Dewey’s Political Philosophy
John Dewey (1859–1952) was an American philosopher, associated with pragmatism. His immense philosophical and other written output encompasses most areas of philosophy as well as a host of other educational, social and political concerns. Although much of Dewey’s political writing is prompted by specific issues, his overall orientation is deeply shaped by his pragmatism or (as he preferred) “experimentalism”. At the core of his political thinking are the beliefs that science and democracy are mutually supportive and interdependent enterprises, that they are egalitarian, progressive and rest on habits of open social communication, and that powerful interpretations of liberal individualism and democracy have become ossified and self-defeating.
Dewey’s earliest philosophical work was deeply influenced by the idealism imbibed from his teacher and colleague George S. Morris. Through the 1890s, and particularly after moving to the newly founded University of Chicago in 1894, Dewey began a steady drift away from idealist metaphysics, a process that he describes in an autobiographical essay “From Absolutism to Experimentalism”. Influenced notably by William James’s Principles of Psychology (1890), Dewey came to repudiate both the Idealist’s claim that the study of empirical phenomena leads to the conclusion that the world is mind, and the belief that the only alternative to this is an atomistic empiricism. Yet he retained the Idealist ambition of articulating a unified account of human progress. While at Chicago Dewey’s interest in educational theory and conception of the school as a central institution for a democratic society came to fruition, in the foundation of the University Elementary School (the “Lab School”), and in books such as The School and Society (1899), The Child and the Curriculum (1902), and later in the culminating statement Democracy and Education (1916). After a dispute with the university president, Dewey left Chicago in 1904 for Columbia University, where he remained until his retirement.
The period between the wars also saw an imposing series of books articulating and developing his philosophical beliefs. This includes Reconstruction in Philosophy (1920), Human Nature and Conduct (1922), Experience and Nature (1925), The Quest for Certainty (1929), Art as Experience (1934), A Common Faith (1934), Logic: The Theory of Inquiry (1938), and Theory of Valuation (1939). The Public and Its Problems (1927) contained a defence of participatory democratic ideals against sceptics such as Walter Lippmann, who argued that there was only space for a minimally democratic politics in complex modern societies. Dewey was a critic of laissez-faire liberalism and its accompanying individualistic view of society from his early writings. This criticism was amplified during the Depression, where he expressed a form of liberal and democratic socialism in writings such as Individualism, Old and New (1930), Liberalism and Social Action (1935), and Freedom and Culture (1939).
As a public intellectual, Dewey was a supporter of such causes as women’s suffrage and the Settlement House movement (he was a frequent visitor to the philosopher Jane Addams’s and Ellen Gates Starr’s famous Hull House in Chicago). He lectured to international audiences and his educational writing in particular was influential in a wide range of settings, including notably China. His immense range of public and political activities included presidency of the teachers’ union, sponsorship of the American Civil Liberties Union and NAACP, support for the Outlawry of War movement in the interwar years, chairing the People’s Lobby, and (persuaded by his student, the philosopher Sidney Hook) participation in the “trial” of Leon Trotsky in Mexico in 1938. After his move to New York, and particularly after the onset of the First World War, a substantial part of his published output consisted of commentary on current domestic and international politics, and public statements on behalf of many causes, both domestic and international. (He is probably the only philosopher in this Encyclopaedia to have published both on the Treaty of Versailles and on the value of displaying art in post offices.) Among these commitments, his support for the entry of the United States into the First World War was hugely controversial, strained or broke many of his ties with the American left, and came to be a source of profound disillusionment. In a way, it marked the highpoint of his belief that the American state could be tethered to democratic goals without thoroughgoing reconstruction. He went on to be a prominent critic from the left of Roosevelt’s New Deal while also opposing Soviet communism and its western apologists. By the time of his death he was lionized as a national sage (as with Bertrand Russell, this status was compatible with his promotion of controversial and often radical public positions). Although his philosophical reputation and public status dimmed somewhat in subsequent years, his work has consolidated in stature as an important reference point and resource for democratic theory.
- 1. Situating Dewey’s Political Philosophy
- 2. Reconstructing Liberalism
- 3. Democratic Ideals and Realities
- 4. Legacies
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Situating Dewey’s Political Philosophy
From a very early point of his intellectual development, Dewey, like the British idealist T. H. Green (on whom he wrote several essays), accepted that traditional liberalism in part rested on a false conception of the individual, which was ethically pernicious in its effect on liberal thought. Accordingly, many of the themes that characterised Dewey’s thinking about social and political theory after his turn to “experimentalism” were present in his earlier, overtly idealist political philosophy. In texts such as “The Ethics of Democracy” (EW1) and “Christianity and Democracy” (EW4), Dewey elaborates a version of the idealist criticisms of classical liberal individualism. For this line of criticism, classical liberalism envisages the individual as an independent entity in competition with other individuals, and takes social and political life as a sphere in which this competitive pursuit of self-interest is coordinated. By contrast, the idealists rejected this view of social and political life as the aggregation of inherently conflicting private interests. Instead, they sought to view individuals relationally: individuality could be sustained only where social life was understood as an organism in which the well-being of each part was tied to the well-being of the whole. Freedom in a positive sense consisted not merely in the absence of external constraints but the positive fact of participation in such an ethically desirable social order. On this foundation, Dewey rebuts Henry Maine’s bleak assessment in Popular Government that democracy is the rule of the ignorant majority. While it is important that voters can reject their rulers and so control them to some extent, democracy is not simply a form of government defined by the distribution of the franchise or majority rule. Rather what matters, as Dewey puts it, is the way that the majority is formed. To understand that requires grasping what Maine misses, in Dewey’s view: that “men are not isolated non-social atoms, but are men only when in intrinsic relations” to one another, and the state in turn only represents them “so far as they have become organically related to one another, or are possessed of unity of purpose and interest” (“The Ethics of Democracy”, EW1, 231–2). Democracy is a form of moral and spiritual association that recognizes the contribution that each member can make in his or her particular way to this ethical community. And each of us can contribute to this community since we each only become the individuals we are through our engagement in the institutions and practices of our society.
Other important themes also appear in these early statements. Dewey is anti-elitist, and argues that the capacity of the wise few to discern the public interest tends to be distorted by their position. Democratic participation is not only viewed as a bulwark against government by elites, but also as an aspect of individual freedom – humanity cannot rest content with a good “procured from without”. Democracy is not “simply and solely a form of government”, but a social and personal ideal; in other words, it is not only a property of political institutions but of a wide range of social relationships. This ideal is common to a range of social spheres, and should take “industrial, as well as civil and political” forms (“The Ethics of Democracy”, EW1, 246). It also has a religious dimension. Through democracy in this expansive and ideal sense,
the incarnation of God in man … becomes a living, present thing … The truth is brought down to life, its segregation removed; it is made a common trust enacted in all departments of action, not in one isolated sphere called religious. (“Christianity and Democracy”, EW4, 9)
While the Christian conception of democracy recedes (but does not entirely disappear) in Dewey’s later work, the idea that democracy should be viewed as a form of relationship that encompasses and unifies different spheres of social life remains important. Dewey’s later work is more questioning of the traditional ethical standards and ideals that he appeals to in an essay like “The Ethics of Democracy”. He is also sharply critical of what he sees as the residual Kantianism in Green’s ethics of self-realization, although the general orientation remains: individuals are not presocial atoms, and democracy in an ideal sense is a primarily social and ethical ideal rather than a method of majority rule through voting.
Three features of Dewey’s wider conception of knowledge and value as he develops them in his later work are particularly important for his political thinking: anti-absolutism, experimentalism, and naturalism. The first strand of Dewey’s philosophy is his scepticism about what he calls an “absolutistic” conception of social and political philosophy. Dewey gathers some different ideas under this heading but at its core it is the belief that there are certain ahistorical and foundational features of the social world and that social and political philosophy should consist in identifying these features and using them to diagnose and evaluate social and political problems. This anti-absolutism is expressed in various ways by Dewey. In one version of this idea is the argument that “the logic of general notions” provides an idealised picture of agents and institutions that is too abstract to contribute to the kind of experimental inquiry that Dewey thinks we need in social thought (Reconstruction in Philosophy, MW12, 187). For example:
We want to know about the worth of the institution of private property as it operates under given conditions of definite time and place. We meet with the reply of Proudhon that property generally is theft, or with that of Hegel that the realization of will is the end of all institutions, and that private ownership as the expression of mastery of personality over physical nature is a necessary element in such realization …. They are general answers supposed to have a universal meaning that covers and dominates all particulars. Hence they do not assist in inquiry. They close it. They are not instrumentalities to be employed and tested in clarifying concrete social difficulties. They are ready-made principles to be imposed upon particulars in order to determine their nature. (Reconstruction in Philosophy, MW12, 188)
Dewey diagnoses the same defect of absolutism in the more “professedly empirical” social theory of J. S. Mill (1843), for whom certain “social laws, normative and regulative, at all periods and under all circumstances of proper social life were assumed to exist” (Public and Its Problems, LW2, 357). On this view, society is an aggregate of individual human minds and the purpose of social science is to derive the laws governing these aggregates. Dewey argues that this ignores the extent to which the content of individual beliefs, desires and purposes are given by the social context in which individuals live and selves are socially constituted: the individual should not be “regarded as something given, something already there” – social institutions are “means for creating individuals” (Reconstruction in Philosophy, MW12, 190, 192). Mill’s individualism exemplifies what he describes as “the most pervasive fallacy of philosophical thinking” (“Context and Thought”, LW5, 5). This is the tendency to divide up experienced phenomena, and to take the distinct analysed elements to be separate existences, independent both of the analysis and of each other. That this abstraction is in particular circumstances essential for inquiry is an important theme in Dewey’s philosophy. But this abstraction goes wrong “whenever the distinctions or elements that are discriminated are treated as if they were final and self-sufficient” (“Context and Thought”, LW5, 7), as when classical liberalism treats the individuals as “something given”, ontologically prior to the social groups of which they are members. His anti-absolutist point, however, is not to claim the universal explanatory primacy of the social (a position associated with Hegel and the idealism of Green and F. H. Bradley that he had come to reject) or to object to the idea that the individuals can be abstracted from their social context for certain analytical purposes but with the idea that this abstracted individual provides the firm foundation for a fixed and ahistorical explanatory framework for social theory.
A second sort of absolutism that Dewey rejects is the idea that there is a fixed and ahistorical standard of social evaluation using critical standards derived from “consideration of the ultimate nature of things – God, the Universe, Man, Reason” (Syllabus Social Institutions and the Study of Morals, MW15, 233). The group of philosophers guilty of this kind of absolutism includes Plato, Augustine, Aquinas, Spinoza and Hegel. He also diagnoses this absolutism in philosophers who define the good with reference to the psychology of personal and private consciousness, encompassing not only hedonistic versions of utilitarianism but also theories of personal conscience associated with Protestantism. These standards gain “outside leverage” only by being “absolutistic and non-historical, and, in effect, partisan, since they choose their outside standard to serve the purpose they have in mind, and there is no objective check upon their choice”. Dewey develops a kind of ideological criticism of traditional philosophy as prone to mistaking contingent (and convenient) social products for unchangeable features of human nature. Famously, for example, he thinks that the philosophical preference for “intrinsic” goods of contemplation and related values such as aesthetic purity originally reflect a form of Greek society structured around a slave class and a leisured class but is reproduced (with increasing difficulty) in other class-divided societies. Instead, what Dewey says that social criticism should be governed by what he calls “an immanent standard”: “this is relative to phenomena but at the same time it is experimental and hence it is checked up by social processes similar to those which suggest it” (Syllabus Social Institutions and the Study of Morals, MW15, 234). This is not an appeal to a conventionalist or relativist idea that the standards for judging a practice are whatever happens to be prevalent or identifiable in a community since, unless we define social groups in a moralistic way, these can include groups “banded together in a criminal conspiracy, business aggregations that prey upon the public while serving it, political machines held together by the interests of plunder“ (Democracy and Education, MW9, 88): so not just any set of standards is valuable. Dewey’s experimentalism and his naturalism each form parts of his alternative to this conventionalist interpretation of immanent standards.
The experimentalist conception of what he calls intelligence or inquiry as problem-solving is intended as an account of human epistemic practices. We don’t chase the impossible goal of certainty, he thinks, and there are no epistemological foundations available to guarantee that we have achieved it. The goal of an inquiry is not to arrive at a certain picture of the nature of things, but to come up with what is an inevitably provisional solution to the practical and intellectual problem that sparked it. Inquiry has reached its apogee in the successes of modern science, medicine, and engineering but is continuous with, and arises from, mundane processes of inquiry and problem-solving or, as he put it in a text for educationalists, with How We Think (MW6, LW8). Inquiry should be understood as part of our struggle with an objectively precarious but improvable environment. Inquiry is demanded by what he calls an “incomplete” or “problematic” situation, that is, one in which our inherited habits and standard ways of doing things run into trouble, perhaps through our actions’ having unexpected consequences, through our having developed new needs and desires that are unmet in current circumstances, or through conflict among our own goals and projects or with those of others. These challenges prompt us to step back, identify the problem that confronts us, and reflect on what to do next. Modern societies have an awesome exemplar of successful inquiry, in the natural sciences which, Dewey argues, have been progressive and cumulative, giving us greater and greater understanding and control of the natural world. This has above all been the result of their experimental character, in which no intellectual element is taken to be beyond rational scrutiny. Theories and hypotheses are invented, used, tested, revised, and so on. At the same time, new methods for the invention, use, testing and revision of theories and hypotheses are developed and refined, and so are new standards for evaluating theories and hypotheses. What counts as success in inquiry is some practice’s meeting these standards, but these standards themselves may be judged in the light of how they square with ongoing practices of inquiry. In this way, the methods used by science are not fixed but themselves have a history and develop progressively and sometimes in unexpected ways. A crucial dimension of the experience that has established these standards and practices is social or communal, as we must look to the community of our fellow inquirers for testing and confirmation of our findings.
Dewey’s conception of inquiry is intended as a general model of reflective intelligence: we struggle with problems in all sorts of areas of human experience, including art and ethics. Accordingly he rejects non-cognitivism about values and holds that values can be true or false in his pragmatic sense, responsive to reasons and corrigible in the light of experience. He argues that we should generally think of values or ideals as hypotheses about what course of action to take, forged reflectively in response to problematic situations, with the aim of providing means for what Dewey calls their “directed resolution” (most fully in these terms in the late work, Theory of Valuation (LW13)). Practical inquiry encompasses instrumental reasoning about means: so if we our path to the beach is blocked by a giant rock (the problematic situation) we can reflect on what it would involve to take another route, to climb the rock, to dynamite it, etc., and can imaginatively rehearse the options. This inquiry also includes reflective criticism of ends: if the journey now has to include arduous rock-climbing, we may reconsider how important our end of getting to the beach is, or of the value we attach to it. Inquiry as practical judgment involves reflecting on, criticising and revising our ends, in the light of what is involved for us in achieving them, and this often leads us creatively to transform our values and to develop new ends.
In this context, Dewey develops a particular conception of moral theory. Deliberation as inquiry is concerned with judging ends and choosing means to achieve those ends. There are situations, though, in which an agent is presented with a conflict of ends or goals which is not straightforwardly susceptible to being settled by reference to some higher order end possessed by the agent. In the case of ethics, a moral problem presents “alternative ends so heterogeneous” that they appeal to different kinds of disposition in the agent (Ethics, first edition, MW5, 192). Dewey and Tufts give as an example a pacifist citizen whose state goes to war:
He is deeply attached to his own state. He has formed habits of loyalty and of abiding by its laws, and now one of its decrees is that he shall support war. He feels in addition gratitude and affection for the country which has sheltered and nurtured him. But his believes that this war is unjust, or perhaps he has a condition that all war is a form of murder and hence wrong. One side of his nature, one set of convictions and habits, leads him to acquiesce in war; another deep part of his being protests. He is torn between two duties: he experiences a conflict between the incompatible values presented to him by his habits of citizenship and by his religious beliefs respectively. Up to this time, he has never experienced a struggle between the two; they have coincided and reenforced one another. Now he has to make a choice between competing moral loyalties and convictions. The struggle is not between a good which is clear to him and something else which attracts him but which he knows to be wrong. It is between values each of which is an undoubted good in its place but which now get in each other’s way. He is forced to reflect in order to come to a decision. Moral theory is a generalised extension of the kind of thinking in which he now engages. (Ethics, 2nd edition, LW7, 165)
In spite of his doubts about moral theory as an external standard for judging social institutions, Dewey isn’t a sceptic about inherited moral theory. Rather, he interprets it as as a repertoire of conceptual resources and tools that we have for dealing with the problems of value judgement in a world of plural and changing values. In Ethics, Dewey and Tufts offer an interpretation of different canonical value theories, teleology, deontology and virtue ethics as providing contrasting methodological orientations for identifying, describing and solving problems. Moral theories are generated in contingent historical circumstances, are responsive to the particular needs and conflicts of those circumstances, and reflect their prejudices and assumption. Ideals and values that were functional for a particular social order can cease to make sense or become dysfunctional as that order changes. Instead of asking which of these approaches best captures “our intuitions” and so should be used as an unvarying standard to guide decision-making in concrete situations, Dewey argues that no one approach constitutes a theoretically adequate guide to how to act in particular situations. Instead, these provide standpoints from which agents can identify and analyze problems, sift important from unimportant considerations, and work out whether what we desire or value is really desirable or valuable. Conflict among these approaches cannot be resolved in theory, only in practice and in particular contexts, if at all, where an agent must make “the best adjustment he can among forces which are genuinely disparate” (“Three Independent Factors in Morals”, MW5, 288). Recall his claim that immanent criticism has the virtue of being “experimental and hence … checked up by social processes similar to those which suggest it”. Experimentalism is immanent in the sense that it is carried out and embodied by particular agents confronted with the particular problems they grapple with, agents who are themselves constituted by the social habitat they grapple with, and uses the criteria of judgment provided by that habitat. At the same time, it is experimental in the sense that the exercise of intelligence does not involve unreflectively applying these criteria but reflectively testing and challenging them in the light of experience. At the social level, the model of ethical deliberation is not that of trying to implement a given standard:
the process of growth, of improvement and progress, rather than the static outcome and result, becomes the significant thing. Not health as an end fixed once and for all, but the needed improvement in health – a continual process – is the end and good. The end is no longer a terminus or limit to be reached. It is the active process of transforming the existing situation. Not perfection as a final goal, but the ever-enduring process of perfecting, maturing, refining is the aim in living … Growth itself is the only moral “end”. (Reconstruction in Philosophy, MW12, 181)
As Dewey and Tufts put it, this experimentalism tells us about “the method by which the criterion should be reached and the spirit in which it is employed, namely, the experimental.That statement concerns the form of the criterion rather than its content or substance” (Ethics, 2nd edition , LW7, 343). This is not all that can be said about the content of a criterion of social judgment, however: Dewey and Tufts go on to explain that “their position is that past experience enables us to state a criterion of judgment which is sufficiently definite to be usable and sufficiently flexible to lead to its own reinterpretation as experience progresses” ((Ethics, 2nd edition, LW7, 343) – to tell us something about content or substance, in other words. Dewey provides a historicised form of ethical naturalism, which fleshes out the criterion of social judgment. In this vein, Dewey says that “the measure of the worth of any social institution, economic, domestic, political, legal, religious, is its effect in enlarging and improving experience” (Democracy and Education, MW9, 9). One way in which we can see Dewey’s account as substantive is in the practical virtues that he thinks accompany the commitment to experimentalism. Social practices that promote free and open learning have the instrumental epistemic benefits of growing knowledge and understanding, increasing the capacity to control experience, and providing a richer and more dynamic environment, and we benefit if we are prepared to be open-minded in dealing with this environment. Beyond this, though, Dewey has a conception of what it is to judge a social group based on its relationship to its members. For example, he writes in Democracy and Education:
Now in any social group whatsoever, even in a gang of thieves, we find some interest held in common and we find a certain amount of interaction and cooperative intercourse with other groups. From these two traits we derive our standard. How numerous and varied are the interests which are consciously shared? How full and free is the interplay with other forms of association? If we apply these considerations to, say, the members of a criminal band, we find that the ties which consciously hold the members together are few in number, reducible almost to a common interest in plunder; and that they are of such a nature as to isolate the group from other groups with respect to give and take of the values of life. Hence the education such a society gives is partial and distorted. If we take, on the other hand, the kind of family life which illustrates the standard, we find that there are material, intellectual, aesthetic interests in which all participate and that the progress of one member has worth for the experience of other members – it is readily communicable – and that the family is not an isolated whole, but enters intimately into relationships with business interests, with schools, with all the agencies of culture, as well as with other similar groups, and that it plays a due part in the political organisation and in return receives support from it. In short, there are many interests consciously communicated and shared; and there are varied and free modes of association with other modes of association. (MW9, 89)
Authoritarian or anti-social groups have to stunt their members’ interests and allegiances in order to maintain their hold over them. As Dewey puts it, reflecting on the gang of thieves in The Public and Its Problems, it is possible for a member of the gang “to express his powers in a way consonant with belonging to that group and be directed by the interest common to its members” but he can do so “only at the cost of repression of his potentialities which can be realized only through membership of other groups” and through “the free give-and-take” that is the condition for “the fullness of integrated personality” (LW2, 328). The free communication of interests and open interaction within and beyond a group provide a standard for judging social groups. This is also in a certain sense formal, since as a criterion it is not a moral demand with a particular determinate content but is itself a tool for dealing with experience to be used or applied experimentally by the individuals involved.
2. Reconstructing Liberalism
One of the legacies of Green’s idealism and of Dewey’s engagement with the New Liberals was the project of recasting liberalism in an appropriate form for modern societies. The core or at least viable component of liberalism is a commitment to“liberty and the opportunity of all individuals to secure full realization of their potentialities” (Liberalism and Social Action, LW11, 38). Moral theories, as we have seen, can be viewed as constructs to solve practical problems. Like an outmoded piece of technology, a past value which was once constructed to address a problem in one set of circumstances can outlive its usefulness, and become a hindrance to the capacity of those in the present to deal with their practical needs and worries. This, Dewey believes, is the case with the theory of classical or laissez-faire liberalism. As he puts it, “the slogans of liberalism in one period can become the bulwarks of reaction” in the next (“Logical Method and Law”, MW15, 76). For Dewey this does not provide a reason to reject liberalism, however although he is sensitive to the allure of anti-liberal thought. Rather, liberalism it for modern societies, usually in a more socialist and radical direction. Throughout his political writings, he develops this thought in discussing the relation of individual and society, the character and value of freedom, and the scope of legitimate social and political action.
Dewey’s treatment of the genealogy of classical liberalism is nuanced but in summary he sees it as a doctrine committed to the universal moral primacy of the individual possessed of pre-societal rights, including liberties of thought and action, which it is the sole business of the state to protect (Liberalism and Social Action, LW11, 7). This meant that the main opponent of liberty was seen as government because of its tendency to encroach on these innate liberties. The abstraction of the individual from social context in classical liberalism shapes its normative theory. If the individual is thought of as existing prior to social institutions, then it is easier to envisage securing freedom for the individual in purely negative terms as solely consisting in the removal of external impediments on individual action, such as legal restrictions on freedom of speech. For classical liberalism or “old individualism”, freedom is taken to consist in the absence of some intentional constraint on the individual’s ability to pursue his or her chosen goals and the individual is viewed as surrounded by a protective cordon of rights, which define his or her freedom. While removal of external constraints may sometimes be very important for supplying the conditions of liberty, liberty in the sense in which it is a value for liberals does not consist in the mere absence of external constraint. For Dewey, this negative view of freedom is at the root of the wider social, ethical and political defects of this form of individualism (“Religion and Morality in a Free Society”, LW15, 181). While the anti-historical character of classical liberalism at one point provided it with a certain ideological advantage, since it allowed it to attack appeals to tradition, it meant that it failed to see the historically conditioned character of its interpretations of liberty and individuality. This failure of historical self-awareness means that classical liberalism neglects or suppresses an understanding of the central challenges to liberty and in effect becomes an instrument of plutocratic interests.
By contrast, as we have seen, Dewey rejects the philosophical absolutism of a fixed and ahistorical conception of the self and argues that a genuine liberalism views the individual as “nothing fixed, given ready-made. It is something achieved, and achieved not in isolation but with the aid and support of conditions, cultural and physical: – including in ‘cultural’, economic, legal and political institutions as well as science and art” (“The Future of Liberalism”, LW11: 291). One argument Dewey makes is for the “historic relativity” of what constitutes a constraint on individual liberty. At one time it made sense to say that dynastic despotic rule or inherited legal customs were the main obstacles to individual freedom. Today, however, liberty signifies “liberation from material insecurity and from the coercions and repressions that prevent multitudes from participation in the vast cultural resources that are to hand” (Liberalism and Social Action, LW11, 38). It is a historically relative matter what constitutes a constraint on individual freedom, however. By attempting to mask this as well as by promoting an outdated conception of what these constraints must be, classical liberalism has come to subvert liberalism’s core commitments to liberty and individuality.
Dewey goes beyond this historicization, however. In the sense in which freedom is a substantive value for liberals, what is valuable about it is not the negative absence of constraints but the positive “power to be an individualized self” (The Public and Its Problems, LW2, 329). Individuality in what we may call a weak sense is universally possessed and consists in the particular patterns of response to the environment that each person displays, “a distinctive way of feeling the impacts of the world and of showing a preferential bias in response to these impacts” (Individualism Old and New, LW5, 121). In the stronger sense in which it is a value for liberals, according to Dewey, individuality consists in the personal capacity for choice, “the most characteristic activity of a self” (Ethics, 2nd edition, LW7, 285). This is not a matter of having the capacity only for arbitrarily or whimsically plumping for one option rather than another. Rather, choice that is expressive of your individuality in the strong sense involves your intelligent criticism and appraisal of options. Accordingly, we can understand why Dewey claims that “to foresee future objective alternatives and to be able by deliberation to choose one of them and thereby weigh its chances in the struggle for future existence, measures our freedom” (Human Nature and Conduct, MW14, 210). The alternative to intelligent self-direction is action according to whatever notions individuals have picked up from their environment, including not only unreflective impulses but propaganda (the “flood of mass suggestion” that he identifies with the media revolution of the early twentieth century), class ideologies and “the monotonous round of imagery flowing from illiberal interests, broken only by wild forays into the illicit” (Ethics, 1st edition, MW5, 392). It follows that possession and exercise of this capacity for individuality require the right social conditions. Throughout his writings he argues that education to produce undocile, unservile, creative citizens is essential. Further, he views this capacity for critical reflection as supported by democratic institutions and culture, since, at least in principle, these allow for openness, epistemic diversity, experiment, contestation and revision that supports freedom as individuality (The Public and Its Problems, LW2, 329; Ethics, 2nd edition, LW7, 358).
Dewey goes further still, though, in situating the free individual: freedom doesn’t only consist in the development of reflective individuality, which requires supportive social and political conditions. It also includes participation in a community (here tweaking an idea he found in Green and the New Liberals). As he puts it in The Public and Its Problems, liberty “is that secure release and fulfilment of personal potentialities which take place only in rich and manifold association with others: the power to be an individualized self making a distinctive contribution and enjoying in its own way the fruits of association” (The Public and Its Problems, LW2, 329). You are free not only in reflectively choosing among a set of options but in having available a rich set of worthwhile options; without these options, you aren’t free, or as free, as someone who does enjoy a rich and manifold association with others. You are also free only when you are making your own distinctive contribution to the society. Dewey is the kind of positive liberty theorist for whom individual freedom is achieved through participation in the process through which the individual’s society exercises collective control over its own affairs. I’ll return to this in the next section, since it shapes Dewey’s conception of democracy.
What should be underlined here is that this account of freedom is the basis of a critical assessment of capitalist society: “[t]he direct impact of liberty always has to do with some class or group that is suffering in a special way from some form of constraint exercised by the distribution of powers that exists in contemporary society” (Liberalism and Social Action, LW11, 38). Liberals agree that the state has an important role in maintaining the conditions for individual freedom. For Dewey, the character and value of freedom, as for the Hegelian idealists and New Liberals on whom he drew and for later writers on negative and positive liberty such as Isaiah Berlin, flowed into a debate about the proper scope of social and political action. The scope of legitimate social and political action had to be determined experimentally and in the light of the needs of his conception of freedom as individuality: laissez-faire should not be assumed to be the default position for a liberal. For earlier liberalism, the opposition of the individual and government may have made sense, in an era characterised by political despotism. In circumstances of popular government and where there is a need to track and regulate the complexities of modern industrial conditions, however, the nostrums of laissez-faire liberalism only serve to provide ideological support for plutocracy. Dewey drew on a wide range of sources to flesh out his conception of social action or social control, including the utopian Edward Bellamy and British guild socialist G. D. H. Cole, and argued for social reforms that tended to strengthen workers’ rights, including rights to form and join unions, and to take strike action, and the extension of democratic control in the workplace, and a welfare state, in the name of freedom as individuality. More pointedly, Dewey argued, particularly in the 1930s, that a socialized economy was necessary to maintain the liberal value of freedom. Unsurprisingly, this drew a hostile reception from advocates of a negative concept of liberty such as F. A. Hayek (1960), who viewed Dewey as profoundly destructive of liberalism.
Since both positive liberty and the idea of social control have been thought to have worrying authoritarian implications, and Dewey is sometimes thought of as a technocrat, it is worth emphasising the liberal and democratic character of Dewey’s conception of social action. Individuality as an ethical ideal requires that individuals find their own way, and not have particular doctrines or social roles imposed on them: it is only “when individuals have initiative, independence of judgment, flexibility, fullness of experience can they act so as to enrich the lives of others” (Ethics, 2nd edition, LW7, 285). Dewey doesn’t think that the liberal rights protected in the name of individual liberty (such as freedoms of speech, thought, movement, and so on) should be dispensed with but rather that they are constitutive in part of the positive liberty he advocates. Indeed, he emphasises that “direct and violent encroachments on liberty of thought and speech are perpetrated by police and by organized bands of persons when suggestions for important change in economic lines are put forth” (Ethics, 2nd edition, LW7, 360). Furthermore, viewing liberty through the prism of individuality only opens up the possibility of political action in the name of liberty, but it does not itself require it. Finally, and in contrast to technocratic critics of laissez-faire such as Walter Lippmann, as we will see, Dewey argues that an extensive form of democracy is essential for social action, and he vests little faith in experts.
3. Democratic Ideals and Realities
While democracy is the key organising concept of Dewey’s political philosophy, it is one that he thinks of in a very unusual way. As he puts it in Democracy and Education, it is “more than a form of government; it is primarily a mode of associated living, of conjoint communicated experience” (MW9, 93) or, famously, it is a “way of life” (Freedom and Culture, LW13, 155; “Creative Democracy: The Task Before Us”, LW14, 226). This is a long way from the conception of democracy as majority rule or as a set of procedures for the selection of governors.
Dewey views democracy as an ideal of associated life in the sense that as an ideal he thinks that it reconciles the full expression of individual potentialities and the common good. In this sense, democracy sits at the apex of his historicised naturalist account of individuality and community. “From the standpoint of the individual”, as he puts it, democracy “consists in having a responsible share according to capacity in forming and directing the activities of the groups in which one belongs and in participating according to need in the values which the groups sustain”, while “from the standpoint of the groups, it demands liberation of the potentialities of members of a group in harmony with the interests and goods which are common” (The Public and Its Problems, LW2, 327–8). In working out what to do, individuals and groups are confronted by dilemmas. Some of us (such as a gang of thieves, in Dewey’s example) address these problems in ways that promote certain kinds of growth and development (you can flourish as a thief, including feeling solidarity with your gang) but inherently frustrate ourselves and our goals, since these set us on paths of activity that necessarily generate conflict with other individuals and groups, and so the need for coercion. It is only a democratic community, Dewey believes, which allows each member fully to realize her potentialities without conflict and coercion, since it does not inherently generate conflict. Dewey is explicit that this ideal describes a problem that societies confront and a critical ideal for them to attain, namely, how to harmonize the development of each individual with the maintenance of a society in which the individual activities will contribute to the common good (Ethics, 2nd edition, LW7, 350), rather than the blueprint for an institutional solution. Dewey’s point is that (unlike externally imposed moral standards) this ideal is immanent to democratic societies, since what makes them democratic is the extent to which they overcome the barriers (of class and race, for example (Democracy and Education, MW9, 93)) to free interaction. As critics point out, this does not furnish a reason for someone who lacks an interest in overcoming those barriers to do so. Perhaps, though, Dewey should not be viewed as striving to provide such a reason, at this very general level, beyond pointing out that those who are antipathetic to other classes and races should not claim to be democrats.
An overlapping but not identical fashion in which democracy constitutes a way of life for Dewey concerns his view of the scope of democracy: democracy does not only govern what we think of as politics or administration, in the normal sense. Dewey thinks that this narrow view misses out the importance of democracy for a much wider range of social institutions: it is “superficial” to think that “government is located in Washington and Albany. There is government in the family, in business, in the church, in every social group” which regulates the behaviour of its members (“Democracy and Educational Administration”, LW11, 221). The scope of democracy, in the sense of the range of institutions to which it applies, should not be construed narrowly. If our individuality is shaped by the wide range of institutions that make up our social habitat, as Dewey thinks, then the rules and norms governing these institutions are too important to us to be left to chance, dogma, tradition or inherited hierarchy. Power and domination are present in all these spheres of social life so restricting democratic scrutiny and control to a single sphere of social life would be a mistake. In The Public and Its Problems, Dewey gives the question of the scope of politics some systematic thought and provides this account of the distinction between public and private:
When the consequences of an action are confined, or are thought to be confined mainly to the persons directly engaged in it, the transaction is a private one …. Yet if it is found that the consequences … extend beyond [those] directly concerned … the act acquires a public capacity … The line between private and public is to be drawn on the basis of the extent and scope of the consequences of acts which are so important as to need control, whether by inhibition or promotion. The public consists of all those who are affected by the indirect consequences of transactions to such an extent that it is deemed necessary to have these consequences systematically cared for. (LW2, 244–6)
What constitutes the public (and private) in particular cases is relative to range of judgments about what counts as a consequence, who is concerned, and what is so important as to need control, and the public is a concept we have to deploy these judgments. So this conception of the public/private distinction fits with his experimentalism by leaving very open the content of these judgments. As we saw in the discussion of liberalism, in part Dewey objects to classical liberalism because he thinks it has an overly restrictive view of what constitutes a constraint on individual liberty, grounded in an ahistorical conception of the individual. If we really collectively value individuality, Dewey thinks, we should think not only about how to protect some sorts of act from regulation (so are “private”) but also about where we need to intervene and regulate in order to support individuality.
Further, “[d]emocracy is only estimable through the changed conception of intelligence that forms modern science” (“Intelligence and Morals”, MW4, 39); it is a kind of social embodiment of his conception of experimentalism. “The very heart of political democracy is adjudication of social differences by discussion and exchange of views”, he writes in a late essay. “This method provides a rough approximation to the method of effecting change by means of experimental inquiry and test” (“Challenge to Liberal Thought”, LW15, 273). Democracy is a method for identifying and solving the common problems confronted by communities. Robust inquiry requires that we must have access to all the available evidence and arguments. If we want our inquiry to be successful, we should not prejudge its outcomes, by excluding sources of experience that allow us to explore and correct our hypotheses. By contrast,
[e]very authoritarian scheme, … assumes that its value may be assessed by some prior principle, if not of family and birth or race and color or possession of material wealth, then by the position and rank the person occupies in the existing social scheme. The democratic faith in equality is the faith that each individual shall have the chance and opportunity to contribute whatever he is capable of contributing, and that the value of his contribution be decided by its place and function in the organized total of similar contributions: – not on the basis of prior status of any kind whatever. (“Democracy and Educational Administration”, LW11, 220)
Although the “democratic faith” suggests that we are all capable of meaningfully contributing to critical inquiry, the development of habits of intelligent conduct isn’t taken for granted: they can be degraded by social disempowerment, propaganda and ideology. And, as we’ve seen, they are in any case viewed as hard-won achievements of schooling and a generally supportive society. Democratic societies are thought of as both seeking to attain desirable goals, and arguing over how to do so, and also as arguing over what a desirable goal is. In other words, democratic politics is a mode of activity in which we can arrive at a conception of what our interests are. Accordingly, like recent deliberative democrats, Dewey ascribes a central importance to discussion, consultation, persuasion and debate in democratic decision-making. As the experimentalist conception of inquiry insists, this does not imply that we need a priori criteria in order to establish if this process has been successful. Rather, criteria for what counts as a satisfactory solution may be hammered out in the process of searching for one. Democracy is experimental for Dewey in that it allows, or should allow, a profound questioning of the idées fixes of the established order, even if, of course, much democratic politics will not take the form of such questioning. Further, it is worth underlining that Dewey does not conflate this kind of deliberative politics with the elimination of social conflict, and so with the critical ideal of democracy in his social ontology. He doesn’t imagine away differences of opinion, conflicts of interest and value pluralism as ineliminable features of social and political life. Even where there is open public discussion, “[d]ifferences of opinion in the sense of differences of judgment as to the course which it is best to follow, the policy which it is best to try out, will still exist” (The Public and Its Problems, LW2, 362). Democracy as public discussion is viewed as the best way of dealing with the conflict of interests in a society:
The method of democracy – inasfar as it is that of organized intelligence – is to bring these conflicts out into the open where their special claims can be discussed and judged in the light of more inclusive interests than are represented by either of them separately. (Liberalism and Social Action, LW11, 56)
A concern with the epistemic costs and risks of social and political hierarchy runs through Dewey’s work: such “social divisions as interfere with free and full intercourse react to make intelligence and knowing of the separated classes one-sided” (Democracy and Education, MW9, 354). It is not only that some classes are excluded from cultural capital and education or subjected to propaganda: “all special privilege narrows the outlook of those who possess it, as well as limits the possibilities of development of those not having it” (Ethics, 2nd edition, LW7, 347). Rationalization of your own superior position as well as wilful ignorance of others’ situation are central epistemic vices of this kind of hierarchy. This anxiety about hierarchy underlies the response to Walter Lippmann’s influential sceptical attack on democratic theory in books such as Public Opinion (1922) and The Phantom Public (1925). Lippmann (who like Dewey was influenced by William James and who shared many philosophical and political commitments with Dewey at an earlier stage of his career) agrees that contemporary moral and political thinking has not caught up with the modern world. Unlike Dewey, however, Lippmann thinks that understanding the complexity and opacity of modern societies requires us to set aside the illusion entertained by classical democratic theorists that citizens are “omnicompetent”, capable of arriving at informed judgments about politics, and instead embrace the legitimacy of decision-making by qualified experts. The force of this critique of democracy for Dewey in part derives from its deployment of his own intellectual strategy for ends with which he vehemently disagrees. In this context, although Dewey can sometimes appear to sound dismissive about what he calls the “political machinery” of democracy such as the vote and majority rule, he never regards this as inessential or disposable. At the minimum, for Dewey, this machinery helps to protect individuals from putative experts about where the interests of people lie. Dewey’s response to this is to point out that experts have their own biases, and need correction from those who have to live with the consequences of their decisions: “in the absence of an articulate voice on the part of the masses, the best do not remain the best, the wise cease to be wise …. In the degree to which they become a specialized class, they are shut off from knowledge of the needs they are supposed to serve”. So the merit of even existing “rudimentary” forms of democracy is that they compel “recourse to methods of discussion, consultation and persuasion” and in so doing provide the opportunity to improve decisions (The Public and Its Problems, LW2, 364; cf. Reconstruction in Philosophy, MW12, 164). Taken in isolation, this way of viewing the desirability of democratic political machinery seems instrumental and minimal; instrumental, in that the desirability of democracy derives from its protecting the interests of each individual against the depredations of an elite class, and minimal, in that the rationale for popular participation is limited to the need to keep the elite informed about where the shoe pinches, if its policies are not to be misguided. In spite of his scathing tone, Dewey is committed to improving this machinery (by supporting the equal distribution of the franchise, for example) rather than merely dismissing it as unimportant. The real target of his ire is the exclusive identification of democracy with a particular current set of political institutions, particularly only with elections and majority rule. As in the case of the defunct idea of liberalism, Dewey thinks of this as a once liberating conception that now contains an inbuilt conservative bias that prevents us from seeing the relevance of democracy to wider social terrain, such as the workplace, and constrains more imaginative institutional thinking.
Dewey’s obituarists eulogized him as the authoritative American philosopher of democracy. Both during his life and subsequently, however, he has been a more controversial figure than this reputation would suggest. In part, this reflects his profile and fecundity. Precisely because he ranged so prominently across such a wide intellectual terrain, Dewey has been a point of reference and target for commentators in all the fields he explored: his educational writings in particular became a default fons et origo of the alleged ills ascribed to schemes of progressive education by their critics. Further, across a long and active career as a public intellectual, Dewey adopted bold and controversial political positions on deeply divisive issues, including (for example) robustly supporting US entry into the First World War and later opposing intervention in the Second World War, which also attracted fierce opprobrium as well as support.
Dewey’s pragmatism was always highly contentious. A dominant view for much of the twentieth century, expounded by such diverse voices as Lewis Mumford (1926), Louis Hartz (1955), Bernard Crick (1959), Max Horkheimer (1974), Herbert Marcuse (2011), John Diggins (1994), and Sheldon Wolin (2004), was that pragmatism is a philosophy for liberal technocrats, an account of how to think flexibly about the achievement of socially endorsed parochial goals but with few resources to think critically about those goals. For others, including Bertrand Russell and William Elliott, its apparent laxity about objectivity made it susceptible to capture by darker forces, such as fascism (a point some fascists were happy to accept). To skeptics in democratic theory, following in the tracks of Lippmann and other of Dewey’s contemporaries such as Reinhold Niebuhr (1960), Dewey’s radical and unconventional idea of democracy is extravagantly optimistic about the epistemic capacities of the individual citizen and of democratic institutions. By the mid-twentieth century his views had to some extent staled in the face of stimulating new research programmes, such as logical empiricism, the Frankfurt School, existentialism, and other approaches. And the key intellectual antagonist of much of Dewey’s political writing, laissez-faire liberalism, occupied a relatively marginal space.
The philosopher who probably did the most singlehandedly to promote the recrudescence of interest in Dewey’s thinking after this period of relative marginality, Richard Rorty, found in his work an historically-minded questioning of epistemological foundations and aspirations to a God’s-eye point of view that of course provided fodder for Rorty’s own project. Yet, in relation to political philosophy, Rorty’s skeptical postmodern liberal ironism glossed over the detailed architecture of Dewey’s ethical and political theory, and made very little either of Dewey’s own naturalistic confidence in the mutually supportive or his conception of the progressive character of scientific method and democracy. Even among those philosophers who have been keen to draw on the pragmatist tradition as a resource for more positively elaborating a political theory than Rorty was inclined to there are important figures, such as Cheryl Misak (2000, 2013), who seek foundations for their view elsewhere, notably in Peirce’s view of the precondition of belief, and express doubts about what they see as Dewey’s less clearly grounded ethical commitments. However, others such as Hilary and Ruth Anna Putnam (2017) and Philip Kitcher (2020, 2021) more wholeheartedly identify with, and try to develop, the commitments of Dewey’s pragmatic naturalism, in thinking through the relationship between scientific inquiry, ethics and democracy. In part, recent increased engagement with Dewey’s political philosophy from philosophers across a range of traditions, including epistemic democrats, such as Elizabeth Anderson (2006), and Frankfurt School critical theorists, such as Axel Honneth (1998, 2008, 2014) and Rahel Jaeggi (2018), flows from an interest in developing a fuller understanding of democracy as a method of social learning. In the teeth of the neoliberal revival of laissez-faire liberalism, many of these authors, and others, have mined his work as a resource for contemporary thinking about liberal socialism and participatory democracy (Medearis 2015, Jackson 2018). Dewey’s political philosophy remains an important reference point and source of inspiration for thinkers who seek to explore and develop radical forms of democratic liberalism.
As well as identifying sources for Dewey’s primary texts and listing works referred here, this bibliography also contains some books, articles and chapters which can be studied to supplement the current article.
Works by Dewey
- The Early Works, 1882–1898, 5 volumes, ed. by JoAnn Boydston, Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 1969–1975 (abbreviated here EW, followed by volume number).
- The Middle Works, 1899–1924, 15 volumes, ed. by JoAnn Boydston, Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 1976–1983 (abbreviated here MW, followed by volume number).
- The Later Works, 17 volumes, ed. by JoAnn Boydston, Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 1981–1990 (abbreviated here as LW, followed by volume number).
- Debra Morris and Ian Shapiro (eds.), John Dewey: The Political Writings, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1993.
- Larry Hickman and Thomas Alexander (eds.), The Essential Dewey (two volumes), Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1999.
- Anderson, Elizabeth, 2006, “The Epistemology of Democracy”, Episteme, 3: 8–22.
- Bernstein, Richard J., 1971, Praxis and Action, Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press.
- –––, 2010, The Pragmatic Turn, Cambridge: Polity Press.
- Bohman, James, 1999, “Democracy as Inquiry, Inquiry as Democratic: Pragmatism, Social Science and the Democratic Division of Labor”, American Journal of Political Science, 43: 590–607.
- Bourne, Randolph, 1977, The Radical Will: Selected Writings, 1911–1918, Olaf Hansen (ed.), New York: Urizen.
- Caspary, William R., 2000, Dewey on Democracy, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- Cochran, Molly, 2010, The Cambridge Companion to Dewey, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Crick, Bernard, 1959, The American Science of Politics, Berkeley: University of California Press.
- Commager, Henry Steele, 1950, The American Mind, New Haven: Yale University Press.
- Damico, Alfonso, 1978, Individuality and Community: The Social and Political Thought of John Dewey, Gainesville: University Presses of Florida.
- Dieleman, Susan, David Rondel, and Christopher Voparil (eds.), 2017, Pragmatism and Justice, New York: Oxford University Press.
- Diggins, John P., 1994, The Promise of Pragmatism: Modernism and the Crisis of Knowledge and Authority, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
- Farr, James, 1999, “John Dewey and American Political Science”, American Journal of Political Science, 43: 520–541.
- Fesmire, Steven, 2003, John Dewey and Moral Imagination, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
- –––, 2015, Dewey, Abingdon: Routledge.
- ––– (ed.), 2019, The Oxford Handbook of Dewey, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Festenstein, Matthew, 1997, Pragmatism and Political Theory: From Dewey to Rorty, Chicago: Chicago University Press.
- –––, 2001, “Inquiry as Critique: On the Legacy of Deweyan Pragmatism for Political Theory”, Political Studies, 49: 730–48.
- –––, 2008, “John Dewey: Inquiry, Ethics and Democracy”, in Cheryl Misak (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of American Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 87–109.
- –––, 2017, “Ideal and Actual in Dewey’s Political Thought”, in Dieleman, Rondel, and Voparil (eds.) 2017, pp. 97–114.
- –––, 2019, “Does Dewey Have an ‘Epistemic Argument’ for Democracy?”, Contemporary Pragmatism, 16: 217–41.
- Festl, Michael G. (ed.), 2020, Pragmatism and Social Philosophy: Exploring a Stream of Ideas from America to Europe, New York: Routledge.
- Forstenzer, Joshua, 2019, Deweyan Experimentalism and the Problem of Method in Political Philosophy, New York: Routledge.
- Frega, Roberto, 2019, Pragmatism and the Wide View of Democracy, Cham: Palgrave Macmillan.
- Fott, David, 1998, John Dewey: America’s Philosopher of Democracy, Lanham, Maryland: Rowman and Littlefield.
- Hartz, Louis, 1955, The Liberal Tradition in America, New York: Harcourt, Brace and World
- Hayek, F. A., 1960, The Constitution of Liberty. Chicago: Chicago University Press
- Hickman, Larry (ed.), 1998, John Dewey: Interpretations for a Postmodern Generation, Indianapolis: Indiana University Press.
- Honneth, Axel, 1998, “Democracy as Reflexive Cooperation: John Dewey and the Theory of Democracy Today”, Political Theory, 26: 763–83.
- –––, 2008, Reification: A New Look at an Old Idea, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2014, Freedom’s Right: The Social Foundations of Democratic Life, trans. by Joseph Ganahl, Cambridge: Polity Press
- Horkheimer, Max, 1974, The Eclipse of Reason, New York: Seabury.
- Jackson, Jeff, 2018, Equality Beyond Debate: John Dewey’s Pragmatic Idea of Democracy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Jaeggi, Rahel, 2018, Critique of Forms of Life, trans. by Ciarin Cronin, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
- James, William, 1890 , Principles of Psychology, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
- Kadlec, Alison, 2007, Dewey’s Radical Pragmatism, Lanham: Lexington.
- Kaufman-Osborn, Timothy V., 1991, Politics/Sense/Experience, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- Kitcher, Philip, 2020, “John Dewey Goes to Frankfurt: Pragmatism, Critical Theory, and the Invisibility of Moral/Social Problems”, in Julia Christ, Kristina Lepold, Daniel Loick, and Titus Stahl (eds.), Debating Critical Theory: Engagements with Axel Honneth, Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield International.
- –––, 2021, Moral Progress, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Kloppenberg, James T., 1986, Uncertain Victory: Social Democracy and Progressivism in European and American Thought, 1870–1920, New York: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 1998, The Virtues of Liberalism, New York: Oxford University Press.
- Knight, Jack, and Johnson, James, 2011, The Priority of Democracy: The Political Consequences of Pragmatism, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Lippmann, Walter, 1922, Public Opinion, New York: Free Press.
- –––, 1925, The Phantom Public, New York: MacMillan.
- Livingston, Alexander, 2017, “Between Means and Ends: Reconstructing Coercion in Dewey’s Democratic Theory”, American Political Science Review, 111: 522–34.
- MacGilvray, Eric, 2004, Reconstructing Public Reason, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
- Marcuse, Herbert, 2011, Philosophy, Psychoanalysis and Emancipation (Collected Papers, Volume 5), Douglas Kellner and Clayton Pierce (eds.), Abingdon: Routledge
- Maine, Henry, 1885, Popular Government, London: John Murray.
- Medearis, John, 2015, Why Democracy is Oppositional, Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press.
- Mill, John Stuart, 1843, A System of Logic, Ratiocinative and Inductive, London: John W. Parker.
- Misak, Cheryl, 2000, Truth, Politics, Morality: A Pragmatist Account of Deliberation, London and New York: Routledge.
- –––, 2013, The American Pragmatists, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2019, “Dewey on the Authority and Legitimacy of the Law”, in Steven Fesmire (ed.), The Oxford Companion to Dewey, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 195–208.
- Mumford, Lewis, 1926, The Golden Day, New York: Horace Liveright, Inc.
- Niebuhr, Reinhold, 1960. Moral Man and Immoral Society: A Study in Ethics and Politics, New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons.
- Pappas, Gregory Fernando, 2008, John Dewey’s Ethics: Democracy as Experience, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
- –––, 2019, “The Starting Point of Dewey’s Ethics and Sociopolitical Philosophy”, in Steven Fesmire (ed.), The Oxford Companion to Dewey, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 235–253.
- Putnam, Hilary, 1992, “A Reconsideration of Deweyan Democracy”, in Renewing Philosophy, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, pp. 180–202.
- Putnam, Hilary, and Putnam, Ruth Anna, 2017, Pragmatism as a Way of Life: The Lasting Legacy of William James and John Dewey, Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press.
- Raber, Michael I., 2020, Knowing Democracy: A Pragmatist Account of the Epistemic Dimension in Democratic Politics, Cham: Springer.
- Renault, Emmanuel, 2017, “Dewey’s Critical Conception of Work”, The Journal of Speculative Philosophy, 31(2): 286–98.
- Rockefeller, Steven C., 1991, John Dewey: Religious Faith and Democratic Humanism, New York: Columbia University Press.
- Rogers, Melvin, 2008, The Undiscovered Dewey: Religion, Morality, and the Ethos of Democracy, New York: Columbia University Press.
- Rondel, David, 2018, Pragmatist Egalitarianism, New York: Oxford University Press.
- Ryan, Alan, 1995, John Dewey and the High Tide of American Liberalism, New York: W. W. Norton and Co.
- –––, 2012, “Staunchly Modern, Non-Bourgeois Liberalism”, in The Making of Modern Liberalism, Princeton: Princeton University Press, pp. 456–72.
- Savage, Daniel M., 2002, John Dewey’s Liberalism: Individuality, Community, and Self-Development, Carbondale and Edwardsville: Southern Illinois University Press.
- Shook, John, 2014, John Dewey’s Social Philosophy: Democracy as Educationd,. New York: Palgrave Macmillan.
- Talisse, Robert, 2011, “A Farewell to Deweyan Democracy”, Political Studies, 59: 509–26.
- –––, 2014, “Pragmatist Political Philosophy”, Philosophy Compass, 9(2): 123–30.
- Tiles, J. E., 1992, John Dewey: Critical Assessments, 4 vols, London: Routledge.
- Welchman, Jennifer, 1995, Dewey’s Ethical Thought, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- Westbrook, Robert B., 1991, John Dewey and American Democracy, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- –––, 2005, Democratic Hope: Pragmatism and the Politics of Hope, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- White, Morton, 1957, Social Thought in America: The Revolt Against Formalism, Boston: Beacon Press.
- Wolin, Sheldon, 2004, Politics and Vision, revised edition, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Zamora, Justo Serrano, 2021, Democratization and Struggles Against Injustice: A Pragmatist Approach to the Epistemic Practices of Social Movements, London: Rowman and Littlefield International.
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