Egalitarianism is a trend of thought in political philosophy. An egalitarian favors equality of some sort: People should get the same, or be treated the same, or be treated as equals, in some respect. An alternative view expands on this last-mentioned option: People should be treated as equals, should treat one another as equals, should relate as equals, or enjoy an equality of social status of some sort. Egalitarian doctrines tend to rest on a background idea that all human persons are equal in fundamental worth or moral status. So far as the Western European and Anglo-American philosophical tradition is concerned, one significant source of this thought is the Christian notion that God loves all human souls equally. Egalitarianism is a protean doctrine, because there are several different types of equality, or ways in which people might be treated the same, or might relate as equals, that might be thought desirable. In modern democratic societies, the term “egalitarian” is often used to refer to a position that favors, for any of a wide array of reasons, a greater degree of equality of income and wealth across persons than currently exists.
- 1. Preliminary Distinctions
- 2. Equality of Opportunity
- 3. Equality of Condition: Equality of What?
- 4. Relational Equality
- 5. Equality among Whom?
- 6. Is Equality Desirable Per Se? Alternatives to Egalitarianism
- 8. Equal Fundamental Human Worth
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Egalitarianism is a contested concept in social and political thought. One might care about human equality in many ways, for many reasons. As currently used, the label “egalitarian” does not necessarily indicate that the doctrine so called holds that it is desirable that people's condition be made the same in any respect or that people ought to be treated the same in any respect. An egalitarian might rather be one who maintains that people ought to be treated as equals—as possessing equal fundamental worth and dignity and as equally morally considerable. In this sense, a sample non-egalitarian would be one who believes that people born into a higher social caste, or a favored race or ethnicity, or with an above-average stock of traits deemed desirable, ought somehow to count for more than others in calculations that determine what morally ought to be done. (On the thought that the core egalitarian ideal is treating people as equals, see Dworkin 2000.) Further norms of equality of condition or treatment might be viewed as free-standing or derived from the claim of equality of status. Controversy also swirls around attempts to specify the class of beings to whom egalitarian norms apply. Some might count all and only human beings as entitled to equality of status. Some would hold that all and only persons have equal moral status, with the criteria of personhood excluding some humans from qualifying (e.g., the unborn fetus or severely demented adult human) and including some nonhumans (e.g., intelligent beings inhabiting regions of outer space beyond Earth). Some would hold that sentient beings such as nonhuman primates that do not satisfy criteria of personhood are entitled to equal moral status along with persons. Some advance other views.
Egalitarianism can be instrumental or non-instrumental. Given a specification of some aspect of people's condition or mode of treating them that should be equal, one might hold that the state of affairs in which the stated equality obtains is morally valuable either as an end or as a means. The instrumental egalitarian values equality as a means to some independently specifiable goal; the non-instrumental egalitarian values equality for its own sake—as an end, or as partly constitutive of some end. For example, someone who believes that the maintenance of equality across a group of people fosters relations of solidarity and community among them, and is desirable for that reason, qualifies as an instrumental egalitarian. Someone who believes that equality of some sort is a component of justice, and morally required as such, would be a non-instrumental egalitarian.
Equality of any sort might be valued conditionally or unconditionally. One values equality in the former way if equality is deemed valuable only if some further condition is in place. One might hold that equality in the distribution of resources among a group of persons is valuable, but only on the condition that the individuals are equally deserving.
Equality might be deemed to be desirable or undesirable. A separate and distinct range of questions concerns whether or not people ought to act to bring about equality or are obligated to bring about equality (see Nagel 1991). The discussion to come often merges these questions, the assumption being that if equality is valuable, that is at least one good reason for thinking one should bring it about.
For those who regard equality as a requirement of justice, the question arises, whether this is a timeless unchanging or instead a variable requirement. Michael Walzer is one who appears to take the latter view. According to Walzer, a society is just if and only if its practices and institutions are in accord with the shared values and cultural understandings of its people. Democratic egalitarianism becomes a requirement of justice in modern societies, because this egalitarianism is an underlying important element of people's shared values and cultural understandings (Walzer 1983). But this appearance may be misleading. Walzer may hold that everyone at all times and places has an equal moral entitlement to be treated according to the shared norms and cultural understandings of one's people or group. Walzer may also hold that everyone at all times and places has equal rights against gratuitous assault by people just seeking fun, whatever the local people's shared beliefs on this matter happen to be. At any rate, we can identify clear exemplars of theorists who regard equality of a certain sort as a timeless unchanging moral requirement. John Locke holds that everyone at all times and places has equal natural moral rights that all of us ought always to respect (Locke 1690). The contemporary moral philosopher Thomas Scanlon holds that all people everywhere equally have the moral right to be treated according to the outcome of a procedure: what constitutes morally right and wrong action is set by the principles that no one could reasonably reject (Scanlon 1998). It is a further question, to what extent this procedure issues in different non-rejectable principles in different times and places featuring different circumstances.
Egalitarianism can be formulated with a variety of roles in mind. For example, an egalitarian norm might be proposed as a fundamental moral principle. As such, it would be intended as a statement of the ultimate norm (or as a member of the set of ultimate norms) to which individual conduct and institutional arrangements ought to conform. An ultimate norm might or might not be suitable for the role of guiding individual decision making or of serving as an explicitly recognized principle regulating institutions and public policy formation in a particular society. If individual agents and public officials are liable through limited cognitive ability, limited knowledge, or limited allegiance to morality to misapply ultimate principles, it might well be the case that these principles could be implemented to a greater degree if they were not employed directly as decision-making guides for individual and public policy choice. (On this issue, see Hare 1981). Following this train of thought, one might favor as guidelines for individual and public choice simple, easily understood, readily implementable rules that are to serve as proxies for the moral principles that are the ultimate norms. Or one might instead hold that the ultimate moral principles that fix what is right and wrong are well suited to be practical decision making guides. The point is merely that we should distinguish these distinct roles that moral norms might play and avoid criticizing a norm in one role by standards appropriate only if the norm is understood to be playing a different role.
Egalitarianism might be upheld as a moral requirement, a component of what we fundamentally owe one another, or as morally optional, a desirable ideal that we might permissibly decline to pursue. When affirmed as morally required, egalitarianism typically figures in a theory of justice. For the most part the discussion in this entry concentrates on egalitarianism as a morally required component of justice, but in considering arguments against a version of egalitarianism, it is worthwhile keeping in mind the possibility that the norm in question is morally desirable but not morally mandatory.
Given some specification of the kind of equality that is under consideration, it is clear what it means to say of a number of people that they are equal in the stated respect. If we are concerned with equal utility, then a group has equal utility when all have exactly the same. If we are concerned with equality of dollar holdings, then people are equal when all hold exactly the same number of dollars. But saying this does not yet suggest a way of determining, in general, whether inequality is greater in one situation than in another, when different people hold different amounts of the good that we are concerned to equalize in the two situations. Inequality can be measured in different ways, and no measure seems to be strongly supported by common sense intuition about the meaning of equality. (See Sen 1997 and Temkin 1993). This entry usually abstracts from this issue by supposing that we can unequivocally determine, for any ideal of equality, how to measure degrees of inequality across the board.
In a hierarchical caste society, positions of advantage are assigned to people on a basis of birth lineage. If one is a legitimate offspring of parents who are aristocrats, one will also enjoy the privileges of aristocratic rank. A historically important form of equality associated with the rise of competitive market economies is the ideal of equality of opportunity. This ideal is also known as formal equality of opportunity or careers open to talents.
Equality of opportunity requires that jobs in economic firms and options to borrow money for investment purposes such as starting a business should be open to all applicants, that applications be assessed by relevant criteria of merit, and that the top-ranked applicant should be offered the job or option to borrow. The relevant criteria of merit are to be set so that those who score highest are those whose selection would best further the morally innocent purposes of the enterprise. In competitive market settings, the presumption typically is that the criteria should be related to profitability. The best applicant for a job or a loan would then be the individual to whom offering the good in question produces the greatest increase in the firm's expected profit. (If the firm's owners are risk averse or risk seeking, the pertinent criterion would be expected profit weighted by their risk preferences.) A further aspect of the ideal of equality of opportunity requires that economic firms offering goods and services for sale should sell to all willing customers, treating all potential customers evenhandedly as potential sources of profit. Finally, equality of opportunity requires that purchasers of goods and services should be responsive only to the price and quality of the goods offered to them for purchase (and not, for example, to the ethnicity or sex or sexual orientation of the maker or seller of the good). This last-mentioned requirement of equality of opportunity might not be included within formulations of the norm that are intended to be enacted as law and enforced by criminal or civil law procedures. But to implement equality of opportunity, an orientation of the hearts and minds of members of society is needed, not merely legal enactments. Equality of opportunity would be subverted if the laws effectively prohibited economic firms from basing decision making on factors other than expected profitability but consumers would not purchase products that embodied the skilled labor of women and blacks, so that their market opportunities are stunted. Moreover, the law might indeed require firms to hire the best qualified applicant, meaning the one best able to perform the role being filled, even if hiring the best qualified in this sense would not be profit-maximizing, due to recalcitrant consumer prejudice.
Two natural extensions of the equality of opportunity ideal deserve mention. One is the requirement that student slots in colleges and universities and competitive private schools should be open to all applicants with applicants ranked by their ability to learn and other academic virtues and selected on these academic grounds (provided they can pay the tuition and fees). A second extension requires that public sector jobs—other than those reserved for elected officials along with their staffs—should be open to all applicants with selection of applicants being made on the basis of the merits of the applications.
The general idea of equality of opportunity is that the political economy of a society distributes positions that confer special advantages and these should be open to all applicants with applicants selected by merit. The merits of the applications for a position should track the degree to which the applicant's hiring or selection for interaction would boost the fulfillment of the morally innocent purposes of the association as weighted by the association's bosses. The more general formulation of the notion of merit allows that an economic firm might legitimately base its decisions on nonmarket values without engaging in wrongful discrimination that violates equality of opportunity rightly construed. For example, a maker of fancy surfboards might sell them by preference to more skilled surfers, and a mountaineering guide might select clients partly on the basis of their physical fitness and their perceived enthusiasm for wilderness adventure. Also, members of the learned professions such as medicine and law might be bound by legal and cultural norms that require them to tailor their services to the aims of the profession rather than just to profitability (e.g., norms that require a medical doctor to refuse to provide a medical treatment to a potential client who is willing and able to pay but would not benefit from the treatment).
The ideal of equality of opportunity is the ideal of a political economy in which each person's prospects as producer depend only on his initial stock of resources plus his ability and willingness to provide goods and services that others value plus luck as market fluctuations are encountered. Moreover, in the role of consumer, each individual (modulo his location) faces the same array of goods and services on sale to anyone who can pay the purchase price (and can satisfy the relevant nonmarket conditions of the seller or maker). Such characteristics of persons as their supposed race, skin color, ethnicity, sex, sexual orientation, and religion play no role in determining one's life prospects in this public sphere except insofar as these traits might happen to affect one's abilities and willingness to offer what others are willing to exchange for money.
In theory, equality of opportunity could be fully satisfied in a society in which wealth passed along by inheritance from generation to generation fundamentally determines everyone's competitive prospects. In this society jobs and positions and so on would be open to all applicants, but the only applicants who have the skills that qualify them for desirable posts are the children of the wealthy. They alone have access to the training and acculturation that confer skills.
A society that establishes and maintains a state educational system sustained by public funds already goes some way beyond equality of opportunity and toward provision to all of its members of some opportunity to develop skills that will enable them to succeed in competitions for desirable positions regulated by equality of opportunity. The same can be said of a society that enforces minimal standards of child rearing to which parents must conform. One can imagine a society doing more in this same spirit.
A society might institute policies that secure at least a minimally acceptable threshold of schooling and skill formation for all its members. An alternative aim is to eliminate entirely the advantages that family wealth and social status confer on individuals in competitions regulated by formal equality of opportunity. The achievement of this aim would render a society classless, in a certain sense. John Rawls (1999, 63; 2001) has formulated this ideal as a principle of fair equality of opportunity (FEO). This principle holds that any individuals in society with the same native talent and ambition should have the same prospects of success in competition for positions that confer special benefits and advantages. FEO goes beyond equality of opportunity by requiring that all efforts by parents to give their children a comparative advantage in competitions for desirable positions and posts are somehow entirely offset. In a society regulated by FEO, socialization is adjusted so that among people equally willing to work to become qualified for a particular career and equally endowed by genetic inheritance with latent ability needed for that career, all have the same chances of success in that career.
FEO also opposes racial and sexual and similar prejudices that work to deprive disfavored individuals from enjoying opportunities to become qualified so that they would benefit from formal equality of opportunity. In some settings, affirmative action policies that aim to help members of historically disadvantaged groups such as African-Americans in the U.S. gain desirable employment opportunities in proportion to their numbers in the population can be regarded as policies intended to move society in the direction of satisfying FEO.
Formal equality of opportunity, in so far as it imposes requirements on firms, universities and colleges, and government as employer, is the law of the land in many modern democracies, and also entrenched in the common-sense morality most people embrace. By contrast, fair equality of opportunity is a controversial principle, which no existing nation seriously strives to achieve or comes close to achieving.
FEO could not be fully achieved without conflict with other values. Consider that parents naturally want to help their children develop the talents needed for competitive success. Some parents control a lot of resources useful for this purpose; some parents have few such resources. The ordinary interaction of parents with their children is then an obstacle to the achievement of fair equality of opportunity. If society were fully to achieve FEO, then either parental freedom to help their children in ways that give them a competitive edge would have to be curtailed or such help would have to be exactly offset by compensating infusion of social resources toward the education and socialization of children whose parents are less effective. (See Fishkin 1983 and Brighouse and Swift 2009).
A society that satisfied the ideal of formal equality of opportunity might provide grim conditions of life for those who are unsuccessful in competitions for positions of advantage. Even a perfect meritocracy that satisfies the stringent Rawlsian fair equality of opportunity principle might impose the same grim conditions of life on those who lack marketable merit and skill. The class of competitive losers might include some who have adequate native talents but fail to make good use of them, but some of the losers will be those with the bad luck to be born without much by way of native talent. The question then arises whether any further substantive ideals of equality, beyond meritocratic ideals, should be affirmed. (See Schar 1967.)
One family of substantive equality ideals, equality of democratic citizenship and civil liberties, is perhaps no more controversial than formal equality of opportunity. Democratic equality embraces the norm that law-makers and top public officials should be selected in democratic elections. All mentally competent adult citizens should be eligible to vote and run for office in free elections that operate against a backdrop of freedom of speech and association, and in which all votes count equally and majority rule prevails. All citizens should have the same wide rights to freedom of speech, assembly, association, and religious practice. Criminal justice rules should be applied evenhandedly to all and should embody the procedural values of the rule of law.
A controversial extension of democratic citizenship resembles Rawlsian equality of fair opportunity applied to the political arena. Call this ideal “equal participation.” Equal participation requires that any individuals in society with the same ambition to influence the political process and the same talents of political persuasion and organization should have equal prospects of influence on the democratic political process. (See Rawls 2005, Lecture VIII, Christiano 1996 and 2008, Walzer 1983, for a criticism, Estlund, 1999, and for a related view, J. Cohen 1989a.)
The remainder of this section surveys several proposals as to what (beyond democratic citizenship and civil liberties) should be distributed equally among the members of society and how equality and inequality in the distribution of these goods should be measured. The latter issue can be posed in this way: When various amounts of heterogeneous goods are held by different individuals, how can one measure individuals' overall holdings of goods so that it can be determined when people's overall holdings are effectively equal?
The Lockean rights approach is so named because an early prominent exponent of the doctrine was John Locke (Locke 1690). It might just as well be viewed as a rejection of egalitarianism rather than as a version of it. Contemporary Lockeans are also known as libertarians (see Nozick 1974).
The Lockean view is that every person has equal basic moral rights—natural rights. Natural rights are rights that one has independently of institutional arrangements, people's subjective opinions, and cultural understandings. A person's natural rights give her a set of claims against all other persons that each person absolutely must respect. Our understanding of a particular rights claim or type or rights claim increases if we can determine whether or not it is forfeitable, waivable by the bearer, and transferable.
The traditional content of Lockean rights is roughly as follows: Each person has the right to do whatever she chooses with whatever she legitimately owns so long as she does not violate the rights of others not to be harmed in certain ways—by force, fraud, coercion, theft, or infliction of damage on person or property. Each person has the right not to be harmed by others in the mentioned ways, unless she voluntarily waives any of her rights or voluntarily transfers them to another or forfeits them by misconduct. Also, each adult person is the full rightful owner of herself and each child person has the right to be nurtured to adult status by those responsible for her creation. It is generally supposed in the Lockean tradition that starting from the premise of self-ownership, under actual conditions on earth one can validly derive strong rights of private appropriation and ownership of land and moveable parts of the earth (Nozick, 1974).
Property ownership of a thing comprises a bundle of rights, the central ones being the right to exclude others from the use of the thing and to control its use oneself. If I own my body, I can exclude others from using it, and I have the right to decide its movements and control what may be done to it. The Lockean supposes that in a world in which self-owning persons confront unowned material resources, moveable and immoveable parts of the Earth, all persons initially have an equal right to use the resources, taking turns if there is crowding. The Lockean supposes this free use regime is provisional. Any individual is permitted to claim any part of the Earth as her private property provided her doing so leaves “enough and as good” for others. Nozick interprets this Lockean Proviso as follows: One's appropriation and continued holding of a part of the Earth as one's private property is morally permissible provided that all persons affected by this claim of ownership are rendered no worse off by it than they would have been if instead the thing had remained under free use (Nozick 1974, chapter 7; compare Simmons 1992, chapter 5). (A different account will need to be given for intellectual property, property rights in ideas.)
Lockean rights do not single out a state of affairs, that in which everyone's rights are fully respected, and hold that all people are obligated to act in whatever ways are needed to bring about this state of affairs. Each person's right generates a duty to respect that right on the part of every other person. Rights are constraints on what each individual may do, and do not set goals that all are together obligated to fulfill (Nozick 1974, chapter 3).
A more egalitarian variant of Lockean rights doctrine combines the right of self-ownership with skepticism about the Lockean account of the moral basis of private ownership rights. Instead the left-wing Lockean asserts that each person is the full rightful owner of herself and each adult person has a right to a per capita share of ownership of the unimproved land and resources of the Earth. In short, this version of Lockeanism combines robust self-ownership with an egalitarian account of world ownership. There are several variants to this doctrine. Critics explore whether or not the doctrine is normatively stable: Do any plausible grounds there might be for denying Lockean private ownership of the world also generate grounds for denying individual self-ownership? Do any grounds there might be for insisting on individual self-ownership also generate reasons to insist on Lockean private ownership of the world? (See Steiner 1994, G. Cohen 1995, Vallentyne and Steiner 2000a and 2000b, and Van Parijs 1995).
The nature of the dispute between the right-wing and left-wing Lockeans emerges into view when we consider justice across generations. Suppose at one time the Earth is unowned and persons alive then appropriate all valuable land. On the next day, new people are born. What natural rights to land do they have? The left-libertarian holds that the doctrine of ownership must provide for fair treatment of each successive generation, and this requires that each new person has a right to an equal share of the value of unimproved resources or to some similar entitlement. The right-libertarian holds that the Lockean Proviso fully accommodates the legitimate claims of new persons. On this view, there is no fundamental right to an equal share in any sense. Luck plays a legitimate role in the operation of a natural rights regime. Granted, it is bad luck for me if I am born uncharming and lacking in good lucks and others are not voluntarily willing to enter into romance or friendship with me, but my distressed condition does not tend to show that my rights have been violated. And granted, it is bad luck for me if I come late on the scene and those who came first happen to be far better off in material wealth prospects than I, but the fact that there are unequal prospects does not tend to show that my rights have been violated. Provided the Lockean proviso is continuously satisfied and the appropriations by others leave me no worse off than I would have been under continued free use, my being worse off than others gives me no moral complaint against their property holdings.
The Marxian tradition in political and economic thought urges the desirability of eliminating some of the inequalities associated with the institutions of a capitalist market economy. Interpreting Karl Marx as an egalitarian normative theorist is a tricky undertaking, however, in view of the fact that he tends to eschew explicit normative theorizing on moral principles and to regard assertions of moral principles as so much ideological dust thrust in the eyes of the workers by defenders of capitalism. Marx does, of course, have an elaborate empirical theory of the evolution of moral principles corresponding to changes in the economic mode of production.
In “The Critique of the Gotha Program,” Marx asserts that in the first phase of communist society the economy will distribute goods according to the norm, to each according to his labor contribution. This norm can be regarded as defining an equal right, but like any such right, it is defective. One defect is that some individuals are naturally more able than others, and so the amount of one's labor contribution will vary depending on factors that vary by luck beyond one's power to control. For this and other reasons Marx asserts it will be desirable to discard this norm when a higher phase of communist society is attained. Then society can move beyond the sphere of bourgeois right altogether and operate according to the norm, from each according to his ability, to each according to his needs. Despite Marx's disclaimer, he seems to be proposing a principle of equal right: Each has the right to receive economic goods that satisfy her needs to the same extent provided she contributes to the economy according to her ability. But Marx would resist the description of this norm as a principle of justice or moral rights. One consideration in his mind may be that moral rights ought to be enforced, but when it is feasible and desirable to implement higher-phase communist distribution, the implementation can be carried out successfully without any legal or informal coercion, and hence should not occur through any process of social enforcement. Or so Marx thinks. (See Marx 1978, Wood 1981, Cohen, G., 1988 and 1995.)
In modern societies with market economies, an egalitarian is generally thought to be one who supports equality of income and wealth (income being a flow, wealth a stock). Respecting this usage, this entry considers an egalitarian in the broad sense to be someone who prefers in actual or at least non-exotic circumstances that people should be more nearly equal in income and wealth and favors policies that aim to bring about such equality.
Money is a conventional medium of exchange. Given an array of goods for sale at various prices, with some money one has the option to purchase any combination of these goods, within the budget constraint set by the amount of money one has. What money can purchase in a given society depends on the state of its economy and also on legal and cultural norms that may limit in various ways what is allowed to be put up for sale. For example, the laws may forbid the sale of sexual activity, human organs intended for transplant, the right to become a parent of a particular child by adoption, narcotic drugs, and so on. What money can purchase also obviously depends on what one is free to do with whatever one purchases—one may catch fish with the fishing rod one purchases only with a license and in accordance with rules issued by the state agency that regulates fishing.
Leaving these complications in the background, one can appreciate that having money gives one effective freedom to engage in a wide variety of activities and experiences. One has the option to purchase any of many commodities and do with them whatever is legally and conventionally allowed, up to the limit of one's budget. The ideal of equality of income and wealth is roughly the ideal that people should enjoy this effective freedom to the same extent.
This ideal is attractive to some and repulsive to others. One serious objection is that to bring about and sustain the condition in which all people have the same amount of money would require continuous and extensive violation of people's Lockean rights, which as standardly understood include the right to gain more property than others possess by gift or trade or hard work. Another, closely related objection is that a regime of equal money could be maintained only by wrongful interference with people's liberty, because if money is distributed equally at one time people will choose to act in ways that over time will tend to result in unequal distribution of money at later times. (For the first objection, see Nozick 1974, chapter 7, for the second, see Walzer 1983.)
Another objection to the ideal of monetary equality is that its pursuit would inhibit people's engagement in wealth-creating and wealth-saving activity, and in the not very long run would reduce society's stock of wealth and make us all worse off in the terms of the effective freedom that was being equalized. Yet another objection is that people behave in ways that render them more and less deserving, and monetary good fortune is among the types of things that people come to deserve differentially.
The advocate of egalitarianism in the broad sense has some replies. Unless some substantive argument is given as to why Lockean rights should be accorded moral deference, the mere fact that equality conflicts with Lockean rights does not by itself impugn the ideal of equality. Maybe some purported “rights” should not be regarded as momentous, and their sacrifice to secure equality might be acceptable on balance. In the same vein, one might hold that the fact that continuous restriction of individual liberty is needed to satisfy some norm does not by itself tell us whether the moral gain from satisfying the ideal is worth the moral cost of lessened freedom. Some restrictions of liberty are undeniably worth their cost, and some ideal of equality might be among the values that warrant some sacrifice of liberty.
Equality might be upheld as one value among others, and increase in wealth or in wealth per capita may be included along with equality in a pluralistic ethics. We may want more effective freedom (of the sort money combined with goods for sale provides), and we may also want this freedom equally distributed, and then we would need to find an acceptable compromise of these values to deal with cases when they conflict in practice. Much the same might be said about the conflict between the achievement of equality of money and the distribution of good fortune according to people's differential desert.
Monetary equality can strike one as a misguided ideal for the different reason that it does not deal in what is of fundamental importance. The value of purchasing power, equal or unequal, depends on the value of what is for sale. Imagine that the economy of a society is organized so it produces only trivial knick-knacks. Freedom to purchase trivia is a trivial freedom, and rendering it equal does not significantly improve matters. (Critics of consumerism and consumer culture are moved by the idea that in actual modern societies, the economy, responsive to consumer demand, is responsive to demands for what is not very worthwhile and ignores many truly important human goods, that either happen to be not for sale or that by their nature are not suitable for sale on a market.)
Another concern about monetary equality is that purchasing power interacts with individuals' personal powers and traits, and real freedom reflects the interaction, which an emphasis on purchasing power alone conceals. Consider two persons, one of whom is blind, legless, and armless, while the other has good eyesight and full use of her limbs. Given equal money, the first must spend his money on devices and services to cope with his handicaps, while the second may purchase far more of what she likes. Here equality of purchasing power seems to leave the two very unequal in real freedom to live their lives as they choose. But the case of handicaps is just an extreme instance of what is always present, namely each individual has a set of traits and natural powers bestowed by genetic inheritance and early socialization, and these differ greatly across persons and greatly affect people's access to valuable ways to live.
One response to the problematic features of the monetary equality ideal is to shift to the notion of real freedom as that which an egalitarian morality should be concerned to equalize. Real or effective freedom contrasts with formal freedom. You are formally free to go to Canada just in case no law or convention backed by penalties prevents you from going and no one would coercively interfere if you attempted to travel there. In contrast, you are really or effectively free to go to Canada just in case this is an option that you may choose—if you choose to go and seriously try to go, you will get there, and if you do not choose to go and make a serious attempt to go, you do not get there. (One might lack formal freedom to do something yet be really free to do it, if one was able to evade or overcome the legal and extralegal obstacles to doing that thing.)
Another response to the problematic features of the monetary equality ideal aims to cope with the thought that freedom of purchasing power may not be of great importance. The response is to characterize what we should be equalizing in terms that directly express what is reasonably regarded as truly important.
Both responses are present in a proposal made by Amartya Sen in several publications beginning in 1980 (see Sen 1980 and 1992 and the references cited in Sen 1992). Sen suggests that in so far as we should value equality of condition, what we should value is equal real freedom, and more specifically basic functioning capability equality. People may function—do or be something—in any of a huge number of ways. Consider all of the different ways that one might function variously. Many of these are trivial or of little importance; set these to the side. Consider then basic functionings, functionings that are essential or important for human flourishing or valuable agency. Consider all of the packages of functionings that an individual at a time is really free to choose all at once; these are one's capabilities at a time. We may also consider an individual's basic capabilities over the life course. The proposal is that society should sustain basic capability equality. (Care must be taken in identifying an individual's capability sets, since what others choose may affect the freedom one has. One may have the option of choosing the functioning of attending college, but only if not too many persons in one's high school cohort make the same choice.)
We might construe “basic capability” as picking out one of the capabilities needed for a minimally decent life. For example, being able to obtain enjoyment in life and gain scientific knowledge that meet threshold levels deemed “good enough” suffice to give one basic enjoyment and basic knowledge capabilities. Above that threshold level for each capability, differences in the level of capability that people can attain do not signify—they do not change the fact that everyone does or does not enjoy equal basic capabilities. To get equal basic capability for everyone would be to get each person at or above the threshold level for every one of the capabilities that are specified to be necessary for a minimally decent or good enough life. So understood, the basic capability proposal falls in the family of sufficientarian ideals; on which, see the section on “Sufficiency” below.
The capability approach to equality can be developed in different ways depending on how basic capabilities are identified.
Some theorists have explored the capability approach by tying it to an objective account of human well-being or flourishing. The aim is to identify all of the functionings needed for human flourishing. For each of these functionings, the ideal is that each person should be sustained in the capability to engage in every one of these functionings at a satisfactory or good enough level. (See Nussbaum 1990, 1992, and 1999.)
Another use of the capability approach ties it to the idea of what is needed for each person to function as a full participating member of modern democratic society. Each person is to be sustained throughout her life, so far as this is feasible, in the capabilities to function at a satisfactory level in all of the ways necessary for full membership and participation in democratic society. (See Anderson 1999 and Walzer 1983.)
It should be noted that the capability approach as described so far might seem to involve the assumption that anything whatever that reduces or expands an individual's real freedom to function in ways that are valuable should trigger a response on the part of a society or agency that aims to establish and sustain capability equality. This appearance is misleading in at least two different ways. For one thing, Sen clearly wants to allow that one's capabilities can increase by virtue of gaining opportunities to function even though one does not get real freedom to accept or decline the opportunities. Consider the capability to be free of malaria, which opens many malaria-free life options, when the capability is obtained by public health measures beyond the power of the individual agent to control. Also, if what one embraces is basic capability equality for all, then by implication one is countenancing that there may be non-basic capabilities, providing which to all is not required. But even if we amend our conception of capabilities to accommodate these points, one might still deny that every reduction or threat to an individual's (basic) capabilities poses a social justice issue while otherwise working within the capability framework.
One might distinguish aspects of a person's situation that are socially caused from those that are naturally caused. This distinction is evidently rough and needs refinement, but one has some sense of what is intended. That I am unable to run fast or sing a tune on key may be largely due to my genetic endowment, which in this context we may take to be naturally rather than socially caused. In contrast, the facts that given the talents of others and their choices to use them in market interaction, my running ability is nonmarketable but my singing ability enables me to have a career as a professional singer are deemed socially caused. That I have a certain physical appearance is natural (any of a wide variety of childrearing regimens would have produced pretty much this same physical appearance) but that my appearance renders me ineligible for marriage or romantic liaisons is a social fact (social arrangements bring this about and different social arrangements might undo it). Even if my natural physical appearance repels any marital or romantic partners I might seek, society might provide me charm lessons or cosmetic surgery or promulgate an egalitarian norm that encourages the charming and the physically attractive not to shun my company (or institute some mix of these three strategies or some others).
However exactly the natural and social are distinguished, one might restrict the scope of an equality ideal to the smoothing out of socially caused inequalities. As Elizabeth Anderson remarks, “The proper negative aim of egalitarian justice is not to eliminate the impact of brute luck from human affairs, but to end oppression, which by definition is socially imposed” (Anderson 1999, 288). What this restriction amounts to depends on how one distinguishes socially caused from other inequalities. Suppose that society pursues policy A, and that if it pursued policy B instead, a given inequality across people would disappear. Does this fact suffice to qualify the inequality as socially caused or not?
Critics of the capability approach home in on three of its features.
The starting point of the capability approach is that the equality that matters morality or that we are morally required to sustain is equality of freedom of some sort. This starting point is open to challenge. Freedom is no doubt important as a means to many other goods and as something everyone cares about to some considerable extent. But why confine the concern of equality to freedom rather than to achieved outcomes? Suppose that we could supply resources to Smith that will expand her freedom to achieve outcomes she has good reason to value, but we happen to know that this freedom will do nobody any good. She will neglect it and it will be wasted. In these circumstances, why supply the resources? If provision of freedom for its own sake is morally of first-priority importance, then the fact that freedom in this instance will do nobody any good would seem to be an irrelevant consideration. If this fact seems highly pertinent to what we should do, this indicates that freedom may not be the ultimate value the distribution of which is the proper concern of an equality ideal. (A version of this objection can be lodged by advocates of any type of doctrine of equality of outcome against any type of doctrine of equal opportunity for outcomes.)
Another feature of the capability approach as elaborated to this point is that it does not appear to register the significance of personal responsibility as it might appropriately qualify the formulation of an equality ideal (Roemer 1996 and 1998). A simple example illustrates the difficulty. Suppose society is dedicated to sustaining all of its members equally at some level of basic capability. Society provides resources fully adequate for sustaining an individual at this level of basic capability, but he frivolously and negligently squanders the resources. The resources are re-supplied, and squandered again, and the cycle continues. At some point in the cycle, many people would urge that the responsibility of society has been fulfilled, and that it is the individual's responsibility to use provided resources in reasonable ways, if his lack of adequate basic capability is to warrant a claim to equality-restoring social intervention. The capability approach could of course be modified to accommodate responsibility concerns. But it will be useful to turn to consideration of the resourcist approach, within which the aim of integrating equality and responsibility has prompted various proposals.
A third feature of the capability approach that has elicited criticism is the idea that knowledge of human flourishing and what facilitates it must inform the identification of an adequate equality norm. The worry in a nutshell is that in modern societies that secure wide freedoms, people will embrace many opposed conceptions of how to live and of what is choiceworthy in human life. These are matters about which we must agree to disagree. At least if an ideal of equality is being constructed to serve in a public conception of justice that establishes basic terms of morality for a modern democratic society, this ideal must eschew controversial claims about human good and human flourishing such as those in which the capability approach must become embroiled. Martha Nussbaum explores how the capability approach to social equality might function appropriately as a public conception of justice (Nussbaum 2000). Charles Larmore argues that it is wrong for government to impose a policy that could only be justified by appeal to the claim that some controversial conception of the good is superior to another (Larmore 1987 and 1996; for criticism of the neutrality requirement, see Raz 1986 and Sher 1997). In response it might be urged that a conception of human capabilities might be controversial but true and, if known to be true, appropriately imposed by government policy.
The ideal of equality of resources can be understood by recognizing its primary enemies. These enemies comprise all manner of proposals that suppose that in so far as we should care about equality of condition across persons, what we should care about equalizing is some function of the utility or welfare or well-being or good that persons attain over the course of their lives. (There is a complication here, because the resource-oriented approach also opposes the capability approach, which so to speak stands midway between resources and welfare. This raises the question whether the capability approach is an unstable compromise (see Dworkin 2000, chapter 7). This issue surfaces for discussion eleven paragraphs down in this section.) John Rawls offers an especially clear statement of the animating impulse of the equality of resources ideal. He imagines someone proposing that the relevant measure of people's condition for a theory of justice is their level of plan fulfillment or attained satisfaction, and responds that his favored conception “takes a different view. For it does not look behind the use which persons make of the rights and opportunities available to them in order to measure, much less to maximize, the satisfactions they achieve. Nor does it try to evaluate the relative merits of different conceptions of the good. Instead, it is assumed that the members of society are rational persons able to adjust their conceptions of the good to their situation.” (See Rawls 1971, section 15.) Resourcist ideals of equality of condition are non-welfarist.
Several thoughts are intertwined here. One is that equality of condition must be developed as a component of an acceptable theory of justice, intended to be the basic charter of a democratic society and acceptable to all reasonable members of such a society, who are presumed to be disposed to disagree interminably about many ultimate issues concerning religion and the meaning and worth of human life (Rawls 2005). We must seek reasonable terms of cooperation that people who disagree about much can nonetheless accept. If there is anything that people cannot reasonably be expected to agree about, it is what constitutes human good, so introducing a controversial conception of human good as part and parcel of the ideal of equality that is to be at the core of the principles of justice is a bad mistake.
Another thought is that responsible individuals will consider themselves to have a personal obligation, which cannot be shifted to the government or any agency of society, to decide for themselves what is worthwhile in human life and what is worth seeking and to fashion (and refashion as changing circumstances warrant) a plan of life to achieve worthwhile ends. So even if the true theory of human good could be discovered, it would offend the dignity and sense of responsibility of individual persons for some agency of society to preempt this individual responsibility by arranging matters so that everyone achieves human good understood a certain way to a sufficiently high degree. Individuals should take responsibility for their ends. (See Rawls 1971, Rakowski 1992, Dworkin 2000, and for a different view, Fleurbaey 2008).
Another thought that motivates the family of equality-of-resources ideals is that society's obligations by way of providing for its members are limited. A just and egalitarian society is not plausibly held to be obligated to do whatever turns out to be necessary to bring it about that their members attain any given level or share of quality of life. The reason for this is that the quality of life (the degree to which one attains valuable agency and well-being goals) that any individual reaches over the course of her life depends on many choices and actions taken by that very individual, so to a considerable extent, the quality of life one reaches must be up to oneself, not the job of society or some agency acting on behalf of society. Along these lines, the actual course of an individual's life and the degree of fulfillment it reaches also depend on many chance factors for which nobody can reasonably be held accountable. Justice is a practical ideal, not a Don Quixote conception that aims to correct all bad luck of any sort that befalls persons. A reasonable morality understands the social justice obligations of society as limited, not open-ended and unbounded. So if equality of condition is part of social justice, it too must reflect an appropriately limited conception of social responsibility. Equality of resources fills this bill. (See Daniels 1990 and chapters 3 and 4 of Buchanan et al. 2000.)
The trick then is to develop an appropriate conception of resources that can serve in an ideal of equality of condition.
Resources can be external, material goods, such as land and moveable property. One can also extend the domain, and consider traits of persons that are latent talents or instruments that help them to achieve their ends as also included within the set of resources to be equalized. Extending the domain in this way will introduce complexity into the account, because personal talents are attached to persons and cannot simply be transferred to others who lack talent. What one can do is take people's variously valuable personal talents into account in determining how material resources should be distributed so as to achieve an overall distribution that should register as (sufficiently) equal. If Smith lacks good legs, this personal resource deficit might be offset by assigning Smith extra resources so he can buy a wheelchair or other mobility device.
Notice that in elaborating equality of resources, it is assumed that a population of individuals with given traits, generated by genetic inheritance and early socialization, is present, and equalization is to proceed by adjusting features of the individuals' environment or by altering features of the individuals, say by extra education. But of course, moral questions may also be raised about the processes by which individuals come to be born and given early socialization so as to endow them with certain traits. With genetic information about an individual made available to prospective parents before the individual is born, a decision can be made about whether to bring this child to term. In the future, genetic enhancements may be available that can alter the genetic makeup of individuals, and again a morality must consider when enhancements should be supplied and by whom. Raising these questions makes it evident that just assuming an initial population of individuals with given traits takes for granted matters that are very much morally up for grabs (see Buchanan et al. 2000). For the purposes of this entry, this complication is noted only to be set aside.
How can resources be identified and rated? We want to be able to say, given two persons each with different amounts of resources, which one has more resources overall. The literature to date reveals two ways of confronting the question. One has been developed by John Rawls (Rawls 1971), one by Ronald Dworkin (Dworkin, 2000).
Rawls suggests that the conception of resources to be deployed in a resourcist ideal of equality is primary social goods. These are defined as distributable goods that a rational person prefers to have more rather than less of, whatever else she wants. (A variant conception identifies them as goods that any rational person would want who gives priority to her interests in (1) cooperating with others on fair terms and (2) selecting and if need be revising a conception of the good and a set of life aims along with pursuing the conception and the aims.) On this approach it is not so far clear how to measure a person's holding of social primary goods overall if there are various primary goods and one has different amounts of the different kinds. The primary goods approach has yet to be developed in detail. Rawls has suggested that the scope of this problem of devising an index of primary goods is lessened by giving some primary goods, the basic liberties, priority over the rest. For the remainder, Rawls suggests that the relative weight of primary goods can be set by considering what people (regarded as free and equal citizens) need. (See Rawls 2001, section 17.)
Rawls does not propose the primary goods approach as adequate to guide us in figuring out what egalitarianism requires by way of compensation for those with serious personal talent deficits. His account assumes that we are dealing with normal individuals who enjoy good health and have the normal range of abilities. In his account, the problem of deciding what an egalitarian approach requires by way of helping (for example) the disabled is to be handled separately, as a supplement to the primary goods account.
The problem of the handicapped is the tip of the iceberg according to the capabilities approach advocate. All people vary enormously in their personal traits, and these traits interact with their material resources and other features of their circumstances to determine what each one is able to do and be with a given resource share. Since we care about what we can do and be with our resources, merely focusing attention on the resources as the primary goods advocate does is inherently fetishistic. The Rawlsian focuses on the distribution of stuff, but we do not care about the distribution of stuff except insofar as the stuff distribution affects the distribution of capability or real freedom. This is in a nutshell the capability approach criticism of primary goods forms of resourcism.
To some this critique of resourcism appears unstable. The capability theorist criticizes the resourcist for tying the idea of just distribution to the idea of fair shares of resources, but resources are not what ultimately matter to us. But this criticism can be turned against the capability theorist. Ultimately each of us wants to lead a good, choiceworthy life, one that is rich in fulfillment, and not merely to lead a life that has as its backdrop lots of options or capabilities among which one can choose. One wants a good life, not just good options. More options in some circumstances might predictably lead to a worse life. With a moderate level of resources (or capabilities) I might live well, whereas with more resources (or capabilities) I might choose heroin or methamphetamine and live badly. Ultimately we are concerned with welfare (living well) and only secondarily with capabilities (abilities and opportunities to live well). In this light, from the welfarist standpoint, the capability approach looks fetishistic, just as from the capability standpoint, the primary goods approach to the measure of people's condition for purposes of deciding what constitutes an equal (or more broadly, a fair) distribution looks to be fetishistic. (The worry that the capabilities approach is an unstable compromise, without endorsement of the welfarist alternative, is voiced in Dworkin 2000, chapter 7.)
The Rawlsian will reply that it is not the proper business of government to be rating and assessing people's personal traits as the capabilities approach and welfarist approaches require. Respect for persons dictates that the state must respect its citizens by not looking beyond resource shares to assess what individuals can do with them and actually do with them (Carter 2011).
Dworkin's approach begins with the idea that the measure of a resource that one person holds is what others would be willing to give up to get it. From this standpoint competitive market prices are the appropriate measure of the resources one possesses: In particular, the division of a lot of resources among a group of people is equal when all are given equal purchasing power for the occasion and all the resources are sold off in an auction in which no one's bids are final until no one wants to change her bids given the bids of the others.
This equal auction is just a first approximation to Dworkin's proposal. Two complications need to be introduced. One is that one ought to extend the domain of resources to include personal talents as well as external property. A second is that equality of resources as conceived in this construction supposes that the results of unchosen luck, but not chosen option luck, should be equalized.
Take the second wrinkle first. If we start from an initial equality of resources brought about by the equal auction mechanism, individuals might then go on to use and invest and spend their resource allotments in various ways. Assume the rules mediating their interaction are set and morally unproblematic. Roughly speaking, we say people are free to interact with others on any mutually agreeable terms but not to impose the costs of their activities on others without the mediation of voluntary consent. Starting from an initial equality of resources, any results that issue from voluntary interactions reiterated over time do not offend against the equality ideal. Let voluntary choice and chosen luck prevail.
The first wrinkle is that individuals differ in their unchosen natural talent resource allotments. These should somehow be equalized. But how? The Dworkin proposal is that we can in thought establish an insurance market, in which people who do not know whether they will be born disabled (afflicted with negative talents) and do not know what market price their positive talents will fetch, can insure themselves in a variant of the equal purchasing power auction against the possibility of being handicapped or having talents that fetch low market price. In this way in thought unchosen luck is transformed into morally inoffensive chosen luck (so far as this is thinkable).
The final Dworkin proposal then is that the thought experiment of the equal auction modified as above is used to estimate in actual circumstances in a rough and ready way who is worse off and who better off than others through no choice of her own. A tax and transfer policy is instituted then that tries to mimic the results of the imaginary equal auction and hypothetical insurance market. To the extent that we establish and sustain such policies—voila!—we have equality of resources across the members of an actual society. (See Dworkin 2000).
The Dworkin proposal is noteworthy for its integration of themes of equality and personal responsibility in a single conception. But the moral appropriateness of linking these themes in the particular way that he espouses is open to question.
One concern arises from the theoretical role that hypothetical insurance markets are to play in the determination of what is to count as equality of resources. This role assumes increasing prominence in Dworkin's later work (Dworkin 2000, chapters 8–13; also Dworkin 20–11, Part 5, especially chapter 16). Dworkin eventually defines the equal distribution of privately held resources as the one that would issue from an initial auction in which all have equal bidding power to purchase materials resources, supplemented by hypothetical insurance markets against the possibility of suffering the bad brute luck of handicap or low marketable talent. From then on, ordinary market relations govern relations among individuals, and their upshot does not impugn the equality of the initial staring point unless new forms of brute luck intervene. For these Dworkin imagines further hypothetical insurance markets, in which the appropriate compensation for post-initial-auction bad brute luck is set by the average level of insurance that people would have purchased if they knew the incidence of the bad brute luck, its impact on people, and the available devices for mitigating it, but not their personal chances of suffering the bad brute luck. Given this background, just policies in actual societies should aim to mimic the results of these hypothetical equal mechanisms. In this exercise, we seek to undo the effect of brute luck but not option luck, that former being luck that falls on you in ways beyond your power to control and the latter being luck that you can avoid, and maybe reasonably avoid, by voluntary choice.
Notice the transition from (1) the insurance decisions you actually make to (2) the insurance decisions you would have made under imagined equal circumstances to (3) the insurance decisions the average member of society would have made under hypothetical equal circumstances. One might wonder for a start why the last of these should be normative for determining what we owe to Sally, who was raised in poverty and became paraplegic after a ski accident. Counterfactuals about what the average person would have done are arguably of doubtful relevance and counterfactuals about what a particular individual would have done in wildly different circumstances may generally lack truth value.
The distinction between brute luck and option luck does not exhaust the possibilities. Most luck is a bit of both. Option luck varies by degree, but it is unclear how the determination of equality of resources should accommodate this fact. Moreover, the insurance decisions on which Dworkin's procedures rely clearly mix together the brute and option luck he wants to separate. In deciding on hypothetical insurance for health care one will take account of the likelihood that one will engage in imprudent behavior that will affect one's health status.
Others point out that what insurance you would have purchased against a brute luck calamity might not intuitively align with the different notion, what compensation for suffering the calamity is appropriate. The simplest way to see this is that for many people, money will have more use if one is healthy and normal than if one is plagued with physical disability, so given a hypothetical choice to insure for handicaps, one might prefer an insurance policy that gives one less income if one is handicapped and more income if one is not. The insurance decision may be reasonable but the idea that on this basis we ought to be forcibly transferring wealth away from handicapped people and distributing the resources to the non-handicapped is arguably not reasonable (Roemer 2002, and for more far-reaching doubts about hypothetical insurance, Fleurbaey 2008).
Setting to the side the details of Dworkin's construction, we can ask about the prospects of the general project he pursues. The starting point, which some had considered prior to Dworkin's contribution, is to consider what we should count as an equal distribution when people have different goods and they have different preferences over these goods. The basic idea is to treat as an equal distribution of resources one which no one prefers to alter—no one prefers any other person's pile of resources to her own. This fairness test does not require interpersonal comparison of welfare, hence has an appeal if interpersonal comparison is incoherent or ethically problematic. No-envy is not generally satisfiable, but there is a family of fairness norms that could be construed as egalitarian criteria for assessing distributions and that is resourcist in the basic sense of eschewing interpersonal welfare comparisons. Suppose we can separate for each person her features for which she should be held responsible and her features for which she should not be held responsible. One fairness norm says that egalitarian transfers should not vary depending on people's features for which they should be held responsible. Another fairness norm says that people with the same features for which they should be held responsible should be treated the same. In the general case, we cannot fulfill both of these norms, but a whole gamut of compromises between them can be identified and have been studied (mainly by economists). The Dworkin view occupies just one point in a large space of possibilities. As is already evident, some of these criteria relax to some degree (or even entirely dispense with) the Dworkin insistence on personal responsibility—the idea that each person is responsible for her choices in the sense that no one is obligated to make good the shortfall in her condition if her choices turn out badly. (Dworkin's account has an extra wrinkle here: each person is responsible for her ambitions and what flows from them, and one's ambitions are one's desires that one is glad to have, does not repudiate). The vision of personal responsibility that is integral to Dworkin's approach does not characterize the broader family of resourcist distributive fairness doctrines that eschews interpersonal welfare comparisons and investigates variants of the no-envy test (see Fleurbaey 2008 for an accessible survey and somewhat skeptical exploration, and Varian 1974 for an early contribution).
Go back to the idea that a viable account of equal distribution must be appropriately sensitive to personal responsibility by dictating compensation for unchosen endowments but not for ambition and choice. The most far-reaching skepticism on this point denies that personal responsibility can be more than instrumentally valuable, a tool for securing other values. One might hold that in a world in which human choices are events and all events are caused by prior events according to physical laws, responsibility can make sense pragmatically and instrumentally in various settings but does not really make good normative sense under scrutiny. One might reach a similar result by noting that even if persons are truly responsible for making some choices rather than others, what we could reasonably be held responsible for and what surely lies beyond our power to control run together to produce actual results and cannot be disentangled. On this view, if we care about equality, we should seek not responsibility-modified equality but straight equality of condition, using responsibility norms only as incentives and prods to bring about equality (or a close enough approximation to it) at a higher level of material well-being.
Another sort of skepticism challenges whether the broad project of holding people responsible for their chosen luck but not for their unchosen luck really makes sense, because unchosen luck of genetic inheritance and early socialization fixes the individual's choice-making and value-selecting abilities. What one chooses, bad or good, may simply reflect the unchosen luck that gave one the ability to be a good or a bad chooser. Suppose for example that Smith chooses to experiment with cigarettes and heroin, and these gambles turn out badly in the form of contraction of lung cancer and long-term hard drug addiction. He is then far worse off than others, but his bad fortune comes about through his own choice—hence is not compensable according to Dworkinian equality of resources. But that Smith chooses these bad gambles and Jones does not may simply reflect the unchosen bad luck that Smith had in his genetic inheritance and early socialization. So holding him fully responsible for the fortune he encounters through chosen gambles may make no sense if we follow through the underlying logic of the Dworkin proposal itself. This takes us back to welfarist equality conceptions, which the resourcist theorist wishes to steer away from at all cost (Roemer 1985 and 1986).
The ideal of equality of welfare holds that it is desirable that the amount of human good gained by each person for herself (and by others for her) over the course of her life should be the same. Human good, also known as welfare or well-being or utility, is what an individual gets insofar as her life goes well for herself (Parfit 1984, Appendix I).). This awkward phrase is meant to distinguish one's life going well for oneself, as one would wish one's life to go from the standpoint of rational prudence, and its going well by way of producing good that enters the lives of other people or animals or fulfills some impersonal good cause. Suppose my life in its entirety consists in sticking my finger in a dike and slowly painfully freezing to death, like the little Dutch boy in the children's fable. So lived, this life produces lots of good for millions of people saved from flood and drowning, but for me it produces no good, just slow misery. The life just imagined is a good in the sense of morally admirable life but not a life that contains much welfare or human good for the one living it.
The background thought is then that morality is concerned with the production and fair distribution of human good. Nothing else ultimately matters (except animal and nonhuman person welfare, but leave these important qualifications aside). So to the extent we believe that fair distribution is equal distribution, that morality requires that everyone get the same, what everyone should then have the same of is human good or welfare or well-being.
To work out this conception of equality of condition would involve determining what account of the nature of human good is most plausible. One account is hedonism, which holds the good to be pleasure and absence of pain. Pleasure and the absence of pain might be identified with happiness, but there are alternative accounts of happiness. For example, one might hold that a person is happy at a time just in case she is satisfied with how her life is going at that time, and happy regarding her life as a whole up to now to the degree she is satisfied with how her life has gone as a whole up to now. If one identifies the good with happiness according to this or another construal of what it is to be happy, we have a non-hedonic happiness account of human good (Sumner 1996, Haybron 2008, and Feldman 2010). Another account identifies the good with desire satisfaction or life aim fulfillment. A variant of this last approach holds that the relevant aims and desires are those that would withstand ideal reflection with full information unmarred by cognitive error (such as adding two and two and getting five). A quite different account supposes that the good is constituted by the items on a list of objectively valuable beings and doings. The more the individual attains the items on the objective list over the course of her life, the better her life goes, whatever her subjective opinions and attitudes about such attainments might be. There are also hybrid views, such as that the good is valuable achievement that one enjoys, or that the good is getting what one wants for its own sake in so far as what one wants and gets is also objectively valuable (Parfit 1984, Appendix I; Adams 1999, chapter 3). The most plausible conception of the ideal of equality of welfare incorporates whatever is the best theory of human good or welfare. (In this connection see Griffin 1986 and Hurka 1990.)
Any such account bumps into problems concerning personal responsibility and the sense that the obligations of society are limited—problems already mentioned in this discussion. A society bent on sustaining equality of welfare would continue pouring resources down the drain if worse off individuals insist on negligently squandering whatever resources are expended on them in order to boost their welfare level up to the average level. One might respond to this responsibility challenge by stipulating that equality is only desirable on the condition that individuals are equally responsible or deserving: It is bad if some are worse off than others through no fault or choice of their own. In a slogan, one might assert an ideal of equality of opportunity for welfare. (See Cohen 1989, Arneson 1989, and for criticism Rakowski 1992, Fleurbaey 1995, Scanlon 1997, and Wolff 1998).
Another criticism does not so much challenge the welfarist interpretation of equality of condition but presses the issue, how much weight any such equality of condition ideal should have in competition with other values. Imagine for example that some people, the severely disabled, are far worse off than others, and are through no fault or choice of their own extremely poor transformers of resources into welfare. A society bent on sustaining equality of welfare or equal opportunity for welfare as a first priority would be obligated to continue transferring resources from better off to worse off no matter how many better off people must then suffer any amount of welfare loss just so long as the pertinent welfare condition of a single still worse off individual can be improved even by a tiny amount.
Another criticism challenges the welfarist conceptions of equality of condition directly. One observes that in a diverse modern society, individuals will reasonably disagree about what is ultimately good and worthwhile in human life. Hence no conception of welfare is available to serve as a consensus standard for a public morality acceptable to all reasonable persons. In a similar spirit, one might invoke the idea that responsible individuals cannot acquiesce in the assumption of the responsibility on the part of the government to determine what is worthwhile and choiceworthy for them, for this responsibility rests squarely on each individual's shoulders and cannot legitimately be dislodged from that perch. (See especially Dworkin, 2000, chapter 7, also Arneson 2000.)
Notice that equality of welfare and equal opportunity for welfare do not exhaust the welfarist egalitarian alternatives. Take the example of a view that is oriented to equality of perfectionist achievement (achievement of objectively valuable achievements of a kind that make one's life go better for oneself). One might hold that what is morally valuable and ought to be promoted is equality of achievement, or equal opportunity for achievement, or another view along the lines of equal achievement of one's potential or equal opportunity to achieve one's potential. Say that each person has a native talent for achievement. I have little native talent; you have a lot. Egalitarianism might be construed as requiring that so far as is possible, social arrangements be set so that each of us achieves, or can achieve, the same percentage of his native potential over the course of her life. Everyone's ratio of actual achievement to native potential for achievement should be the same. So my having the opportunity to achieve little, and my actually achieving little, compared to you, on this conception would not necessarily offend against the egalitarian ideal (see McMahan 1996, and for the thought that measurement of achievements on a single scale is chimerical, Raz 1986).
Philosophical discussions of what should be equalized if we care about equality of condition raise dust that has not yet settled in any sort of consensus. All the rival views canvassed encounter difficulties, the seriousness of which is at present hard to discern.
It should be noted that the issue, how to measure people's condition for purposes of a theory of equality, connects to a broader issue, how to measure people's condition for purposes of a theory of fair distribution. Equality is just one of the possible views that might be taken as to what fair treatment requires. (For example, the sufficientarian and prioritarian principles discussed in the text below both admit of resourcist and welfarist and “capabilitist” variants.) Any theory of distributive justice that says that sometimes better off persons should improve the situation of worse off persons requires an account of the basis of interpersonal comparisons that enables us to determine who is better off and who is worse off.
Finally, the reader might wish to test the merits of rival answers to the equality-of-what question by considering a social justice issue different in character from the issues considered so far. Suppose a society is divided into two or more linguistic communities, one being by far the most populous. The language of the dominant community is the official language of public life, and a minority linguistic group demands redress in the name of social equality. The minority group seeks government action to help sustain and promote the survival and flourishing of the minority linguistic community. For another example, suppose a modern democratic society contains more or less intact remnants of hunter-gatherer bands who claim in the name of social equality the right to withdraw from the larger surrounding society and practice their traditional way of life and run their affairs autonomously. How should a society committed to an ideal of equality of condition handle this type of issue? (See Kymlicka 1995, Young 1990, Anderson 1999, and Barry 2001.)
The discussion so far presupposes that an egalitarian holds that in some respect people should get the same or be accorded the same treatment. There are other possibilities. One is the idea that in an egalitarian society people should relate to one another as equals or should enjoy the same fundamental status (and also perhaps the same rank and power).
Relational equality ideals are often coupled with the ideal of equal democratic citizenship. On this view, in an egalitarian society, all permanent adult members of society are equal citizens, equal in political rights and duties, including the right to an equal vote in democratic elections that determine who shall be top public officials and lawmakers responsible for enacting laws and public policies enforced on all. An ideal of social equality complements political equality norms. The idea is that citizens might be unequal in wealth, resources, welfare, and other dimensions of their condition, yet be equal in status in a way that enables all to relate as equals. On this approach, an egalitarian society contrasts sharply with a society of caste or class hierarchy, in which the public culture singles out some as inferior and some as superior, and contrasts also with a society with a dictatorial or authoritarian political system, accompanied by socially required kowtowing of ordinary members of society toward political elites.
From the standpoint of the relational equality versions of egalitarianism, equality of condition doctrines get the moral priorities backward. These doctrines make a fetish of what should not matter to us, or should not matter very much. A better approach is to look at distributive justice issues by asking what social and distributive arrangements are needed to establish and sustain a society of free, equal people, a society in which individuals all relate as equals. When the question is posed in this way, relational equality advocates sometimes claim to discern a new strong case for embracing a sufficientarian approach to distributive justice. That some people have more money than others is not an impediment to a society of equals, the argument goes. But if some are so poor they are effectively excluded from market society or pushed to its margins, they are in effect branded as socially inferior, which offends against relational equality. Some philosophers argue for some restriction on the size of the gap between richest and poorest that society tolerates, again as what is needed to sustain a society of equals. Others might see the difference principle as required for the same purpose. Some also pleas for institutional insulation of the political and some social spheres so as to protect these as realms of equality from the corrosive influence of economic inequality (Walzer 1983 and Rawls 2005, Lecture VIII).
The ideal of a just modern society as a democratic society in which citizens relate as equals appears in writings by Michael Walzer on social justice (Walzer, 1983). Elizabeth Anderson and Samuel Scheffler both affirm versions of relational equality and from this standpoint criticize the family of views that Anderson calls “luck egalitarian,” whose foremost exponents are perhaps G. A. Cohen and Ronald Dworkin (Cohen 1989, Anderson 1999, Scheffler 2010, chapters 7 and 8, Dworkin 2000, and for responses to criticisms, Dworkin 2003 and 2010 and Arneson 2004). According to Anderson, the luck egalitarian holds that unchosen and uncourted inequalities ought to be eliminated and that chosen and courted inequalities should be left standing). She criticizes these views on several grounds. One is that the luck egalitarian wrongly takes the aim of egalitarian justice to be achieving an equal distribution of stuff rather than egalitarian solidarity and respect among members of society. Another is that the policy recommendations implied by luck egalitarian principles are too harsh in their dealings with people who fare badly but are deemed personally responsible for their plight (see also Fleurbaey 1995). A third is that the luck egalitarian, in order to establish that people who are badly off are owed equalizing compensation, must involve distributive agencies in intrusive and disrespectful inquiries that issue in public negative assessments of people's traits as grounding the conclusion that these unfortunate individuals are not properly held personally responsible for their misfortune (see also Wolff 1998). A related criticism is that luck egalitarianism adopts a moralizing posture toward individual wayward choice that would make sense only if free will libertarianism were correct (Scheffler 2010).
A further criticism is that the luck egalitarian supposes that if we aim to undo unchosen luck, this aim somehow provides an underlying justification for some form of equal distribution (Hurley 2003). It is not clear that undoing the influence of unchosen luck has anything to do with promoting equal distribution: consider that sometimes via unchosen luck people end up equally well off. A better strategy is for the luck egalitarian to start with the intuitive idea that distribution should be equal and then allow that this presumption for equality can be taken away when people could sustain equal distribution and instead end up unequally well off via individual choices. Equality is deemed morally valuable on the condition that inequality does not emerge from choices for which people are reasonably held responsible.
Another criticism of luck egalitarianism, pressed by Scheffler and especially Anderson, is that the doctrine engenders an inappropriate expansion of what is deemed to be the legitimate business of the state. Suppose we distinguish roughly between misfortune that is imposed on people by social action and social arrangements and misfortune that just falls on people without being imposed by anyone. The distinction draws a line between inequality due to society and inequality due to nature. In the words of Anderson, “the proper negative aim of egalitarian justice is not to eliminate the impact of brute luck from human affairs, but to end oppression, which by definition is socially imposed” (Anderson 1999).
Relational equality ideals might be regarded either as required by justice or as not required by justice or other morally mandatory principles, rather as morally optional. Or a component of social equality might count as a justice requirement while another component is treated as a part of a broader social ideal that is desirable but not mandatory.
The idea of relating as equals can be construed in different ways. Samuel Scheffler suggests one specification when he writes that “we believe that there is something valuable about human relationships that are, in certain crucial respects at least, unstructured by differences of rank, power, or status” (Scheffler 2010, 225). The idea is that equality of rank, power, and status is both instrumentally valuable and valuable for its own sake. He immediately notes that such differences are ubiquitous in the social life of modern industrial democracies, so equality so understood is puzzling. If the ideal calls on us to tear down and completely restructure the social life of modern industrial democracies, it looks problematic. Why accept this demand? If one qualifies and hedges the ideal, so it is less revisionary, then the question arises, what is the basis for drawing these lines of qualification and hedge.
At this point the advocate of an equality of condition doctrine in the luck egalitarian range may see an opening. The advocate may urge that we should regard inequalities in rank, power, and status not as desirable or undesirable in themselves but in purely instrumental terms, as means or impediments to fundamental justice goals, the ones identified by the best version of luck egalitarianism. For example, a welfarist luck egalitarian will say that the inequalities in rank, power, and status that we should accept are those that contribute effectively to promoting good lives for people, taking account of fair distribution of good across individual persons. The inequalities that are impediments to promoting good lives for people, fairly distributed, we should oppose. The luck egalitarian will add that we should distinguish two different claims that might be asserted in holding that Schefflerian social equality is valuable. Social inequality might be affirmed either as morally wrong or as humanly bad, something a prudent person would seek to avoid. The luck egalitarian critic of this relational equality ideal is committed only to rejecting it as a proposal for the domain of moral right. If being on the lower rungs of a status hierarchy were per se a way in which one's life might go badly, like failing to attain significant achievement or to have healthy friendships, it would register in a luck egalitarian calculation of a person's situation that determines what we fundamentally owe one another—at least according to versions of luck egalitarianism that affirm a welfarist measure of people's condition.
Scheffler makes a suggestion as to how one might incorporate into the theory of justice a norm against certain inequalities of rank, power, and status and justify the selection of the “certain inequalities” that are singled out in this way. One might invoke the Rawlsian political liberalism project (Rawls, 2005). In this project what is rock-bottom is the idea of society as a system of fair cooperation among free and equal people. This idea is understood in philosophically noncommittal ways so that it can plausibly command support from all of the reasonable comprehensive conceptions of the right and the good affirmed by members of society and also from reasonable individuals who affirm no such comprehensive conception. The principles of justice are the principles people committed to this idea of social cooperation would affirm as capturing the core of their intuitive pre-theoretical commitment. Norms of relational equality that figure in this scheme would then qualify as principles of justice that all citizens of modern democracies can affirm, and to which we are already implicitly committed. To evaluate this suggestion one would have to examine and assess the Rawlsian political liberalism project.
An alternative construal of the relational equality ideal proposes that people in a society relate as equals when the society's political constitution is democratic and all members are enabled to be fully functioning members of democratic society (Walzer 1983, Anderson 1999). All are fully functioning members of democratic society when all are able to participate to a “good enough” extent in all of its core institutions and practices. So understood, the relational equality ideal becomes a version of the sufficiency doctrine (on which, see section 6.1 of this entry).
Relational equality advocates usually advance their equality ideal as a rival to other understandings of equality including luck egalitarianism. But these disparate equality ideals need not be opposed. For example, one could (1) affirm relational equality and hold that in a just society people should relate as free and equal and also (2) affirm luck egalitarianism and hold that people should be equal in their condition (according to their holdings and attainments of resources, capabilities, or welfare or according to some other measure) except that people's being less well off than others is acceptable if the worse off could have avoided this fate by reasonable voluntary choice. One could uphold both ideals even if they sometimes conflict. One could also mix and match elements of these different equality ideals. For example, one might hold that people should have equal status and relate as equals but add that one can legitimately be demoted to lesser status by being responsible for making bad choices or failing to make good choices. Along this line, even a staunch democratic equality advocate might allow that by virtue of committing a serious crime and being convicted of this offense one forfeits some citizenship rights at least for a time. Egregiously bad conduct might warrant exile. Along the same line, some benefits disbursed by a democratic state might be made conditional on specified forms of responsible choice. These moves would all involve qualifying the relational equality ideal by a luck egalitarian commitment to appropriate sensitivity to personal responsibility. On the other side, a luck egalitarian view might allow that in certain domains entitlement to equal treatment might be forfeitable by one's irresponsible choice but maintain that there is a floor of democratic equality status to which all members of society are unconditionally entitled. Taking this stance would be to qualify commitment to luck egalitarianism by a constraint of insistence on some democratic equality.
Luck egalitarianism could be a module or component in either a consequentialist or non-consequentialist moral doctrine. Luck egalitarianism might specify one goal or even the sole goal to be promoted in the former, or might be understood as a deontically required form of treatment in the latter. The same is true of the relational equality ideal. That people should relate as free and equal might be taken to be a goal to be promoted or an entitlement to be respected.
The discussion of relational equality versus luck egalitarianism has stressed the relational equality critique of the luck egalitarian way of integrating personal responsibility concerns into the ideal of equality. There are other lines of potential conflict. What these are will turn on the particular versions of the ideals being considered. For example, consider versions of luck egalitarianism that affirm the idea that all should have equal opportunity for welfare as assessed over the life course. The advocate of views in the welfarist equality of condition family will worry that relational equality could be fully achieved world-wide even if in each society some people lead avoidably miserable and squalid lives and even if in some societies people on the average are far more likely to lead avoidably miserable and squalid lives than in other societies. In other words, the concern is that the relational equality ideal pays no heed to the moral imperative of bringing it about that people lead genuinely good lives, or have the opportunity to lead genuinely good lives, while ensuring that the opportunities for good are fairly distributed.
Settling which aspect of people's condition (if any) should be the same for all and fixing a measure of people's condition in this respect still does not render an ideal of equality of condition fully determinate. So far the question remains open, among whom should equality of condition obtain? The same question arises if one dismisses or downgrades the equality of condition views and takes some relational equality ideal to capture the core morally required egalitarian aspiration. Among whom should equality, of whatever type is deemed morally required, obtain?
At some spots the discussion to this point has assumed an answer to this question. The issue is posed, in what ways should the members of a society or nation state be made equal? Framing the issue in this way presumes that what is morally valuable is that equality prevails among the members of each separate society. The idea then is that it is desirable that the condition of the inhabitants of India should be rendered more equal and that the condition of inhabitants of Germany should be rendered more equal but that equalizing the condition of Germans and Indians combined need not be desirable. But why not? (On this issue, see Dworkin 2000 and Rawls, “The Law of Peoples,” in Rawls 1999.)
If equality is prized as a means to other values, it may be the case that only equality among individuals who interact in significant ways has a tendency to promote the desired further goals. For example, if we prize equality of possessions to foster social solidarity, it may be that producing equality among people who live in distant parts of the globe and hardly interact will have no tendency to promote solidarity across the combined population. For the instrumental egalitarian, one should seek equality among those collections of people in which equality would produce the desired further results.
If equality is valued for its own sake, rather than as a means to further goals, it is less clear why the domain of persons among whom equality should obtain is limited in space or time or by political boundaries. Why not hold that it is desirable that equality should prevail to the degree this is feasible among all persons who shall ever live?
This question may not be rhetorical. Many philosophers hold that requirements of social justice including requirements of egalitarianism are triggered by social interaction. When people interact in certain ways, then and only then do egalitarian justice requirements apply and become binding on them. Call egalitarian justice theories that adopt this position “social interactionist.”
Perhaps the dominant view among contemporary political theorists is that when people set up a wide-ranging system of coercion on the scale of a political nation, special moral requirements come into play, including a requirement that all whose lives are ruled by this system of coercion should be treated equally or brought to an equal condition in some respects. (If a world government were established, the special requirements would be global in scope.)
This idea comes in various versions. One idea is that it makes sense to deploy the concept of justice—not just egalitarian justice, but any justice notion—only where there is a stable scheme of enforcement in place, or at least the potential for that, which only the framework of a functioning state supplies (Nagel 2005; for criticism see Cohen and Sabel 2006 and Julius 2006). The basic thought is that justice norms cease to be binding if the individual cannot be confident that others will comply so that the goods the scheme of justice promises will in fact obtain. If a bus is stalled at the bottom of a hill, and the passengers can work together to push it to the top of the hill if all cooperate together, but pushing by less than all produces no gain, and there is no expectation that all the rest will cooperate, one has no clear duty to cooperate by doing one's “fair share” of pushing. But the bus example is a special case, which may not generalize to illuminate the run of global justice issues. If some of us insist that the products we buy not be produced by coerced or maltreated laborers, and the result of the insistence is that some laborers suffer less coercion and maltreatment, whether consumers generally follow our example may not diminish or offset the effects of what some do. Justice might require me to join the some who are insisting on fair play. If there is a justice duty falling on economically advanced nations to open their doors more than they now do to needy would-be immigrants, one country's opening its doors as required by this duty does good for the people admitted independently of whether or not any other advanced nations follow suit. My behaving in a way that emits excessive greenhouse gases may result in harm in the future to some determinate persons that is caused by me and would not occur but for my actions, and these facts may bring into play a duty of justice to refrain from wrongfully harming non-consenting others.
Another view is that the state massively coerces individuals residing within its claimed jurisdiction and does not to the same extent massively coerce those outside its territorial borders. The imposition of this massive coercion on individuals inside a nation is a presumptive violation of their autonomy, which demands a strong justification if state coercion is to be rightly deemed legitimate, morally permissible. It is plausible to suppose the required justification must include acknowledgement that the state must organize society so that egalitarian principles such as the Rawlsian difference principle are satisfied. The plausibility of this claim increases once one notices that the state might enforce any of a wide range of conceptions of property and criminal law and tort, and selecting one rather than another conception to enforce will be to the advantage of some citizens and the disadvantage of others. Hence the requirement is triggered to the effect that the coercive scheme must be justifiable in particular to the one who fares worst under the scheme. This in turn points either to a strong insistence on equality or the difference principle (Blake 2001 and Miller 1998), but the case for the insistence is limited in scope by the jurisdiction of the coercive scheme.
A difficulty with this view is that imposition of a massively coercive scheme either need pose no threat to individual autonomy or if it does pose a threat, does so only in circumstances in which the autonomy that is downgraded is worth very little. The law issues credible coercive threats that if, for example, I were to murder someone, I would be arrested, prosecuted, and subjected to capital punishment or a long prison sentence. If I have no desire whatsoever to murder anyone, the coercion sits on me light as a feather and does not reduce my autonomy. Suppose I developed a desire to murder someone and would act to satisfy the desire except that I am deterred by the law's coercive threats. Now arguably the law significantly impinges on my autonomy, but this is clearly a better state of affairs than would result if the criminal law penalties against murder were removed. Suppose on the other hand the law piles criminal penalties on a type of activity that is innocent and harmless such as walking on the beach. Here the coercion wrongfully restricts autonomy. The solution is to repeal the law. The concern then is that either the coercion imposed on individuals by the state is morally acceptable, in which case no special compensation is owed to those coerced, or it is morally unacceptable, in which case the coercion should be withdrawn. The picture of coercion constricting the autonomy of the coerced and thus presumptively wrong unless compensation is paid to the coerced appears to be fading away. And if this picture is not sustainable, then it cannot help explain why equality should be required within but not across national borders.
This argument will not do as it stands because there might be cases in which imposition of coercion is neither unconditionally right nor unconditionally wrong but rather conditionally acceptable—acceptable provided adequate compensation is paid to those whose autonomy is burdened by the coercion. Are there such cases? Perhaps conscription of youth for military service in a just war can be morally permissible, but only if compensation is paid to those coerced into this arduous and dangerous service. Coercion requires a justification, which might include compensation to the coerced, but need not in all cases. What is necessary is adequate moral justification. The justification of having coercive states, and the reason all of us ought to support them, might appeal to the need to have stable protection of certain important rights of insiders (those who live inside the state's borders) and outsiders as well. Nothing so far rules out the possibility that these rights include egalitarian rights of global scope. The sheer fact that the particular state of the land you inhabit coerces you arguably does not establish any sort of presumption that the state's scheme of coercion must be specially tailored to your interests, that those coerced have special justice claims on the particular state that coerces them.
Another possible idea in this area is that the state both massively coerces its members but not outsiders and also claims to speak in the name of the members who are coerced. By claiming to speak in our name, the state involves the will of those in whose name it claims to act. The state not only does but must claim to speak in the name of those it coerces; rulers of a state could not avoid the moral implications that flow from this claim by explaining that they are just authoritarian rulers, bosses who command state power and plan to rule for their own personal benefit. The state compels obedience to its commands and affirms that these commands reflect the legitimate will of the commanded subjects. The argument then is that the combination of these conditions triggers the application of egalitarian principles of justice and these principles apply state by state, not across all states (Dworkin 2000 and Nagel 2005).
A concern regarding this line of thought is that whenever one acts, what one does should be justifiable to those who are affected or might be affected by one's choice. If what one does is justifiable, in principle anyone who is impinged on or ignored can be provided a justification of what is being done to them (or not being done to them), a justification they can accept and will accept if they sort through the relevant considerations and assess them rightly. In this sense, whenever individuals make choices, their choices involve the will of all those who are impinged on or might have been impinged on by one or another choice that might have been made. And for that matter, bystanders who could not have been affected in any way by what is done but who are aware that some individual is choosing some act or omission should also be able to discern a fully adequate justification for what is done. The involvement of the will of those one's action impinges on turns out to encompass the entire community of rational agents, all of whom should be able to see that what one does is rationally justified. So it is still mysterious how the involvement of the will of those coerced by the laws and public policies of a functioning state might be thought to trigger the application of special egalitarian justice obligations that do not apply except among those caught in the particular web of coercion.
Another line of thought offered to support the claim that egalitarian justice duties apply state by state among the members of each political community united by a state rather than among all inhabitants of a region of the Earth or all of the Earth's inhabitants or among all rational agents anywhere and everywhere appeals not to state coercion but to collective goods. The suggestion is that the members of any tolerably well-functioning political community cooperate together through the state to provide crucial benefits to all—basic goods of physical security, property, and the rule of law. In the absence of these goods one would not have a reasonable opportunity to pursue any plan of life. People's compliance with legal rules and basic norms of cooperation supplies these crucial goods to all, and thus obligations of reciprocity are triggered in all recipients. At this point a luck egalitarian consideration enters the argument. Factors beyond anyone's individual power to control importantly affect her good fortune or bad fortune under the existing scheme of cooperation in her political community; hence what one owes to other fellow cooperators by way of reciprocity takes the form of egalitarian justice requirements along the lines of the difference principle. These egalitarian justice requirements are owed by the members of each distinct political community to each other and not to outsiders (Sangiovanni 2007).
This line of thought prompts several questions. If stringent egalitarian duties to needy people arise only because the needy participate in a scheme of cooperation with the non-needy, then strategic action to avoid the duties seems permissible. If the rich separate from the poor and form their own distinct political communities, the reciprocity argument will no longer support the claim that the rich have substantial obligations to the poor. One might question whether genuine justice obligations are avoidable in this way (Cohen and Sabel 2006). Another question is whether reciprocity obligations formed by cooperative collective provision nicely divide state by state as the argument supposes. In Southern California, the law abidingness of neighbors in Mexico is more crucial to people's physical security than the law abidingness of fellow citizens in Maine or Florida. Treaties and peaceful relations among militarily armed states, brought into being by peaceable desires of people in all the states, are immensely important to people's physical security in all of the potentially threatening nations. A third question is why reciprocity obligations owed to fellow cooperators in basic security schemes amount to more than the requirement to contribute a fair share to the burdens of supplying the goods. It is not immediately clear why requirements of egalitarian redistribution arise in this way, since socially disadvantaged people may benefit equally as much as socially advantaged folk from the goods that such cooperation supplies.
The social interactionist arguments just canvassed purport to show that special egalitarian justice requirements apply among members of a nation state and require equality only among those members. The arguments do not attempt to show that no egalitarian justice requirements hold across national borders. These cross-border requirements are presumably triggered by a morally mandatory beneficence requirement that gives special priority to helping people, the worse off they are, or by a luck egalitarian principle such as the following: It is morally bad—unjust and unfair—if some are worse off than others through no fault or choice of their own. The weightier the special egalitarian obligations that the social interactionist sees holding country by country, and the less weighty the general egalitarianism that is perceived to hold across countries, the more the social interactionist approach will conflict with general egalitarian equality of condition doctrines that are claimed to have global scope.
Another version of social interactionism does not seek to show that national borders are morally important for determining what we owe each other by way of egalitarian justice. This approach holds that stricter egalitarian justice duties are gradually triggered by social interaction, and become more stringent and demanding as the density of social interaction increases (Cohen and Sabel 2006 and Julius 2006, see also Julius 2003). On this view, egalitarian justice duties might be strongest among the members of a political community, strong among people involved in dense regional trade and other forms of association, less strong among more far-flung inhabitants of the globe whose social interaction ties are slight.
A related social interactionist approach holds that egalitarian justice requirements come into play among people where there is a framework of institutions and rules or a basic social structure regulating their interactions. Some see such a cooperative framework existing only in each separate nation state; some see a global cooperative framework (Beitz 1979, Pogge 1989). The background idea is that justice becomes relevant when people are cooperating together for mutual gain under common rules.
The question, whether the requirement of equalizing people's condition applies within particular societies but not across societies on a global scale, might be thought to raise a rough dilemma for the normative attractiveness of any equality ideal. The dilemma arises in the following train of thought. On the one hand, there is no good basis for restricting the scope of equality. If equality matters, the group that should be made equal is people everywhere. On the other hand, a global equality requirement will strike many as deeply counterintuitive because it seems to impose very demanding requirements on prosperous individuals and nations to share their wealth with less prosperous strangers in distant lands. The dilemma paints egalitarianism as either (1) parochial or (2) Quixotic and utopian. To remove this impression of dilemma, it would suffice either to defend the restriction of egalitarian requirements to single societies or to show that the requirements of demanding global egalitarianism are not really counterintuitive.
Further issues may be raised about the nature of the individuals among whom equality should obtain. One might hold that across whatever kind of group is deemed to be the relevant domain of equality, individuals in the domain should be made equal in condition over the course of their lives. This view would allow that people might fare unequally well at different stages of life so long as their lifetimes taken as a whole are identical in faring well. Another possibility is that the individual persons at the same stage of the life cycle should be rendered equal in condition. On this latter view, a society in which over time the people who are old all enjoy the same condition, and likewise the people who are young and those who are middle-aged, could perfectly conform to the ideal of stage-by-stage equality of condition even if the old are (say) far better off than the middle-aged and the middle-aged are always far better off than the young. From the whole-lives perspective, stage-by-stage equality is unacceptable, because some people die young, and those who die young never get to enjoy the peak condition. One might uphold a stringent view that requires, so far as possible, that all achieve the same lifetime level of good and that in addition at each separate stage of life (individuated how?) everyone achieves the same level of good. Another possible view is that equality should be formulated so it demands that from now, the condition of all those living should be equalized (regardless of what condition people enjoyed in the past). (See McKerlie 1989 and 2001 and Temkin 1993, chapter 8).
Another issue emerges if one asks: why focus on individual persons rather than on groups? One might hold that it is not important that individual persons have equal life prospects, but it is morally valuable that men and women on the whole should have equal life prospects, that heterosexuals and non-heterosexuals should have the same life prospects, that people of different supposed races should have the same life prospects on the whole, and so on. To fill out this proposal one would need to develop a normative account that explains what sorts of group classifications matter for this purpose and on what grounds. Notice that one might be troubled, for example, if it is found that men have better life prospects on the average than women, because that would be an indicator that perhaps equality of opportunity and fair equality of opportunity are not satisfied. To be moved by this consideration is not to value equality of condition across groups per se.
Finally, the discussion in this entry assumes that if equality is valuable or morally required, the equality that matters is equality among human persons. Equality across individual humans and individual members of other animal species has not been envisaged. But why not? If human beings are picked out as morally special, some reasonable ground must be adduced for this selection. In view of the fact that there might be intelligent beings who qualify as persons but are nonhuman (angels, intelligent extraterrestrials, and so on), perhaps we should focus on persons and consider whether equality of condition should prevail among persons and only among persons and if so, on what basis. Notice that the claim that human persons share a special equal status from which less intelligent animals are excluded still allows that these animals, though not equal in status to humans, may nonetheless be morally considerable.
Why should it matter that people have or get the same? In previous sections of this entry some attempt has been made to clarify some principles that prize equality of condition of some sort. No doubt in some circumstances movement toward equality of some sort can be expected to increase the extent to which other values worth caring about are achieved. The question here is whether the achievement of equality of condition of any sort matters for its own sake, independently of whether it hinders or promotes the attainment of other values.
What has been called the “leveling-down objection” suggests a reason to answer in the negative: everyone's being equal is not valuable for its own sake. Suppose the universe contains two persons, one of whom is far better off than the other. If we can effect a change, perhaps by transferring resources, that will make the worse off person better off and make the better off person worse off, provided the change does not bring it about that the formerly better off person is now worse off, the change will bring the people closer to being equally well off. So equality recommends the change, at least if other things are equal. This seems plausible. But now suppose we can effect a change that will make the better off person worse off without making anyone else better off, and without making it the case that the formerly better off person is now worse off. Perhaps the better off person has a nice house, and we can burn down the house costlessly, making him worse off, but without improving the condition of anyone else. This is leveling down. If equality is non-instrumentally valuable, then the situation that obtains after leveling down must be in at least one respect better than the preceding situation: the new situation is more equal. The objection simply is that it is counterintuitive to claim that in any respect increasing equality by making someone worse off and no one else better off is improving the situation. Leveling down is pointless or worse.
As stated, the leveling down objection invites the reply by the egalitarian that the situation after leveling down is indeed in one respect better than the situation previously obtaining: after all, we now have greater equality or a closer approximation to a condition of equality. We may have a standoff of conflicting moral intuitions. Those who doubt that equality is non-instrumentally valuable offer this diagnosis. When we envisage a more equal world, we tend to think of changes that make some people better off—those who before got the short end of the stick now are made better off so that equality across persons is approached. We also tend to envisage situations in which those who are worse off than others are badly off in non-comparative terms. In this way we tend to run together (1) people being more equal and (2) the worse off (who are likely badly off) becoming better off. By a halo effect, the goodness of 2 appears to shine on 1. Once we see clearly that having equality and making gains toward equality need have nothing to do with 2, we see that we had all along we had been misjudging the value of 1, and so our considered judgment should be that it is not the case that equality of any sort is non-instrumentally valuable (Parfit 1991, Temkin 1993, and Holtug 2010, chapter 7).
In considering this question, one should beware of conflating equality per se with distinct and independent values that in some circumstances will closely shadow it. The values that might be confounded with equality include sufficiency, priority, and desert.
Suppose one compares the grim conditions of life endured by the poorest inhabitants of the earth with the garishly opulent conditions of life enjoyed by the wealthiest people. A natural reaction is that it is morally outrageous that such inequalities in life prospects exist. As George Orwell once wrote, “a fat man eating quails while children are begging for bread is a disgusting sight” (Orwell 1938, 115). But one may wonder if what is troubling about the example is the gap between rich and poor or rather the deplorable condition of the poor, which might continue unabated even if the gap itself were eliminated. To put the issue another way, if it is the inequality per se that is bad, then the gap between poor and rich would seem to be no worse than a same-sized gap between the life prospects of the rich and super-rich. Talk here of a “same-sized gap” presupposes that we have an agreed standard for measuring the sizes of gaps. The claim then would be that according to any plausible such standard, the gap between someone who is very badly off and someone who is much better off will be far more morally significant and bad than an identical gap between someone who is extremely well off in non-comparative terms and someone who is much better off than that. If the latter inequality strikes one as morally inconsequential, the question arises whether inequality is in and of itself really objectionable. Perhaps the problem is not that the poor have less than the rich, but rather that the poor do not have enough—a sufficient level of resources to provide a good life or a reasonable prospect of a good life. The suggestion then is that sufficiency not equality is what per se matters. How one's condition compares to the situation of other people is not important in itself. What is morally important is that people have enough to bring them over the threshold of decent life prospects. (For this line of thought, see Frankfurt 1987 and 2000, Nussbaum 1990 and 2000, Miller 1995, Wiggins 1991, Anderson 2000, and for an earlier statement of the sufficiency ideal, Walzer 1983).
The doctrine of sufficiency holds that it is morally valuable that as many as possible of all who shall ever live should enjoy conditions of life that place them above the threshold that marks the minimum required for a decent (good enough) quality of life. Sufficiency can rationalize egalitarian transfers of resources from better off to worse off persons when such transfers would increase the total number of people who ever achieve sufficiency.
A potential problem for the sufficiency doctrine is that it may not be possible non-arbitrarily to specify a line of sufficiency such that moving a person just across that line has great moral significance. If the sufficiency doctrine were asserted either as a complete theory of justice or as a principle that trumps all competitors, it would definitely be problematic. Suppose a large number of people are unavoidably below sufficiency, leading hellish lives, and that transfer of resources could vastly improve their lives while leaving them below the sufficient level. Instead we could use these same resources to boost a single person who is now just barely under sufficiency to just barely over it. Sufficiency as a trumping doctrine says that we ought to do what will increase the total number of persons who ever achieve sufficiency no matter what the cost to other moral values. This instruction is worse than dubious. A similar difficulty emerges when one imagines cases in which many people are unavoidably over the sufficiency level, but with a resource infusion their lives will be vastly improved, and in which the same resources could instead be used to prevent a single person now just above sufficiency from falling a hair beneath this line. If we try to mitigate the first concern by lowering the sufficiency threshold, this exacerbates the second concern.
The doctrine just criticized is not the only one that falls under the general heading of sufficientarian views. Roger Crisp (2003) suggests that justice requires giving priority to making people better off, and greater priority to helping a person, the worse off in non-comparative terms she is—up to the point at which the person attains a good enough quality of life. Roughly speaking, the idea would be priority for the worse off, up to sufficiency, and straight utilitarian maximization of aggregate well-being above that line. This is a doctrine of priority (see next section) qualified by a sufficiency line. The question arises, how non-arbitrarily to draw the line. The sufficiency skeptic might hold that the underlying moral reality is that a person's well-being, in all its dimensions, varies by degree, as does any overall index of well-being, and there is no “good enough” line that has the significance the Crisp-type sufficientarian must give to it. A further question is how much priority to give to helping people below the threshold when that competes with helping people above the threshold. If one says no trade-offs are allowed, that a jot of gain for a below-threshold person outweighs any amount of good that can be gained for any number of above-threshold individuals, many will object that this is an extreme and wildly implausible view. But this may be one of those cases in which one person's reductio is another's Q.E.D. (If the sufficiency line is truly arbitrary, then giving any weight to it at all in determining what should be done will be excessive.)
Other formulations of views that emphasize the moral importance of the sufficiency line are possible. One says that one should bring it about that, as far as is possible, over the history of the universe, the total sum of the gaps between the level of lifetime well-being each person achieves and the sufficiency level, for all persons whose lifetime well-being is below sufficiency, is as small as possible. This implausibly recommends preventing any future persons from being born and having any life at all, if unavoidably some will fall below sufficiency. We might try the idea that we should seek to make the aggregate sum of the gaps just described per person as small as possible for the entire history of the world. If the sufficiency line is deemed to be above the line of a life worth living, then if unavoidably at some point in the future people can only have lives worth living not good enough lives, the minimization of gaps-per-person again yields a recommendation to bring it about that no future persons live, even though they would have lives worth living. Or consider an Adam and Eve scenario—Adam and Eve lead nice lives above the sufficiency line, but begetting any children and bringing it about that any further persons exist would be wrong to do, according to the view under consideration, if it is the case that bringing about the existence of future persons will unavoidably make things worse from the standpoint of minimizing total gaps-per-person.
Notice that we might deny that the sufficiency view is a rival to egalitarianism. One might instead hold that sufficiency is a version of egalitarianism. Sufficiency holds that all persons equally have a claim to live a sufficiently good life, and that people's condition is relevantly and importantly equal when all equally live at or above the level of sufficiency. I assume there need be no more than verbal disagreement between one who asserts and one who denies that the sufficiency advocate values a type of equality. (This purely verbal disagreement can arise whenever someone asserts that the doctrine that all should equally have X or receive X treatment is an egalitarian and someone else denies that this X theory is genuinely egalitarian.)
There is another route to the conclusion that equality per se is not morally valuable. Consider again the scenario in which the poorest inhabitants of the earth face grim and miserable conditions of existence and the richest enjoy an enormously better quality of life. The sufficientarian's diagnosis of this situation is that what is bad about this scenario is not the inequality, the gap between rich and poor, but the fact that the poor do not have enough. An alternative diagnosis can most easily be explained by supposing that we have a cardinal interpersonal measure of welfare or well-being. An individual's level of well-being registers how well her life is going as it would be assessed from the standpoint of rational prudence. An individual's level of well-being is the level of benefits or advantages for herself that her life contains. From this perspective, when one speaks of “better off” and “worse off” persons, one is speaking of persons whose lifetime level of well-being is high or low.
With this bit of background in place, the idea that transfers of resources from better off to worse off persons are sometimes morally desirable can be understood without supposing either that equality of any sort is per se desirable or that there is some level of well-being that marks the good enough level and that has a special status as specified by the sufficiency doctrine. Suppose that for any person, the lower her lifetime well-being score—the amount of well-being she gains or is now expected to gain over the course of her life—the more morally valuable it would be to secure an incremental gain of well-being for her (or to avoid a small loss). This is the root idea of prioritarianism.
The prioritarian idea is to be sharply distinguished from the idea that across some range, resources secured for a person have declining marginal utility. To illustrate, suppose one person is leading a hellish existence and another is leading a life of sheer bliss. We might think that a single unit of some generally useful resource such as water is likely to do more good, result in a greater aggregate of well-being among all persons, if the unit is provided to the person suffering in hell rather than the person enjoying heavenly bliss. This may be so. The straight utilitarian of well-being will then favor provision of the unit of water to the inhabitant of hell. Now suppose instead that a unit of some resource would provide exactly the same increase in well-being if it is provided either to the person leading the hellish or the person leading the blissful life. (Perhaps the person already in bliss is a very efficient transformer of resources into personal well-being.) The prioritarian gives priority to getting benefits to those whose well-being level is low, so will favor helping the miserable rather than the lucky person even if the well-being aggregate is thereby reduced a bit, compared to what it would have been if the resource had been channeled to the blissful person.
Prioritarianism holds that the moral value of achieving a benefit for an individual (or avoiding a loss) is greater, the greater the size of the benefit as measured by a well-being scale, and greater, the lower the person's level of well-being over the course of her life apart from receipt of this benefit. Well-being weighted by priority as just specified is sometimes called “weighted well-being.” To this account of value the prioritarian adds the position that one ought to act, and institutions should be arranged, so as to maximize moral value as defined. (See chapter 2 of Scheffler 1982, Weirich 1983, Parfit 1997).
Prioritarianism is not vulnerable to the leveling down objection, so if one finds that objection decisive against any position that takes equality of any sort to be non-instrumentally valuable, priority looks to be an ethically attractive alternative. Political conservatives sometimes conjecture that the rancorous emotion of envy fuels the impulse to egalitarian movements. With respect to a possible good and your having it or my having it or both of us or neither of us having it, if I am an envious person, I prefer my having it rather than your having it and also prefer neither of us having it to your having it. The prioritarian judgments as to what ought to be done do not reflect the preferences of the envious. (Clarification: Envy as just described corresponds to the ordinary common-sense notion of envy as a vice, which should be sharply distinguished from the bland preference constitutive of the No-envy fairness criterion. These are different ideas.)
Another attractive feature of prioritarianism is that it promises to combine in a single determinate principle the values of well-being maximization and priority for the badly off. So elaborated, the priority doctrine would contain a solution to the problem of integrating the values of efficiency and equality broadly understood. But this advantage is just notional pending a determination of how to weight the competing values of well-being gains and priority in a single principle. As stated, the priority doctrine does not specify a determinate principle but a family of principles. At one extreme, hardly any weight is given to priority as it competes with maximizing well-being, and the prioritarian doctrine is then barely distinguishable from straight act utilitarianism with utility identified with well-being. At the other extreme, hardly any weight is given to maximizing well-being as it competes with priority, and the prioritarian doctrine is then barely distinguishable from the maximin principle with well-being as the maximand. (Maximin holds that one should choose that policy, among the alternatives, that brings about the best position for the worst off individual affected by the policy choice.)
The priority doctrine has been explicated as a version of welfarism. One can see that the prioritarian idea itself is separable from any commitment to welfarism. In general terms, the prioritarian holds that the moral value of gaining a benefit for a person is greater, the lower the benefit level of the person prior to receipt of the increment, and greater, the greater the size of the benefit. So stated, the doctrine admits of various interpretations that put different constructions on the idea of “greater benefit.” For example, if benefit is identified with the Rawlsian idea of a primary social good, and one takes prioritarianism beyond its limit to maximin, one then has the Rawlsian conception, that justice in most general terms is bringing about the best possible outcome for the very worst off. (See Rawls 1971, chapter 2, and for a defense of maximin, J. Cohen 1989.)
As characterized here, priority says one ought always to choose the act that maximizes the moral value that is brought about, with moral value being larger, the larger the benefit one brings about for a person, and larger, the worse off the person would be absent this benefit over the course of her life. A challenge to priority, raising a doubt against the thought that morality should dispense with any relational equality concern, points out that priority says that if one's acts can affect only oneself, one morally must do the act that maximizes one's lifetime benefit level. Here priority and prudence coincide in their dictates as to what one should do. But suppose the acts one can choose are risky, they might produce better or worse outcomes. A natural extension of priority says that when one's choices are risky and affect others, one should be risk averse, the degree of risk aversion that is called for depending on how much weight should be assigned to getting benefits to a person, the worse off the person is. So far, so good. But priority applies to the choice of a single person whose acts affect only himself: Consider Robinson Crusoe alone on an island. He can choose to swim, which would be fun but carries some risk of being eaten by a shark and dying immediately, or instead climb coconut trees on the beach, less fun but carrying no risk of harm as grave as a shark attack. Rational prudence, we think, does not dictate that Crusoe be conservative in his choices by giving extra weight to the outcome in which he suffers low lifetime well-being. Prudence permits Crusoe to be risk-loving, risk-averse, or risk-neutral is deciding among options such as swim with the sharks or climb on the safe beach. But the natural extension of priority makes it a strict moral requirement that he be risk-averse, giving extra weight (above and beyond what his own preferences dictate) to avoiding the outcome in which death right away induces low lifetime well-being. That seems odd. We might respond by saying that egalitarian values only come into play in dictating what we ought to do when our acts affect other people, and thus affect how badly off or well off people are relative to each other. When choices affect only the self, following ordinary prudence is fine. That response abandons extended priority and challenges the idea that priority captures our moral convictions regarding why there is extra moral reason to help those who are worse off than others (see Otsuka and Voorhoeve 2009).
The prioritarian can choose among several ways to stave off the Otsuka and Voorhoeve challenge. The most sensible response may be simply to bite the bullet and, in effect, acknowledge that Crusoe has special reason to avoid the sharks. This does not mean that taking risks that would bring it about that one's absolute well-being level is low is never or seldom rational. Dangerous sports, after all, can provide sublime experience. In fact, accepting a slight risk of a fatal car crash by driving across town to get better quality bread, when one's available choices affect only oneself, may be perfectly rational. But priority tells us to put a thumb on the scale so as to favor avoiding very bad life outcomes. It is difficult to assess the acceptability of this implication of the doctrine pending some specification of the priority weights as they bear on decision making.
Egalitarian transfers will in some circumstances be recommended by yet another principle that cares nothing for equality per se (Kagan 1999 and 2012). This is the principle of desert: It is desirable that each person should gain good fortune corresponding to her virtue (deservingness). As construed here, the desert principle presupposes that individuals' virtue is cardinally interpersonally measureable. A number can then be assigned to each person indicating that person's level of virtue; persons assigned higher numbers have greater virtue. Suppose that for each number there is a specific amount of good fortune or well-being that an individual with that number indicating her amount of virtue deserves to have. This is the level of good fortune that corresponds to one's virtue. This level is higher for the more virtuous, lower for the less virtuous. (One might allow that very non-virtuous persons deserve some level of bad fortune or negative well-being.)
Suppose one adds to the desert principle the further norm that when a person has less than she deserves, it is morally more valuable to gain an increment of good fortune for that person, the greater the gap between what she has and what she deserves. Call the further norm the greater gap principle. Just as the prioritarian regards it as morally more valuable (a matter of greater moral urgency) to gain a benefit for a person, the worse off in absolute terms she would otherwise be, the greater-gap desertitarian as just characterized holds that it is morally more valuable (a matter of greater moral urgency) to gain a benefit for a person, the greater the shortfall (if any) between the benefit level she has and the benefit level she deserves. Accepting the desert principle and the greater gap principle, one will then sometimes favor egalitarian transfers purely from considerations of desert.
Just as someone might fail to notice that in some situations both priority and equality will both recommend equalizing transfers, and so wrongly think that she favors the transfer in these situations because she values equality per se, someone might fail to notice that in some situations desert and equality will both recommend equalizing transfers, and so wrongly think that she favors the transfer in these situations because she values equality per se. The situation is clarified when one considers examples in which priority and equality disagree about what ought to be done, and examples in which desert and equality disagree about what ought to be done. Shelly Kagan presses the proposal that when we consider a wide range of views and examples, we should conclude that bringing it about that people should get good fortune corresponding to their virtue rightly commands our allegiance and bringing it about that people get the same or have the same does not rightly command our allegiance.
Kagan poses many examples and tests our responses to them (Kagan 1999 and 2012). An important range of examples involves situations in which a person is badly off, but has more than he deserves, and another person is well off, but has less than he deserves. Kagan suggests that for each person at a given level of deservingness, there is some absolute level of benefit or well-being that is exactly what the person deserves. From the standpoint of desert, getting this amount is ideal, better than getting either more or less. Kagan calls this level of benefit for a person with a specified deservingness score that person's peak. Now consider a saint who is very well off, but is way below her peak, and consider a sinner who is very badly off, but still is far beyond her peak. The sinner enjoys more good fortune than she deserves, the saint less. Now we face a choice: we can help either the sinner or the saint but not both. An advocate of equality says, help the badly off person, the sinner. An advocate of priority will say the same. Kagan suggests to the contrary that we should regard it as morally the better course of action to aid the saint, who has less than she deserves, rather than to help the sinner, who already has more than she deserves. Kagan suggests that rewarding desert trumps any moral imperative to equalize (or “prioritize”). Kagan adds a further suggestion: that getting what one deserves matters more, the more deserving one is. The sinner's getting less than she deserves is less of a big deal, morally speaking, than the saint's getting less than she deserves.
In reply: the advocate of equality (or priority) might stiff-arm the idea that people should get what they deserve. Maybe in a diverse modern society any standard of virtue will be contestable, and so not a good building block for constructing fundamental moral principles. Maybe we are all determined by prior conditions and causes to behave just as we do, and this fact properly understood should lead us to hold either that the idea of being deserving lacks clear sense or that everyone's deservingness score is the same. On either view, rewarding the deserving is not a moral imperative. At most doing this will be a means to other goals, not desirable for its own sake.
Even if we cannot endorse the flat denial that rewarding the deserving has any moral value, we might give this norm decisively subordinate status. One suggestion along this line denies the idea that there are “peaks”—a level of benefit for each person such that his becoming better off is bad from the standpoint of desert. Instead we might say that desert only establishes a comparative ranking among individuals. Being deserving or undeserving enhances or dampens the moral reason to bring it about that one gains further benefits or avoids further losses, but never to the point that gaining further benefits or avoiding further losses has negative value. So to speak, being more or less deserving puts one toward the front or rear of the line of people eligible for benefits, but does not ever make one morally ineligible for a better life. Along the same line, one might allow that desert reasons compete with equality or priority reasons, but give decisively less weight to desert reasons.
Just about any moral principles might require moves toward equality of some sort across persons in some actual, likely, or conceivable circumstances. Utilitarianism says that one ought always to do whatever would maximize aggregate welfare. In some circumstances doing that would require working especially hard to boost the welfare of the disadvantaged, and so to bring about a state of affairs that is closer to equality of welfare than would otherwise have come about. Sometimes in order to maximize aggregate welfare one would need to transfer income or wealth from rich to poor, and thus bring about a closer approximation to the state of affairs in which all persons have the same income or wealth or both. A Lockean natural rights view holds that one is always bound by a strict moral duty to respect everyone's natural rights, come what may. It might be that in some circumstances doing what brings about greater equality of some sort across persons would be a good means to bringing it about that one respects the natural rights of other people that morality says one ought to respect. In other situations increasing equality might be a byproduct of the course of action that one is morally obliged to take, according to Lockean morality, in order to respect people's natural rights.
It should be clear that even if some contingent connections of these sorts hold between promoting equality and acting in conformity with some quite different moral view whose best articulation contains no essential reference to equality promotion, the quite different moral view is not thereby revealed to be egalitarian. At the outset of this survey broad and narrow egalitarianism were distinguished. The former says equality is at least instrumentally valuable and should be promoted; the latter says equality is non-instrumentally valuable and should on that ground be promoted. To show that some moral doctrine supports broad egalitarianism one would need to show not just that the view might conceivably, given some logically possible circumstances, support the claim that equality of some sort should be promoted, but rather that given the world as it is and is likely to be, the doctrine in question is often or usually or always aligned with broad egalitarianism.
Sufficiency, priority, and desert are rivals of narrow egalitarianism. Advocates of each of these views have argued that the rival often supports equalization, and so one might mistakenly support equalization on the ground that equality of some sort is non-instrumentally valuable. But once one examines a broader sample of examples, and reviews situations in which the rival and narrow egalitarianism yield opposed recommendations as to what should be done, one should conclude that the rival, and not any version of narrow egalitarianism, should be affirmed as non-instrumentally valuable and incorporated into the set of fundamental moral principles. Or so the advocates of the rivals will say.
To defend the position that equality is per se morally desirable one would need carefully to investigate the scenarios in which egalitarian transfers are attractive and the variety of principles that would support egalitarian transfers in those scenarios. If the norm of equality does not match our considered judgments after wide reflection, we should be content to be instrumental egalitarians if we are determined to be egalitarians at all.
7. Egalitarian Standards for Institutions and Individual Conduct
Egalitarian principles might apply only to individual conduct, only to institutions, to both, or neither. The same principles might apply to individual conduct and institutions, or it could be that different principles apply in each domain.
One reason for supposing that more demanding egalitarian principles apply to the enactment of laws and public policies and to the conduct of states than to individual conduct is that the reasons to insist that the state choose its actions according to impartial standards, treating all citizens impartially, are stronger than the reasons to insist that individuals in private life should choose actions according to impartial standards, treating all fellow citizens who might be affected by one's choices impartially. In private life, an individual is permitted to favor herself over others. An individual is also permitted to favor her own friends and family members over other people in many contexts (not when she is an employer selecting who among those who have applied for a job should be selected for employment, nor is she permitted to offer goods and services for sale to some while refusing to sell these same commodities to others). Individuals are thought to have wide discretion to pursue their own projects in their own way. In contrast, the state is widely supposed to be entitled to favor the interests of its citizens living with its jurisdiction over the interests of noncitizens living outside its jurisdiction, but is required to be strictly impartial in treating citizens. In the words of Ronald Dworkin, the state is obliged to treat all citizens with equal concern and respect.
The considerations advanced in the previous paragraph could be given a stronger or a weaker interpretation. On the stronger reading, the principles that determine morally acceptable state actions have no implications for what individuals should do in private life. The principles for state action might in principle be entirely separate and distinct from the principles that determine morally acceptable individual conduct. On the weaker reading, the principles that regulate state action might have implications for what individuals should do in their private as well as public roles and might partially determine the standards regulating individual conduct. Nonetheless individuals generally should have greater permission to deviate from strict impartiality in deciding how to act when their actions could help others than states should have.
Even those sympathetic to the position just outlined are likely to acknowledge the position must be qualified and hedged in some ways. Consider racial discrimination. Suppose we hold that the state should not engage in discriminatory conduct on the basis of racial classifications even to advance morally worthy goals—imagine that in some circumstances guiding police behavior by racial profiling would be a cost-effective measure to reduce crime. The reasons we hold it is wrong for the state to engage in racial discrimination would appear to carry over to private discriminatory behavior by citizens. It would be wrongful racial discrimination to choose my friends according to their race or skin color. Private action by individuals that expresses hatred of people on grounds of their race or skin color is wrong for pretty much the same reasons that it would be wrong for a state to pass and enforce laws and public policies that express hatred of people on grounds of their race or skin color.
To illustrate some of the complexities of determining how egalitarian principles regulating state action and egalitarian principles regulating individual conduct might be related, consider John Rawls's view that the primary subject of justice is the basic structure of society—core institutions including the state, private ownership and the market economy, and the family as they interact and affect people's fundamental life prospects. Rawls devises a special argument designed to generate principles for the regulation of the basic structure of society that we, contemplating this argument, should accept as principles that determine what must be true if the basic structure is to qualify as just. The special argument device, which Rawls calls the “original position,” is also deployed to select principles of individual conduct associated with the principles of justice, but these principles merely state that individuals should support just institutions. When the basic structure of society is just, individuals should support it and conform to its norms and rules, and if the basic structure is not just individuals should cooperate with others to bring about a just basic structure so long as they can do so at moderate cost and risk to themselves (Rawls 1999, chapters 2 and 3).
For purposes of examining the relationship between requirements on individuals and requirements on institutions in a theory of justice, I shall simplify Rawls's theory and suppose it simply mandates that the basic structure institutions should be arranged so that the primary social good holdings of the worst off sector of society are maximized. (As is well known, Rawls's theory also includes a principle of equal liberty that mandates that a fully adequate scheme of civil and political liberties be secured for all and a principle of fair equality of opportunity that requires that inequalities in primary social good holdings be attached to positions and offices open to all in such a way that those with equal ambition and equal native talent have equal chances of being competitively successful. These principles take lexical priority over the difference principle [Rawls 1999, chapters 2–4]).
There is undoubtedly a certain appeal to the strategy of holding the legal, coercive structure of legal rules to be the entity that delivers distributive justice according to the difference principle. The laws including laws regulating contract, property, torts, and family are set so that, as compared to any alternative set of rules that might be chosen, they work to maximize the long-run primary social good holdings of the people who have least of these. In private life, and carrying out private decisions within the institutions regulated by the coercive rules, the individual citizen has complete liberty to act according to her own values and preferences so long as she obeys the legal rules that apply to her. The strategy reflects a balance of liberty and equality (Nagel 1991).
The adoption of the strategy also reflects the view that the coercively imposed basic structure of society including its political constitution must be acceptable to all reasonable persons in a diverse society in which reasonable people disagree widely in their comprehensive conceptions of the right and the good. Since any attempt to impose egalitarian norms on individual economic choices would be unavoidably controversial and socially divisive, the just society eschews the attempt, on principle (Scheffler 2010, chapter 5).
In several of his writings G. A. Cohen has mounted an attack on the Rawlsian position that the basic structure is the primary subject of justice and that beyond supporting just institutions individuals are not morally required to pursue justice goals including the difference principle in their choices of how to live (Cohen 2000 and 2008, see also Murphy 1998). In a nutshell, Cohen objects that in a society in which people and institutions are just according to Rawls's standards, the people endorse the difference principle: they believe institutions should be set to make the condition of the worst off in primary goods holdings as good as it can be made. However, their own actions, individually and in the ensemble, will have an impact on the condition of the least advantaged members of society. Hence their acceptance of the difference principle ought to have implications for the conduct of their lives. Grant that each person is free to live as she chooses, to some extent, without being required in every action to do her utmost to bring about the fullest realization of social justice in the universe. Each person has a legitimate personal prerogative to do actions that produce less than the best outcome within certain moral limits (Scheffler 1982). But the prerogative gives out, and where it does, if one is committed to the difference principle, one will make decisions concerning work and career that will aim to improve the condition of the worst off. Suppose one holds instead that justice requires an equal distribution of benefits and burdens among the members of society, except when inequality arises in a way for which the person who ends up with less should properly be held responsible (Cohen 2008). Then also, one will, to some considerable extent, shape one's economic behavior with this egalitarian aim in view, if one is seriously committed to the idea that justice demands equality.
If justice is a fair distribution of benefits and burdens across people, and if one's economic behavior affects the degree to which justice obtains, then if one is committed to justice, one must, to some degree, guide one's behavior by that commitment. So Cohen urges. He complains that Rawls countenances a split in the thinking and action of the just individual in an imagined fully just society that does not make sense. The Rawlsian just individual supports the difference principle as the regulative standard for institutions, for the basic structure of society, but does not regulate his own life choices in daily economic affairs and career choices by the difference principle. Cohen objects that this split personality cannot be an ideally just person, contrary to what Rawls claims (Rawls 1999). According to Cohen a fully just society regulated by egalitarian principles would include an egalitarian ethos that instructs individuals that each should do her bit towards sustaining equality by her everyday choices. Individuals internalize the egalitarian ethos and are guided by it in their economic choices, and hence will not be disposed to bargain hard for extra pay and benefits in exchange for making efficient contributions to the economy. They will rather be disposed to cooperate with others efficiently in their economic interactions without requiring the spur of economic incentives. In this way a thoroughly just Rawlsian society populated by just individuals achieves more egalitarian outcomes while maximizing the benefits that go to the worst off than a Rawlsian society regulated in the split personality fashion. (Cohen also challenges Rawls's argument for the difference principle. Cohen claims that Rawls starts with a consideration favoring equality that illicitly gets dropped as his discussion proceeds. Cohen then holds that Rawls, and we, should believe that justice requires equality, even if pragmatic nonjustice grounds favor the difference principle, which does not incorporate the idea that equality is non-instrumentally morally valuable. (See Cohen 2008, chapter 4). But in the argument being considered here, Cohen accepts the difference principle arguendo, and argues that Rawls does not fully acknowledge the implications of his own commitment to it.)
A Rawlsian rejoinder to Cohen might point out that the principles of justice including the difference principle are principles for the regulation of the basic structure of society. Accepting the difference principle as a standard for institutional arrangements is not tantamount to accepting the difference principle as a guide to one's personal life. Cohen insists this position is unstable. Rawls holds that the basic structure of society is the primary subject of justice because its effects on people's fundamental life prospects are so deep and widespread. But voluntary choices of individuals within institutions such as the economy and the family also massively shape people's fundamental life prospects. According to Cohen, the rationale for taking the basic structure to be the primary subject of justice is also a rationale for taking people's choices within the basic structure to be incorporated in the primary subject of justice. Perhaps the principles of justice in their application to individuals take a somewhat different form than they do in their application to institutions. Recall here Cohen's acceptance of the idea that each individual has a Scheffler prerogative to pursue her own projects and aims, to some extent, and not always to be acting with a view to promoting justice. But Cohen's bottom line is that if justice requires the promotion of a moral goal, acceptance of that moral goal as a requirement of justice by the individual must commit her to acting in her own life with a view to promoting that goal.
Several issues arise in considering Cohen versus Rawls. According to Rawls, a just society is a fair scheme of cooperation among persons regarded as free and equal. Each is free in having the ability and the right to develop and pursue a conception of the good and also the ability and the disposition to cooperate with others on fair terms. In any modern, diverse society that refrains from clearly unacceptable restriction of freedom, individuals will develop allegiance to different and opposed conceptions of the right and the good, and a conception of justice that can elicit everyone's reasonable acceptance must be acceptable to the different reasonable ethical views that individuals espouse. The moral equality of persons generates this unanimity requirement. To satisfy this requirement, a justice doctrine must be built up from ideas deeply embedded in the culture of modern democracies. To enable satisfaction of this requirement, reasonable citizens do not press as justice norms controversial, sectarian doctrines that some cannot reasonably accept. When we act together as citizens through the state, we act on the basis of shared reasons, a common ideal of justice. But each of us has different ultimate ethical allegiances, and no single idea of what demands morality places on us to promote justice in our private conduct will make sense to all of us. Moreover, it would be a form of tyranny to require that we generally act only on the shared reasons of justice throughout our lives rather than on the aims and ambitions that are uniquely our own. In a just society, individuals in their daily lives will decide from their own individual ethical perspectives what goals to pursue, including justice goals, within constraints set by the rights of others. There is no social consensus on this issue, so no particular view of the demands of justice promotion in ordinary life will be part of a conception of justice that all can accept (see generally Rawls 2005).
The defender of the Cohen side of this debate will insist that reasonable people can make mistakes, so the fact, if it is a fact, that any particular view of the positive duties to promote justice and equality in daily life that we should accept will fail to gain unanimous support does not necessarily impugn the particular view. Some such view may be correct though controversial. Also, the egalitarian ethos with its demands on individual daily conduct is not supposed to be legally enforceable, rather it is supposed to be a social norm backed by informal sanctions and rational persuasion. Still, justice demands an egalitarian ethos, and individual conduct in conformity with it. So the defender of the Cohen position will hold. This is a tricky issue. It may be difficult to determine to what extent Cohenites and Rawlsians are in substantial disagreement, as opposed to arguing past each other. It may be still more difficult to determine which side (if either one) is right on the points that substantially divide them.
Stepping back from the Cohen versus Rawls polemic (on which, see Williams 1998, Pogge 2000, Scheffler 2006, and Shiffrin 2010), we should note that any theory of egalitarian justice must indicate how its requirements for institutions and practices mesh with its views concerning what justice requires of individuals. For example, any ordinary person seeking to fashion a fulfilling life for himself will form friendships and close family ties and other associations that will command his loyalty. Being a good friend, one will be partial to one's friend over others in some contexts; being a good family member, one will be partial to one's family members over others; being a good citizen, one will (perhaps, this case is more controversial) have a special loyalty to one's compatriots. These special-tie commitments appear to be unavoidably in tension with any commitment to any impartial justice norms (Scheffler 2003). Suppose we accept the idea that the person committed to egalitarianism will not seek to expunge all personal commitments from her life but will seek to accommodate impartial ethical and partial concerns in some way that does justice to both. What way is that? Presumably the answer will vary across the different types of personal commitments that might lead one to do what cuts against justice requirements. Relations to colleagues, family members, friends, lovers, parents, children, ethnic and social group comrades, and so on will pose different sorts of problems that will require different sorts of accommodations and adjustments. A complete egalitarian theory includes principles that would properly guide these accommodations and adjustments. (For an attempt to work out these issues for one domain, that of parents and children, from a perspective sympathetic to Cohen's line, see Brighouse and Swift 2009).
Egalitarian justice doctrines rest on the fundamental premise that all persons have the same fundamental worth and dignity, which commands respect. An aristocratic doctrine that held that all lords are inherently superior to commoners and hence ought to have greater rights and privileges would reject the basic equal human worth premise. However, acceptance of this fundamental or background egalitarian premise need not per se commit one to any very substantive egalitarian ethic. Accepting basic equal human worth, one might cheerfully maintain that the correct ethic is egoism, that each person ought to strive to bring about her own advantage as best she can. Or one might hold that there is no moral requirement that the inhabitants of a political community should share equally in political power or political rights, and no moral requirement that people who happen to become better off should help the worse off.
The gap between equal fundamental human worth and a substantive egalitarian ethic is exposed in Utilitarianism, chapter 5, when Mill avers that utilitarianism incorporates the fundamental principle of equality, that in the determination of what to do, each person's interests should count exactly the same as any other person's exactly similar interest. On this basis he denies that utilitarianism, the doctrine that one ought always to do whatever maximizes aggregate utility, comes into conflict with the recommendations for conduct of a justice norm of equality (Mill 1979). The utilitarian rule “everyone to count for one, nobody for more than one” is already a substantive egalitarian norm, which goes beyond the bare assertion of equal basic human worth. However, there are egalitarian doctrines that insist on equal treatment of persons in some more robust sense, which neither equal basic moral worth nor utilitarian equal counting necessarily delivers. Some egalitarians might hold that equal free speech rights or democratic rights for all should be upheld even if denial of free speech or voting rights in particular circumstances would lead to the greatest total of utility or happiness. Some egalitarians might hold that it would be morally better to bring about a situation in which there is somewhat less aggregate utility (human good) dispersed equally among all people than an alternative situation in which the utility total is larger but its distribution is extremely unequal across persons.
The assertion that all persons have equal basic moral worth is not transparently clear. What is being asserted? I will try to elucidate the idea by giving two examples of its application. A Lockean theory holds that all persons equally have certain natural moral rights. Just being a person confers on one the same package of rights that every other person possesses. One can perhaps forfeit some of these rights by bad conduct, but initially the protections the rights afford are the same for all. If possession of rational agency capacity confers moral worth, and having this moral worth makes you a possessor of natural rights, equal worth gives everyone equal natural rights. For another example, a utilitarian might also hold that being a person makes the fulfillment of your interests and the achievement of your good just as valuable as the fulfillment and achievement of any other person's identical welfare gains. Your good weighs the same as anyone else's on the scale that determines what outcomes would be best and so what ought to be done (and a boost to any person's welfare morally counts for more than an identical boost in welfare that instead might be brought about for any lesser, nonperson sentient creature). What equal basic worth of persons implies regarding how persons should be treated varies from moral theory to moral theory and depends on the structure and content of the particular theory.
The assertion that all persons have equal basic moral worth and dignity calls out for justification or at least elucidation. What is it about persons that renders them all morally equal in some fundamental sense? One proposal is that a being becomes morally considerable by gaining some capacity for rational agency, for thinking through what ought to be done and setting one's will to do it, and that if one attains rational agency capacity at a certain threshold level, one becomes a full person, and further increases in rational agency above that threshold line that some might attain would not affect one's fundamental status of being a person with the same worth and dignity possessed by all other persons (Nozick 1974, chapter 3).
This proposal has the attractive feature that it treats evenhandedly members of the human species and members of any other species of being there might be anywhere in the universe. If any beings possess rational agency capacity at a threshold level, they are persons and have the moral worth and dignity that attaches to persons. The proposal also provides an attractive approach to the issue of what rights and duties humans and other animals have with respect to each other. The proposal suggests that the more it is the case that an individual being attains some degree of rational agency capacity, below the threshold of full personhood, the more morally considerable that being is.
Though attractive, the proposal faces difficulties that have not so far been solved. One initial difficulty is to specify and justify the threshold that marks the personhood boundary. There are evidently different components of rational agency capacity, such as the ability to perceive features of one's environment, the ability to recognize and assess reasons for choice, the ability to deliberate and choose, the ability to form intentions and carry through what one has decided, and so on. To speak of rational agency capacity as one capacity presupposes some way of adding together an individual's component ability levels into one overall capacity. Then there is a line drawing problem: What justifies identifying the level of capacity that marks one as a person here rather than there? A perhaps more troublesome difficulty is that it is not at all obvious why the fact that people differ in their attainment of rational agency capacity above the threshold of personhood does not bring about difference in their fundamental moral status. Why doesn't the fact that you possess more of the very capacities for reasoning, insight, choice, and effective volition that qualified us as persons than I do render it the case that you are morally more considerable than I, have a higher fundamental moral worth? (see Carter 2011 and Waldron 2003). There is the further question how to determine what degree of moral worth or moral considerability attaches to beings who possess some rational agency capacities below the threshold level, or who possess capacities of some other sort such as bare sentience that should be regarded as moral considerability qualifications. And finally, Peter Vallentyne poses yet another worry (Vallentyne 2007). Suppose that we take rational agency capacity to be the basis of personhood. What then do we say about newborn human infants or normal young human children, who surely lack rational agency capacity at any plausible threshold level. If we say, the newborn human is a potential person, hence entitled to rights close to those of persons, the problem arises that in the future, when we have better genetic therapies available, and by applying expensive genetic treatment to a normal mouse, could endow it with rational agency capacity, the normal mouse looks likely to qualify as a potential person if the newborn or young human does.
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