John Dewey

First published Thu Nov 1, 2018

John Dewey (1859–1952) was one of American pragmatism’s early founders, along with Charles Sanders Peirce and William James, and arguably the most prominent American intellectual for the first half of the twentieth century. Dewey’s educational theories and experiments had a global reach, his psychological theories had a sizable influence in that growing science, and his writings about democratic theory and practice deeply influenced debates in academic and practical quarters for decades. In addition, Dewey developed extensive and often systematic views in ethics, epistemology, logic, metaphysics, aesthetics, and philosophy of religion. Because Dewey typically took a genealogical approach that couched his own view within the larger history of philosophy, one may also find a fully developed metaphilosophy in his work.

Dewey’s pragmatism—or, “cultural naturalism”, which he favored over “pragmatism” and “instrumentalism”—may be understood as a critique and reconstruction of philosophy within the larger ambit of a Darwinian worldview (Lamont 1961; MW4: 3). Following James’ lead, Dewey argued that philosophy had become an overly technical and intellectualistic discipline, divorced from assessing the social conditions and values dominating everyday life (FAE, LW5: 157–58). He sought to reconnect philosophy with the mission of education-for-living (philosophy as “the general theory of education”), a form of social criticism at the most general level, or “criticism of criticisms” (EN, LW1: 298; see also DE, MW9: 338).

Set within the larger picture of Darwinian evolutionary theory, philosophy should be seen as an activity undertaken by interdependent organisms-in-environments. This standpoint, of active adaptation, led Dewey to criticize the tendency of traditional philosophies to abstract and reify concepts derived from living contexts. As did other classical pragmatists, Dewey focused criticism upon traditional dualisms of metaphysics and epistemology (e.g., mind/body, nature/culture, self/society, and reason/emotion) and then reconstructed their elements as parts of larger continuities. For example, human thinking is not a phenomenon which is radically outside of (or external to) the world it seeks to know; knowing is not a purely rational attempt to escape illusion in order to discover what is ultimately “real” or “true”. Rather, human knowing is among the ways organisms with evolved capacities for thought and language cope with problems. Minds, then, are not passively observing the world; rather, they are actively adapting, experimenting, and innovating; ideas and theories are not rational fulcrums to get us beyond culture, but rather function experimentally within culture and are evaluated on situated, pragmatic bases. Knowing is not the mortal’s exercise of a “divine spark”, either; for while knowing (or inquiry, to use Dewey’s term) includes calculative or rational elements, it is ultimately informed by the body and emotions of the animal using it to cope.

In addition to academic life, Dewey comfortably wore the mantle of public intellectual, infusing public issues with lessons found through philosophy. He spoke on topics of broad moral significance, such as human freedom, economic alienation, race relations, women’s suffrage, war and peace, human freedom, and educational goals and methods. Typically, discoveries made via public inquiries were integrated back into his academic theories, and aided their revision. This practice-theory-practice rhythm powered every area of Dewey’s intellectual enterprise, and perhaps explains why his philosophical theories are still discussed, criticized, adapted, and deployed in many academic and practical arenas. Use of Dewey’s ideas continues apace in aesthetics and art criticism, education, environmental policy, information theory, journalism, medicine, political theory, psychiatry, public administration, sociology, and of course in the philosophical areas to which Dewey contributed.

1. Biographical Sketch

John Dewey lead an active and multifarious life. He is the subject of numerous biographies and an enormous literature interpreting and evaluating his extraordinary body of work: forty books and approximately seven hundred articles in over one hundred and forty journals.

Dewey was born in Burlington, Vermont on October 20, 1859 to Archibald Dewey, a merchant, and Lucina Rich Dewey. Dewey was the third of four sons; the first, Dewey’s namesake, died in infancy. He grew up in Burlington, was raised in the Congregationalist Church, and attended public schools. After studying Latin and Greek in high school, Dewey entered the University of Vermont at fifteen and graduated in 1879 at nineteen. After college, Dewey taught high school for two years in Oil City, Pennsylvania. Subsequent time spent in Vermont studying philosophy with former professor H.A.P. Torrey, along with the encouragement of the editor of the Journal of Speculative Philosophy, W.T. Harris, helped Dewey decide to attend graduate school in philosophy at Johns Hopkins University in 1882. There, his study included logic with Charles S. Peirce (which Dewey found too “mathematical”, and did not pursue), the history of philosophy (especially with George Sylvester Morris, and physiological and experimental psychology with Granville Stanley Hall (who trained with Wilhelm Wundt in Leipzig and William James at Harvard).[1]

Though many years later Dewey attributed important credit to Peirce’s pragmatism for his mature views, during graduate school, Peirce had no sizable impact. Dewey’s main graduate school influences—Neo-Hegelian idealism, Darwinian biology, and Wundtian experimental psychology—created a tension, which he sought to resolve. Was the world fundamentally biological, functional, and material or was it, rather, inherently creative and spiritual? In no small part, Dewey’s career was launched by his attempt to mediate and harmonize these views. While they shared the idea of “organism”, Dewey also saw in both —- and rejected—any aspects deemed overly abstract, atomizing, or reductionistic. His earliest attempts to create a “new psychology” (aimed at merging experimental psychology with idealism) sought a method by which experience could be understood as integrated and whole. As a result, Dewey’s early approach was a modified, English absolute idealism. Two years after matriculating, Dewey completed graduate school in 1884 with a dissertation criticizing Kant from an Idealist position (“The Psychology of Kant”); it remains lost.

While scholars still debate the degree to which Dewey’s mature philosophy retained early Hegelian influences, it is clear that the personal influence on Dewey was profound. New England’s religious culture, Dewey recalled, imparted an “isolation of self from the world, of soul from body, [and] of nature from God”, and he reacted with “an inward laceration” and “a painful oppression”. His study (with George Sylvester Morris) of British Idealist T.H. Green and G.W.F. Hegel afforded Dewey personal and intellectual healing:

Hegel’s synthesis of subject and object, matter and spirit, the divine and the human, was, however, no mere intellectual formula; it operated as an immense release, a liberation. Hegel’s treatment of human culture, of institutions and the arts, involved the same dissolution of hard-and-fast dividing walls, and had a special attraction for me. (FAE, LW5: 153)

Philosophically, Dewey’s early encounters with Hegelianism informed his career-long quest to integrate, as dynamic wholes, the various dimensions of experience (practical, imaginative, bodily, psychical) that philosophy and psychology had defined as discrete.

Dewey’s family and reputation as a philosopher and psychologist grew while at various universities, including the University of Michigan (1886–88, 1889–1894) and the University of Minnesota (1888–89). At Michigan, Dewey developed long-term professional relationships with James Hayden Tufts and George Herbert Mead. In 1886, Dewey married Harriet Alice Chipman; they had six children and adopted one. Two of the boys died tragically young (two and eight). Chipman had a significant influence on Dewey’s advocacy for women and his shift away from religious orthodoxy. During this period, Dewey wrote articles critical of British idealists from a Hegelian perspective; he read and taught James’ Principles of Psychology (1890), and called his own view “experimental idealism” (1894a, The Study of Ethics, EW4: 264).

In 1894, at Tuft’s urging, President William Rainey Harper offered Dewey the position of head of the Philosophy Department at the University of Chicago, which at that time included both Psychology and Pedagogy. Attracted by the prospect of putting these disciplines into active collaboration, Dewey accepted the offer, and began to build the department by hiring G.H. Mead from Michigan and J.R. Angell, a former student at Michigan (who also studied with James at Harvard). Dubbed, by James, the “Chicago School” Dewey along with Tufts, Angell, Mead and several others develop “psychological functionalism”. He also published the seminal “Reflex Arc Concept in Psychology” (1896, EW5; hereafter RAC), and broke from transcendental idealism and from his church.

At Chicago, Dewey founded The Laboratory School, which provided a site to test his psychological and educational theories. Dewey’s wife Alice was the school’s principal from 1896–1904. Dewey became active in Chicago’s social and political causes, including Jane Addams’ Hull House, and Addams became a close personal friend of the Dewey’s. Dewey and his daughter and biographer Jane Dewey credited Addams with helping him develop his views on democracy, education, and philosophy; nevertheless, the significance of Dewey’s intellectual debt to Addams is still being uncovered (“Biography of John Dewey”, Dewey 1939a; see also Seigfried 1999, Fischer 2013).

In 1904, conflicts related to the Laboratory School lead Dewey to resign his Chicago positions and move to the philosophy department at Columbia University in New York City; there, he also established an affiliation with Columbia’s Teacher’s College. Among Dewey’s important influences at Columbia were F.J.E. Woodbridge, Wendell T. Bush, W.P. Montague, Charles A. Beard (political theory) and Franz Boas (anthropology). Dewey remained at Columbia until retirement 1930, going on to produce eleven more books.

In addition to a raft of important academic publications, Dewey wrote for many non-academic audiences, notably via the New Republic; he was active in leading, supporting, or founding a number of important organizations including the American Civil Liberties Union, the American Association of University Professors, the American Philosophical Association, the American Psychological Association, and the New School for Social Research. Dewey was spoke out in support of both progressive politics and social change during the first part of the twentieth century. His renown as a philosopher and educator lead to numerous invitations; he inaugurated the Paul Carus Lectures (revised and published as Experience and Nature, 1925), gave the 1928 Gifford Lectures (revised and published as The Quest for Certainty, 1929), and gave the 1933–34 Terry Lectures at Yale (published as A Common Faith, 1934a). He traveled for two years in Japan and China, and also made notable trips to Turkey, Mexico, the Soviet Union, and South Africa.

In 1946, almost two decades after Alice Chipman Dewey died (1927), Dewey married Roberta Lowitz Grant. John Dewey died of pneumonia in his home in New York City on June 1, 1952.

Short Chronology of the Life and Work of John Dewey

Source: H&A 1998, xiv

  • 1859 Oct. 20. Born in Burlington, Vermont
  • 1879 Receives A.B. from the University of Vermont
  • 1879–81 Teaches at high school in Oil City, Pennsylvania
  • 1881–82 Teaches at Lake View Seminary, Charlotte, Vermont
  • 1882–84 Attends graduate school at Johns Hopkins University
  • 1884 Receives Ph.D. from Johns Hopkins University
  • 1884 Instructor in the Department of Philosophy at the University of Michigan
  • 1886 Married to Alice Chipman
  • 1888–89 Professor of Philosophy at the University of Minnesota
  • 1889 Chair of Department of Philosophy at the University of Michigan
  • 1894 Professor and Chair of Department of Philosophy (including psychology and pedagogy) at the University of Chicago
  • 1897 Elected to Board of Trustees, Hull-House Association
  • 1899 The School and Society
  • 1889–1900 President of the American Psychological Association; Studies in Logical Theory
  • 1904 Professor of Philosophy at Columbia University
  • 1905–06 President of the American Philosophical Society
  • 1908 Ethics
  • 1910 How We Think
  • 1916 The Influence of Darwin on Philosophy, Democracy and Education, Essays in Experimental Logic
  • 1919 Lectures in Japan
  • 1919–21 Lectures in China
  • 1920 Reconstruction in Philosophy
  • 1922 Human Nature and Conduct
  • 1924 Visits schools in Turkey
  • 1925 Experience and Nature
  • 1926 Visits schools in Mexico
  • 1927 The Public and its Problems
  • 1927 Death of Alice Chipman Dewey
  • 1928 Visits schools in Soviet Russia
  • 1929 The Quest for Certainty
  • 1930 Individualism, Old and New
  • 1930 Retires from position at Columbia University, appointed Professor Emeritus
  • 1932 Ethics
  • 1934 A Common Faith, Art as Experience
  • 1935 Liberalism and Social Action
  • 1937 Chair of the Trotsky Commission, Mexico City
  • 1938 Logic: The Theory of Inquiry, Experience and Education
  • 1939 Freedom and Culture, Theory of Valuation
  • 1946 Married to Roberta (Lowitz) Grant; Knowing and the Known
  • 1952 June 1. Dies in New York City

2. Psychology

Dewey’s involvement with psychology began early, with the hope that this emerging discipline would provide answers to philosophy’s deepest questions. His early approach was akin to Hegelian Idealism, though, markedly, it did not incorporate Hegel’s dialectical logic but instead sought to incorporate new methods in psychology (Alexander forthcoming). He wished to overcome longstanding divisions (between subject and object, matter and spirit, etc.) and show how human experiences —physical, psychical, practical, and imaginative —were all integrated in one, dynamic person (FAE, LW5: 153). Dewey had large ambitions for psychology as the new science of self-consciousness, calling it the “completed method of philosophy” (“Psychology as Philosophic Method”, EW1: 157). Although nominally a textbook, Psychology (1887 EW2) was an introduction to psychology’s study of the self as ultimate reality.

Soon, Dewey began developing his own psychological theories; extant accounts of behavior, he argued, were flawed because they were premised upon outdated and false philosophical assumptions. (He eventually judged that larger questions about the meaning of human existence reached deep into cultural practices and exceeded the resources of psychology; such questions required philosophical investigations of experience in the fields of art, politics, ethics, and religion, etc.) Dewey’s psychological work reconstructed the components of human conduct (instincts, perceptions, habits, acts, emotions, and conscious thought) and these proved integral to later, mature statements about experience. They also informed his lifelong contention that mind, contrary to long tradition, is not fundamentally subjective and isolated, but social and interactive, made through natural and cultural environments.

2.1 Associationism, Introspectionism, and Physiological Psychology

Dewey entered the field of psychology while it was dominated by introspectionism (arising from associationism, a.k.a., “mentalism”) and the newer physiological psychology (imported from Germany). Earlier British empiricists, such as John Locke and David Hume, accounted for intelligent behavior with (1) internally inspected (“introspected”) entities, including perceptual experiences (e.g., “impressions”), and (2) thoughts or ideas (e.g., “images”). These accrue toward intelligence by way of an elaborate process of associative learning. Discovery-by-introspection was indispensable for many empiricists, and for many physiological and experimental psychologists (e.g., Wundt) as well.

Dewey was deeply influenced by his graduate school study of physiological psychology with G. Stanley Hall; classes included theoretical, physiological, and experimental psychology; he conducted laboratory experiments on attention. Unlike introspectionism, Hall’s methods incorporated strict experimental controls, and this biology-based approach promised Dewey an organic and holistic model of experience capable of overcoming the subjectivist dualisms plaguing the older, associationist models.[2] However, Dewey still found physiological psychology retaining an atomized and mechanistic view of experience based on “sense data”. From his Hegelian perspective, this psychology could never account for the wider world of lived meanings, the socio-cultural environment. In other words, “organism” entailed “environment”, and “environment” entailed “culture”. A rigorously empirical psychology could not merely study “the” mind, but had to forge connections with other sciences.[3]

2.2 The “Reflex Arc” and Dewey’s Reconstruction of Psychology

Thus, Dewey sought an account of psychological experience mindful both of experimental limits and culture’s pervasive influences. William James’s tour de force, The Principles of Psychology (1890), modeled how he might explain the conscious and intelligent self without appeals to a transcendental Absolute. As Dewey recalled, Principles’ emphatically biological conception of mind gave his thinking “a new direction and quality” and “worked its way more and more into all my ideas and acted as a ferment to transform old beliefs” (FAE, LW5: 157). Rather than measuring psychic phenomena against preexisting abstractions, James showed how one might employ a “radical empiricism” that starts from the phases and elements of actual, lived experience. The goal would be to understand experience’s functional origins from a perspective that was, typically, coherent and whole.

One expression of Dewey’s early psychology (and Jamesean turn) was his seminal critique of the reflex arc concept (1896), written at Chicago. The “reflex arc” model of behavior was an increasingly influential way to explain human behavior empirically and experimentally using stimulus-response (cause-effect) pairings; it sought to displace other, less observable and testable approaches that relied upon “psychic entities” or “mental substance”. In the reflex arc model, a passive organism encounters an external stimulus causing a sensory and motor response; for example, a child sees a candle (stimulus), grasps it (response), burns her hand (stimulus), and pulls her hand back (response). This, it argued, makes explicit the event’s basic stimuli and responses, replete with connections satisfactorily describable in mechanistic and physiological terms—and all without recourse to mysterious and unobservable entities.

Dewey criticized the reflex arc framework on several grounds. First, events (sensory stimulus, central response, and act) are artificially separated for the purpose of analysis. “The reflex arc”, Dewey wrote, “is not a comprehensive, or organic unity, but a patchwork of disjointed parts, a mechanical conjunction of unallied processes” (RAC, EW5: 97). Second, the model falsifies the nature of genuine interaction; organisms do not passively receive stimuli and then actively respond; rather, organisms continuously interact with environments in cumulative and modifying ways. The child who encounters a candle is already actively exploring, anticipating a room, for example; noticing the flame modifies already ongoing actions. “The real beginning is with the act of seeing; it is looking, and not a sensation of light” (RAC, EW5: 97). Third, and relatedly, the model is too rigid in designating certain events as the stimulus or the response—in a word, it “reifies” them. Because events studied are enmeshed in a wider, ongoing activity matrix, other designations (of “cause” or “event”) could be plausible, contingent on the aims of some other experimental inquiry. Effectively, Dewey pointed out how the reflex arc model, intending to shed metaphysical assumptions, had inadvertently imported new and different ones. We are seeking to discover, Dewey wrote, “what stimulus or sensation, what movement and response mean” and we are finding that “they mean distinctions of flexible function only, not of fixed existence” (RAC, EW5: 102; emphasis mine). This suggestion is pragmatic; it says, rather than seeking an underlying reality (pure stimulus, pure response), look to meanings. In doing so, it is evident that terms such as stimulus, response, sensation, and movement “mean distinctions of flexible function only, not of fixed existence” (RAC, EW5: 102). The meaning of terms is grasped by recognizing their functions as acts in a wider, dynamic context which includes aims and interests.[4]

Dewey’s critique and reconstruction of the reflex arc presaged other important developments in his pragmatism. His argument that psychology needed to pay greater attention to context and function was applied, in time, to all the sciences, as well as to logic and mathematics. The methodological lesson was, in effect, a warning not to mistake eventual outcomes of analysis for existents already there.[5] Theoretical distinctions which are meaningful in specific situations depend upon a wider context that is both retrospective and prospective.

While there is not space to present Dewey’s extensive reconstruction of the phenomena psychology considered permanent parts of human beings, a cursory review can show his philosophical method at work. Let us consider instincts/impulses, perceptions, sensations, habits, emotions, sentiency, consciousness, and mind.

2.3 Instincts/Impulses

Attempts to explain complex, developed behavior by reference to preexisting impulses and instincts had already been attacked by James (e.g., in “Habit”, James 1890: chapter 4) and Dewey continued the assault. Such explanations fail to consider instinct’s plastic and pliable character. Across a variety of individuals, instincts considered simple or basic are anything but—they blossom into many different habits and customs.[6] They also fail to see that instincts are not pushing an essentially passive creature, but are actively taken up in diverse circumstances, for diverse purposes. As with “stimulus”, the meaning of any “instinct” depends on contextual factors, which can include both biological and socio-linguistic responses. But, in a phrase, there is no psychology without social psychology, no possible inquiry into pure, biological instincts (or any other “natural” powers) which does not also consider both the social and environmental context of the phenomena studied and the inquiry’s own context. Instincts/impulses are interactive phenomena-in-environment, and must be appreciated as transactions (HNC, MW14: 66).

2.4 Perception/Sensation

Dewey’s methodological lesson regarding instincts was twofold; first, one cannot premise an empirical science on unquestioned, metaphysical posits; even basic terms must be open to revision or deletion; second, strictly analytical methods using simple elements to build up complex behavior are often inadequate to explain the meaning of psychological phenomena. This lesson also applies to perception and sensation. Dewey attacked the view, common in his day, that a perception (1) was simply and externally caused, (2) completely occupied a mental state, and (3) was passively received into an empty mental space.

All three elements, he argued, grow out of “psychophysical dualism”, the erroneous and radical separation of perceiver and world. Consider (1), external causation. Perception as simply and externally caused is contravened by the Darwinian, ecological model where ongoing interactions between organism and environment include, but are not ontologically reducible to, “minds”, “bodies”, and their impingements—the so-called “impressions” and “ideas” of modern philosophy. While there are events which are unbidden, surprising, or not under our control, this does not justify the metaphysical conclusion of a world “out there” and a mind “in here”. While experience is profoundly qualitative, qualities are never merely received (like packages in the mail) nor are they simple or context-free. This is, in effect, a new view of qualities that also rejects a longstanding dualism between “objective” and “subjective”. A lemon’s “yellowness” or “tartness” are neither in a perceiver nor in a lemon; either quality emerges from complex interactions and later become characterized (as “tartness”) for reasons germane to the inquiry making that designation. Dewey wrote,

The qualities never were ‘in’ the organism; they always were qualities of interactions in which both extra-organic things and organisms partake. (EN, LW1: 198–199)

Thus, perceptions and qualities are discriminations made in inquiry and language; they are not reports of ontological entities which are simple, ultimate, or discrete. Always, pragmatic factors are decisive. (Dewey makes the same point about nouns and concepts; cf. W.V.O. Quine’s example of “gavagai”.) “Perception”, then, is shorthand for the more complicated processes of interacting events. “Red” is an abstraction from more complex experiences (such as red-car-merging-into-my-lane), and the pragmatic question becomes, What is the function of this abstraction? How does it mediate thought or action for future experiences? (“A Naturalistic Theory of Sense-Perception”, LW2: 51; EN, LW1: 198–199)

Regarding (2), perceptions pervading mental states, Dewey echoes an important point made by James in “The Stream of Thought” (James 1890: chapter 9). Namely, while a perception may occupy the focus of awareness, each has an attendant “fringe” which contributes a contrast and, to the wider situation, an “underlying qualitative character” (“Qualitative Thought”, LW5: 238 fn. 1). In the lemon case, above, the “tartness” has its character amidst a slew of “fringe” conditions such as immediate past flavors, anticipations, etc.

Finally, regarding (3), as mentioned, perception is an activity of “taking up” by organisms already functioning in situations, not an instant, passive apprehension of stimulus. As such, there are always selective adjustments; quick or slow, they always take some time. Perception is never naïve, never a confrontation with some “given” content already imbued with inherent meaning. Long before Wilfred Sellars (see entry on Sellars) dismissed the passive-perception-encounter as modern empiricism’s “Myth of the Given”, Dewey rebuked such claims. All seeing is seeing as—adjustments within larger acts. Over time, these habits of adjustment change and, as a result, what is perceived can also shift; subsequent selections and interpretations are modified (DE, MW9: 346).

2.5 Acts and Habits

Later writings develop the argument of “Reflex Arc”, namely that complex behavior cannot be explained by building up simpler constituents. “Acts” provide a better starting point, of organisms in environments (HNC, MW14: 105). Acts are transactional: we act with and on things, in contexts, amidst conditions. Acts are fundamental to understanding behavior because they are selective. By directing movement and organizing situations, they manifest interest. This combination—of selectivity and interest—make activities meaningful. For example, our ancestors acted selectively regarding how to satisfy instinctive hunger; such selectivity created the conditions for a more elaborate interest in the taste of food, and, much later, in dining customs and cuisine.

Drawing upon James’ and Peirce’s uses of “habit”, Dewey integrates habit deeply into his philosophy. Habit helps explain various dimensions of human experience (biological, ethical, political, and aesthetic) as manifested in complex and social behaviors—walking, talking, cooking, conversing.[7] Habits are not simple; they are composed of acts. Acts unfold in time, beginning with instinct borne of need and muddling toward reintegration and satisfaction. To become a habit, an act-series must possess gradual and cumulative change; such change concresces as one act leads to the next. When there is a cumulative linking of acts which structure experience, there is “habit”. Habit, Dewey wrote, “is an acquired predisposition to ways or modes of response, not to particular acts” (HNC, MW14: 32). These ways are typically shaped by both past experience as an individual and especially through social and linguistic interactions; we call habits shared by groups “customs”.

While habits may become routines, Dewey argued against the assumption that they were therefore automatic or insulated from conscious intervention. They cannot be automatic, because new situations vary, and the same exact acts never repeat. Thus, unlike machine routines, organic habits remain plastic, changeable. My habitual eating of sweets is subject to contingency (a sharp toothache) and modification (restraint, substitution); frequently, conscious reflection on an existing habit is the first stage of habit revision.

Habits were also envisioned as dormant powers, waiting to be invoked. Dewey argued that habits are, instead, “energetic and dominating ways of acting” determining what we do and are: “All habits are demands for certain kinds of activity; and they constitute the self” (HNC, MW14: 22, 21). Dewey inveighed against the notion that habits are like individual possessions. Rather, habits exist as transactions between organisms and environments; they are not “inner forces” but functions which make adaptation or reconstruction possible.

Habits enter into the constitution of the situation; they are in and of it, not, so far as it is concerned, something outside of it. (“Brief Studies in Realism”, MW6: 120)

Because the situation is cultural as well as bio-physical, habits are ineliminably social. So-called “individual” habits emerge within the social world of friends, family, home, work, media, etc. This means that effecting a change of habits does not require a magical act of sheer willpower, but rather intelligent inquiry into relevant conditions (psychological, sociological, economic, etc.).

2.6 Emotion

Like “habit”, Dewey redescribed “emotion” as a basic form of involvement present in “coordinated circuits” of activity. Where habits are controlled responses to problematic situations, emotion, by contrast, is not predominantly controlled or organized; rather, it is an organism’s resonance with a situation, a “perturbation from clash or failure of habit” (HNC, MW14: 54). As with the other aspects of psychological life, Dewey’s account reconstructed emotion as fundamentally transactional with other experiences typically analyzed as discrete (the “rational” or “physical” dimensions, e.g.).

Dewey’s account connected those of Charles Darwin and William James. Darwin argued that internal emotional states cause organic expressions which, depending on their survival value, may be subject to natural selection; for example, my feeling and expression of emotion may earn sympathy that aids survival of like-feeling offspring. James, in contrast, sought to decrease the distance between emotion and accompanying bodily expression. In actual cases of emotion, a perception excites a pre-organized physiological mechanism; our recognition of such changes just is the emotional experience: “we feel sorry because we cry, angry because we strike” (James 1890 [1981: 450]). Dewey’s “The Theory of Emotion” (1894b & 1895, EW4) pressed James further, toward the integrated whole of feeling-and-expression. Being sad is not merely feeling sad or acting sad but is the purposive organism’s overall experience. This is Dewey’s attempt to gently correct James’ unfortunate reiteration of mind-body dualism. To understand emotion, Dewey argued, we must see that “the mode of behavior is the primary thing” (“The Theory of Emotion”, EW4: 174). As with habit, emotion is not the private possession of the subject, but rather emerges from the fluid boundary connecting event and organism; emotion is “called out by objects, physical and personal”, an intentional “response to an objective situation” (EN, LW1: 292). If I encounter a strange dog and I am perplexed as to how to react, there is an inhibition of habit, and this excites emotion. As I entertain a range of incompatible responses (Run? Call out? Slink away?), a tension is created which further interrupts and inhibits habits, and is experienced as emotion (“The Theory of Emotion”, EW4: 182) Thus, emotions are intentional insofar as they are “to or from or about something objective, whether in fact or in idea” and not merely reactions “in the head” (AE, LW10: 72).

Philosophically, emotion is a central feature of Dewey’s critique of traditional epistemology and metaphysics. He decried traditional systems which, in their pursuit of rational access to truth and reality, create an invidious distinction by casting emotion as confused thought, distraction, or bodily interference which needs to be suppressed, controlled, or bracketed. Emotion is intertwined, psychologically, both in the individual (in reasoning and acting), and in the wider culture (with social forms of meaning creation). Attempts to balkanize emotion are motivated in part, he argued, by the desire to segregate leisure from labor, men from women; on this reading, the traditional rationalistic bent is, in effect, a power-play that deserves intellectual and moral critique.

2.7 Sentiency, Mind, and Consciousness

Dewey’s accounts of sentiency, mind, and consciousness build upon those of impulse, perception, act, habit, and emotion. These are complex topics, but a cursory view can complete this sketch of Dewey’s psychology.


As with other psychic phenomena, sentience emerges through the transactions of organisms in natural environments. In general, creatures seek to satisfy needs and escape peril; when stability yields to precariousness, a struggle to reestablish balance begins; there is adjustment to self, to one’s environment, or both. Methods successful in the past, pre-organized responses, sometimes fail. In such cases, we become ambivalent—divided against ourselves about what to do next. It proves advantageous to inhibit practiced responses (to look before leaping); this pause or inhibition of the action flow creates a space which, Dewey wrote, “introduces mental confusion, but also, in need for redirection, opportunity for observation, recollection, anticipation” (EN, LW1: 237). In other words, inhibition creates ambivalence, and ambivalence makes possible new ways of considering alternatives; crude, physical situations take on qualitatively new complexities of meaning. Thus, Dewey wrote, sentiency or feeling

is in general a name for the newly actualized quality acquired by events previously occurring upon a physical level, when these events come into more extensive and delicate relationships of interaction. (EN, LW1: 204)

At this stage, the new relationships are not yet known; they do, however, provide the conditions for knowing. Symbolization, language, is the next step in liberating these noticed relationships using intellectual tools including abstraction, memory, and imagination (EN, LW1: 199).


Dewey rejected both traditional accounts of mind-as-substance (or container) and more contemporary schemes reducing mind to brain states (EN, LW1: 224–225). Rather, mind is activity, a range of dynamic processes of interaction between organism and world. Consider the range connoted by mind: as memory (I am reminded of X); attention (I keep her in mind, I mind my manners); purpose (I have an aim in mind); care or solicitude (I mind the child); paying heed (I mind the traffic stop). “Mind”, then, ranges over many activities: intellectual, affectional, volitional, or purposeful. It is

primarily a verb…[that] denotes every mode and variety of interest in, and concern for, things: practical, intellectual, and emotional. It never denotes anything self-contained, isolated from the world of persons and things, but is always used with respect to situations, events, objects, persons and groups. (AE, LW10: 267–68)

As Wittgenstein (entry on Wittgenstein, section on rule-following and private language) pointed out 30 years later, no private language (see entry on private language) is possible given this account of meaning. While meanings might be privately entertained, they are not privately invented; meanings are social and emerge from symbol systems arising through collective communication and action (EN, LW1: 147).

Active, complex animals are sentient due to the variety of distinctive connections they have with their environment. But “mentality” (mindfulness) arises due to the eventual ability to recognize and use meaningful signs. With language, creatures can identify and differentiate feelings as feelings, objects as objects, etc.

Without language, the qualities of organic action that are feelings are pains, pleasures, odors, colors, noises, tones, only potentially and proleptically. With language they are discriminated and identified. They are then “objectified”; they are immediate traits of things. (EN, LW1: 198)

The bull’s charge is stimulated by the red flag, but unlike the driver ignoring a broken red stoplight, the bull cannot detach “red” as a sign; it remains a crude stimulus.

Dewey thus demoted and promoted the mind’s significance. No longer our spark of divinity, as some ancients held, it is also rescued from merely being a ghost in a machine. Mind becomes vital, investigating and addressing problems, and inventing new tools, aims, and ideals. Mind bridges past and future, an “agency of novel reconstruction of a pre-existing order” (EN, LW1: 168).


Like mind, consciousness is also a verb—the brisk transitioning of felt, qualitative events. Dewey was profoundly influenced by James’s metaphor of consciousness as a constantly moving “stream of thought” (FAE, LW5: 157). In the end, however, Dewey did not believe a fully adequate account of consciousness could be captured in words. Talk about consciousness is elliptical—it is “vivid” or “conspicuous” or “dull”—and such characterizations are never quite adequate. Because the experience of consciousness is ever-evanescent, we cannot fix it as we do for the objects of our attention—as, for example, “powers”, “things”, or “causes”. Dewey, then, did not define consciousness, but evoked it using contrasts and instances. Consider these contrasts in Experience and Nature, (EN, LW1: 230)

Mind is Consciousness is
A whole system of meanings as embodied in organic life Awareness or perception of meanings (of actual events in their meaning)
Contextual and persistent: a constant background Focal and transitive
Structural and substantial: a constant foreground A punctuated series of heres and nows
Enduring luminosity Intermittent flashes of varying intensities
A continuous transmission of messages The occasional interception and singling out of a message that makes it audible

Given the processual, active nature of our psychology, Dewey was forced to depict consciousness with a dynamic, organismic vocabulary. Consciousness is thinking-in-motion, an ever-reconfiguring event series that is qualitatively felt as experience transforms. Whereas mind is a “stock” of meanings, consciousness is realization-and-reconstruction of meanings, enabling activities to be reorganized and redirected (EN, LW1: 233). Consciousness is drama; mind is the indispensable back story. This back story is not radically subjective; it is social, constituted by communities past and present.

Dewey also tried to get at consciousness performatively, so to speak; he provoked the reader to consider the nature of consciousness while reading. Here, again, he utilized notions of “focus” and “fringe”, emphasizing how the latter is indispensable for mental orientation (EN, LW1: 231). As physical balance controls walking, mind’s meanings constantly adjust and direct present, focal interpretation. The progressive advance of vivid consciousness is enabled by mind’s pervasive and persistent system of meanings.

Having concluded this review of Dewey’s psychology, we turn now to his account of experience.

3. Experience and Metaphysics

3.1 The Development of “Experience”

Dewey’s notion of “experience” evolved over the course of his career. Initially, it contributed to his idealism and psychology. After he developed instrumentalism in Chicago during the 1890’s, Dewey moved to Columbia, revising and expanding the concept in 1905 with a historically significant essay, “The Postulate of Immediate Empiricism” (PIE, MW3). Further developments show up in “The Subject-matter of Metaphysical Inquiry” (1915, MW8) and the “Introduction” to Essays in Experimental Logic (1916, MW10) which consolidated and advanced his view that “experience” was more than just way to rebut subjectivism in psychology, but was also factored into metaphysical accounts of existence and nature (Dykhuizen 1973: 175–76). Dewey advanced this in the1923 Carus Lectures, revised and expanded in his metaphysical magnum opus, Experience and Nature (1925, revised edition, 1929; EN, LW1). Many other significant elaborations on experience follow, notably in Art as Experience (1934b, AE, LW10).[8] Because experience is pivotal across his philosophical oeuvre, interested readers should track its functions in other sections of this entry; here, experience is treated concisely, with a focus upon Dewey’s philosophical method and metaphysics.

To begin, why was experience such an important concept that it penetrated Dewey’s very approach to philosophy? Keep three influences in mind. First, recall that Dewey inherited from Darwin the idea of nature as a complex congeries of changing, transactional processes without fixed ends; in this context, experience means the undergoing and doing of organisms-in-environments, “a matter of functions and habits, of active adjustments and readjustments, of coordinations and activities, rather than of states of consciousness” (“A Short Catechism Concerning Truth”, MW6: 5). Second, recall that Dewey took from James a radically empirical approach to philosophy—the insistence that perspectival experience, including that called personal, emotional, or temperamental, was philosophically relevant and worth factoring into abstract and logical theories. Finally, recall that Dewey accepted from Hegel experience as manifested in particular social, historical, and cultural modes. Not only is the self constituted through experiential transactions with the community, but this recognition vitiates the Cartesian model of the simple, atomic self and methods based upon that presumption. Philosophy may start where we start, personally — with complex, symbolic, and cultural forms—and then articulate further emergences from them.

These three major influences, plus Dewey’s own discoveries, convinced him that “experience” was the linch-pin to a broader theory of nature and humanity’s axiological place within it. More than just another node in a system, experience also amounted to a metaphilosophical method, a way of doing philosophy. Within this Weltanschauung, philosophy was not a rational bridge to transcend life, but was equipment for living. Thus, clarifying what experience meant assumed the greatest importance, insofar as this was vital to philosophy earning back its status as a wisdom which might aid survival, growth, and flourishing.

It should be noted that “experience”, both as sheer terminology and as Dewey deployed the concept, generated much confusion and debate. Dewey recognized this and commented about it toward the end of his life.[9] Decades later, one of the Dewey’s foremost philosophical celebrants, Richard Rorty, lambasted Dewey for both the term and (what Rorty perceived as) Dewey’s intentions.[10] (Rorty 1977, 1995, 2006) Nevertheless, since the term lives on, both in Dewey’s work and in everyday discourse, it deserves continued analysis.

3.2 Traditional Views of Experience and Dewey’s Critique

Understanding Dewey’s view of experience requires, first, some notion of what he rejected. It was typical for many philosophers to construe experience narrowly, as the private contents of consciousness. These contents might be perceptions (sensing), or reflections (calculating, associating, imagining) done by the subjective mind. Some, such as Plato and Descartes, denigrated experience as a flux which confused or diverted rational inquiry. Others, such as Hume and Locke, thought that experience (as atomic sensations) provided the mind at least some resources for knowing, albeit with reduced ambitions. Both general philosophical approaches agreed that percepts and concepts were different and in tension; they agreed that sensation was perspectival and context-relative; they also agreed that this relativity problematized the assumed mission of philosophy—to know with certainty—and differed only about the degree of the problem.

Dewey disputed the shared empiricist conviction that sensations are categorically separable contents of consciousness. This belief, he argued, produced a “whole epistemological industry” devoted to solving the general problem of “correspondence” and a host of specific puzzles (about the existence of an external world, other minds, free will, etc.) (“Propositions, Warranted Assertibility, and Truth”, LW14: 179). This “industry” isolates philosophy from empirically informed accounts of experience and from pressing, practical problems. Regarding the phenomenon of mental privacy, Dewey argued that while we have episodes of what might be called mental interiority, it is a later human development. “Personality, selfhood, subjectivity, are eventual functions that emerge with complexly organized interactions, organic and social” (EN, LW1: 162; see also 178–79). Regarding sensorial atomicity, discussed previously in the section on psychology, Dewey explained sensation as embedded in a larger sensori-motor circuit, a transaction which should not be quarantined to any single phase—nor to consciousness. Sensation emerges dynamically from the engagements of minds, bodies, and their environments, where “environments” includes human language and culture. (Consider, as evidence of how blurry the boundaries between “sensation” and “culture” can be, how differently food tastes in varying circumstances and cultures.)

Dewey levied similar criticisms against traditional accounts of reflective thought. Mind is neither static nor a substance which stands, somehow, apart from the body—or from history, from culture. Reasoning is one function of mind, not the product of a separate “faculty”, and not “purified” of feeling. Rather, reasoning is always permeated with both feelings and practical exigencies. While it can help to “bracket out” a feeling or exigency scrambling a present calculation, it is nevertheless true that reasoning subsists in a wider “qualitative world”, one that “forms the field of characteristic modes of thinking, characteristic in that thought is definitely regulated by qualitative considerations” (“Psychology and Work”, LW5: 243).

3.3 Dewey’s Positive Account of Experience

So far, these details, and the section on psychology, limn an outline of Dewey’s view: experience is processual, transactional, socially mediated, and not categorically prefigured as “rational” or “emotional”. Here are three additional, positive characterizations: first, experience as experimental; second, experience as primary (“had”) vs. secondary (“known”); and third, experience as methodological for philosophy.

First, experience exhibits a fundamentally experimental character. This was impressed upon Dewey in a variety of his educational roles. Children’s experiences involve alternating phases: acting and being acted upon. Such phases become “experimental” when agents consciously relate what is tried with what eventuates and eventually understand which actions are significant for controlling future events. “Learning” is the name for the outcome of experience as experimental.[11]

Second, as shown, Dewey did not think experience was primarily known or reflective; much is “felt” or “had”. Dewey calls such experience direct, primary, or had. Had experience is barely regulated or reflected upon, whereas other experience is characterized by “knowing” or mediation-by-reflection; Dewey labels such experiences “indirect”, “secondary”, or “known”. Known experience abstracts away from had (or direct) experience in purposeful and selective ways; knowing isolates certain relations or connections. Dewey’s The Quest for Certainty provides a cogent description:

[E]xperienced situations come about in two ways and are of two distinct types. Some take place with only a minimum of regulation, with little foresight, preparation and intent. Others occur because, in part, of the prior occurrence of intelligent action. Both kinds are had; they are undergone, enjoyed or suffered. The first are not known; they are not understood; they are dispensations of fortune or providence. The second have, as they are experienced, meanings that present the funded outcome of operations that substitute definite continuity for experienced discontinuity and for the fragmentary quality due to isolation. (QC, LW4: 194)[12]

Dewey’s had/known distinction is a way of describing existence without presupposing a dualism between appearance/reality. Much in experience is unknown to us without being illusory or merely apparent; we are not trapped in a cave full of illusions with only rational dialectic to yank us upwards. Rather, we engage and cope with a world which is not completely meaningful. We strive to make the world more meaningful, but while some of the meanings devised assist in prediction and control of circumstances, others are simply enjoyed—but that does not make them less real.

Third, experience was also considered a “method”. This requires some unpacking.

Dewey’s distinction between experience “had” and “known” was more than just a phenomenological observation; it was a metaphilosophical directive regarding how philosophy, itself, should be done. For experience is not just “stuff” presented to or witnessed by consciousness; rather, experience is activity, engagement with life. Philosophy, too, is a form of activity—which means that we need to do philosophy differently; we need pay attention to where and how we start; in this sense, experience is a method.[13]

One might sensibly ask,

If Dewey says that experience happens in both primary (felt, had) and secondary (reflective, known) ways, why not start with theory? Is that not experience, too?

Dewey’s reply would be that while theory is one kind of experiencing, it is not where we start; theory is an intermediate phase of inquiry. As we live our lives, we confront problems which invoke the need for inquiry and, often, there is a need to devise a tool of explanation and amelioration. Theory is that tool, generated by these encounters; it does not come first. “The vine of pendant theory”, Dewey wrote, “is attached at both ends to the pillars of observed subject-matter” (EN, LW1: 11; see also 386).

As did James and Peirce before him, Dewey challenged not only the theories of previous philosophers, but the assumptions informing their methods. For generations, philosophers started their philosophical examinations with various theoretical conceptions—“substances”, “mind vs. body”, “pleasure as natural aim”, and so on. In his philosophical work, Dewey criticized any number of these presuppositions, but here his point is metaphilosophical—how these conceptions enter into the practice of philosophy as presuppositions. Too often philosophy puts the (theoretical) cart before the (practical) horse. We simply cannot know—and should not assume—which terms and theories are necessary for an analysis of a novel situation. Nevertheless, much philosophy has assumed such necessities. We may call this the assumption of a “theoretical starting point”. It has produced endless dialectical exchanges; it has caricatured and hollowed out many complex and changeable subject matters. Overall, it has isolated philosophy from a more thoroughgoing empiricism which could engage with humanity’s most important problems.

Dewey’s suggestion of “experience as method” method, then, is both a warning and a positive recommendation. It warns philosophers to recognize that while intellectual terms may seem “original, primitive and simple” they should be understood as the historically and normatively situated “products of discrimination and classification” (EN, LW1: 386; see also 371–372, 375). “Knowing” is not an activity standing somehow beyond experience or nature; it is an activity with its own standpoint and qualitative character. Intellectual products come, then, from earlier inquiries, which possessed their own parameters and purposes. Whatever theory is eventually devised for a new situation—and Dewey is not against theory, to be very clear—it must be checked against ordinary experience (EN, LW1: 26).

Dewey’s proposed method—the experiential starting point—is not just another philosophical “move”, but a radical attempt to philosophize from what Ortega y Gasset calls “the shaken confines of our own life” and what Douglas Browning calls “bedrock” (Ortega y Gasset 1957: 40; Browning 1998: 74).[14] Dewey wrote,

The experiential or denotative method tells us that we must go behind the refinements and elaborations of reflective experience to the gross and compulsory things of our doings, enjoyments and sufferings—to the things that force us to labor, that satisfy needs, that surprise us with beauty, that compel obedience under penalty. (EN, LW1: 375–76)

Such a method is truly critical, because it forces inquirers to check previous interpretations and judgments against their live encounters in a new situation (EN, LW1: 364). This entails that philosophy as a practice impose upon itself a much more radical and dynamic model of theorizing, one pressed into much closer transactions with existing practices and problems. This imposition, in turn, forces philosophy to engage with new subject matters (and theories), beyond the traditional “problems of philosophy”, and to embrace the idea that “the starting point is the actually problematic” (EN, LW1: 61).

3.4 Metaphysics

Much which is central to Dewey’s metaphysics has been discussed—the transactional organism-environment setting, mind, consciousness, and experience. Accordingly, this section will focus on the development of Dewey’s conception of “metaphysics”, the main project in Experience and Nature, how a so-called empirical metaphysics intended to reconnect with the ancient idea of philosophy as wisdom, and finally it will sketch some of the criticisms Dewey’s metaphysics received.

3.5 The Development of “Metaphysics”

Debate over a definite meaning for the term “metaphysics”, was just as alive in Dewey’s day as in ours. From the beginning, Dewey sought to critique and reconstruct metaphysical concepts (e.g., reality, self, consciousness, time, necessity, and individuality) and systems (e.g., Spinoza, Leibniz, Kant, and Hegel). Like his fellow pragmatists Peirce, James, and Mead, Dewey sought to transform not eradicate metaphysics. As described earlier, Dewey’s early metaphysical views were closest to idealism, but engagements with experimental science and instrumentalism convinced him to abandon traditional metaphysics’ project of giving an ultimate and complete account of reality überhaupt.

His dormant interest in metaphysics was revivified at Columbia by his colleague F. J. E. Woodbridge, who illustrated how metaphysics might be done in a “descriptive” rather than an extra-physical way (“Biography of John Dewey”, in Schilpp 1939: 36). While many of Dewey’s most important writings on metaphysics were also about experience (discussed above), special attention should be paid to “The Postulate of Immediate Empiricism” (1905, PIE, MW3), “The Subject-Matter of Metaphysical Inquiry” (1915, MW8), and his “Introduction” to Essays in Experimental Logic (1916c, MW10)—all vital steps toward his magnum opus, Experience and Nature.[15] EN’s final chapters, dealing with art and consummatory experience, are developed in Art as Experience (1934b, LW10), another source of significant metaphysical discussions.

While labels tend to obscure Dewey’s innovations, it is safe say that Dewey had a realist, naturalistic, non-reductive, emergentist, process metaphysics.[16] He sought to describe the most general features (“generic traits”) of nature in a way which did empirical justice to the world as encountered, and which could be useful toward future attempts to describe and change the world for the better. Unlike other metaphysics, Dewey explicitly said that metaphysics served something further—criticism. In the end, Dewey wound up describing his efforts both as a “metaphysics” and as a “system”, that is, “the hanging together of various problems and various hypotheses in a perspective” (“Nature in Experience”, LW14: 141–142). He described his enterprise as both informed by “a definite point of view” and by the contemporary, human world (“Half-hearted Naturalism”, LW3: 75–76 ).

3.6 The Project of Experience and Nature

Experience and Nature provides both extended criticism of past metaphysical approaches, especially their quest for certainty and assumption of an Appearance/Reality framework, and a positive, general theory regarding how human existence is situated in nature. It is proffered as empirical, descriptive, and hypothetical; it eschews claims of special access beyond “experience in unsophisticated forms”, which, Dewey argued, give us “evidence of a different world and points to a different metaphysics” (EN, LW1: 47). EN looks to existing characteristics of human culture, anthropologically, to see what they reveal, more generally, about nature. The isolation, analysis, and description of the “generic traits of existence” and their relations to one another, is one significant outcome.

While this entry lacks space for even a bare summary, it is worth noting that EN begins with an extensive discussion of method and experience as a new starting point for philosophy. An extensive presentation of the generic traits follows, which, in due course, evokes and informs discussions regarding science, technology, body, mind, language, art, and value. While the traits are not presented systematically (à la other metaphysicians such as Spinoza or Whitehead) there is a progression moving from the more basic to the more complex.[17]

3.7 Empirical Metaphysics and Wisdom

Since Dewey is a pragmatist and meliorist, it is worth asking: How can metaphysics contribute to the world beyond academic philosophy? Dewey’s larger ambition was to return philosophy to an older, ancient mission—the pursuit of wisdom. And while Dewey describes philosophy as inherently critical, a “criticism of criticisms”, where does that leave even an empirical, hypothetical, naturalistic metaphysics? (EN, LW1: 298) Dewey raises the issue, prophylactically:

As a statement of the generic traits manifested by existences of all kinds without regard to their differentiation into physical and mental, [metaphysics] seems to have nothing to do with criticism and choice, with an effective love of wisdom. (EN, LW1: 308)

Dewey answers his own question with his account of the generic traits, one which purportedly provides “a ground-map of the province of criticism, establishing base lines to be employed in more intricate triangulations” (EN, LW1: 308).[18] New maps, new ways of looking at existence can defang old truisms—e.g., men are rational, women are emotional, humans are intelligent, animals are dumb, etc.—and facilitate the creation of new meanings. Many of philosophy’s conceptual tools (kinds, categories, dualisms, aims, and values) were entrenched; a reconsideration of the “what” and “how” of existents promised a basis for a new start.

The activity of metaphysical map-making fits in with the more engaged role Dewey envisioned for philosophers. The philosopher would serve as what Dewey called a “liaison officer”, a kind of semantic intermediator able to help those speaking at cross purposes (or in different jargons) to communicate more effectively (EN, LW1: 306). Metaphysical maps draw from contemporary circumstances and purposes, so they would not promise certainty or permanency. Indeed, the general traits “are actually so intimately intermixed that all important issues are concerned with their degrees and the ratios they sustain to one another” (EN, LW1: 309). Just as physical maps must be redrawn based on changing needs and purposes, so would metaphysical maps; in the meantime, hopefully, criticism is sharpened and value is more effectively secured.

3.8 Criticisms of Dewey’s Metaphysics

Dewey received and responded to many criticisms of his metaphysical views, from 1905’s “Postulate of Immediate Empiricism” and on. Critics often overlooked that his position was aiming to undercut prevailing metaphysical genres; often, his view was just aligned with one or another existing position. (He was taken, variously, as in league with realism, idealism, relativism, subjectivism, etc. See Hildebrand 2003.) One recurrent criticism was that the view advanced in PIE (that “things are what they are experienced as”) could not possibly yield a metaphysics because it merely bespoke the kind of subjective, immediate experience inimical to a more mediated and objective account. Similar reactions arrived twenty years late to EN from critics attacking the contrast there between “experience” and “nature”.[19]

Subsequent criticisms honed in on a supposed tension between two foci of Dewey’s: “qualities” vs. “relations”. Qualities are immediate, while relations are mediate; how could both coexist in the same item of experience? There seemed to be a contradiction within Dewey’s view.[20] Richard Bernstein (1961) seized on this issue, and claimed that Dewey harbored two irreconcilable strains, a “metaphysical strain” and a “phenomenological strain”, but failed to sufficiently account for them with his “principle of continuity”. One response to this argued that such critiques are vitiated by their unwitting reproduction of the very spectatorial standpoint Dewey’s experiential starting point was designed to prevent.[21]

In recent years, some specialists in pragmatism and American philosophy have debated whether Dewey should have engaged in metaphysics at all. Some, such as Richard Rorty and Charlene Haddock Seigfried, have argued that Dewey’s critique of traditional metaphysics was the most he should have done; going further diverted him from more important ethical work (Seigfried 2001a, 2004) or plunged him into foundationalist projects he had previously disavowed (“Dewey’s Metaphysics” in Rorty 1977). Others have argued that Dewey invented a genuinely new approach to metaphysics which avoided old problems while contributing something salutary to culture at large (Myers forthcoming, Garrison 2005, Boisvert 1998a, Alexander forthcoming).

4. Inquiry and Knowledge

4.1 The Organic Roots of Instrumentalism

The interactional, organic model Dewey developed in his psychology informed his theories of learning and knowledge. Given this new ecological framework, a range of traditional epistemological proposals and puzzles (premised on metaphysical divisions such as appearance/reality, mind/world) lost credibility. “So far as the question of the relation of the self to known objects is concerned”, Dewey wrote, “knowing is but one special case of the agent-patient, of the behaver-enjoyer-sufferer situation” (“Brief Studies in Realism”, MW6: 120). As we have already seen in psychology, Dewey’s wholesale repudiation of the tradition’s basic metaphysical framework required extensive reconstructions in every other area; one popular name for Dewey’s reconstruction of epistemology (or “theory of inquiry”, as Dewey preferred to call it) was “instrumentalism”.[22]

As did his earlier psychological functionalism, instrumentalism utilized a Darwinian starting point to criticize and dissolve entrenched divisions between, for example, realism/idealism, science/religion, and empiricism/rationalism. Seen from this standpoint, change and transformation are natural features of the actual world, and knowledge and logic are ways to adapt, survive, and thrive. The vitality of the world in which we reason, its dynamic and biological basis, is more informative about knowledge and truth than the paradigms of physics or mathematics, historically celebrated by philosophy. While instrumentalism acknowledges sensation’s contributions, it also insists upon the constructive power of reasoning.[23]

Early statements of instrumentalism (and definitive breaks by Dewey with Hegelian logic) may be seen in “Some Stages of Logical Thought” (Dewey 1900 [1916], MW1); that essay follows Peirce (entry on Peirce section on pragmatism, pragmaticism, and the scientific method],[24] especially the well known 1877–78 articles championing the larger framework of scientific thinking, namely the “doubt-inquiry process” (MW1: 173; see also Peirce 1877, 1878). This account is developed in Studies in Logical Theory (Dewey 1903b, MW2), by Dewey and his collaborators at Chicago. In the work, Dewey acknowledges a “preeminent obligation” to James (Perry 1935: 308–309).[25]

Studies criticizes transcendentalist logic extensively, concluding that logic should not assume either thought or reality’s existence in general but should rest content with the function or use of ideas in experience:

The test of validity of [an] idea is its functional or instrumental use in effecting the transition from a relatively conflicting experience to a relatively integrated one. (Studies, MW2: 359)

Thus, instrumentalism abandons all psycho-physical dualisms and all correspondentist theories of knowing. Dewey wrote,

In the logical process the datum is not just external existence, and the idea mere psychical existence. Both are modes of existence—one of given existence, the other of possible, of inferred existence….In other words, datum and ideatum are divisions of labor, cooperative instrumentalities, for economical dealing with the problem of the maintenance of the integrity of experience. (Studies, MW2: 339–340)

4.2 Beyond Empiricism, Rationalism, and Kant

So far, we have seen that Dewey’s instrumentalism is of a piece with his system’s other components. But it was also responding to dialectic within philosophy’s epistemological positions, particularly the tension between British empiricism, rationalism (see entry on rationalism vs. empiricism), and the Kantian synthesis. A brief account will suffice to introduce Dewey’s response.

Classical empiricists insisted that the origins of knowledge lay in sensory experience. They were motivated, in part, by the concern that rationalistic accounts, seeking to trace knowledge to thought alone (rather than particular, independent sense stimuli), were too unchecked. Without the limits imposed by sense experience, philosophy would continue to produce wild and divergent dogmatisms. There was in classical empiricism, as in Dewey, a genuine interest in scientific progress; for science to advance, it needed to escape unfettered speculation. The account developed, then, by figures such as Locke, Berkeley, and Hume claimed that (in Locke’s version) the world writes on a receptive blank slate, the mind, in the language of ideas. By the faculties of memory, association, and imagination, knowledge is generated; further elaborations of what is known must, on the empiricists’ account, be checkable against its origins in sense experience.

Rationalists, in contrast, argued that knowledge was by nature both abstract and deductively certain. Consider, for a moment, your sensory experiences: they are fluid, individualized, and permeated by the relativity borne of innumerable external conditions. How could a philosophical account of genuine knowledge—necessarily certain, self-evident, and unchanging—be derived using a method so besotted with sensorial flux? Knowledge must derive, rather, from inner concepts, which could be certain. Knowledge, then, is produced by an immaterial entity, mind, with a power to reason which is innate, and which stands logically independent of practical ends and the contingencies of one’s physical body.

Kant responded to the empiricist-rationalist tension by reigning in their overweening ambitions; he argued that philosophy must stop attempting to transcend the limits of thought and experience. Philosophy’s proper aspiration is more modest—to discover what is possible to know in the phenomenal world. Kant, then, refused an originary role to either percepts or concepts, arguing instead that sense and reason are co-constitutive of knowledge. More important, Kant argued that what epistemology requires is an account of the mind as a systematic and constructive force.

Dewey’s response to this three-way epistemological conflict was foreshadowed in the earlier discussion of the “Reflex Arc” paper, with its account of natural constituent of the sensori-motor circuit. Any proposal premised on a disconnected mind and body—or upon one assuming that stimuli (be they causes or impressions or whatever) were atomic and in need of synthesis—was a non-starter for Dewey.[26]

While he accepted some of Kant’s criticisms of rationalism and empiricism, he rejected Kant’s propagation of several significant but unjustified assumptions. Chief among these assumptions was the idea that knowledge must be certain; that nature and intellect were categorically distinct; and that a noumenal realm (things-in-themselves) was a justified posit. In addition, Dewey questioned Kant’s claim that the sensations which supply knowledge are inchoate, initially—this claim being merely another posit driven by Kant’s architectonic. Methodologically, and perhaps more significantly, Dewey followed James in criticizing Kant’s overall standpoint as, still, too spectatorial. From the pragmatic, Jamesean, “radical empiricist” standpoint, one may accept as real (though not necessarily as known) a variety of phenomenon, whether such are clear, vague, felt, remembered, anticipated, etc.

Thus, for Dewey, Kant cannot achieve the philosophical perspective necessary for a dynamic synthesis of perception and conception, nature and reason, practice and theory. While Kant’s model of an active and structuring mind was a clear advance over more passive systems, it maintained the retrograde depiction of knowledge as faithful mirror of reality. The missing insight was knowledge as dynamic instrument, consisting in managing (predicting, controlling, guiding) future experience. Within this framework, determining “knowledge” is akin to judging the value of an eye or hand; one asks how they affect the organism’s ability to cope:

What measures [knowledge’s] value, its correctness and truth, is the degree of its availability for conducting to a successful issue the activities of living beings. (“The Bearings of Pragmatism Upon Education”, in MW4: 180)

Thus, Dewey replaced Kant’s mind-centered system with one centered upon experience-nature transactions—“a reversal”, Dewey wrote, “comparable to a Copernican revolution” (QC, LW4: 232).

4.3 Inquiry, Knowledge, and Truth

In the context of instrumentalism, what do “logic” and “epistemology” amount to? Dewey remains focused on these subject matters but insisted on a more empirical approach. How, he asked, does reasoning and learning actually happen?[27] Dewey addresses the nature of logic in his major 1938 study, Logic: The Theory of Inquiry (LTI, LW12); his term for logic is the “inquiry into inquiry”. LTI undertakes the systematic process of collecting, organizing, and explicating the actual conditions of different kinds of inquiry; the aim of this reconstructed logic, as outlined in the 1917 “The Need for a Recovery of Philosophy”, is pragmatic and ameliorative: to provide an “important aid in proper guidance of further attempts at knowing” (MW10: 23).

Throughout his career, Dewey described processes and patterns evident in active problem solving. Here, we consider three: inquiry, knowledge, and truth. There is, Dewey argued, a “pattern of inquiry” which prevails in problem solving. In “Analysis of Reflective Thinking” (1933, LW8) and LTI (LW12) it has five phases. Explicitly disavowing categorical divisions between emotion and reason, the initial phase of inquiry begins (1) with a feeling of something amiss, a unique and particular doubtfulness; this feeling endures as a pervasive quality imbued in inquiry and serves as a kind of “guide” to subsequent phases. Next, because what is initially present is indeterminate, (2) a problem must be specifically formulated; problems do not preexist inquiry, as typically assumed.[28] Next, (3) a hypothesis is constructed, one which imaginatively utilizes both theoretical ideas and perceptual facts to forecast the possible consequences of various operations. Next, in phase (4), one reasons through the meanings involved in the hypothesis, sizing up the implications or possible contradictions involved; frequently, what is discovered here requires a return to an earlier phase (to reformulate the hypothesis or even the problem).[29] Finally, inquiry comes to a close with phase (5), acting to evaluate and test the hypothesis; here, it is revealed whether a proposed solution solves the problem, or to put it LTI’s terminology, whether inquiry has converted an “indeterminate situation” into a “determinate one”.

The inquiry pattern Dewey sketched is schematic; he noted that actual cases of reasoning often do not show such discreteness or linearity. Thus, the pattern is not a summary of how people always think but rather how exemplary cases of inquirential thinking unfold (e.g., in the empirical sciences).

Knowledge, as viewed by Dewey’s transactional model of inquiry, departs from tradition; in effect, it is brought to earth. “Knowledge, as an abstract term”, Dewey wrote,

is a name for the product of competent inquiries. Apart from this relation, its meaning is so empty that any content or filling may be arbitrarily poured in. (LTI, LW12: 16)

To understand a product, one must understand the process; this is what Dewey does. Denying the importance of knowledge, qua isolable product, is effectively denying a metaphysical account of reality that makes mind-the-substance separate from everything else. It does not depreciate knowing as an activity, and Dewey strongly maintained that “intelligence” is a crucial mediator of individual and societal conflict.[30]

Truth, too, is radically reevaluated. For too long, truth connoted an ideal—an epistemic fixity (a correspondence, a coherence) which could terminate all further inquiry. As this is not the actual situation human beings (or philosophy) inhabits, the ideal should be set aside. Still, Dewey was ever the (re)constructivist; in “Experience, Knowledge, and Value” (1939c) he provided an account of truth; it no longer pointed toward some transcendental thing, but toward the process of inquiry (“Experience, Knowledge, and Value”, LW14: 56–57). To label a proposition “true” is to say it offers some reliability as a resource in further inquiry:

In scientific inquiry, the criterion of what is taken to be settled, or to be knowledge, is being so settled that it is available as a resource in further inquiry; not being settled in such a way as not to be subject to revision in further inquiry. (LTI, LW12: 16)

Truth does not stand outside of experience, but is an experienced relation, particularly one which is socially shared. In How We Think, Dewey wrote,

Truth, in final analysis, is the statement of things “as they are,” not as they are in the inane and desolate void of isolation from human concern, but as they are in a shared and progressive experience….Truth, truthfulness, transparent and brave publicity of intercourse, are the source and the reward of friendship. Truth is having things in common. (HWT, MW6: 67; see also “The Experimental Theory of Knowledge”, 1910b, MW3: 118)

In Dewey’s instrumentalism, then, knowledge and truth are adjectival not nominative, they describe a process which, as Peirce tells us, can go on as long as we do. “There is no belief so settled as not to be exposed to further inquiry” (LTI, LW12: 16). To understand why words like “knowledge” and “truth” deserve to be honorifics, one must understand their historic value as tools that have aided past inquiries and helped secure experiences of value.

5. Philosophy of Education

It is probably fair to say that, around the world, Dewey remains as well know for his educational theories (see entry on philosophy of education, section Rousseau, Dewey, and the progressive movement) as for his philosophical ones. However, a closer look at Dewey’s body of work shows how often these theories align. Dewey recognized this, reflecting that his 1916 magnum opus in education, Democracy and Education (DE, MW9) “was for many years that [work] in which my philosophy, such as it is, was most fully expounded” (FAE, LW5: 156). DE argued that philosophy itself could be understood as “the general theory of education”. In lieu of philosophy’s increasing tendencies to become hyper-specialized and technical, he urged a greater investment in the problems affecting everyday life. In effect this was a call to see philosophy from the standpoint of education. Dewey wrote,

Education offers a vantage ground from which to penetrate to the human, as distinct from the technical, significance of philosophic discussions….The educational point of view enables one to envisage the philosophic problems where they arise and thrive, where they are at home, and where acceptance or rejection makes a difference in practice. If we are willing to conceive education as the process of forming fundamental dispositions, intellectual and emotional, toward nature and fellow-men, philosophy may even be defined as the general theory of education. (DE, MW9: 338)

Dewey was active in education his entire life. Besides high school and college teaching, he devised curricula, established, reviewed and administered schools and departments of education, participated in collective organizing, consulted and lectured internationally, and wrote extensively on many facets of education. He established the University of Chicago’s Laboratory School as an experimental site for theories in instrumental logic and psychological functionalism. This school also became a site for democratic expression by the local community.

5.1 Experiential Learning and Teaching

Dewey’s “Reflex Arc” paper applied functionalism to education. “Reflex” argued that human experience is not a disjointed sequence of fits and starts, but a developing circuit of activities. Learning deserves to be framed in this way: as a cumulative, progressive process where inquirers move from the dissatisfying phase of doubt toward another marked by the satisfying resolution of a problem. “Reflex” also shows that the subject of a stimulus (e.g., the pupil) is not a passive recipient of, say, a sensation but an agent who takes it amidst other ongoing activities in a larger environmental field.

Cognizance of such fundamental facts entailed, Dewey argued, that educators discard pedagogies based on the “blank slate” model of curriculum. Rather, in The School and Society, Dewey wrote, “the question of education is the question of taking hold of [children’s] activities, of giving them direction” (MW1: 25). Dewey’s How We Think (1910c, MW6) was intended, primarily, to instruct teachers how to apply instrumentalism; education’s intellectual goals could be advanced by acquainting children with the general intellectual habits of scientific inquiry.

The native and unspoiled attitude of childhood, marked by ardent curiosity, fertile imagination, and love of experimental inquiry, is near, very near, to the attitude of the scientific mind. (HWT, MW6: 179)

Given Dewey’s different approach to psychology, teaching roles would need revision. While teachers still had to know their subject matter, they also needed to understand the student’s cultural and personal backgrounds. Learning as an activity which incorporated actual problems necessitated a careful integration of lessons with specific learners. Traditional motivational strategies, too, had to change; rather than relying on rewards or punishments, Deweyan teachers were called to reimagine the whole learning environment; they must merge the school’s preexisting curricular goals with their pupils’ present interests. One way to do this was by identifying specific problems able to bridge curriculum and student and then create situations in which students have to work them out.[31] The problem-centered approach demanded a lot from teachers, as it required training in subject matters, child psychology, and various pedagogies capable of interweaving these together.[32]

5.2 Traditionalists, Romantics, and Dewey

Dewey’s educational philosophy emerged amidst a fierce 1890’s debate between educational “romantics” and “traditionalists”. Romantics (also called “New” or “Progressive” education by Dewey), urged a “child-centered” approach; they claimed that the child’s natural impulses provided education’s proper starting point. As active and creative beings, education should not fetter growth—even instruction should be subordinated to content if necessary. Traditionalists (called “Old” education by Dewey) pressed for a “curriculum-centered” approach. Children were empty cabinets which curriculum fills with civilization’s lessons. Content was supreme, and instruction should discipline children to ensure they are receptive.

In many articles and books (“My Pedagogic Creed”, 1897b, EW5; The School and Society, 1899, MW1; Democracy and Education, 1916b, MW9; Experience and Education, 1938b, LW13, etc.) Dewey developed an interactional model to move beyond that debate. He refused to privilege either child or society. While Romantics correctly identified the child (replete with instincts, powers, habits, and histories) as an indispensable starting point for pedagogy, Dewey argued that the child cannot be the only starting point. Larger social groups (family, community, nation) also have a legitimate stake in passing along extant interests, needs, and values as part of an educational synthesis.

Still, of these two approaches, Dewey tilted more strongly against the high value placed by traditionalists on discipline and memorization. While recognizing the legitimacy of conveying content (facts, values), Dewey thought it paramount for schools to eschew indoctrination. Educating meant incorporating, with a wide berth for personal freedom, unique individuals into a changing society which—this had to remain clear—would soon be under their dominion. This is why who the child was mattered so very much. Following colleague and lifelong friend G.H. Mead, Dewey argued that any child’s “self” was an emerging construct of social and personal experiences, so no child’s deeds, words, or interests could be isolated from their social context. Insofar as these were facts of social psychology, schools had to become micro-communities to best reflect children’s growing interests and needs. “The school cannot be a preparation for social life excepting as it reproduces, within itself, the typical conditions of social life” (“Ethical Principles Underlying Education”, 1897a, EW5: 61–62).[33]

5.3 Democracy Through Education

Dewey’s efforts to connect child, school, and society were motivated by more than just a desire for better pedagogical methods. Because character, rights, and duties are informed by and contribute to the social realm, schools were critical sites to learn and experiment with democracy. Democratic life consists not only in civic and economic conduct, but more crucially in habits of problem solving, compassionate imagination, creative expression, and civic self-governance. The full range of roles a child might assume in life is vast; once this is appreciated, it is incumbent upon society to make education its highest political and economic priority. During WWII, Dewey wrote,

There will be almost a revolution in school education when study and learning are treated not as acquisition of what others know but as development of capital to be invested in eager alertness in observing and judging the conditions under which one lives. Yet until this happens, we shall be ill-prepared to deal with a world whose outstanding trait is change. (“Between Two Worlds”, 1944, LW17: 463)

Democracy, on Dewey’s view, was much more comprehensive than a form of government. “Democracy”, Dewey wrote, “is not an alternative to other principles of associated life [but] the idea of community life itself” (PP, LW2: 328). Individuals exist in communities; as their lives change, needs and conflicts emerge that require intelligent management; we must make sense out of new experiences. Education

is that reconstruction or reorganization of experience which adds to the meaning of experience, and which increases ability to direct the course of subsequent experience. (DE, MW9: 82)

In other words, the engine of America’s political identity was creative experimentation; in order to fulfill their eventual roles as fully participating citizens, students needed education in the habits (imaginative, empirical) which made the experimental sciences so successful. Dewey called such attitudes and habits “intelligence”.[34]

Informing all the spheres just discussed—science, education, and democratic life—is Dewey’s naturalism which places hope not in what is immutable or ultimate (God, Nature, Reason, Ends) but in the human capacity to learn from life. In “Creative Democracy—The Task Before Us” (1939b) Dewey wrote,

Democracy is the faith that the process of experience is more important than any special result attained, so that special results achieved are of ultimate value only as they are used to enrich and order the ongoing process. Since the process of experience is capable of being educative, faith in democracy is all one with faith in experience and education. All ends and values that are cut off from the ongoing process become arrests, fixations. They strive to fixate what has been gained instead of using it to open the road and point the way to new and better experiences. (“Creative Democracy”, LW14: 229)

The success or failure of democracy rests on education. Education is most determinative of whether citizens develop the habits needed to investigate problematic beliefs and situations, to communicate openly, throughout. While every culture aims to convey values and beliefs to the coming generation, it is critical, Dewey thought, to distinguish between education which inculcates collaborative and creative hypothesizing and education which foments obeisance to parochialism and dogma. And philosophy must apply this same standard to itself.

6. Ethics

Dewey wrote extensively on ethics throughout his career; some writings were explicitly about ethics, but ethical analyses are present in works with other foci.[35] As elsewhere, Dewey critiques then reconstructs traditional views; he argued it is typical for traditional systems (e.g., teleological, deontological, or virtue-based) to seek comprehensive and monocausal accounts of, for example, ultimate aims, duties, or values. Such ideal theory is obligated to explain morality’s requirements for all individuals actions or character.

Dewey, in contrast, argued for a more experimental approach. Rather than a grand and final explanatory account of moral life, ethics describes intelligent methods for dealing with novel and morally perplexing situations. There are no stipulated, ultimate values, nor should any be sought.[36] At best, the only value toward which he would gesture was “growth”.[37] Ethics means inquiry into concrete, problematic conditions; such inquiry may use theories to inform hypotheses tested in experience. Reliable hypotheses may come to be called “knowledge”, but must, in the end, be considered fallible and revisable. Actual resolutions to moral problems, Dewey observed, typically point toward plural factors (aims, duties, virtues), rather than just one (TIF, LW5). Moreover, actual conduct (including inquiry) is undertaken not by isolated, rational actors but by fundamentally social beings.[38] “Conduct”, Dewey wrote,

is always shared; this is the difference between it and a physiological process. It is not an ethical “ought” that conduct should be social. It is social, whether bad or good. (HNC, MW14: 16)

Dewey’s ethical theory, like those in education and politics, utilizes his transactional views of experience, habit, inquiry, and the communicative, social self. It also exemplifies Dewey’s metaphysics of a world both precarious and stable, where conflict is natural and quests to deny or permanently eradicate it are fantastical.[39] Conflict is a generic trait of life, not a defect; theories denying this tend to be so reductive and absolutist that they divorce inquiry from the essential details of concrete situations, cultures, and persons. Such strategies tend to fail.[40]

Progress in ethical theory, then, means improvements that render inquiry more discriminating, more revelatory of alternatives and consequences.[41] Improved deliberation is crucial to more effective inquiry; Dewey argued this requires being open to contributions from many sources: all sciences, social customs, jurisprudence, biographies, and, yes, even moral systems of the past.[42] Deliberation especially benefits from what Dewey called “dramatic rehearsal”, where creative and dramatic enactment adds to logical tools and helps illuminate the emotional weight and color of potential ethical choices.[43]

For further details on Dewey’s ethics, see the entry Dewey’s moral philosophy by E. Anderson (2018).

7. Political Philosophy

Dewey’s political philosophy, like other areas, presumes that that individuals subsist transactionally with their social environment, and can use inquiry to solve problems in hypothetical and experimental ways.[44] As elsewhere, theory is instrumental; concepts and systems are tools initially devised to function in particular, practical circumstances. While those proving valuable can be retained for reuse, all are considered fallible and capable of reconstruction. Dewey rejected approaches relying upon non-empirical, a priori assumptions (e.g., about human nature, historical progress, etc.) or which propose ultimate, often monocausal, explanations. Dewey criticized and reconstructed core political concepts (individual, freedom, right, community, public, state, and democracy) along naturalist and experimentalist lines; besides numerous articles (for academic and lay audiences), Dewey’s political thought can be found in books such as The Public and Its Problems (1927b, LW2), Individualism, Old and New (1930f, LW5), Liberalism and Social Action (1935, LW11), and Freedom and Culture (1939d, LW13). Because Democracy and Education (1916b, DE, MW9) emphasizes profound connections between education, society, and democratic habits—it also merits study as a “political” work.

Enormous changes took place during Dewey’s lifetime, including massive US population growth, the rise of industrial, scientific, technological, and educational institutions, the American Civil War and two world wars, and a global economic depression. These events strained prevailing liberal theories, and Dewey labored to revise both democracy and liberalism. “The frontier is moral, not physical”, Dewey urged, proposing that democracy was tantamount to a “way of life”, and required continual renewal to survive.[45] Beyond governmental machinery (universal suffrage, recurring elections, political parties, trial by peers, etc.), democracy was “primarily a mode of associated living, of conjoint communicated experience” (DE, MW9: 93; see also, PP, LW2: 325). Such experience, expressed as collaborative inquiry, required the intellectual and emotional competencies necessary to tackle shared problems and negotiate value differences. Ultimately, democracy requires faith in experience as a sufficient resource for future solutions and that it is no longer necessary to place faith into transcendent rules or aims.[46]

Dewey’s analysis of individualism grew both from earlier academic interests and from his sensitivity to contemporary economic and technological pressures.[47] The older “atomic” individualism—where natural egoists vie to maximize their standing—was now harming not protecting individuals; such individualism, deployed as a rhetorical pretext, was enabling the wealthy and powerful to undermine (for most) the protections which justified liberalism, initially![48]

Dewey’s counter-proposal was “renascent liberalism”.[49] By reconstructing its core concept (“atomic” individuals become “social”), Dewey also revised other key political notions—e.g., “liberty”, “freedom”, and “rights”,—and placed them in an instrumentalist framework (LSA, LW11: 35; E, MW5: 394).[50] Also revised are concomitant notions of “community” and “public”. The Deweyan “public” forms around problems; the aim is to conduct experimental inquiry and act for redress (PP, LW2: 314). Dewey also expressed a grave concern, still with us today, regarding “inchoate” publics. Such publics consist of members lacking the critical education, time, and attention necessary for inquiry. They present democracy with perhaps its most significant and undermining condition (PP, LW2: 321, 317).

For further details on Dewey’s political theory, see the entry on Dewey’s political philosophy by M. Festenstein (2014).

8. Art and Aesthetic Experience

In his magnum opus on aesthetics, Art as Experience (AE, LW10: 31) Dewey stated that art, as a conscious idea, is “the greatest intellectual achievement in the history of humanity” (31).[51] Such high praise, especially from a philosopher with expertise in (what remains) philosophy’s “main” subjects (e.g., knowledge, ethics, science) deserves notice. Dewey began writing about aesthetics from early in his career—on art’s relevance to psychology (1887, EW2) and education (1897c, EW5), on why the distinction between “fine” and “practical” art should be rejected (1891, EW3: 310-311), and on Bosanquet (1893, EW4). His own theory emerged in Experience and Nature (1925a, EN, LW1) and flourished in AE (1934b), proposing that aesthetics is central to philosophy’s proper mission: to render everyday experience more fulfilling and meaningful.

Dewey’s aesthetics has, arguably, four main objectives. First, it explicates art’s ontology, the interrelated processes of making and appreciation, and specifies the functions of interpretation and criticism.[52] Second, it examines arts’ social role in presenting, reimagining, and projecting human identity. Third, it analyzes the communicative functions of art, especially in education and political life. Finally, it describes and analyzes the implications of art’s expression as experience; such experience is so vivified and integrated as to be qualitatively distinct—experience as “consummatory”.[53] Consummatory experience happens occasionally; sometimes it occurs not in an “artistic” context (concert, museum, etc.) but in unexpectedly quotidian circumstances. Nevertheless, it is also life at its fullest. Determining how more of life’s experiences could become consummatory is the main purpose of Dewey’s aesthetics.

Thus, the main question AE poses is: How did a chasm arise between the arts, artists and ordinary people? How have cultural conditions and aesthetic theories (reinforced by institutions) isolated “art and its appreciation by placing them in a realm of their own, disconnected from other modes of experiencing”? (AE, LW10: 16) AE makes explicit art’s natural continuities with everyday life, while seeking to prevent its reduction to mere entertainment or “transient pleasurable excitations”[54] (AE, LW10: 16). Dewey criticizes traditional aesthetics’ spectatorial (or theoretical) starting point and goes on to offer radically empirical accounts of art making, appreciation, expression, form, and criticism. Because aesthetic experience has organic roots, it can be recognized even in everyday objects and events.[55] Again, the goal is to dissolve the dualisms between “fine” and “useful” objects and to help establish a greater “continuity of esthetic experience with normal processes of living” (AE, LW10: 16).

For further details on Dewey’s aesthetics, see entry on Dewey’s aesthetics by T. Leddy (2016).

9. Religion, Religious Experience and A Common Faith

The whole story of man shows that there are no objects that may not deeply stir engrossing emotion. One of the few experiments in the attachment of emotion to ends that mankind has not tried is that of devotion, so intense as to be religious, to intelligence as a force in social action. (A Common Faith, 1934a, LW9: 52–53)

9.1 Dewey’s Religious Background

Dewey grew up in a religious family; his mother was especially devout and pressured her sons to live up to a similar devotion. His family church was Congregationalist; a bit later, including in college, Liberal Evangelicalism proved to be a more acceptable form of Christianity. At twenty-one, while living in Oil City, Pennsylvania, Dewey had a “mystic experience” which he reported to friend Max Eastman:

There was no vision, not even a definable emotion—just a supremely blissful feeling that his worries [about whether he prayed sufficiently in earnest] were over. (Dykhuizen 1973: 22)

Dewey belonged to congregations for about thirty-five years and turned away circa 1894, as he left for a post in Chicago. From then on, Dewey’s deepest loyalties lay outside religion; he was, as John J. McDermott put it,

an unregenerate philosophical naturalist, one for whom the human journey is constitutive of its own meaning and is not to be rescued by any transcendent explanations, principles of accountability, or posthumous salvation. (McDermott 2006, 50–51)

Dewey returned to philosophical issues of religion in the 1930’s. “What I Believe” (1930, LW5) argued for a new kind of “faith”, a “tendency toward action”. Such a faith would not be directed transcendentally, but would signify that “experience itself is the sole ultimate authority” (“What I Believe”, LW5: 267). This is not self-enclosed experience, of course, but comes from “the full participation of all our powers in the endeavor to wrest from each changing situation of experience its own full and unique meaning” (“What I Believe”, LW5: 272). In 1933–34, Dewey gave the Terry Lectures at Yale, later published as A Common Faith (1934a, ACF, LW9), Dewey’s major statement on religion and religious experience.

9.2 Aligning Naturalism and Religion

The challenge A Common Faith took on seems, in retrospect, insurmountable. He wished to reconstruct religion in a way which harmonized it with his empiricism and naturalism, while showing how the power of religious experience and belief could be transformed in ways which supported and advanced a secular conception of democracy. Religions vary, of course, but to a large degree they posit transcendent, eternal, unobservable entities and reveal themselves in ways which are not, shall we say, open to verification. Empirical experience (regardless of its specific construal) is seen as inferior—whether castigated as flux, illusion, uncertainty, or confusion, it must be left behind. In short, Dewey had squared himself against the metaphysics, epistemology, and seemingly the morality, of major religions.

It is worth noting who were ACF’s intended audience. Dewey was not addressing believers contented with supernatural religion, nor religious liberals seeking a via media postulating discrete realms to scientific and spiritual truths. Also, he was not addressing militant atheists, whose dogmatism Dewey rejected.[56] Rather, ACF addressed those who, despite their abandonment of supernaturalism, nevertheless believe themselves to be religious (“Experience, Knowledge, and Value”, LW14: 79–80). ACF was meant to salvage whatever made the religious attitude experientially valuable while shedding both traditional religious frameworks and supernaturalistic beliefs.

9.3 “Religion” vs. “Religious”

Dewey’s strategy, then, was to pry “religious” experience away from religion, to show how religious experience may be framed within a natural and social context.[57] Because Dewey can find no clear, univocal meaning for “religion”, the alternative was to look more closely at religious experience (ACF, LW9: 7). To mention just two conclusions, Dewey found that whichever qualities exhibited by religious experience (feelings of peace, wholeness, security, etc.), none offered evidence for the supernatural. In other words, a religious experience’s report can no more count as a judgment about causation than pointing to a book’s description can prove a physical law (ACF, LW9ff.).

A second conclusion was that religious experience is not hermetic, unable to color or affect other experiences. Just a sunset may have an “aesthetic” element or a linguistic remark may have a “moral” tint, there may be a religious coloration of a variety of experiences (ACF, LW9: 9.). Understood in this sense, the “religious” character of experience is an attitude, one lending “deep and enduring support to the processes of living” (ACF, LW9: 15). Dewey analyzed religiosity in this sense by comparing it with a certain kind of coping. Consider three options: (1) one can accommodate an obstacle by merely resigning to put up with the conditions they impose; (2) one can adapt or modify the obstacle’s conditions to one’s liking; finally, (3) one can adjust to the obstacle in such a way that one both changes one’s attitude and alters the conditions. (Consider, as adjustment, the case of of becoming a parent which demands significant changes that encompass both self and environment.) This last option (3) of adjustment is characteristic of religious experience for it is “inclusive and deep seated” and transformative of attitudes in “generic and enduring” ways (ACF, LW9: 12,13). In adjustment, imaginative possibilities are projected and then put into action—both in oneself (wants, aims, ideals) and in surrounding conditions—and the cumulative impact is an evolution of identity (ACF, LW9: 13).[58]

9.4 Faith and God

Dewey effort to naturalize religion (by shifting the focus toward a non-transcendental understanding of “religious experience”) also required a reinterpretation of other traditional notions—such as “faith” and “God”. Faith, typically, is juxtaposed with reason. Faith requires neither empirical inquiry nor verification; one has faith in the evidence of (transcendent, ultimate) things not seen. Also, faith typically connotes intellectual acceptance, again without proof, of religious propositions (such as “God exists and loves mankind”).

Dewey made at least two important criticisms of traditional faith. First, faith is too closely identified with intellectual acceptance, which eclipses its pragmatic side; faith in a cause, for example, indicates a practical willingness to act strong enough to modify present desires, purposes, and conduct. By over-identifying the meaning of faith with intellectual recognition, the traditional account attenuates inquiry and constructive action. Second, traditional faith tends to reify its objects (e.g., “sin”, “evil”, etc.) converting them, in effect, to surds immune to inquiry and redescription. The resulting creed is then deployed to “solve” problems with formulaic appeals to absolutes. In Dewey’s view, the better approach is experimental—complicated, living problems are more effectively address with experimental inquiry. Insofar as traditional faith frustrates inquiry which could be ameliorative, it runs counter to the aims of morality.

The faith Dewey can accept is “natural piety”. Natural piety is not grounded in unseen, supernatural powers but, Dewey wrote, in a “just sense of nature as the whole of which we are parts” and the recognition that as parts we are

marked by intelligence and purpose, having the capacity to strive by their aid to bring conditions into greater consonance with what is humanly desirable. (ACF, LW9: 18)

Faith grounded in natural piety accepts the idea that (again) “experience itself is the sole ultimate authority” (“What I Believe”, LW5: 267).

Dewey’s naturalism, of course, disallows a traditional God—a single being responsible for the physical and moral universe, and its inhabitants. Belief in God is neither warranted nor advisable. Instead, Dewey offers a reconstruction of “God”. Very briefly, he asks that we think not of a singular object but of the qualities to which God is compared—goodness, wisdom, love. Such descriptions show that God represents our highest ideals. Remove the idea of a possessor of ideals and add in the way in which ideals pull from us the means (imagination, calculation, action) to put make ideas actual —and one begins to grasp Dewey’s notion.

This idea of God, or of the divine is also connected with all the natural forces and conditions—including man and human association—that promote the growth of the ideal and that further its realization….It is this active relation between ideal and actual to which I would give the name “God”. (ACF, LW9: 34; see also 29–30)

9.5 Religion as Social Intelligence—a Common Faith

As a pragmatist, a meliorist, and a humane democrat, Dewey sought a way to harness the undeniable power of religion and religious experience toward an end beneficial to all. Religion, he understood, provides people with a story about the larger universe and how they fit within it. He knew it was not enough to criticize religion, because this leaves powerful human needs unmet. Dewey did not propose swapping out old religious institutions for new ones; he hoped, rather, that the emancipation of religious experience from institutional and ideological shackles might direct its energies toward something like a “common faith”, a passion for imaginative intelligence pursuing moral goods. The methods of inquiry and criticism are not mysteries; they are deeply familiar already. The necessary turn would come when religious persons realize that inquiry could be extended to enhance religious experience and values (ACF, LW9: 23). If it could be appreciated how many celebrated accomplishments were due not to God but to intelligent, human collaboration, then perhaps the idea of community could inspire a non-sectarian, common faith.[59]

Dewey’s call for a common faith was, he thought, deeply democratic. Why? Because the idea of the supernatural was, by definition, suspicious of experience (as an adequate guide) and, consequently, suspicious of empirical methods of inquiry. Unchecked by lived experience or experiment, supernaturalism can produce especially deep divisions. The approach of Dewey’s common faith is, in contrast, intertwined with experimental inquiry—drawing upon lived experience and constantly renewed through open communication. This is why Dewey’s exhortation to trade traditional religious faith for a common faith in empirical intelligence is of a piece with his experimental ideal of democracy.




Citations to John Dewey’s works are to the thirty-seven-volume critical edition The Collected Works of John Dewey, 1882–1953, edited by Jo Ann Boydston (Southern Illinois University Press, 1969–1991). The series includes:

  • [EW] 1967, The Early Works, 1882–1898, 5 volumes.
  • [MW] 1976, The Middle Works, 1899–1924, 15 volumes.
  • [LW] 1981, The Later Works, 1925–1953, 17 volumes.

This critical edition was also published in electronic form as:

  • The Collected Works of John Dewey, 1882–1953: The Electronic Edition, Larry A. Hickman (ed.), Charlottesville, Va.: InteLex Corporation, 1996, available online. To insure uniformity of citation, the electronic edition preserves the line and page breaks of the print edition.

In-text citations give the original publication date, series abbreviation, followed by volume and page number. For example LW10: 12 refers to page 12 of Art as Experience, which is published as volume 10 of The Later Works.

Abbreviations of Dewey works frequently cited

  • [ACF] 1934a, A Common Faith
  • [AE] 1934b, Art as Experience
  • [DE] 1916b, Democracy and Education
  • [E] 1908, Ethics, with James H. Tufts,
  • [E-rev] 1932, Ethics, revised edition, with James H. Tufts,
  • [EEL] 1916c, “Introduction” to Essays in Experimental Logic
  • [EN] 1925a, Experience and Nature
  • [FAE] 1930a, “From Absolutism to Experimentalism”
  • [H&A] 1998, The Essential Dewey
  • [HNC] 1922a, Human Nature and Conduct
  • [HWT] 1910c, How We Think
  • [ION] 1930f, Individualism, Old and New
  • [LSA] 1935, Liberalism and Social Action
  • [LTI] 1938c, Logic: The Theory of Inquiry
  • [PIE] 1905, “The Postulate of Immediate Empiricism”
  • [PP] 1927b, The Public and Its Problems
  • [QC] 1929, The Quest for Certainty: A Study of the Relation of Knowledge and Action
  • [RAC] 1896, “The Reflex Arc Concept in Psychology”
  • [RIP] 1920, Reconstruction in Philosophy
  • [TIF] 1930d, “Three Independent Factors in Morals”
  • [TV] 1939e, Theory of Valuation

Individual works

  • 1884, “The New Psychology”, Andover Review, 2(Sept.): 278–289. Reprinted in EW1: 48–60.
  • 1886, “Psychology as Philosophic Method”, Mind, old series, 11(42), 153–173. Reprinted in EW1: 144–67. doi:10.1093/mind/os-XI.42.153
  • 1887, Psychology, New York: Harper and Brothers. Reprinted in EW2.
  • 1891, Outlines of a Critical Theory of Ethics, Ann Arbor, Michigan: Register Publishing Company. Reprinted in EW3: 239–388.
  • 1893, Dewey, review of Bosanquet, “A History of Aesthetic, by Bernard Bosanquet, formerly Fellow of University College, Oxford”, Philosophical Review, 2 (Jan. 1893):63–69. Reprinted in EW4: 189–197.
  • 1894a, The Study of Ethics: A Syllabus, Ann Arbor, MI: The Inland Press. Reprinted in EW4: 220–362.
  • 1894b, “The Theory of Emotion I: Emotional Attitudes”, Psychological Review, 1(6): 553–569. Reprinted in EW4: 152–169. doi:10.1037/h0069054
  • 1895, “The Theory of Emotion II: The Significance of Emotions”, Psychological Review, 2(1): 13–32. Reprinted in EW4: 169–188. doi:10.1037/h0070927
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