsibility. They are not responsible for their conduct. Yet, in praising and blaming them, we hold them responsible for their conduct, as the necessary means by which they can become responsible for their conduct in the future. This is not a special or anomalous use of praise or blame; it is its paradigmatic use (HNC 119–22; LE 86–96).

4.4 Reflective Morality

Dewey’s accounts of the main types of moral theory fit neatly into his experimentalist account of practical reasoning and value judgments. Individuals begin their lives as human societies did historically: acting on impulse and custom. These modes of conduct, being unselfconscious and shortsighted, cannot handle all the challenges life poses, and generate problems of their own. Thus arises the need for reflective appraisal of conduct in view of its wider consequences, with the aim of controlling future conduct by means of these appraisals, so as to solve the problems at hand. This practical reasoning uses the same general experimental method as theoretical reasoning does. We begin with certain given facts: these are our immediate valuings of things by impulse and habit. The data for appraisal of these valuings come from the consequences of acting on them, along with the ways we value these consequences. The three types of moral theory identify three sources of evidence that bear on our current valuings: our desires (which by definition are informed), the claims or demands of other people, and their approvals and disapprovals of our conduct. Traditional philosophical ethics tries to erect these sources of evidence into transcendent, authoritative criteria, typically by means of certain idealizing moves (such as universalization and full information). Dewey argued that the supposedly external, transcendent criteria for appraising conduct — ideals of the good, principles of right, standards of approval and disapproval — should rather be treated as hypotheses, as tools for uncovering additional data needed to appraise our valuings. They provide us with standpoints by which we can make ourselves aware of a wider set of consequences of our conduct. Ideals of the good enable us to take up the standpoint of the prudent and foresighted individual, concerned to harmonize current desires with one another and with the self’s future needs and interests. Principles of right enable us to take up the standpoint of others who make claims on us in light of the impact of our conduct on their interests. Standards of approval enable us to take up the standpoint of observers, who approve and disapprove of our conduct not just for its consequences but on account of its underlying motives as well. Thus, these norms enable us to survey the consequences of our conduct from a first personal, second personal, and third personal point of view, respectively, and to shape new ends (desires) accordingly. But no actual ideal, principle, or standard exhaustively captures each point of view, since each is subject to further development with further extensions of information, imagination, and sympathy. They can only be accepted tentatively, as hypotheses to be tested by acting on them and seeing what further data they elicit. Some of this data — new regrets, new complaints, new disapprovals — will disconfirm our hypotheses and provide grounds for revising our ideals, principles, and standards. (This is not to suggest that the import of the data themselves should be taken at face value. Some regrets simply reflect the resistance of old dysfunctional habits; some complaints are unreasonable; some disapprovals reflect hidebound and dogmatic dispositions. But these hypotheses, too, can be tested.) History and the social sciences provide us with additional data on the customs and laws by which people have dealt with the problems that have arisen in their circumstances, and general knowledge of human psychology and social interactions that enable us to learn from the experiences of others and formulate educated guesses — new hypotheses — for how we might solve our problems.

Dewey stressed several themes in developing his account of reflective morality for the present day: change, pluralism, conflict, and anti-authoritarianism. Living in an era of unprecedented social change, Dewey situated reflective morality in a non-teleological Darwinian view of organisms’ adaptation to environmental contingencies (IDP). Nature does not supply a telos or rule for human beings, but rather a constantly changing environment to which humans need to adjust by using their intelligence. Modern science and education lead people to doubt old traditions and arrive at different beliefs by empowering them to think for themselves. Immigration brings people of different faiths and cultures together, with a need to devise shared moral norms to regulate their interactions. Interpersonal conflict along lines of class, religion, race, and other socially salient divisions generates demands for new norms to resolve disputes. All of these factors undermine appeals to traditional norms, which are not adapted to changed circumstances, presuppose a consensus that does not exist, and suppress rather than address interpersonal conflict. Nor is resort to traditional authorities any solution. People don’t agree on their authority. Moreover, authority itself corrupts people’s moral views:

It is difficult for a person in a place of authoritative power to avoid supposing that what he wants is right as long as he has power to enforce his demand. And even with the best will in the world, he is likely to be isolated from the real needs of others, and the perils of ignorance are added to those of selfishness. (E 226)

Moral insights come from the demands of others, not from any individual’s isolated reflections. And insights come from all social quarters. Intelligent revision of norms therefore requires practices of moral inquiry that stress mutual responsiveness to others’ claims, and social inclusion of all members of society. Such practices are constitutive features of democracy, understood as a form of everyday life (not simply as a type of state constitution) (CD 224–230). This is the point at which Dewey’s political philosophy emerges from his ethics. Democracy, in Dewey’s view, is the means by which we practice intelligent moral inquiry together, seeking solutions to the problems we face together (PP).

5. Aesthetic Value

Dewey’s identification of intelligent reflection with experimental methods might be thought to suggest a narrowly scientistic worldview, in which values are reduced to purely subjective, arational “oughts” or likings applied to inherently value-free facts or natural kinds discovered and defined independently of human valuations. In fact, Dewey’s project aims to unify scientific with humanistic inquiry rather than to enforce divisions between the two. While intelligent humanistic inquiry partakes of experimental method, scientific inquiry itself is an art (EN 285–6). The categories in terms of which we make intelligent sense of the world are not limited to those which are useful solely for describing objects of abstract, generalized knowledge divorced from feelings and aspirations. Feelings and aspirations are themselves part of the natural world and hence proper subjects of experimental investigation (EN 316). The job of art is to create objects that enhance our capacities for meaningful, appreciative experience. Criticism in turn aims to develop meaningful categories that inform enriched experiences of objects. “Nothing but the best, the richest and fullest experience possible, is good enough for man” (EN 308).

For experiences to be capable of such enrichment, they must be able to incorporate intelligent appraisals, just as desires and actions do. To the extent that such incorporation is attentive to the features of the object along with their import, so as to produce a unified, free, emotionally engaged, satisfying, appreciative experience of the object, the experience realizes aesthetic value (AE 42–3, 47). Such appreciative perception of the object incorporates knowledge of causes and effects. “[T]here enter[s] into the [epicure’s] taste, as directly experienced, qualities that depend upon reference to its source and its manner of production in connection with criteria of excellence” (AE 55). The listener informed by music theory learns to hear, and thereby take pleasure in, different types of modulation from one key to another, and is thereby primed for certain musical expectations, creating alternating tensions, fulfillments, and surprises as the musical performance unfolds. Similar claims can be made for all of the arts, whether they be “fine” or “practical.”

The job of the critic is not to pass judgment on the object as a judge issues a decision on the basis of precedent, but rather to point out meaningful features in the object in ways that enhance observers’ experience of it (AE 302–4). Nor should aesthetic appraisal of artworks simply consist in applications of prior aesthetic standards to currently perceived works of art. Recall that value judgments are instruments that, while they may have been found useful in past cases, may fail to successfully guide current conduct. To the extent that a work of art is capable of evoking novel appreciative experiences, the application of established standards of aesthetic value to the work may close off such novelty and reduce the experience of it to a stereotyped, boring recapitulation of past experiences (if the artwork happens to meet the old standard), or, worse (if it fails to meet the old standard) provoke a stunted reaction of offense or disapproval. In such cases the aesthetic judgment would have failed to do its job, which is to enhance perception by drawing the observer’s attention to features of the object, and of relations among the object, its creator, and observers, that are understood as meaningful and thereby excite feeling (AE 303). Criticism renders the aesthetic value of an artwork objective to the extent that it succeeds in evoking common appreciative experiences among many observers by drawing their attention to the same features and relations of the artwork (AE 312–3).

On Dewey’s expansive understanding of the aesthetic dimension of experience, aesthetic value is not possessed by works of art alone, but can also be possessed by tools and other instruments (EN 283). In the course of repairing a shelf, one might use a hammer and feel its heft and balance to be splendidly proportioned for the task, feel the handle to be molded in a way that perfectly fits one’s hand, perceive its materials to have been selected with attention to their fitness for driving nails, and so forth. Such intelligent appreciation of the hammer in one’s direct experience of it amounts to an aesthetic valuation of it, insofar as the experience itself is savored and one’s perceptive faculties are not merely identifying instrumentally valuable features of the hammer for future reference but actively engaged in appreciating the aptness of its design and materials. The repair job, too, can have aesthetic value to the extent that one experiences it as a unified, smoothly unfolding process, beginning with an astute assessment of the required operations, leading to the skilled, fluid, unfrustrated execution of these operations, and ending with what is appraised and prized as a successful conclusion--the object experienced as satisfactorily repaired. When the experience of this process as aptly unifying means and ends absorbs one’s appreciative attention, either as actor or as observer, it has aesthetic value.

On this account, the work process itself can have aesthetic value. Dewey’s aesthetic theory thus provides the basis for understanding his critique of work as it exists in societies sharply divided by class. In such societies, the processes of work are reduced to merely mechanical operations assigned to a servile class, and divorced from consummatory experiences of the propertied, leisure class that enjoys the products of others’ labor. Class division, by divorcing means from ends (production from consumption) and intelligent planning from physical operations, reduces physical labor to a tedious, mindless, meaningless mechanical exercise of habit, which thereby lacks aesthetic value in lacking unity and intelligent appreciation. The challenge of the modern day is to consider how work, and human activity generally, can be reformed so that it has aesthetic value and is thus no longer valued merely instrumentally (EN 277–8, 307–8).

6. Social Ethics

Consistently with his contextualism, Dewey stressed the social circumstances in which different moral theories arose. His and James Tufts’s Ethics begins, not with a review of rival moral theories, but with a survey of anthropology and a brief history of the moral problems and practices of the ancient Hebrews, Greeks, and Romans. By locating moral theories in their social contexts, Dewey exposed their limitations. Theories that make sense in certain contexts may not make sense in others. For example, Dewey argued that the failure of ancient Greek teleological theories to grasp the independence of the right from the good arose from the fact that the good for individual citizens of Greek city-states was inextricably wrapped up with participation in civic life and promotion of the good of the city-state as a whole (TIF 283).

Dewey, like Hegel, stressed the ways abstract philosophical doctrines are socially embodied. He frequently focused on the ways these doctrines rationalize and reinforce stultifying and unjust social arrangements. For example, the sharp dichotomy between purely instrumental and intrinsic goods both reflects and reinforces an organization of work life that reduces it to drudgery. Since work is of merely instrumental value, so the thinking goes, there is no point in trying to make it interesting to those who do it. The dichotomy also rationalizes oppressive class divisions. Insofar as the good life is conceived in terms of devotion to or enjoyment of purely intrinsic, noninstrumental goods (such as intellectual contemplation and the appreciation of beauty), it is a life that can be led only by a leisured class, whose members do not have to spend their time earning a living. This class depends upon a working class whose function is to provide them with the leisure they need to pursue the good life. Dewey’s critique of traditional ways of distinguishing means from ends is thus simultaneously a critique of class hierarchy (HNC 185–8, TV 235).

Dewey argued that the primary problems for ethics in the modern world concerned the ways society ought to be organized, rather than personal decisions of the individual (E 314–316). Thus, in contrast with his voluminous political commentaries, Dewey published very little on personal “applied ethics.” The rapid social changes that were taking place in his lifetime required new institutions, as traditional customs and laws proved themselves unable to cope with such issues as mass immigration, class conflict, the Great Depression, the demands of women for greater independence, racism, and the threats to democracy posed by fascism and communism. Dewey was a founding member of the NAACP and the ACLU. As a progressive liberal, he advocated numerous social reforms such as promoting the education, employment, and enfranchisement of women, social insurance, the progressive income tax, and laws protecting the rights of workers to organize labor unions. However, he stressed the importance of improving methods of moral inquiry over advocating particular moral conclusions, given that the latter are always subject to revision in light of new evidence.

Thus, the main focus of Dewey’s social ethics concerns the institutional arrangements that influence the capacity of people to conduct moral inquiry intelligently. Two social domains are critical for promoting this capacity: schools, and civil society. Both needed to be reconstructed so as to promote experimental intelligence and wider sympathies. Dewey wrote numerous works on education, and established the famous Laboratory School at the University of Chicago to implement and test his educational theories. He was also a leading advocate of the comprehensive high school, as opposed to separate vocational and college preparatory schools. This was to promote the social integration of different economic classes, a prerequisite to enlarging their mutual understanding and sympathies. Civil society, too, needed to be reconstructed along more democratic lines. This involved not just expanding the franchise, but improving the means of communication among citizens and between citizens and experts, so that public opinion could be better informed by the experiences and problems of citizens from different walks of life, and by scientific discoveries (PP). Dewey regarded democracy as the social embodiment of experimental intelligence informed by sympathy and respect for the other members of society (DE 3, 89–94). Democracy is not simply a set of legal institutions but a way of life informed by an ethos of open and respectful communication, in which political rivals repudiate abusive and suspicious modes of discourse and open themselves up to learning from others (CD). Unlike dictatorial and oligarchic societies, democratic ones institutionalize feedback mechanisms (free speech) for informing officeholders of the consequences for all of the policies they adopt, and for sanctioning them (periodic elections) if they do not respond accordingly.

Dewey’s moral epistemology thus leads naturally to his political philosophy. The reconstruction of moral theory is accomplished by replacing fixed moral rules and ends with an experimental method that treats norms for valuing as hypotheses to be tested in practice, in light of their widest consequences for everyone. To implement this method requires institutions that facilitate three things: (1) habits of critical, experimental inquiry; (2) widespread communication of the consequences of instituting norms, and (3) extensive sympathy, so that the consequences of norms for everyone are treated seriously in appraising them and imagining and adopting alternatives. The main institutions needed to facilitate these things are progressive schools and a democratic civil society. Experimentalism in ethics leads to a democratic political philosophy.


Primary Literature

Abbreviations of Principal Works Bearing on Dewey’s Ethics

[AE] Art as Experience, in Later Works, vol. 10 (1934)
[CD] “Creative Democracy: The Task before Us,” in Later Works, vol. 14 (1939).
[DE] Democracy and Education, in Middle Works, vol. 9 (1916)
[EN] Experience and Nature, in Later Works, vol. 1 (1925)
[HNC] Human Nature and Conduct, in Middle Works, vol. 14 (1922)
[HWT] How We Think, in Middle Works, vol. 6 (1910).
[E] Ethics, rev. ed.(John Dewey and James Tufts), in Later Works, vol. 7 (1932).
[IDP] “The Influence of Darwin on Philosophy,” in Middle Works, vol. 4 (1909).
[LE] Lectures on Ethics, 1900–1901, Ed. D. Koch, Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press (1991).
[LJP] “The Logic of Judgments of Practice,” in Middle Works, vol. 8 (1915).
[PP] The Public and Its Problems, in Later Works, vol. 2 (1927).
[RP] Reconstruction in Philosophy, in Middle Works, vol. 12 (1920).
[TIF] “Three Independent Factors in Morals,” in Later Works, vol. 5 (1930).
[TV] Theory of Valuation, in Later Works, vol. 13 (1939).
[VEK] “Valuation and Experimental Knowledge,” in Middle Works, vol. 13 (1922).
[VORC] “Value, Objective Reference, and Criticism,” in Later Works, vol. 2 (1925).


  • Dewey, J., 1967, The Early Works, 1882–1898, J. A. Boydston (ed.), Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press.
  • Dewey, J., 1976, The Middle Works, 1899–1924, J. A. Boydston (ed.), Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press.
  • Dewey, J., 1981, The Later Works, 1925–1953, J. A. Boydston (ed.), Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press.
  • Dewey, J., 1994, The Moral Writings of John Dewey, J. Gouinlock (ed.), Buffalo, N.Y.: Prometheus Books.
  • Dewey, J., 1998, The Essential Dewey, L. Hickman and T. M. Alexander (ed.), Bloomington: Indiana University Press.

Secondary Literature

  • Cochran, M. (ed.), 2010, The Cambridge Companion to Dewey, Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Fesmire, S., 2003, John Dewey and Moral Imagination: Pragmatism in Ethics, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • –––, 2019, The Oxford Handbook of Dewey, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Frega, R. and S. Levine (eds.), 2021, John Dewey’s Ethical Theory: The 1932 Ethics, New York: Routledge.
  • Garrison, J. W. (ed.), 1995, The New Scholarship on Dewey, Dordrecht and Boston: Kluwer Academic.
  • Gouinlock, J., 1972, John Dewey’s Philosophy of Value, Atlantic Highlands, N.J.: Humanities Press.
  • –––, 1986, Excellence in Public Discourse: John Stuart Mill, John Dewey, and Social Intelligence, New York: Teachers College Press.
  • Hickman, L. (ed.), 1998, Reading Dewey: Interpretations for a Postmodern Generation, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Pappas, G., 2009, John Dewey’s Ethics: Democracy as Experience, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Rogers, M., 2008, The Undiscovered Dewey: Religion, Morality, and the Ethos of Democracy, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Ryan, A., 1995, John Dewey and the High Tide of American Liberalism, New York: W.W. Norton.
  • Tiles, J. (ed.), 1992, John Dewey: Critical Assessments, London New York: Routledge.
  • Welchman, J., 1995, Dewey’s Ethical Thought, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Westbrook, R. B., 1991, John Dewey and American Democracy, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.

Other Internet Resources

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