Tibetan Epistemology and Philosophy of Language

First published Wed Feb 2, 2011; substantive revision Wed Mar 18, 2020

The birth of the Tibetan epistemological tradition (Tib. tshad ma) follows the reception in Tibet of a corpus of Indian Buddhist works focusing on the topic of “reliable cognition” (Skt. pramāṇa, Tib. tshad ma), principally works by Dharmakīrti and his commentators. If Tibetan epistemology developed to a large extent in the framework of a commentarial tradition, this did not prevent it from evolving into an autochthonous system with its specific terminology and formal features as well as addressing new topics that add to the themes inherited from the Indian tradition. The present entry focuses on questions linked with the theory of knowledge and the philosophy of language, but the scope of Tibetan epistemological works, like that of Indian epistemological treatises, extends also to the domain of logic and argumentation, metaphysics, religion, and ethics.

The currently available works (commentaries on the treatises of the Indian Buddhist forefathers and independent compositions), written in Tibetan, range from the 11th c. to the present days. This abundant literature has for the most part not been studied outside the Tibetan framework of monastic studies; the majority of works has never been edited, only a few are translated, mostly only partially. In particular, material representative of the formative phase of Tibetan epistemology only became available in the last two decades.

This entry will merely scratch the surface of this rich tradition, which is by no means monolithic. Individual entries will hopefully be devoted to the respective thinkers in the future. Although Tibetan epistemologists address common themes of inquiry and can in part be situated within lineages sharing tendencies of interpretation, the individual compositions reveal a diversity that would make any attempt at grouping them into rigid categories prone to oversimplification. This article thus relies on the contributions of selected influential figures to sketch out some key topics of inquiry and conflicting models representative of mainstream interpretative orientations.

1. Periodization

Following van der Kuijp (1989) one can periodize the Tibetan tradition of epistemology by relying on the one hand on the Indian sources taken as focus of interpretation by Tibetan scholars, on the other on the type of scholarly activity involved (translation, composition of commentary or of independent treatises). One can thus distinguish:

  1. The ancient period. Corresponding to the time of the First Diffusion of Buddhism in Tibet (starting in the 7th c.), it is marked mainly by the translation of some Indian treatises on the subject. This early interest in the topic might be connected to the invitation to Tibet of the Indian master Śāntarakṣita, famous for his integration of logico-epistemological tools in the discussion of Madhyamaka themes.
  2. The pre-classical period. It starts with the Later Diffusion of Buddhism in Tibet in the late 10th c., a period which sees the translation (in some cases revision) of the sevenfold collection of Dharmakīrti’s works, and of a selection of commentaries, as well as of independent works by the authors of these commentaries. Tibetan scholars devise new literary genres to apprehend the contents of these works (notably, “Topical outlines” analyze Indian treatises according to a hierarchical structure, “Concise guides” offer an orientation into the contents, explaining Indian treatises paragraph by paragraph), write commentaries, and also start composing independent works. Typical of this period are the so-called Summaries of epistemology (tshad maʼi bsdus pa). While these claim to present the essence of Dharmakīrti’s seven-fold collection, they actually mainly (if not exclusively) rely on Dharmakīrti’s Pramāṇaviniścaya. Apart from the commentarial works of the “Great translator” and pioneer exegete Ngok Loden Shérap (rNgog Blo ldan shes rab, 1059–1109), Tibetan epistemological commentaries in this period are limited to the Pramāṇaviniścaya. This trend extends to the 13th c., overlapping with the beginning of the classical period.
  3. The classical period. Its start can be identified with the crucial contribution of Sakya Pandita Künga Gyeltsen (Sa skya Paṇḍita Kun dgaʼ rgyal mtshan, 1182–1251) in his Treasure of Reasoning (Tshad ma rigs gter), composed in 1219. The focus shifts from Dharmakīrti’s Pramāṇaviniścaya to his Pramāṇavārttika, with the first commentary on the latter being composed in the middle of the 13th c., after Sakya Pandita had revised its Tibetan translation together with the Kashmirian scholar Śākyaśrībhadra (1127–1225) around 1210. Another characteristic of this period is that it sees the beginning of a tradition of Tibetan commentaries on Tibetan epistemological works, starting with commentaries on Sakya Pandita’s Treasure of Reasoning.
  4. The post-classical period. Starting in the 15th c., it is characterized by a reappraisal of ideas developed in the pre-classical period, criticism of Sakya Pandita’s work and, respectively, defense of the latter. The composition of commentaries on Indian and Tibetan epistemological works co-exists with that of independent treatises, including manuals known as “Collected topics” (bsdus grwa), of which the oldest available instance is the Rwa stod bsdus grwa composed by Jamyang Chokla Öser (ʼJam dbyangs mChog lha ʼod zer, 1429–1500).

In the pre-classical period, the lineage of epistemology initiated by Ngok Loden Shérap at the Kadampa (bKaʼ gdams pa) monastery of Sangpu (gSang phu Neʼu thog) played the leading role. Ngok Loden Shérap himself and influential figures among his successors—notably Chapa Chökyi Senggé (Phya pa Chos kyi seng ge, 1109–1169) and Tsang Nakpa Tsöndrü Senggé (gTsang nag pa brTson ʼgrus seng ge, ?–after 1195)—set interpretative milestones. The “Ngok tradition” (rngog lugs) of epistemology represented the mainline interpretative stream up to the 13th century, when Sakya Pandita, advancing the need to treat the Indian sources more faithfully and more exhaustively, embarked on a generalized critique of his Tibetan predecessors and contemporaries, and initiated the “Sakya tradition” (sa lugs). The rupture was not total, as Sakya Pandita’s epistemological system retained many features developed in the Ngok tradition, but a dividing line was set on specific issues. These remain points of dissent between authors whose lineage goes back to Sakya Pandita and authors belonging to the Gandenpa (dGaʼ ldan pa) and subsequent Gelukpa (dGe lugs pa) traditions (both referred to as “Gelukpa” here for simplicity’s sake). The former includes thinkers such as Gorampa Sönam Senggé (Go rams pa bSod nams seng ge, 1429–1489) and Serdok Panchen Śākya Chokden (gSer mdog paṇ chen Śākya mchog ldan, 1428–1508). Representative for the Gelukpa tradition are the works of the disciples of Tsong Khapa Lobsang Drakpa (Tsong kha pa Blo bzang grags pa (1357–1419)—Khédrupjé (mKhas grub rje dGe legs dpal bzang, 1385–1438), Gyeltsapjé (rGyal tshab rje Dar ma rin chen, 1364–1432), Gedündrup (dGe ʼdun grub, 1391–1474)—as well as the “Collected topics” manuals used in monastic education. These prolonged, to some extent, ideas found in the Ngok tradition, although one should avoid hasty claims of continuity.

2. Epistemology

The examination of “reliable cognition” (tshad ma) is the core subject of Buddhist epistemological works in India and Tibet. In the Tibetan tradition, it is subsumed under the broader enterprise of classification of “mind” or “mental episodes” (Tib. blo) and involves the determination of the objects which the respective cognitions bear on. Tibetan authors typically proceed by establishing various typologies of objects and of mental episodes and elucidating the various ways in which mental episodes are related to objects. Mental episodes are associated with different operations and are categorized via progressive subdivisions based on criteria that are also instrumental in defining reliable cognition. The characterization of the different types of objects, in particular within the typology of “apprehended objects” (see 2.1.2, a), is tied with the adoption of a specific ontological and epistemological framework.

2.1 Objects

2.1.1 Ontological framework

a. The scope of reality

Tibetan epistemologists are primarily Buddhist thinkers who follow the Madhyamaka views. A pertinent question for them is whether reliable cognitions bear on objects pertaining to conventional reality and/or ultimate reality.

While some authors seek to include knowledge of the ultimate within the scope of reliable cognitions, the view of the majority is that reliable cognitions concern the conventional realm. A further debate is about whether reliable cognitions should be limited to what, in the conventional realm, is held to be real. The definition of an ontological position in epistemological works thus concerns conventional reality; the ultimate is beyond the reach of reasoning. What Indian Buddhist epistemologists categorized as “ultimate” and “conventional” is transposed into the Madhyamaka framework of the Two Truths under the categories of “correct conventional” (yang dag paʼi kun rdzob) and “incorrect conventional” (log paʼi kun rdzob), with varying repartitions of objects between the two according to the ontological model that is adopted.

Tibetan authors define their position—in some cases a provisional one adopted as a mere interpretative tool for dealing with Dharmakīrti’s texts—on the basis of models associated with Indian Buddhist schools. A fourfold typology of philosophical tenets is set forth along two lines of distinction. The first separates external-realist positions from idealist (Vijñānavāda)ones; the second separates representationalist positions from non-representationalist ones. External-realist models agree in positing the existence of extra-mental entities, but differ in their account of the way that a cognition of such objects takes place. According to the non-representationalists (commonly associated with the views of the Vaibhāṣika school), extra-mental entities exist simultaneously to their cognition and are cognized directly by the latter. According to the representationalists (associated with the Sautrāntika school), extra-mental entities are the cause of their cognition but, being momentary, they have ceased to exist at the time cognition arises.

Early treatises attest to various choices among these models. For instance, Chapa refutes the idealist and the Sautrāntika external-realist models and settles for a Vaibhāṣika-like position, whereas Chumikpa Senggépel (Chu mig pa Seng ge dpal, 13th c.) opts for an idealist framework. Sakya Pandita’s position, shared by Gelukpa authors, is to arrange these positions along a gradual ascending scale; the lowest, the Vaibhāṣika model is refuted in favor of the adoption of the Sautrāntika model, which is itself replaced by an idealist one on a higher scale of analysis.

b. The extension of the real

While real particulars (what Dharmakīrti calls “svalakṣaṇa”), characterized by their capacity to bring about an effect, are allotted conventional existence (extra-mental or exclusively mental, according to the model adopted), Tibetan scholars are divided as to the spatial and temporal extensions of such particulars.

The spatial options range from an infinitesimal particle (the atom being considered the smallest size unit) to a macroscopic object up to a commonsense object; the temporal ones from a momentary entity to a continuum of indeterminate (although not infinite) duration. The adoption of extended objects is subject to the criticism brought forward by Dharmakīrti against Indian philosophers who admit wholes as distinct from their parts, and would, in a general way, conflict with the Buddhist idea that compounds only have nominal existence. On the other hand, the infinitesimalist view has difficulties to account for the fact that macroscopic objects appear to our cognition rather than individual atoms. The latter difficulty leads, in Dharmakīrti’s works, to the refutation of extra-mental reality in favor of an idealist position. An intermediate view is to grant reality to objects that have some spatial extension: not commonsense objects, but aggregations of atoms within the scope of a specific sense-sphere (Skt. āyatana, Tib. skye mched), such as, for the visual sense-sphere, patches of color.

Regarding the temporal extension of real particulars, momentary entities pose a challenge to transactional usage: once known, they have already ceased and hence cannot be used nor acted upon. Transactional usage is better grounded in objects that have some duration. Continua, however, bring about the same critique as macroscopic objects: what really exists is a particular at each moment, but the chain of causally related moments, even though it may appear to the ignorant mind as an object having duration, only exists nominally. A limited temporal extension is not an option, for, in difference to aggregated atoms, the different moments in a series do not co-exist—only the present one exists and is causally efficient; they hence cannot be considered to contribute collectively to the cognition of an object.

Few Tibetan authors, among them Taktsang Lotsawa Shérap Rinchen (sTag tshang Lo tsā ba Shes rab rin chen, b. 1405), adopt the infinitesimal-momentary view. The intermediate view is prescribed by Sakya Pandita and adopted, for instance, by Lowokenchen Sönam Lündrup (Glo bo mkhan chen bSod nams lhun grub, 1456–1532), while Gelukpa authors and some Sakyapa ones such as Ngawang Chödrak (Ngag dbang chos grags, 1572–1641) extend their view of reality to commonsense objects and continua, which are held to possess their own causal capacity. They are described as collections, but distinguished from the partless wholes distinct from their parts advocated by the more extreme realist Indian philosophers who are the target of Dharmakīrti’s criticism.

2.1.2 Typologies

Objects (Tib. yul) are primarily considered as cognitive objects, in relation to cognitive episodes (Tib. blo). In the common vocabulary of Tibetan epistemology, several sorts of objects are distinguished:

  1. the “appearing object” (snang yul)
  2. the “apprehended object” or “grasped object” (gzung yul)
  3. the “intentional object” or “conceived object” (zhen yul)
  4. the “engaged object” or “object of application” (ʼjug yul)

While the terminology, which reflects different kinds of mental operations, is shared among Tibetan epistemologists, they disagree as to the definition of each sort and as to the equivalence of some of them, in particular of the appearing object and the apprehended object.

a. The appearing and apprehended objects

Regarding the appearing object and the apprehended object, a major cause of dissension lies in the model adopted to account for the process of a cognition of an object. Two options are in competition in the external-realist model: (i) direct realism (associated with the Vaibhāṣika model) advocates a direct contact with reality; in this model the object and its cognition exist simultaneously, albeit distinctly; (ii) a causal theory (associated with the Sautrāntika model) according to which an object acts as a cause for the emergence of its cognition but, being momentary, has ceased to exist once this cognition arises.

(i) For an adherent of the first model such as Chapa, the appearing object, the object that manifests itself in cognition, and the apprehended object, what cognition apprehends, are one and the same thing (“appearing object” does not even figure as a distinct category of cognitive object). “Appearing” (snang ba) is held to be a mental operation shared by all types of cognition. As such, each cognition is held to have its apprehended object, and a threefold typology of awareness is established on the basis of three sorts of apprehended objects, which are exhaustive of what can appear in cognition:

  • particulars (mental or extra-mental)
  • hallucinations/illusions (i.e., something that appears to a non-conceptual cognition while being nonexistent)
  • concepts (don spyi)

These three are distinguished and paired with three sorts of mental episodes by relying on two corresponding sets of criteria:

  1. The characteristic of existence (associated with the notion of causal efficacy) separates particulars (real entities) on the one hand and concepts and hallucinated objects on the other; it matches the identification of the corresponding mental episodes as “non-erroneous” and “erroneous” respectively. Here, the notion “erroneous” (ʼkhrul pa) conveys a specific type of error, distinct from a mistaken determination (such as identifying a rope as a snake, or identifying something impermanent as permanent), an error which is simply due to the object not being real.
  2. The characteristic of vividness, associated with that of specificity, separates real entities and hallucinated objects from concepts, and is the ground for the distinction between non-conceptual and conceptual mental episodes.

The correspondence plays out as follows:

object cognition
(a) (b) (a) (b)
particular vividly appearing;
causally efficient non-conceptual non-erroneous perception
hallucinated object vividly appearing;
not causally efficient non-conceptual erroneous pseudo-perception,
e.g., dream or hallucination
concept not vividly appearing;
not specific
not causally efficient conceptual erroneous any conceptual cognition

The kind of awareness depends on the kind of object that it apprehends. Mental episodes may be phenomenologically indistinguishable but still be of different types because their object is different. For instance, the perception of a fire (a non-conceptual non-erroneous cognition) and the hallucination of a fire (a non-conceptual erroneous cognition) are of different types, because the object of the first is a particular and the object of the second is not. As such, Chapa can be said to endorse a form of experiential and phenomenal disjunctivism, and an externalist account of cognition.

(ii) The premise that every cognition has its apprehended object does not hold for an adherent of the causal model such as Sakya Pandita: a mental episode for the arising of which no real entity acted as a direct cause must be held to have, strictly speaking, no object, or at least, no “apprehended object” (gzung yul). In other words, only non-conceptual non-erroneous cognitions (namely, perceptions) have a grasped object.

The causation-model further has the consequence that the apprehended object cannot be identical with the appearing object: the apprehended object has ceased at the time of the arising of its effect, a cognition in which an object manifests itself. Additionally, Sakya Pandita understands “appearance” in the restricted sense of the mode of operation proper to non-conceptual cognitions. There can be no “appearance” in the case of a conceptual cognition, for the latter does not apply to reality by way of an appearance reflecting real objects, but by way of exclusion, namely by determinations that consist in eliminations of the opposite. Thus, according to Sakya Pandita, the distinction between non-conceptual and conceptual amounts to a difference in the mode of operation of the respective cognitions, namely, via appearance (or vivid appearance) for the first, via exclusion for the second, while the distinction between non-erroneous and erroneous relies on the existence of an apprehended object, understood as a real object causing this cognition.

Adherents of the direct realist model are thus criticized by those of the causation model for admitting improper, non-existent apprehended objects (namely, the concept and the hallucinated object), and for blurring the difference between the respective modes of operation of non-conceptual and conceptual cognitions. In return, the causation model is criticized in that it does not enable direct access to real objects; those can, at best, be inferred.

Although later Gelukpa authors, who take causality and the time-gap problem it involves seriously, adopt the causation model, they mostly preserve Chapa’s typology, together with the identification of apprehended object and appearing object. This leaves them in a difficult situation as they adopt a typology of objects that precisely avoids a model in which the object grasped by cognition would be different from the object that appears to it. Their solution is to invoke the notion of “aspect”: a cognition caused by an object takes a form similar to its cause. This aspectualism differs from a representationalist view in that it does not involve, strictly speaking, a representation which would stand as a curtain between cognition and the object. Cognition still cognizes its object directly by taking its aspect.

b. The intentional object

While “appearance” is passive, the “intentional object” is associated with an intentional operation of determination (zhen pa) that involves the (involuntary) blurring of the distinction between the mental appearance and an extra-mental particular by way of an unconscious error inherent to the thought process of ordinary beings. Such operation is restricted to conceptual cognitions, and is what allows action based on concepts, insofar as via intentional determination the concept is conceived as having the nature of something external.

c. The engaged object

The “engaged object” is usually identified with the object of reliable cognition, and hence understood differently according to the definition of reliable cognition adopted by each author. In some versions, the “engaged object” stands out as a real, extra-mental particular considered to be the object that is likely to be acted upon at the outcome of a reliable cognition (for instance, a fire when perceiving a fire or when inferring that there is a fire on a mountain pass as one perceives smoke on a mountain pass). According to other authors, such as Chapa, the engaged object is the “object with regard to which opposite superimpositions have been eliminated,” without reference to any transactional “application.”

One can identify, at the source of this typology of objects of cognition, the need to specify the scope of reliability for reliable cognitions, in view of problematic cases—an issue already dealt with by the Indian epistemologist Dharmottara. One such case is that of inference, which qualifies as a reliable cognition, but is strictly speaking “erroneous” due to its conceptual nature. Namely, the thought-content of an inferential cognition is a universal, which bears no correspondence whatsoever with extra-mental reality. Distinguishing between different types of objects allows making sense of this by considering inference to be erroneous with regard to its apprehended object (for those that admit that it has one), or just erroneous qua conceptual cognition (for those who do not admit that it has an apprehended object), but reliable with regard to its engaged object, a real particular.

2.2 Cognitions

Typical of Tibetan epistemology is the classification of mental episodes, which gives rise to the specialized literature of “Lorik” (blo rigs), “types of mental episodes.” The typologies adopted depend on the authors’ respective views on objects, the model they adopt to account for their cognition, and how they define reliable cognition.

The threefold typology met with above, which distinguishes between conceptual and non-conceptual mental events, and among the latter between erroneous and non-erroneous ones, is generally accepted, but not its correspondence with a threefold typology of apprehended objects.

More fundamental in view of the focus of epistemological works is the distinction between reliable and non-reliable cognitions. There is agreement as to which cognitions are reliable cognitions—precisely those prescribed by Dharmakīrti, namely, perception and inference—although not as to what defines them as reliable cognitions. As for non-reliable cognitions, one finds an opposition between a fivefold typology, which is the trademark of works of the pre-classical period, and a more basic threefold typology prescribed by Sakya Pandita.

2.2.1 Reliable cognition (tshad ma)

Following Dharmakīrti, Tibetan epistemologists restrict the number of reliable cognitions to two sorts: perception and inference. The first is defined as “non-erroneous and devoid of conceptualization,” the second as the “understanding coming from a triply characterized logical reason.” Both share the status of being “reliable cognitions” (tshad ma), a status that Dharmakīrti associatedin his Pramāṇavārttika with the characteristics of being (1) “non-belying” and (2) “revealing an unknown object.” In addition to a prolongation of the commentarial dispute on the verses in which these characteristics are given, a notable confrontation is found in the Tibetan tradition between two models that can be distinguished in view of the understanding of perception that they entail: (a) a model in which perception retains a passive status insofar as, being devoid of conceptualization, it cannot itself achieve a determination of its object, and (b) a model that seeks to give a more active role to perception without however stepping back on its characterization as “non-conceptual.” Two versions of the “active perception” model are found: an “indirectly active perception” model and an innovative “directly active perception” model.

a. The “passive perception” model

The “passive perception” model can also be termed the “classic” model in that it claims to offer a more literal reading of Dharmakīrti. This model, adopted for instance by Sakya Pandita, takes “non-belying,” combined with “novelty,” as definiens of reliable cognition. Without giving a pragmatic view of reliability, this model involves the capacity to fulfill a goal, or to have some causal efficacy, as a criterion for the non-belying character of cognition. Although being non-belying and novel is sufficient to qualify as reliable, in a transactional context, conventional reliable cognitions are expected to lead to an ascertainment (nges pa). While inference ascertains its object by itself, perception is unable to do so, because ascertainment—a conceptual operation, equivalent to the elimination of opposite superimpositions—is incompatible with its being “devoid of conceptualization.” Such an ascertainment, should it occur (this requires a number of circumstantial elements), must be performed by a conceptual cognition that follows perception. In other words, perception is reliable in itself, but has to rely on a subsequent conceptual mental episode for ascertainment. This “two-tier” way of accounting for both reliability and determination keeps a strict division as to the role and capacity of non-conceptual and conceptual cognitions, which Sakya Pandita compares respectively by way of illustration to “a seeing mute” and “a speaking blind.” Should a subsequent ascertainment not arise immediately (due to the nature of the object, competence and mindfulness of the cognizer, visibility, etc.), the preceding episode of perception still qualifies a a reliable cognition, but its reliability has to be ascertained extrinsically.

b. The “active perception” model

Some interpreters, already in India, were dissatisfied with this “passive” status of perception. Tibetan epistemologists in the pre-classical period similarly argued in favor of a more active role for perception for it to qualify as a reliable cognition.

b1. The “indirectly active perception” model

One version of the “active perception” model was upheld by Ngok Loden Shérap, who included in his understanding of reliable cognition the requirement of a conceptual determination, while upholding the classical tenet that perception itself cannot conceptually determine its object. The model of reliable perception he proposes is thus indirectly active. It follows the two-tier way of accounting for determination in the “passive perception” model, but sets determination as a necessary condition for reliability.

An important consequence of this move is that it implies a distinction between perceptual cognitions that are reliable in this sense and perceptual cognitions that are not. Perceptual episodes that are such that no subsequent determining cognition immediately arises, which, in the passive model, were considered reliable cognitions whose reliability nevertheless had to be ascertained extrinsically, fail here to qualify as reliable cognition. A further consequence is that this model leaves room for mental episodes that are both reliable and non-reliable. For instance, the perception of an impermanent patch of blue, which is followed by the determination “blue” but not by the determination “impermanent,” is only partially reliable.

b2. The “directly active perception” model

The “directly active perception” model, which was propounded by Chapa, brings revolutionary changes, first by introducing in the definition of reliable cognition the notion of “elimination of opposite superimpositions,” then by claiming that perception itself (not a subsequent conceptual cognition) performs such a function.

Chapa formulates a new definition of reliable cognition in terms of the “understanding of a veridical object” (don bden rtogs). The object considered here is the “engaged object,” and its being veridical is explained as a correspondence to the status of reality supported by the absence of opposition. The long version of this definition brings to the fore elements that are systematized by later authors in a threefold list:

  1. the elimination of opposite superimpositions
  2. novelty
  3. the mode of apprehension—to be reliable, a cognition must depend on its object in a way that it does not occur when the object is absent.

In the later Gelukpa tradition, which draws on this model, the definition whose short version is formulated in terms of “newly non-belying” also includes the requirement of “eliminating superimpositions.”

In the Dharmakīrtian system, the “elimination of superimpositions” is tantamount to ascertainment (nges pa). This is to be understood in the framework of the “apoha” (lit. “exclusion”) theory: any positive determination proceeds via the elimination of what is other. For instance, determining a patch of colour as “blue” does not consist in identifying some blue property or some blueness shared by blue things, but in differentiating this patch from the “other,” namely from things that are not-blue. Determination as “blue” amounts to eliminating actual superimpositions of “non-blue” (for instance, if one thought that the patch was yellow), or potential ones; in the former case, the determination eliminates a mistaken judgment and replaces it by a correct one, in the latter it prevents the subsequent arising of a mistaken judgment. Both sides of the process, superimposition and its elimination, are, for Dharmakīrti, exclusively conceptual operations.

The adoption of the criteria of “eliminating superimpositions” in the definition of reliable cognition does not affect inference. According to Chapa, however, “elimination of superimpositions” is not limited to conceptual cognition in general. It has a broader scope than the kind of conceptual operation that follows an intentional determination (zhen pa). Perception, although it does not perform any intentional determination, is indeed capable of eliminating superimpositions. It does so via a causal process: perception gives rise, at the next moment, to another non-conceptual mental episode in which the potential of the wrong superimposition to arise has been neutralized, thus preventing its subsequent arising. By the third moment, there are no more superimpositions. Insofar as it, by this means, eliminates opposite superimpositions, perception is reliable and can be held to ascertain (nges pa) its object, without involving any conceptual element. Whether a conceptual determination occurs subsequently or not is irrelevant to the reliability of the preceding perceptual awareness.

The set of circumstances invoked in the passive model and the indirectly active model to explain the lack of a conceptual determination subsequent to a perceptual episode is now invoked to explain why, although all aspects of the object appear, not all superimpositions opposite to these aspects are eliminated. In particular, Chapa identifies as an objective condition preventing the elimination of superimpositions the case when a feature is non-manifest (for instance, “non-blue” can be eliminated, but “permanent” cannot be eliminated when perceiving an impermanent patch of blue, because the feature blue is manifest, but impermanence is not).

A further specificity worth noting is that the “elimination of opposite superimpositions” can bear on an object which is not the appearing object. For instance, a perception which has a patch of blue as its appearing object can eliminate the superimposition “non-blue” and thereby ascertain “blue,” but it can also eliminate the superimposition “presence of a patch of yellow” and thereby ascertain “absence of a patch of yellow” even though the absence of yellow does not appear to this perception. The first process is termed “direct realization” (dngos rtogs), the second “indirect realization” (shugs rtogs). A particular application of the “direct/indirect realization” model regards the realization or ascertainment that can be achieved via reflexive awareness (rang rig). Reflexive awareness allows the ascertainment of a range of features pertaining to the episode of awareness that is its apprehended object, and directly permits the indirect ascertainment of features pertaining to the object of that episode of awareness.

The main criticism addressed by advocates of the “passive” model to the “directly active” model is that it attributes to perception an operation that is restricted to conceptual cognitions; in their view indeed, “elimination of superimpositions” amounts exclusively to the “exclusion of what is other,” the mode of operation of conceptual cognitions. Proponents of the “directly active” model are not, however, guilty of attributing to perception a conceptual operation. It is thus, rather, their new conception of “elimination of superimpositions” that is at stake here, for which the more traditionally oriented proponents of the “passive” model do not see a grounding in Dharmakīrti’s system.

As hinted at in the last discussion, the fundamental disagreement between advocates of the respective models with regard to perception and more generally with regard to the definition of reliable cognition has consequences for their understanding of non-reliable cognitions.

2.2.2. Non-reliable cognitions

a. Fivefold typology

By embedding the discussion of reliable cognition within a general examination of mental episodes, Tibetan epistemologists were led to develop a typology of non-reliable cognitions. A fivefold typology is shared by the majority of scholars in the pre-classical period and is mostly adopted in later Gelukpa textbooks. Thinkers who adopt it frequently disagree, however, about the phrasing of the definition of each type and the specific cases they cover or not.

  1. Non-ascertaining perception (snang la ma nges pa). These are typically cases of non-conceptual cognitions that fail to eliminate opposite superimpositions with regard to their appearing object. This failure can result from a lack of attention, of wit, of familiarity, or can be due to the nature of an appearing aspect; the latter might be non-manifest, or too “subtle.” Such cognitions do not qualify as reliable since an elimination of opposite superimpositions does not take place, but still qualify as perceptions insofar as they are non-erroneous and devoid of conceptualization. Alternatively, they are defined in terms of their inability to bring about a subsequent determining conceptual cognition.
  2. Post-knowledge cognition (bcad paʼi yul can, or bcad shes). Such cognition, either conceptual or non-conceptual, applies to an object with regard to which opposite superimpositions have already been eliminated. It thereby fails to fulfill the criterion of “novelty.”
  3. Factive assessment (yid dpyod). Such a cognition correctly ascertains an object conceptually, but not via a proper inferential process. Although it is novel and eliminates opposite superimpositions, it does not qualify as reliable in view of its mode of apprehension. Indeed, factive assessment is held to entail truth, while still not depending on its object either via a relation of causality or identity.
  4. Mistaken cognition (log shes). A cognition can be mistaken from the point of view of its apprehended object or of its intentional object. In both cases, the error consists in not apprehending—respectively, not conceiving—in concordance with reality. Any cognition in which something that is not real, i.e., not causally efficient, appears is “erroneous.” This includes perceptual errors such as hallucinations and dreams, as well as all conceptual cognitions since their apprehended object is a concept, i.e., something that is merely superimposed. Determination (zhen pa) is in itself erroneous in that it confuses what is conceived and what is real. More restrictively, “erroneous with regard to the intentional object” indicates that a determination is faulty in that it does not relate to a state of affairs, for instance, if one determines sound as permanent whereas it is in reality impermanent.
  5. Doubt (the tshom). Doubt occurs when one fails to choose between two alternative possibilities, leaving both options open. Doubt is usually considered a conceptual cognition. It may be held to involve an intentional operation of determination (zhen pa), but does not bring about a conclusive ascertainment (nges pa), either mistaken or non-mistaken. This case thus appears as the conceptual pendent of non-ascertaining perception.
b. Threefold typology and critique of the fivefold typology

Opponents to the new definition of reliable cognition and the “active perception” model, starting with Sakya Pandita, instead adopted a threefold typology of non-reliable cognitions:

  1. Non-understanding (ma rtogs)
  2. Mistaken understanding (log shes/log rtog)
  3. Doubt (the tshom).

These share as definiens the failure of being “non-belying” and can be ultimately reduced to the unique category of non-understanding.

The critique of the fivefold typology of non-reliable cognition targets in particular the categories of non-ascertaining perception, post-knowledge cognition, and factive assessment.

Sakya Pandita argues from the perspective of the “passive perception” model, relying on the understanding of perception as a passive cognition which does not itself ascertain its object, but whose reliability is actually independent of this subsequent ascertainment. The category of “non-ascertaining cognition” is thus denied the status of independent category: according to proponents of the “passive perception” model, every perception is a non-ascertaining perception; ascertainment (when it takes place) is always the deed of a subsequent conceptual cognition. There is thus no such thing as an “ascertaining perception” if what is implied is ascertainment by perception itself.

Post-knowledge cognition is also rejected as a distinct category. Non-conceptual post-knowledge cognition is in particular held to be impossible. Indeed, any subsequent perception necessarily has a new object since the object of the previous perception, being a momentary particular, has already ceased to exist when the subsequent perception arises. More generally, a post-knowledge cognition would have no cognitive role, for its object would not be something that is to be understood; it is accordingly judged to amount to non-understanding.

Cases of factive assessment are subsumed under the category of doubt. Doubt should not be understood here in the sense of “hesitation,” between two options but as the lack of decisive ascertainment. Indeed, that an episode of factive assessment is actually correct—which can only be ascertained extrinsically—does not amount to its constituting a decisive ascertainment. If no evidence at all is adduced, such “lucky guesses” are not worth any certitude, and if faulty evidence is adduced, they are to be interpreted as pseudo-inferences.

2.3 Universals

An important issue at the crossing of ontology and epistemology that also has consequences for the philosophy of language is that of universals. Two main trends can be distinguished among Tibetan authors: The first, which is termed below “antirealism,” is a literal interpretation of Dharmakīrti’s thought denying reality to universals and properties. The second, which one can describe as “moderate realism,” holds that not all universals are non-existent. In particular, it concedes some reality to predicates, thereby granting reality to the universals that are their referents.

2.3.1 Antirealism

The antirealist position, held by Sakya Pandita and his epigones, insists on the radical distinction between the conceptual domain and reality, between universals and particulars. Only particulars are real—the criterion for reality being causal efficiency. Universals are mere mental constructions; they are superimpositions that do not reflect reality, but veil the individuality of particulars under the cover of an imagined shared property. Conversely, the distinct properties that one ascribes to a particular are equally not part of the fabric of reality, but mental constructions that veil the unity of that particular.

The question of the why and the how of concept formation is dealt with within the framework of the theory of anyāpoha (“exclusion of the other,” Tib. gzhan sel) propounded by Dharmakīrti. According to Dharmakīrti, conceptual thought proceeds by applying distinctions among particulars in a way that reflects some subjective intention and beginningless habits acquired in countless past lives. One accordingly ends up grouping things by excluding them from other things. What is implied by the term “exclusion” is that what particulars apprehended under the cover of a universal have in common is merely that they are all excluded from a complementary domain. In short, what xs have in the common is that they are not non-xs. By subsuming a particular under an imagined universal, or by ascribing a property to it, mentally or verbally, one is not identifying a real feature of this object, but merely distinguishing it from other particulars.

Although universals and properties are conceptual constructions, we mistakenly identify them as something real. This mistaken conflation of the conceptual and reality that we spontaneously apply when forming or using concepts provides a bridge between the two domains, prompting practical action, interaction with reality, based on fictions. The success of such interaction is accounted for by the causation involved in the process of concept formation which guarantees an indirect link between universals and the particulars they are taken to stand for: concepts are formed as the result of experiences involving causally active particulars; however, only the individual causal capacities of particulars are involved, not any shared potential that would determine natural kinds. Thus, for instance, the universal “fire” is conceived following experiences of particulars that one excludes from other particulars that are held not to burn. By acting on the basis of the inference that there is “fire” on a mountain pass when one perceives smoke in this locus, although the object of this inference is the universal “fire,” not a real fire, when one acts on the basis of this inference one obtains a particular that fulfills the expected function of burning, as the previously experienced particulars that one excluded from non-fire did.

2.3.2 Moderate realism

The Gelukpa tradition as well as some Sakyapa thinkers instead adopted a moderate realist position with regard to universals. Their argument is that if universals were not real, reasoning based on universals would not apply to reality. In other words, reasoning cannot lead to practical success by relying on mere fictions. Moderate realism thus presents itself as an attempt to account for the soundness of conceptual cognitions, and to do so in a way that is more intuitive than the antirealist model.

In Gelukpa textbooks, universals and specific instances are defined in terms of each other: a universal is something instantiated by its instances, the instances are what is subsumed by a kind, or universal. To qualify as an instance, three criteria must be satisfied, namely, x is a specific instance of y if

  1. x is y
  2. x has a relation of essential identity with y
  3. there are other instances of y different from x.

There is thus no intrinsic difference between particular and universal, those are relative notions. For instance, “pen” is a universal with regard to “red pen,” which is its particular (a red pen is a pen, and is essentially identical with pen, and there are other instances of pen, such as a blue pen, that are not a red pen). But “pen” is also a particular with regard to “impermanence,” and “red pen” is a universal with regard to “plastic red pen.”

Further, the instantiation of a universal by its specific instance is taken to be a relation that obtains in reality, rather than amounting to a constructed superimposition. The red pen really is a pen; it is not merely apprehended under the superimposed universal “pen” due to its being excluded from non-pen.

The relation between the instance and the universal is expressed by the formula “one nature and distinct exclusions” (or “distinct distinguishers for one nature,” Tib. ngo bo gcig la ldog pa tha dad). The term “exclusion” brings us back to the theory of apoha. When proponents of antirealism use this formula, they mean that various conceptual distinctions can be made with regard to a unique particular, by distinguishing it from various complementary domains; for instance, one can conceive of a particular as excluded from non-blue, from non-impermanent, from non-material, etc. For the moderate realist, however, this distinction is not a mere conceptual one, it extends to reality, although it does not entail a distinction pertaining to the substance. There are thus real properties that can be predicated, but they are not intrinsically distinct from their subject. If one accepts real predicates, then the universals that are the referents of the corresponding expressions must also be accepted.

Both the antirealist and the moderate realist models attempt to bridge the gap between universals and particulars by grounding universals in reality, the antirealist one by involving causality in the process of concept formation, the moderate realist one by implying a correspondence in reality to our conceptual distinctions. The second model, although it provides a more intuitively acceptable explanation, meets with difficulties. If taking conceptual divisions as actual divisions is not without tensions, the mere fact of positing real universals is problematic in the commentarial tradition of an antirealist forefather. A key move in this regard is to distinguish the idea of a universal qua mental construct, and a universal qua a phenomena common to several instances. In the second sense, a universal needs not be unreal.

Other models of moderate realism were developed in the Sakyapa tradition, that also invoke the necessity for the existence of a real shared property without which our thinking would be arbitrary. Uyukpa Rikpé Senggé (ʼU yug pa Rigs paʼi seng ge, 13th c.), who adopts such a line of interpretation, explains Dharmakīrti’s refutation of real universals as referring to a “mental universal,” the mistaken conflation of distinct things under a unitary appearance. His view of an “objective universal” involves the theory of apoha, in a way that takes the exclusion from non-x as a fact rather than as a mental construct.

Another Sakyapa author who adopts moderate realism is Podong Choklé Namgyel (Bo dong Phyogs las rnam rgyal, 1376–1451). He qualifies as a realist insofar as he distinguishes between universal qua construct and universal qua common phenomena, and accuses the antirealists of nihilism. He nonetheless criticizes other Tibetan versions of moderate realism, which he considers to be prone to Dharmakīrti’s critique against real universals. His solution, akin to Uyukpa’s, is to reformulate the universal negatively as a real elimination; a solution which, however, does not escape the faults he himself addressed against the positive version of real universals.

Moderate realism is traditionally ascribed to Chapa and scholars of the Sangpu school in general. However, the earliest occurrence of explicit arguments in favor of real universals identified so far is in the works of Chumikpa in the last phase of the pre-classical period that already overlaps with the classical one.

3. Philosophy of language

3.1 The object of words

Language is dealt with in Tibetan epistemological treatises in terms of the relationship between “what expresses” (rjod byed) and “what is expressed” (brjod bya)—two notions that come quite close to the Saussurian distinction between “signifier” and “signified.”

According to the basic presuppositions of Buddhist ontology, “words” consist in singular sound emissions uttered at a specific place and time, and the “objects” that are interacted with as a consequence of language use are momentary and unique particulars. Although words and objects appear to be what expresses and what is expressed, the success of language cannot rely on a relation between particular words and particular objects, for this would not provide the generalizability necessary for language to have any practical utility. Particular words express particular objects only in virtue of the conventional relation established, within a linguistic community, between generic words and meanings.

Accordingly, Tibetan models distinguish between (i) a “direct signifier” and a “directly signified”—a generic word (sgra spyi) and a generic object, identified as a “don spyi” (the term was previously translated as “concept” when discussing the apprehended object of conceptual cognition)—and (ii) a “conceived signifier” and a “conceived signified,” the particular sound emission and the particular object.

(i) direct signifier
(dngos kyi rjod byed = sgra spyi)
directly signified
(dngos kyi brjod bya = don spyi/sgra don)
(ii) conceived signifier
(zhen paʼi rjod byed = sgra [rang gi mtshan nyid])
conceived signified
(zhen paʼi brjod bya = don [rang gi mtshan nyid])

There are two main issues with this model, one is the relation between the direct signifier and signified and the conceived ones, the other is the understanding of what is the “directly signified.”

(a) The question of establishing relations between generic words and meaning whereas there exist, in reality, only particular sound utterances and objects, and the question of interaction with these particulars relying on generic words and meanings echo the issue already met with in the context of conceptual processes and actions relying on them, namely, bridging the gap between the conceptual realm and reality. The expression “conceived” (zhen pa) is here also indicative of a process of intentional determination that involves the mistaken identification of the conceptual fiction with extra-mental reality. Sakya Pandita distinguishes the context of “explanation,” where one differentiates between “direct” and “conceived” signifier and signified, between generic and specific words and objects, and the context of “action,” that is, practical language use. In the context of “action”—this includes convention-setting and application of conventions—these differences are blurred for speakers and hearers. The double articulation of the conceptual and reality thus holds together thanks to spontaneous mistaken identifications that take place while learning and applying linguistic conventions.

The divergences discussed in the section on universals between antirealists and moderate realists are reflected when it comes to language: while antirealists hold that language, just like conceptual thought, merely deals with fictions, moderate realists argue that language captures real features of the world, even if only in a distorted fashion. They thereby admit real properties shared by discrete instances. These properties are (due to commentarial requirements) presented in negative terms, as “objective exclusions.” For later Gelukpa authors, the “not being non-x” (some authors do not bother with the double negation) shared by several instances is the main object of the convention, while the corresponding concept, the don spyi, is its secondary object.

For a justification of the success of language, antirealists can appeal to the theory of apoha and the explanation involving causality in concept formation. Indeed, words reflect conceptual distinctions that can also be understood as constructed universals; language can only occur within a system of concepts. In Dharmakīrti’s system, which is here presupposed, words are associated via conventions not with an object, but with a “distinction” which requires a bipartition of particulars in two complementary domains. A word can be associated to this distinction of xs from non-xs at the time of an agreement. Subsequently, any use of an utterance that is a token of this word indicates nothing else than the elimination of non-xs, but can lead to obtain a particular excluded from non-xs. The causal process involved in the process of concept formation is what ensures success, provided that conventions are established and learned successfully.

(b) The identification of the “directly signified” prompts divergences among Tibetan scholars.

For authors who accept that conceptual cognition has an apprehended object, this object (the concept [don spyi]) is also what is directly signified by a word. A word utterance triggers the emergence of such an appearing object in the mind of the hearer. The distinction between “direct” and “conceived” signified supports a distinction between sense and reference. Distinct words trigger the emergence of distinct “generic objects”—there are distinct “directly signified.” The corresponding “conceived signified” can be distinct as well (for instance for the emergence of the generic objects “pot” and “pillar”) or the same (for instance a particular blue pot is the conceived signified for both the generic objects “pot” and “blue”). Some authors of the pre-classical period contend that some distinct words—true synonyms—generate the apparition of the same generic object, thus parting with the ultra-intensionality that reigns in Dharmakīrti’s system, where each word is ascribed a unique way of excluding something from what it is not.

Note that the generic object is not unanimously accepted as the signified even among authors that admit that it is the apprehended object of conceptual awareness. Chumikpa for instance prescribes as signified “a generic object mixed with a generic word.” Accordingly, what appears in conceptual cognition upon hearing a particular word is a mixed aspect of the corresponding generic word and generic object. The extra-mental entity is obtained via an operation of determination pertaining to the generic object, which is the apprehended object of conceptual awareness.

That conceptual cognitions have an apprehended object is not admitted by all Tibetan scholars, and, as seen above, is criticized in particular by Sakya Pandita. The latter nevertheless adopts the same basic linguistic model as his predecessors, using for the “directly signified” the more Dharmakīrtian expression “verbal object” (Tib. sgra don, Skt. śabdārtha) alternatively to the expressions “generic object” (don spyi). However, the point of contention discussed in the context of the threefold typology of objects re-emerges, as this author insists that such a signifier actually does not exist (it is not a causally efficient particular) and is not even properly speaking an “object.” Still Sakya Pandita adopts, phenomenologically speaking, a view that is quite similar to the one he criticizes: while his opponents speak of a “generic object appearing to conceptual awareness,” Sakya Pandita accepts that there is the emergence of an “image” or “reflection” (Tib. gzugs brnyan, Skt. pratibimba/pratibhā) in conceptual thought. But as far as meaning is concerned, Sakya Pandita holds the more radical view that words actually do not signify anything: a word does not have any object, because nothing qualifies as such. One can speak, but only metaphorically, of the extra-mental particular as being “signified” insofar as it is what one obtains when acting upon the determination in which generic and specific, conceptual and real, are confused. This extra-mental particular alone can provide the basis for intersubjective agreement about the object of words. The generic object could not play this role: being private, it would in any case not be able to play any epistemic role.

This model is constructed as a way to bridge the gap between conceptual processes and reality, and, consequently, focuses on language use in transactional usage involving real entities. If the use of words expressing non-entities can be accounted for, it however turns out to be problematic, in a model where meaning is only acquired indirectly through a mistaken process of conflating a conceptual fiction and reality, to talk about abstract entities, such as first- or second-order properties. For instance, the word “red” could only acquire a meaning in the sense of a red particular, i.e., as “something red,” but not as the “property red.” As a consequence, heterological predicates are ruled out, for both the word for the subject and the word for the property are related to the same particular in the process of mistaken identification with an extra-mental entity. For instance, expressing the idea that “(the particular) sound is audible but (the property) audible is not audible” would be problematic if “audible” only means “what is audible.” In contrast, advocates of concepts being the apprehended object of conceptual cognition can account for metalinguistic discussions by keeping open the possibility that, via the operation of intentional determination, the concept is conceived as a concept (and not systematically as an extra-mental particular).

3.2 The theory of definition

A significant contribution of Tibetan epistemology which can be included within the philosophy of language is the discussion of definition and the related issue of predication. The specificity of the Tibetan theory of definition is that it takes into account not two elements—a definiens and a definiendum—but three elements—the definiens, the definiendum, and the definitional basis—along a model which bears many similarities with that of inference. “Defining” thus relies on the relation between the definiens and the definiendum, but actually consists in the establishment that some definiendum is fit to be applied to some definitional basis on account of the relevant definiens; for instance, that “John is fit to be called ‘man’ because he is a rational animal,” or to take a more indigenous example, that “the white calf is fit to be called ‘cow’ because it has a hump and a dewlap.”

Discussions on definition focus on the identification of the instances of each of the three elements (what can be a definiens, a definiendum, or a definitional basis) and on their respective definition, leading in particular to the question whether a definiens requires a definiens. Another issue is that of the nature of the distinction between the three elements.

The evaluation of a definition relies on three criteria that a correct definiens must fulfill: (i) the definiens applies to the definitional basis, (ii) the definiens can be understood without relying on an extrinsic motive, and (iii) the definiens has the same connotation and denotation as the definiendum.

The second requirement underlines a difference between the definiens and the definiendum, expressed in Tibetan in terms of the first being “substantially existent,” the second “nominally existent.” The latter thus depends on the understanding of something else—here the definiens. According to the third requirement, definiens and definiendum must be co-extensive, but only a single definiens provides the specific denotation of the definiendum. For instance, “causally efficient” is not the definiens of “impermanent” even though everything that is causally efficient is impermanent and vice-versa, because it is not held to be directly contradictory to “permanent,” the way “not remaining for a second moment” (the accepted definiens of “impermanent”) is.


A. Sources and translations

In this section of the Bibliography, the order of the works listed is based on the alphabetical order of the root Tibetan letter of the first syllable of the author’s name.

1. Pre-classical period

The available resources for the pre-classical period currently consist of about 40 works. The majority of them were published as facsimile in the series bKaʼ gdams gsung ʼbum (4 sets of 30 volumes each), dPal brtsegs bod yig dpe rnying zhib ʼjug khang, Chengdu, 2006, 2007, 2009, 2015: Si khron mi rigs dpe skrun khang. A few additional ones appeared as typeset editions or are available as facsimile via the Buddhist Digital Resource Center (www.tbrc.org). These resources include the works by Ngok Loden Shérap, Chapa, Tsang Nakpa, Tsurtön Shönnu Senggé (mTshur ston gZhon nu seng ge, ca. 1150–1210) and Chumikpa, as well as several summaries and commentaries on Dharmakīrti’s Pramāṇaviniścaya. The translations currently available are limited to individual chapters and passages analyzed in the studies mentioned under B. This entry relied in particular on the following works:

  • Anonymous (wrongly attributed to Klong chen Rab ʼbyams pa)(12th or 13th c.). Tshad maʼi de kho na nyid bsdus pa. Ed. by Padma tshul khrims, Chengdu, 2000: Si khron mi rigs dpe skrun khang.
  • Chu mig pa Seng ge dpal (ca. 1200–1270). gZhan gyi phyogs thams cad las rnam par rgyal ba. bKaʼ gdams gsung ʼbum phyogs bsgrigs thengs gnyis pa/gsum pa. Ed. dPal brtsegs bod yig dpe rnying zhib ʼjug khang, Chengdu, 2007: Si khron mi rigs dpe skrun khang, vol. 45, 11–163 and Chengdu, 2009: Si khron mi rigs dpe skrun khang, vol. 87, 315–448.
  • rNgog Lo tsā ba Blo ldan shes rab (1059–1109). Tshad ma rnam nges kyi dkaʼ baʼi gnas rnam par bshad pa. Ed. by Sun Wenjing, Qinghai, 1994: Krung goʼi bod kyi shes rig dpe skrun khang.
  • Phya pa Chos kyi seng ge (1109–1169). Tshad ma yid kyi mun pa sel pa. bKaʼ gdams gsung ʼbum phyogs bsgrigs thengs dang po. Ed. dPal brtsegs bod yig dpe rnying zhib ʼjug khang, Chengdu, 2006: Si khron mi rigs dpe skrun khang, vol. 8, 434–626.
  • Phya pa Chos kyi seng ge (1109–1169). Tshad ma rnam par nges paʼi ʼgrel bshad yi ge dang rigs paʼi gnad la ʼjug paʼi shes rab kyi ʼod zer. bKaʼ gdams gsung ʼbum phyogs bsgrigs thengs dang po. Ed. dPal brtsegs bod yig dpe rnying zhib ʼjug khang, Chengdu, 2006: Si khron mi rigs dpe skrun khang, vol. 8, 35–427.
  • gTsang drug pa rDo rje ʼod zer (ca. 12th c.). Yang dag rigs paʼi gsal byed sgron ma. bKaʼ gdams gsung ʼbum phyogs bsgrigs thengs gnyis pa. Ed. dPal brtsegs bod yig dpe rnying zhib ʼjug khang, Chengdu, 2007: Si khron mi rigs dpe skrun khang, vol. 47, 11–165.
  • gTsang nag pa brTson ʼgrus seng ge (?–after 1195). Tshad ma rnam par nges paʼi ṭi ka legs bshad bsdus pa. Otani University Tibetan Works Series, Volume II, Kyoto, 1989: Rinsen Book Co.
  • mTshur ston gZhon nu seng ge (ca. 1150–1210). Tshad ma shes rab sgron ma. Ed. by P. Hugon, Vienna, 2004: Arbeitskreis für Tibetische und Buddhistische Studien (Wiener Studien zur Tibetologie und Buddhismuskunde 60).

2. Classical and post-classical period (selective list)

  • ʼJam dbyangs mChog lha ʼod zer (1429–1500). Rwa stod bsdus grwa = Tshad ma rnam ʼgrel gyi bsdus gzhung shes byaʼi sgo ʼbyed rgol ngan glang po ʼjoms pa gdong lngaʼi gad rgyangs rgyu rig lde mig. In Rwa stod bsdus grwa, Dharamsala, 1980.
  • Sa skya Paṇḍita Kun dgaʼ rgyal mtshan (1182–1251). Tshad ma rigs paʼi gter and Tshad ma rigs paʼi gter gyi rang gi ʼgrel pa.
    • Edition of the complete text: Ed. by Nor brang o rgyan in Tshad ma rigs paʼi gter gyi rang gi ʼgrel pa, Lhasa, 1989: Bod ljongs mi dmangs dpe skrun khang.
    • Edition and Japanese translation of chapters 1–5: Yoichi Fukuda, Seiji Kimura, Hiroaki Arai. Tshad ma rigs paʼi gter of Sa skya Paṇḍita Chapter 1/2/3/4a/4b/5. Text, Translation and Notes, Chibetto ronrigaku kenkyū 1–6 {Studies in Tibetan Logic Vol. 1/2/3/4/5/6}, Tokyo, 1989/1990/1991/1992/1993/1994: The Tōyō Bunko (Studia Tibetica 17/19/21/25/27/29).
    • Edition and French translation of chapter 4 and of the beginning of chapter 10: Pascale Hugon. Trésors du raisonnement. Sa skya Paṇḍita et ses prédécesseurs tibétains sur les modes de fonctionnement de la pensée et le fondement de l’inférence. Edition et traduction annotée du quatrième chapitre et d’une section du dixième chapitre du Tshad ma rigs paʼi gter. Vienna, 2008: Arbeitskreis für Tibetische und Buddhistische Studien (Wiener Studien zur Tibetologie und Buddhismuskunde 69.2).
  • (Attributed to) Tsong kha pa Blo bzang grags pa (1357–1419). sDe bdun la ʼjug paʼi sgo don gnyer yid kyi mun sel. In Collected Works of Tsong kha pa – Khams gsum chos kyi rgyal po Tsong kha pa chen poʼi gsung ʼbum, Tashi lhunpo edition, published by Ngag dbang dge legs de mo, Delhi, 1975–79 (Ge den sung rab mi nyam gyun phel series 79–105), vol. Tsha, 1a-25b.

B. Modern studies

1. General studies

For an introduction to the pre-classical and classical period of Tibetan epistemology, see:

  • Steinkellner, Ernst (2006). “The Buddhist Tradition of Epistemology and Logic (tshad ma) and Its Significance for Tibetan Civilisation,” in Andre Gingrich and Guntram Hazod (eds.), Der Rand und die Mitte, Wien: Verlag der Österreichischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, 193–210.
  • van der Kuijp, Leonard W.J. (1983). Contributions to the Development of Tibetan Buddhist Epistemology, Wiesbaden: Franz Steiner.
  • van der Kuijp, Leonard W.J. (1989). “An Introduction to Gtsang-nag-pa’s Tshad-ma rnam-par nges-paʼi ṭi-ka legs-bshad bsdus-pa. An Ancient Commentary on Dharmakīrti’s Pramāṇaviniścaya, Otani University Collection No.13971.” Introduction to the facsimile edition of the text in Otani University Tibetan Works Series, Volume II, Kyoto: Rinsen Book Co., 1–33.

For an overview of the characteristic features of Tibetan epistemology in the pre-classical period, see:

  • Stoltz, Jonathan (2013). “Cognition, Phenomenal Character, and Intentionality in Tibetan Buddhism,” in Emmanuel, S. (ed.), A Companion to Buddhist Philosophy, Oxford: Wiley Balckwell, 405–418.

A more detailed discussion, with a focus on Chapa’s views can be found in:

  • Hugon, Pascale and Stoltz, Jonathan (2019). The Roar of a Tibetan Lion: Phya pa Chos kyi seng ge’s Theory of Mind in Philosophical and Historical Perspective, Vienna: Austrian Academy of Sciences Press.

The most extensive general study of the classical and post-classical period is:

  • Dreyfus, Georges B.J. (1997). Recognizing Reality. Dharmakīrti’s Philosophy and Its Tibetan Interpretations, Albany, N.Y.: State University of New York Press.

2. Specific studies

  • Dreyfus, Georges B.J. (1991). “Dharmakīrti’s Definition of Pramāṇa and Its Interpreters,” in Ernst Steinkellner (ed.), Studies in the Buddhist Epistemological Tradition. Proceedings of the Second International Dharmakīrti Conference. Vienna, June 11–16, 1989, Vienna: Verlag der Österreichischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, 19–38.
  • Dreyfus, Georges B.J. (1992). “Universals in Indo-Tibetan Buddhism,” in Ihara, S. and Yamaguchi, Z. (eds.), Tibetan Studies, Proceedings of the Fifth Seminar of the IATS, Narita 1989, Narita, 29–46.
  • Dreyfus, Georges B.J. (1999). “Getting Oriented in the Tibetan Tradition: a Contribution,” in Katsura, Sh. (ed.), Dharmakīrti’s Thought and Its Impact on Indian and Tibetan Philosophy. Proceedings of the Third International Dharmakīrti Conference. Hiroshima, November 4–6, 1997, Vienna: Verlag der Österreichischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, 37–46.
  • Gold, Jonathan (2007). The Dharma’s Gatekeepers: Sakya Pandita on Buddhist Scholarship in Tibet, N.Y.: State University of New York Press. Chapter 3, 45–53.
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