John Niemeyer Findlay

First published Thu Aug 22, 2019

J. N. Findlay was a twentieth century South African philosopher who taught at universities in South Africa, New Zealand, England, and North America. He was respected for his analytical abilities, and is credited by Arthur Prior with being the founder of tense logic. In the philosophy of mind and language, he maintained the tradition of Brentano, Meinong, and Husserl against the contrary tradition of Frege, Russell, and Wittgenstein. In a series of Gifford lectures, he argued for a mystical metaphysics that was very much influenced by Plotinus and by Hindu and Buddhist scriptures.

The abbreviations for citations to books are listed at the beginning of the Bibliography.

1. Life (1903–1987)

John Niemeyer Findlay was born on 25 November 1903 in Pretoria, South Africa, in what was then the Crown Colony of the Transvaal.[1] His father, born in South Africa, was by descent Scottish, Welsh, and English; his mother, also born in South Africa, was by descent French, German and Dutch. The Findlays and the Niemeyers were distinguished South African families. Findlay’s great grandfather, on his father’s side, was the Scottish captain of the ship Alacrity and an early European explorer of South Africa. His great uncle, on his mother’s side, was the poet Eugene Marais, one of the founders of Afrikaans literature. Findlay’s father advised the government on legal matters, and his cousins included a Cape Prime Minister, the novelist, Olive Schreiner, and the Brazilian architect Oscar Niemeyer. This birth and lineage has its effect. Findlay’s manner, though never cold, combined that mixture of aristocratic courtesy and unwavering self-assurance sometimes associated with the well-born. This heritage might explain Findlay’s confidence in swimming constantly against the philosophical mainstream, and, in his metaphysical work, far out to sea.[2]

From 1909, Findlay attended various grammar schools in Pretoria and the High Veld. He learned Latin and Greek at school, Dutch from his nurses, Afrikaans from his friends and French entirely on his own. He memorized poems and wrote many himself. Later in life, he joined a theater company and acted in all the major plays of Chekhov. This love of language and theater generated his eloquent prose style, an apt vehicle for later virtuoso exercises in phenomenological description. It also percolated into Findlay’s teaching manner, often highly theatrical. He would, for example, in seminars, put a handkerchief over his face and then snatch it off, as an illustration of the Husserlian distinction between unfulfilled and fulfilled intentions. In 1915, Findlay moved on to the High School for Boys in Pretoria, where he was (as he writes) “monotonously” the top student in his class every year.

Two items of philosophical note emerge from Findlay’s youth:

First, at age seven Findlay became a firm vegetarian, not because meat animals can suffer, but because (he writes) meat animals are conscious, which gives them moral status. (That Findlay was a vegetarian will come as a surprise to some of his former graduate students, who may have observed Findlay carving roast beef at his supper parties, but never noticed he took no plate of his own.) Perhaps Findlay’s early attitude towards non-human animals provoked his later separation of mentality from linguistic competence.[3]

Second, possibly in reaction to the Christian orthodoxy prevailing at the High School for Boys, Findlay began reading the theosophists, including Madame Blavatsky, and, one after another, Max Müller’s “Sacred Books of the East”, adding “a little Sanskrit” to his linguistic repertoire. Findlay’s affection for Buddhism and Hinduism was lifelong, and his disaffection with monotheism was also lifelong. It motivated his most discussed article, “Can God’s Existence Be Disproved?” (1948a) the title of which was emended by Ryle from the submitted original, “A Disproof of the Existence of God”.[4] But Findlay was more drawn to the metaphysics of the theosophists, which he identified with Neoplatonism, than to their spiritual exercises, and his interest in Madame Blavatsky was guarded. Nevertheless, Findlay later remarked that his Gifford lectures were theosophy, with all the defective points left out.

Findlay graduated from high school in 1922, and his brother gave him as gifts copies of Henri Bergson’s Creative Evolution (1907 [1911]) and William Wallace’s translation of Hegel’s Logic (Hegel 1830 [1873]), his first books of Western philosophy. Hegel’ Logic presented Findlay with an immanent absolute that displaced the Upanishadic mysticism of his teenage years.

In 1924, Findlay won a Rhodes scholarship to Oxford, and spent two years at Balliol, reading greats. Despite his affection for Hegel, or perhaps because of it, Findlay had little interest in the British Hegelianism of Bradley or Bosanquet. He veered away from modern philosophy into studies of Plato, developing the hypothesis that Aristotle’s disparaging remarks about Plato’s late philosophy were important indicators of a deeper Platonic system than is found in the dialogues. This historical work, conceived decades before German scholars began writing in earnest about the ungescriebende Lehre of late Plato, earned him a First. It also planted the seeds of a book on Plato, which Findlay eventually published, after a typically long gestation, in 1974.

In his third year at Oxford, Findlay discovered Russell, Wittgenstein, and the new realism, which put him at odds with the prevailing Oxford idealism. Findlay’s admiration for Russell, a thinker dismissed by a contemporaneous Oxford don as “not a philosopher, but a criminal” foreclosed any possibility of a fellowship.

So, in 1927, Findlay returned to South Africa as a young philosophy lecturer at the University of Pretoria, his first appointment in an extended Wanderjahre that included positions at Dunedin (New Zealand, 1933–1944) Grahamstown (Eastern Cape, S.A.1944–6), Pietermartizberg (Natal, S.A, 1946–1948). It was at Dunedin that he met and married his wife Aileen Hawthorn, with whom he had three children in the early 1940s.

The Wanderjahre for the Findlays continued in the Northern hemisphere after World War II at Newcastle on Tyne (1948–51), with an appointment as chair at Kings College, University of London (1951–1965), and with professorships at Carleton College (1965), the University of Texas (1966–67), Yale University (1967–73) and Boston University (1973–84).

Findlay’s academic appointments do not track his intellectual development; the crucial turns in his mental life involved academic leaves. In 1929, Findlay went to Germany and spent part of 1930 in Berlin. There he learned German, and discovered the works of Brentano, Meinong, and Husserl. Brentano inspired Findlay’s book, Values and Intentions (VI begun in 1933, published in 1963); Meinong inspired the book Meinong’s Theory of Objects (M, begun in 1931, published in 1933,) and Husserl inspired Findlay to undertake the translation (begun in 1939, published in 1970). of Husserl’s intricate Logisiche Untersuchungen. The research on Meinong involved several stays at the University of Graz, where he received a doctorate in 1932 for his work on Meinong. The depth of his commitment to the phenomenological tradition is indicated by the scale of these projects, involving decades of work on an almost daily basis.

The second leave of consequence was in 1938 and 1939, where Findlay went from New Zealand to England via North America. He met Carnap at Berkeley, Russell in Chicago, Quine in Boston, and Heidegger in Freiburg. The analytic philosophers made a good impression, Heidegger a bad one:

One of those natural catastrophes that occur even in philosophy, a blanketing snowfall beneath which all the familiar landmarks in philosophy are gradually obscured.

Heidegger told Findlay that he would perhaps understand the mysteries of Angst and Nothingness if he had had front line experience during the First World War.

His black leggings and peasant attire gave him the vague aspect of a circus-master, cracking his whip while the ominous shapes evoked by his discourse seemed to caper around. (ML: 31)

While in Freiburg Findlay took a quiet sidelong glance at the workings of Nazism: “the youths and maidens with their bright faces”, and “some poor Jews silently praying as they passed the ruins of their demolished synagogue” (Ibid.)

Returning to England, Findlay abandoned Oxford for Cambridge, met with Moore and Wittgenstein, and attended their seminars in Fall 1939. The result was a stream of papers in a hard-core analytic style, tightly reasoned and bristling with distinctions. These include “Time: a Treatment of Some Puzzles” (1941b), “Goedelian Sentences: A Non-Numerical Approach” (1942), “Morality by Convention” (1944),“Can God's Existence Be Disproved?”(1948), “The Notion of Infinity” (1953), and “The Justification of Attitudes” (1954), all anthologized in Language, Mind, and Value (LMV, 1963).

When Findlay was appointed to King’s College at the University of London in 1951, he found himself in competition with A. J. Ayer, the leading light at the University College branch of the same university. Ayer, still professing logical positivism, was attracting the best students and professors, so Findlay, by way of strategic contrast, made Hegel the Special Author in the curriculum at Kings. The choice proved surprisingly popular. Ayer generously responded with an offer to publish a book by Findlay on Hegel. The book, Hegel: A Re-examination (1958) written in a clear style, was for decades a life raft for those graduate students who despaired of ever understanding Hegel in the raw.

Findlay’s efforts in the Hegel book led to a change of method in his work. The requirements of analytic philosophy—the demand for clarity, the insistence on deductive connection of ideas-- gave way to a more flexible movement of thought, where many connections of ideas were declared to be “logical” even if the connection was less than deductive. Contradictions and antinomies were embraced; “clarity is not enough” became a rallying cry. The new technique for philosophy is described in Findlay’s article “Essential Probabilities” (1967a). Essential probabilism encouraged Findlay to return to his long abandoned book on the mind, published as Values and Intentions, in 1961. He returned to his youthful interest in metaphysics, presenting his own speculative system in two series of Gifford lectures, The Discipline of the Cave (DC, 1966) and The Transcendence of the Cave (TC, 1967). In the Gifford lectures, Findlay reintroduced the absolute that he had foresworn in his essay on God. He now conceded publicly that the monotheists were right to have an absolute, but wrong in the absolute they chose. “How odd/of God/to choose/the Hindoos”, says the preface to The Transcendence of the Cave. The later writings of the 1970s are footnotes and supplements to what is given in these three books from the 1960s.

From the standpoint of mainstream analytic philosophy, Findlay serves as the dedicated contrarian. He threw Husserl at Frege, Meinong at Russell, Brentano at the later Wittgenstein. He did not attack with the contemporary method of generating counterexamples to mid-level philosophical generalizations. He set up Husserl and Meinong and Brentano as substantial figures, as worthy of interest as their analytic counterparts. When these three diverged from the analytic gods, they provided full-fledged philosophical alternatives, not isolated pot-shots.

As for his systematic metaphysics, which exudes an almost Leibnizian optimism regarding the failures of the everyday world, Findlay himself felt doubts. What he once said about Hegel applies to his own works:

When I do hard theoretical work…I feel clear too that the world has a sense, and that no other philosophy [than Hegel’s] expresses this sense satisfactorily. But in my more frequent mood of mild depression, I am not a Hegelian: I regress to a materialism which is not, I fear, at all dialectical. I see the world as devoid of sense, I submit masochistically to its senselessness, even taking more comfort in its cold credibility than in the rational desirability of Hegelianism. (“The Contemporary Relevance of Hegel”, 1959a [LMV: 231])

Despite these depressions, Findlay remained loyal from first to last to his favorite texts: the Timaeus of Plato, the Enneads of Plotinus, and the Logic of Hegel: “Plato for inventing the forms, Plotinus for relating them to an absolute, and Hegel for setting them all into dialectical motion” (Lecture at Baruch College, New York City, April 1976. unpublished). The reward for loyalty was a singular philosophy of unusual scope.

2. Meinong’s Theory of Objects (1932–3)

Findlay reports that he was won over to realism (i.e., anti-idealism), during his undergraduate years, mainly through clandestine readings of Russell and Moore. Reading Russell, he certainly became acquainted with the name and ideas of Alexius Meinong, discussed by Russell at length in 1904 and 1905 (Russell 1904 [1973]). In 1930, after he acquired German, Findlay began reading Meinong’s works in earnest, under the direction of Meinong’s pupil Ernst Mally.

The result was the book, Meinong’s Theory of Objects, published by Oxford in 1933, and expanded in 1963 into Meinong’s Theory of Objects and Values (M). This book, for decades, was the standard reference work on Meinong in the Anglophone world. Given Mally’s imprimatur, we can presume that Findlay’s account of Meinong is accurate, but what is more relevant is Findlay’s defense of Meinong against his critics, Russell most of all.

The dispute turned, notoriously, on the status of non-existent objects. For Meinong, there are non-existent objects, they can possess properties, and true things can be said about them. For Russell, there are no non-existing objects, they cannot possess properties, and nothing true can be said about them. So, for Meinong, it is true the golden mountain is golden, because everything that is F and G is F. For Russell, it is false that the golden mountain is golden, because there is no such thing as the golden mountain to be golden.

Russell dismissed Meinong with a few deft sentences in 1905. If you say that the golden mountain is golden, then you must say that there is a golden mountain, that there are chimeras, that there is a present King of France. This offends, Russell later wrote, against our “robust sense of reality”. Furthermore, if the golden mountain is mountainous and golden, then the round square is both round and square, so something exists that is round and square. This offends against the law of non-contradiction. Many readers accepted these arguments as decisive. But not Findlay.

To begin, there is a question as to whether Russell got Meinong’s position right. Meinong never maintained that the round square existed (or subsisted). On the contrary, it neither exists nor subsists, so for Meinong nothing exists that is both round and square. But it can be a subject of predication, and if the predication is correct, it is a part of a fact, and facts about contradictions are not contradictions. In other words, in terms of propositions, Meinong maintained that:

  • (1) the round square is round


  • (2) the round square is non-round

are both true but denied that from (2) one could infer

  • (3) not (the round square is round.)

Now (3) contradicts (1) but (2) does not. So we have Meinong maintaining, as a general law, “The F and G is F”, and Russell maintaining, as a general law, “Nothing can be a subject of predication unless it exists”. This seems to pit a logical proposition against a metaphysical one, a win for Meinong.

The round square inhabits a realm Meinong called Aussersein, and Findlay points out that sections of Aussersein can be grouped into compatible entities and consistent propositions (or facts) about them. These correspond, Findlay argues, to the different domains of different possible worlds (M: 58)) That different possible worlds can have different domains would become one of Findlay’s major complaints against Wittgenstein’s Tractatus and its fixed domain of ultimate objects.

There are, of course, metaphysical issues lurking in the background. Russell certainly wanted to make statements that, prima facie, are about non-existents, like the present king of France. Russell’s famous trick replaces statements about non-existing individuals with statements about sets of properties that do not jointly hold of any individual. Findlay believed that Russell’s idea was best expressed by Moore in 1918:

We have said that ‘lions are real’ means that some particular property or other—I will say, for the sake of brevity, the property of being a lion, though that is not strictly accurate, does in fact belong to something—that there are things that have it, or, to put in another way, that the conception of being a lion is a conception which does apply to some things—that there are things that fall under it. And similarly what “unicorns are unreal” means is that the property of being a unicorn belongs to nothing. Now, if this is so, then it seems to me, in a very important sense, ‘real’ and ‘unreal’ do not in this usage stand for any conceptions are all. The only conceptions which occur in the proposition ‘Lions are real’ are on this interpretation are, plainly (1) the conception of being a lion, and (2) the conception of belonging to something, and perfectly obviously “real” does not stand for either of these. (Moore 1918 [1959: 212]))

Findlay disagrees vigorously with this form of metaphysical actualism, which he describes as an illicit reduction of facts about being to facts about so-being.

Let us consider the case of a person who wishes that there were such a thing as a philosopher’s stone. If the fact of the existence of the philosopher’s stone is identical with the fact of the possession by some object in the universe of the properties of the philosopher’s stone, then we must suppose that the person in question is really wishing that one or the other of the objects in the universe should possess the properties of (a) being a stone, and (b) turning baser metal into gold. But it is perfectly clear that the man might wish nothing of the kind. He might be perfectly content with all the objects in the universe… If a childless woman wishes for child, she does not wish to stand in the relation of motherhood to one of the children actually in the world, but to another child, which is not in the circumstances an actual child at all, but which would become an actual child if her wish were fulfilled. It is no doubt true that, if her wish is fulfilled, one of the things actually in the world will be her child, but it is equally true that, while she is wishing, she is directing her mind to something which lies beyond the actual world, and which will possibly always like beyond it. (M: 30–53-4 )

It is not possible here to follow Findlay’s defense of Meinong’s realm of objectives, which includes states of affairs, facts, and other abstract entities that, in Meinong’s terminology, subsist rather than exist. Many of Meinong’s analyses predate the classic texts of logical atomism with which they share a common core of analytic concerns, such as the relation between states of affairs and facts. Findlay is even more generous than Meinong in describing the population of subsistents:

It is highly arguable that human experience, even at the level of perception, is rich in objects that go beyond the concrete existent things of an individualist ontology. The world around us seems to be full of bearings, of suggestions, of half-formed possibilities, of pin-pointed acts or circumstances, of gaps, vaguenesses, of generalities, or unrealized limits, and it is of dogma rather than direct experiences that all these higher order things will reduce to individuals and their actual properties. (AE: 29)

On the analytic subjects, to which the most space in the book is devoted, where Russell and Wittgenstein diverge from Meinong, Findlay sides with Meinong. But his exposition is not slavish. The realm of Aussersein has its problems:

We speak of the world of Aussersein, but in reality the objects which have no being do not constitute a world. They are a chaos of incoherent fragments….Between actual existents we can always discover a large number of intimate connections. Beyond the boundaries of being no such connections subsist: there is no fixed distance between Valhalla and the islands of the blessed, nor does the planet Vulcan exert a gravitational pull on the star of Bethlehem. (M: 56)

And even the famous expansion of the ontology has its problematic side:

To do what Meinong does, and merely to set the non-existent, false, and absurd alongside the actual and the true, to treat them like the white and red roses of Russell’s famous comparison,[5] with nothing to explain the special prerogative of being real or being the case, is the very type of a dead, surd, and unintelligible mode of conception. (M: 342)

Despite the doubts expressed here about the realms of Sein and Aussersein, Findlay would press them into service in many future books. To begin, the objects of these realms serve as the intentional objects of thought. Second, these realms provide the referents for “vacuous” names in works of fiction. These are the opening gambits of the next book, Values and Intentions.

3. Values and Intentions (1936–63)

After completing the book on Meinong in 1932, Findlay began work on Values and Intentions (VI), a project that occupied him, on and off, for the next thirty years. The resulting book combines the phenomenological tradition of Brentano with the analytical psychology of G. F. Stout and the empirical discoveries of the Würzburg psychologists. It also attempts to integrate the philosophy of mind and moral philosophy. Its predecessor, and perhaps its organizational model, is Hume’s Treatise (1738), which also begins with perceptions, proceeds to emotions, and then moves on to conclusions about ethics. But it rejects Hume’s phenomenalism, and attempts a smoother dialectical flow from the laws of the mind to the rules of justice.

On a typical page of Values and Intentions, one finds little argument but much description. These descriptions of mental processes are presented as the results of introspection. Now, even by 1932, introspection was rejected as a method in both philosophy and psychology. This dismissive attitude was recognized, weighed, and rejected by Findlay in his article “Recommendations Concerning the Language of Introspection” (1948b). The reader, on first encountering Values and Intentions, may stand with Wittgenstein and declare, “By God, this is impossible”. Or she may be persuaded by Findlay that it can be done because he does it. From Findlay’s viewpoint, Wittgenstein portrays our inner life as a desert. For him, it is a rainforest.

Findlay follows Brentano in vigorously maintaining that intentionality is the mark of the mental. But then the exposition turns Husserlian. Intentional objects are presented to consciousness, but they can present themselves clearly or obscurely, completely or incompletely, in various lights and with varying scope. There is a problem distinguishing what is in consciousness from what lies outside it. “We must distinguish, between what is actually and what is only facultatively or dispositionally present to mind”. The distinction provides an occasion for a typical descriptive excursus:

The interior of a church may be ready to come to mind when I look steadily at its façade, but this is not the same as the actual presence to my mind of [the façade’s] contrasting pattern of black and white layers, which I nevertheless do not explicitly ‘notice’…. In thinking of Jeremiah I may, e.g., think definitively, though obscurely, of Hebrew prophets and prophecy: I may, however, only be ready to think of the prophet Amos or of the prophetess Joanna Southcott. (VI: 48)

The rule is that for every thought, there is an object of thought. Prior and many other have objected to this: Prior’s counterexample is “I am thinking of nothing” (Prior 1971: 122–123). But these counterexamples only work if the sentences that express them are true. One wonders if one can think of nothing, or whether what is referred to in “thinking of nothing”, is, as older people often experience, an unnoticed bout of unconsciousness.

A deeper problem for Findlay and the “mind as intentionality” school is the presence of phenomena that seem to be mental but are not intentional, like the pains and quales that preoccupy discussions in the contemporary philosophy of mind. Here Findlay reverts, surprisingly, to his “depressed materialism” and identifies such states with bodily conditions:

That the category of indiscerptible, qualitative feeling has no plain instances has been recognized by thinkers, who, like Titchener, reduce the life of feeling to two strange “feeling elements” of pleasure or unpleasure, or who like Ryle, operate with various twinges, tingles, throbs, and other residua of emotional experience…. These doctrines are a mistake, only abstracts torn from sensible objects have such qualitative status, the whole placing of them ‘in the mind’ points to a confusion and misapplication of categories.…

…here their links with our conscious orientations seem contingent rather than necessary: it is for instance unclear why sensory pains should be so very disagreeable, so much an object of aversion.… our hatred of pain is not per se intelligible, but can at best achieve a quasi-intelligibility when seen in the more general quasi-intelligibility of ‘bodily purpose.’

The main emergent use of ‘feeling’ in connection with our own bodies, is therefore that of the largely obscure…knowledge of our bodily state; it is the intimation of the body itself gives us of our inner condition. (VI: 172–3)

It is possible, then, to have a pain and yet not be repelled by it, a view confirmed by modern medical research on pain agnosia.

It is not possible here to unravel all the details of Findlay’s treatment of beliefs, wishes, wants, and acts of will. Each token case of a propositional attitude can manifest itself as a concentrated “sense” before the mind, or spread itself out as a pattern of behavior in the physical sphere. The account is complicated, perhaps too complicated for anyone to have accepted it. But we must remark on the distinction between believing and wishing, as this points towards the ethics section of the book. When we believe that something is so, we cannot wish that it is so. We can only wish that it be not so. Conversely, when we believe that something is not so, we cannot wish that it be not so, but we can wish that it be so. Wishes, then, are directed at making the non-existent exist or the existing not exist. (or, in a parallel way, towards the making true or the making false of propositions.) This is the starting point of ethics. We wish the world changed in some way.[6]

If ethics starts with wishes, then the ethical system that emerges will be broadly teleological: the good is prior to the right, as the good is what we wish for. But the good cannot be a one dimensional good, nor can the many dimensions of good be compared with each other, nor is it intelligible to speak of “maximizing the good”. So the system that results is a form of ideal utilitarianism of the sort desiderated by Hastings Rashdall (1907) and described in the last chapter of Moore’s Principia Ethica (1903: ch. 6). It is hostile to rule based ethical systems deriving from the Decalogue or Kant, and hostile to puritanism while suspicious of hedonism. Findlay’s principles of axiology, culled and combined from the works of Brentano, Meinong, Scheler, and Hartmann, as well as Moore, Rashdall, and Ross, include:

….that there are radically different sorts or senses of value between which quantitative or even ordinal comparison is not readily possible, that there is a deep distinction between values that appear purely personal and those that claim cogency or validity, that value and values have a close and necessary relation to feeling, but that values that claim cogency or validity cannot be exhaustively analyzed or even explained in terms of mere feeling, that the main ‘heads’ of impersonal valuation, freedom, fairness, happiness etc, are moderately clearly and readily agreed upon though their detailed specification or correct practical implementation is infinitely controversial, that value and disvalue have close connections with various senses of “ought” but that the central sense of the latter reveal it as a much more restricted conception, much more closely concerned with disvalues and their avoidance than with values… that the values called “moral” presuppose all other types of value as objects of pursuit, but their value does not depend on the latter value, that moral value has a close connection with the readiness to sacrifice personal good for impersonal good, etc. (AE: 78)

Perhaps the most unusual claim of Values and Intentions is that there is a dialectical connection between personal values and impersonal values. Adam Smith had described the shift from the partial spectator to the impartial spectator, and contemporary authors remark frequently on the transition from the first person standpoint to the third (or second) person standpoint. In these authors, however, the transition is contingent, based either on a free choice, or on moral education, or on Aristotelian conditioning. In Findlay, the transition is based on a drive for generality that is inherent in the operations of the mind:

It is natural, and nigh inevitable, for a man reflecting more or less disengagedly on the objects of his various parcelled interests to acquire a second-order zest for the interesting as such and for any and every interest.(TC: 70)...impersonality is by its nature contagious. It obeys a ‘logic’ and that logic is to spread, to level farther and farther, to become more and more absolute. Once speak for some, and one will find oneself readily forced into speaking for more, until, in all situations not warped by personal bias, one comes to speak for all: impersonality resembles the scriptural mustard-seed in whose branches the fowls of the air ultimately find their accommodation. (VI 430)

Findlay in many places develops this “drive for generality”. To begin, there are certain basic values that accompany all good thinking, such as clarity, consistency, and simplicity. These are essential to communication; they are “values in speaking” (1950b [LMV 105–128]), and must be deployed even by nihilists who profess contempt for logic. Secondly, there are the virtues of good scientific thinking, including avoidance of arbitrary Duhemian maneuvers and manufactured concepts like Goodman’s “grue” and “bleen”.[7] Thirdly, there are the virtues of good practical reasoning, including rational arbitration between the demands of present versus future selves. Like Sidgwick before him and T. Nagel after, Findlay argues that the admitting the demands of my future self but a step towards admitting the demands of other selves:

The rise to self-love is in fact a matter so strange that the further spread to rational benevolence is trivial by comparison: having come to be interested in, e.g., the provision of food at a time when I am not hungry, it is no great wonder that I am rationally moved by another’s real or imagined need for food as much as by my own.… And by, an extension natural to it, once its ampliative zeal has got underway, it tends to extend itself to an interest in what is interesting to anyone or everyone, and to develop a defensive dislike of whatever sets grounds to its natural expansiveness. (TC: 71)

The drive to generality moves us from favoring personal good to impersonal goods. Rules about the right, or the “moral ought” concern the production, distribution, or destruction of impersonal goods. Oddly, justice in impersonal goods requires the recognition of persons, subjective selves. These are introduced in Values and Intentions via discussions of the problem of other minds, which for Findlay is no pseudo-problem. The solution is found by applying the ubiquitous phenomenological relation of “seeing as” to social interactions. The argument involves the idea that mental states are psycho-physical complexes with poignant concentrated feelings on one side and spread out behavior on the other. We perceive some patterns of behavior as intentional, some as mechanical. When we perceive the behavior as intentional, we infer the psychical side. (Findlay’s discussion of reactive perceptions anticipates by several years Peter Strawson’s work on reactive attitudes.) The bottom line, however, is familiar: justice requires placing oneself in the shoes of the other.

4. The Husserl Translation (1939–70)

Findlay attitude towards Husserl was conflicted. On the one hand, he declared, more than once and without qualification, that Husserl was “the greatest philosopher of the twentieth century”. On the other, he rejected most of the philosophical claims published by Husserl subsequent to 1912.

The conflict was doctrinal. The biographical section has described Findlay’s embrace of realism toward the end of his undergraduate years. Through his long career, Findlay never wavered from his commitment to realism, that is, to the view that very little of reality is “mind-made”. It is not surprising, then, that Findlay would react negatively to Husserl’s swerve towards idealism, first exhibited in his Ideen of 1913.[8] So it was also natural for Findlay to focus on Husserl’s early work, the Logisiche Untersuchungen (1901–03) most of all. By the late 1930s, he was committed to translating this massive text into English. (Wittgenstein asked him in 1939 why he was so interested in “that old work”.) When the translation appeared, in 1970, it made less of a splash than might have been expected. Husserl’s student and assistant, Marvin Farber, had already published a paraphrase of the Untersuchungen in 1942, and laid side by side, there are not terribly significant differences between the two renditions, and some readers prefer Farber to Findlay the way some Anglophone Kant readers prefer Kemp-Smith to Guyer.

Whatever disagreements Findlay had as regards Husserl’s conclusions, he never wavered from his admiration of his analytical abilities. He supported the approach to numbers presented in Husserl’s Philosophy of Arithmetic (1891), a book that Husserl himself had repudiated. (Findlay endorsed Husserl’s idea of numbers as essentially sequential, and held it superior to the Frege-Russell account: “In Principia”, he once remarked, “you always end up counting the quantifiers” (1975b)). He championed Husserl’s lectures on the phenomenology of inner time consciousness (1905–11), arguing that the unfolding-folding schema (e.g., the past becoming past past, and the past past becoming the past past past) proposed by Husserl captured what Kant and James had correctly but dimly prefigured concerning the nature of time (TC: 151). Among Husserl’s later works, he found much to praise in the notion of “life world” developed in Husserl’s last book, Experience and Judgment (1939).

But as regards idealism, Findlay drew a line in the sand. It is simply false, he wrote, that esse est construi. He rejected Husserl’s famous “epoché”, or suspension of the “natural attitude” towards the world, even arguing the epoché, is inconsistent with idealism. Husserl has assumed that to not affirm the natural world is to affirm that the natural world is not. But a true suspension would affirm nothing, either way.

Husserl has provided no good or even meaningful reason for doubting that the natural world exists, however much that existence may also have been ‘constituted’ or rather reconstituted for out minds, and that its processes have an important causal relation to the acts of constitution just mentioned, being in fact responsible for the ‘fulfilment’ of those acts through appropriated data, and that natural objects are increasingly given as they are in and for themselves, in an unbracketed and not merely bracketed sense, both through the normal perceptions of men and the theories of the less methodologically prejudiced scientists. ("Phenomenology and the Meaning of Realism," 1975b, 156)

Given such deep disparagement, what did Findlay find in Husserl that justified the accolades Findlay showered on him? Findlay in his last book would remark that analytic philosophy has two obsessions: reference and representation. He found in Brentano’s notion of intentionality, and Husserl’s’ implementation of it, a comprehensive theory of meaning that underlay both reference and representation and extended to areas undreamt of by the descendants of Frege and Russell. There is more to reference than language; there is more to representation than mental mirroring. This for Findlay was the Husserl’s enduring legacy.

5. Time and Tense (1941; 1956)

“The founding father of modern tense logic was J. N. Findlay”, Arthur Prior wrote in 1967.

[Findlay] said in a paper published in 1941 [1941b [1963]] that “our conventions with regard to tenses are so well worked out that we have practically the materials in them for a formal calculus. …the calculus of tenses should have been included in the modern development of modal logics”. (1967: 1)

Findlay’s commitment to tense logic in 1941 went beyond the announcement of project for future logicians. He supplied in the article a modal form for tensed statements, and laid down a few tense logical “laws” governing such.

The form of tensed statements, Findlay insisted, was modal, not variable. It had been the custom of logicians previously to consider tensed statements as “incomplete” statements, like Russellian propositional functions, where the gap in the function was to be filled in by supplying a date. So

  1. Archduke Ferdinand was shot at Sarajevo

was considered incomplete, neither true nor false, until the verb was de-tensed and a date added to the statement:

  1. Archduke Ferdinand is assassinated on June 28, 1914

But adding a date does not tell us that the assassination has happened. To preserve the temporal claim, Findlay suggested the modal form:

  1. Past (Archduke Ferdinand being assassinated)

The truth conditions of A and B differ. C is the correct translation of A.

Prior claimed what is modalized by Findlay is a statement, but in Findlay’s text it is more like an event description, symbolized by “x”. What is modalized is a mode of occurring. Three modal laws are suggested in the 1941 article:

  1. Present (x) implies Present (Present (x)):
    What is present is presently present.
  2. Future (Present x) implies Present (Future x):
    What will be present is presently future.
  3. (Past x) or (Present x) or (Future x) implies Future (Past x):
    What is either past or present or future will be past.

Law III shows that Findlay has not excluded vacuous names for events. The laws apply to non-occurring events. For example, what is never future, for example, is never past, in models with no earliest moment.

It appears, then, that we have two different languages. In the first, verbs are tenseless but dated. In the second, verbs are tensed but undated. Do we need two languages? In the language with dates, we can measure that interval between two events, and compare it with the interval between two other events. In a system of moving objects, we can partially order the dates via the Special Theory of Relativity. Why bother with the tensed system at all?

In “An Examination of Tenses” (1956a), Findlay gives reasons for retaining the tensed system. The dated system implies a “block universe” of events pinned at unchanging locations in space-time. But the essence of time is change. Furthermore, and more interestingly, Findlay argues that a block universe cannot explain the fact that we know so much more about the past than the future, and that this asymmetry is not inferable from the structure of space-time or the laws relating events within it. (Findlay cites Ehrenfels [1916] for noticing that all the basic laws of physics are time symmetric.) Findlay proposes his own explanation of the asymmetry: collisions between particular substances changes their configuration, and these changes, or “traces” provide evidence in the present for collisions in the past. (This explanation of temporal asymmetry via traces is distinct from claiming that the collisions release heat and increase entropy, which would reduce temporal asymmetry to principles of thermodynamics.) General principles are not involved, only the historical facts of particular collisions when world lines criss-cross. Why are there no present traces of the future events? Because future collision have not yet occurred.

6. The Gifford Lectures

Findlay delivered the Gifford Lectures in two series at the University of St. Andrews, the first set, The Discipline of the Cave, from December 1964 to February 1965, the second set, The Transcendence of the Cave, from December 1965 to January 1966. The Discipline of the Cave is dominated by the cave metaphor presented in Plato’s Republic; The Transcendence of the Cave is dominated by the metaphor of the metaphysical hemisphere, derived from Plotinus, especially Ennead V, 8, “Of Intellectual Beauty”.

The strategy of the lectures is similar to F. H. Bradley’s in Appearance and Reality (1893). The ordinary natural world is found to be absurd and self-contradictory, and the contradictions point to a different world that is ultimately real. In Bradley’s case the contradictions emerge from the idea that the ordinary natural world is a world of substances that somehow “possess” properties. In Findlay’s case, the contradictions emerge from absurdities in the concepts of space, time, and material bodies, not only in their ordinary manifestations but also in their scientific doppelgangers.

What do these alleged absurdities point to? In Bradley’s case, the absurdities of distinct substances point to a realm of undifferentiated and undirected Feeling. In Findlay’s case, the absurdities show merely that we are in a cave, and if we are inside, there is necessarily an outside. The outside will prove to be a marvelously complex web of perfected individuals. Though mystics have responded positively to Findlay’s more Swedenborgian postulations, an argument is needed to give them minimal philosophical credibility. Findlay gives two: first, the argument that everything that is ideal in the actual world is actual in an ideal world;[9] second, that in an ideal world the distinctions between type and instance, between fact and value, are progressively wiped out, so that the distinction between the ideal and the actual is no longer applies.

The features of the Cave are given by phenomenology; the escape from the Cave is provided by dialectic. It is not possible to follow Findlay in all the vivid phenomenological descriptions provided in DC. A small part of the discussion of space will serve as an example:

Our idea of void space is one of most poignantly clear that we possess; it is the indispensable foil to body. We cannot move our members without being aware of it…True void is not seen or touched, or if seen and touched, not quite in the same manner as the bodies in it: it is nonetheless in front of us, even if its vividness is marred by one or two wafts of air or by similar irrelevancies… The space of our own bodies as given in bodily feeling in the dark watches of the night is often little different from void space: what is evident, indefeasible in it, is its three dimensionality, its extension and position, not the feeble sense contents that irrelevantly flicker through it (DC: 99)…[I suggest that] what is now called a Euclidean structure, and what is now regarded as a somewhat unadventurous type of spatiality among a thrilling variety of such, is in fact simply the notion of space as such, and all other notions of space presuppose it, and represent progressive deviations from it, deviations which present no formal impossibility, but which represent no less the slow demise, the putting out of action, of the nobly interesting notion of space. (DC: 101)

Similar, and lengthy, phenomenological treatments are given of time and bodies. Where are the absurdities? Findlay argues that for bodies to be bodies, they must proceed unaffected through the media of space and time, but at the same time, space and time, to be what they are, must interact with body. So space and time must be absolute, and must be relative, a contradiction. As for bodies, there are insuperable problems about the relation between bodies and their observable qualities, and between some bodies and their governing minds.

The list of such like antinomies is long, yet the underlying malady is clear: in one way or another, they all stem from the separation of individuals from each other. What is the remedy for these separations? In the first half of the Transcendence Findlay considers Hegel’s proposal that these separations can be overcome by the development of common realm of logical concepts, meanings, ideals, and shared gods, at least where rational beings are found. But in Transcendence, Lecture 5, Findlay rejects the Hegelian option:

Our aim is therefore bring to ruin the whole teleological fabric we have been rearing, particularly its crowning religious manifestations… The main uneasiness that affects the teleological picture can be quite readily stated: it lies in its imposed, arbitrary, willful character. (TC: 102) To view all phenomena in a special teleological relation to our rational selves remains a difficult, unstable way of viewing things (TC: 103)…The stars may be, as Hegel said, a mere light-rash upon the sky, infinitely insignificant beside the simplest human thought or emotion. But is there not something very wanton in saying that the whole meaning of the former, in all their immensity of spatial and temporal extent, lies in their role as mere background or supposition of the latter? It is particularly when we consider such factors as the extent of space, now yawning more and more vacuously as planet after planet reveals itself bare of its imagined population, that a teleological absolutism à la Hegel seems more and more frivolous (TC: 104) … Plainly again it is only by a dialectical tour of force that this can be held to be involved in our wretched, confused, heartless, piecemeal living (TC 105)… The objects of religion may be the supreme occupants of the human cave, but they are also the most blemished by antinomy and obscurity of any cave phenomenon (TC 106)… We conclude that the actual religions of the world, which all represent rational faith at its highest, are also all phenomena of the Cave, with inappropriate absurd, sinister, and even monstrous elements, which most apologists have sought to minimize. (TC: 117)

Monotheism and Hegelianism cannot rescue us from the vast arbitrariness of the physical universe: that these things exist and not others, that these things are here and others are there; that these things happened now, and not later, and that these things will happen later but not now: all these are tossed in a sea of contingency, all are de trop. But Plotinus does provide an answer: it is not only our notions of things that can overcome separation: is the things themselves, which contain a dimension of the divine. This leads to the new metaphor of the “Plotinian hemisphere”. Consider the liberated inhabitants of the cave as scattered along the equator of a sphere. Each individual is intersected by a meridianal line, and these lines rise and converge on the pole. These metaphorical lines of hemispheric “otherworldly geography” include the points they intersect, so each thing at the equator is also part of what exists at the pole, at which and in which their differences disappear. (Take a square inscribed within a circle and shrink it to a point; the result will be a point-like round square.) The pole here is the Plotinian One, the “absolute” to which Findlay will devote an entire subsequent book, Ascent to the Absolute. But in the Gifford lectures, it is the lives of the individuals as their meridians approach the pole that is the detailed object of description. Findlay leans here heavily on Plotinus’ portrait of the Realm of Mind, and the portrait of the spirit world of the Buddha, as given in the Gandavyuha, in which individuals can exchange places without crossing the space between, in which every mind is accessible to every other, and in which the shoes of the other become one’s own shoes:

Life is easy yonder, and truth is their parent and nurse, and they see all things, not such as are in flux, but as have true being, as they see themselves in others… For all things are transparent, and nothing is dark and resistant, light being made manifest to light. (Plotinus Enneads V, 8; Findlay’s own translation [TC: 158])

The Gifford audience was very small, “the most exiguous of my experience, but not inattentive”. One wonders what the reception of these lectures might have been had they been presented in 1893, the same year as Bradley’s Appearance and Reality.

7. “The Perspicuous and the Poignant”

This, the last of Findlay’s “analytical” articles, and his sole separate contribution to aesthetics, was published in 1967 in the British Journal of Aesthetics. The discussion of the aesthetic values of perspicuity and poignancy harks back to Plotinian values of clarity and intensity. But the unusual turn in the article is the connection of the “aesthetic attitude” with the philosophical psychology of Brentano:

Brentano divided the attitudes of the conscious mind into three basic species. There was mere conception or presentation, having something before one or present to one, without taking up any further conscious stance towards it; there was the theoretical acceptance of something as real, true, existent, believable… and there was finally the other non-theoretical acceptance or rejection which is present in our feelings,… our desires, and all our practical decisions… We may well doubt whether pure presentation has that priority in mental life which Brentano gave to it, whether it is not perhaps rightly regarded as a deficient mode of attitudes far more involved and existential. However this may be, the value of the scheme is that is places the aesthetic field very satisfactorily—the aesthetic field is one of suspended conception, of pure having something before one to contemplate. It is a field essentially divorced from the Yes-No of belief and conviction, as it is divorced from the other Yes-No of practical concern…When we are aesthetically minded we are interested in what comes before us purely as an instance of character regardless as to whether there really is, or is not, such a thing or sort of thing, and our interest is moreover, not concerned, as practical interest always is, to bring what is merely thought of or intended into the field of reality, or to push something from the field of reality out into the field of the merely thought or intended. (1967d [1972: 94])

Presentations need not, and sometimes cannot, be sensually filled, so the resulting aesthetics does not emphasize sense perception, allowing Findlay to speak comfortably of the beauty of mathematical proofs and other abstracta. Likewise, the separation of presentations from emotions, Brentano’s “feelings of love and hate”, undercuts expressionistic aesthetic theories, allowing Findlay to speak coherently about severely abstract works of art that neither convey nor provoke emotion.

Presentations, however, can be clear or obscure, and Findlay makes clarity a necessary condition of aesthetic quality. (This includes being clear about obscure things). The poignancy requirement is more unusual, and involves what Findlay describes as an “arrest” in our normally turbulent mental life. Some perspicuous presentations bore us, but the poignant ones captivate us: we are rapt, ecstatic, in contemplating them, and our mind does not wish to move on to any successive intentional act. Since aesthetic appreciation requires such ecstatic arrests, we often suffer “aesthetic impotence”, returning to an adored object and finding ourselves unmoved by it. Such impotence may involve a past overestimation of the value of the object. But more often it involves an inability to recover youthful levels of concentration. One might consider that Findlay’s doctrine of “arrest” before works of art might explain “museum fatigue”, where walking one hall in a museum can prove as tiring as hiking one mile in the woods.

8. Wittgenstein

As noted, Findlay met Wittgenstein in February 1930 and again in 1939. His description of the first encounter, published in 1974, has been frequently quoted by Wittgenstein’s biographers (see, for example, Bartley 1985: 192):

At the age of 40 he looked like a youth of 20, with a godlike beauty, always an important feature at Cambridge. The God received him and gave him lunch in an ascetic room, beautiful in its almost total emptiness, where a wooden bowl of fruit on a table made one note of color. The God was all he had been described as being: he looked like Apollo who had bounded into life out of his own statue, or perhaps like the Norse God Baldur, blue-eyed and fair haired, with a beauty that had nothing sensual about it, but simply breathed the four Greek cardinal virtues, to which was added a very exquisite kindness and graciousness that bathed one like remote, slightly wintry sunshine… The tea that one drank with him tasted like nectar. (EQ: 173–4)

Findlay was also a keen appreciator of Wittgenstein’s prose style, and felt that some fraction of Wittgenstein’s influence stemmed from the beauty of his German sentences, a beauty that an unwary reader might mistake for truth. Nevertheless, he freely acknowledged Wittgenstein’s philosophical genius:

One could not listen to Wittgenstein’s least pronouncements, however falteringly expressed, without feeling that they sprung from a mind of supreme integrity and the most penetrating insight. (W: 24)

and the threat it posed to his own work. If the Tractatus was right, his book on Meinong was wrong; if the Blue and Brown books were right, then Values and Intentions was misguided, if the Philosophical Investigations (1953) got it right, the Gifford lectures were nonsense. The defensive result was Wittgenstein: a Critique, published in Findlay’s eightieth year.

I have returned to my own orbit as a result of learning to answer almost all of Wittgenstein’s rhetorical questions, which were intended to promote the answer “Yes”, with the straight answer “No”.(EQ: 168)

Wittgenstein: A Critique reviews the Tractatus, the Blue and Brown books, Remarks on the Foundations of the Mathematics, and the Investigations. The format is to take key aphorisms from Wittgenstein, expound them at considerable length, and then launch objections, which pile up as in a Thomistic Summa, but absent the replies. For example, against the Tractatus, Findlay objects (1) “Ultimate simple objects” are not ontologically viable, whatever can be referred to must have an internal structure, and form part of a larger relational structure; (2) “The restriction of all domains to the actually existent” is to be rejected because it is always significant to suppose that this thing that exists, might have not existed; (3) the view that “all necessities are logical necessities” is wrong because two atomic propositions can be inconsistent; (4) the axiom of extensionality is false because there are significant and true modal propositions; (5) not “all logical necessities are tautological”, since , e.g., “p” and “not not p” differ in sense; ( 6) the picture theory of language is wrong because meanings are connected to objects by intentional mental acts, not by “mirroring” (W: 222).

Husserl’s “meaning as intentionality” theory is brought to bear on the “meaning as use” doctrine of the Blue and Brown books and Philosophical Investigations. Findlay remarks that he was shocked in 1939 when Wittgenstein admitted to him that he had already written a great deal about “mental processes”, while reading next to nothing of the great early twentieth century experimental psychologists (SF: 31). So when Wittgenstein mocked the story of the mind’s eye viewing inner mental pictures, he was ignorant of Titchner’s work on “imageless thought;” when he attacked introspection as pseudo-science, he was ignorant of the careful and disciplined introspective methods of Külpe and the Würzburg school, and so forth. Many of Wittgenstein’s targets are thus straw men.

Findlay readily concedes that Wittgenstein is right that there is rarely a uniform inner experience that is invariably present in a specific mental processes such as thinking or believing. But it is a mistake infer from the absence of uniform inner experiences that there are no inner experiences at all:

Wittgenstein denies the existence of specific experiences of intending, with equal correctness and incorrectness. There are intentions as poignantly experienced as the nailing of these to church doors, and intentions distinguished only by the very faint note of “to be doneness”, as when we go up to someone and greet him. (W: 39)

And again:

Wittgenstein’s dogmatic pronouncement may here be contrasted with the vastly varied categorizations which introspective psychologists have brought into the examination of pain, as well as into every other form of organic or kinesthetic sensation, using metaphorical descriptions without stint, and often with great aptness. (W: 222)

These inner experiences are part of a general subjectivity that form the background without which language cannot even arise; this background is a quasi-language of thought possessed to some degree by non-human animals.

[Wittgenstein] has rejected what seemed to him the idle pictures that men fashion in going beyond the actual sues of language, but he has given us little understanding of what those actual uses are, and what they ought to be. Blind acceptance of the uses of expression, without a justifying ontology or experimental phenomenology, does not recommend itself to the most naïve user of words: they look for a justification of use, and they seek it beyond use. The falsifying, merely pictorial element abounds in inner-life talk, but it will none the less not do to throw out the baby of inner experience with the bath water of undisciplined diction (W: 252)

Wittgenstein’s famous argument against “a private language”, is set by Findlay in a special context. In the Tractatus Wittgenstein endorses solipsism: there is even a example of one eye contemplating a world that is entirely its own. Findlay argued that Wittgenstein not only preached solipsism; he lived it. “Wittgenstein, I consider, is one of the few and genuine complete solipsists who have ever existed” (SF: 62). He believed that he did not know what it is to be like someone other than Wittgenstein, or that anyone else could gasp what his own life was like.

His pervasive aestheticism certainly displayed a character that I believe, is technically describable as “schizoid”, there was something, queer, detached, surreal, incompletely human about it. His colorless simple objects are not things that one can touch and handle, and his villagers who sell apples one by one taken from a drawer, and then ritually count them as they are taken out, or who assure themselves that something is red by taking a named sample of red out of their pockets, are plainly the inhabitants of a dream or a nightmare, and not of a possible village. (W: 21)

The “private language argument” in this context, becomes an almost hysterical attempt to provide a public world and public communication between the separate selves of the Tractatus. To insist (against private languages) that “inner processes must have outer criteria” is not a problem for Findlay, who remained a quasi-behaviorist to the end. The problem is to claim, as Wittgenstein did, that in most cases outward criteria cannot be found, and to declare on this basis that inner processes are largely mythical. On Findlay’s interpretation, Wittgenstein spent his youthful years hiding his inner experiences, and then in later life invented a philosophy that declared that he had nothing to hide.

The Wittgenstein wave has largely passed by, and Findlay’s multitudinous objections look a bit like overkill. Philosophy today has rediscovered psychology, though it is the psychology of Kahneman and Tversky and Pylyshyn, not the psychology of Brentano or Titchner. But Findlay’s style of objecting to Wittgenstein, rather than ignoring him, presupposes a common ground, and suggests a continuing relevance of Wittgenstein’s thought for the contemporary philosophy of mind.

To close with an autobiographical passage: Findlay, a theosophist surrounded by hostile logicians, seems to have found in Wittgenstein a kindred spirit:

He treated me with extraordinary graciousness, perhaps principally because he saw in me an inconsequential unbelongingness akin to his own. He gave me his then only copy of the first 150 sections of the Philosophical Investigations to read! It is in the light of his many kindnesses that I should wish this present, highly critical book about his teachings to be regarded, not merely as a critique, but also as a tribute. (W: 22)


Note: In this article, the following book abbreviations are employed (all by Findlay unless otherwise indicated):

AA Ascent to the Absolute, 1970
AE Axiological Ethics, 1970
DC The Discipline of the Cave, 1966
EQ “My Encounters With Wittgenstein”, 1973c
LMV Language, Mind, and Value, 1963
M Meinong’s Theory of Objects and Values, 1963
ML “My Life: 1903–1973”, 1985
SF Cohen et al. (eds), Studies in the Philosophy of J. N. Findlay, 1985
TC The Transcendence of the Cave, 1967
VI Values and Intentions, 1961
W Wittgenstein: A Critique, 1984

Primary Sources

Note: archival materials including lecture notes, letters, and manuscripts are stored at the Howard Gotlieb Archival Research Center, Boston University.

Books by Findlay

  • 1933, Meinong’s Theory of Objects, Oxford: Oxford University Press. (original title)
    • [M] 1963, Meinong’s Theory of Objects and Values, second edition, Oxford: Oxford University Press. (expanded title)
  • 1958, Hegel: A Re-examination, London: Allen and Unwin.
    • 1969, Spanish translation, Re-examen de Hegel, Barcelona.
    • 1972, Italian translation, Hegel Oggi, Milan: Instituto Librario.
  • [VI] 1961, Values and Intentions: A Study in Value-theory and Philosophy of Mind, London: Allen and Unwin and New York: Macmillan.
  • [LMV] 1963, Language, Mind, and Value: Philosophical Essays, London: Allen and Unwin and New York: Humanities Press.
  • [DC] 1966, The Discipline of the Cave, London: Allen and Unwin
    • 1969, Spanish translation, La Disciplina de la Caverna, Madrid: Gredo.
  • [TC] 1967, The Transcendence of the Cave, London: Allen and Unwin.
    • 1969, Spanish translation, La Transcendencia de la Caverna, Madrid: Gredo.
  • [AE] 1970, Axiological Ethics, London: Macmillan.
  • 1972, Psyche and Cerebrum, Aquinas lecture, Milwaukee: Marquette University Press.
  • [AA] 1970, Ascent to the Absolute: Metaphysical Papers and Lectures, London: Allen and Unwin. New York: Humanities Press, 1974.
  • 1974, Plato: The Written and the Unwritten Doctrines, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul and New York: Humanities Press.
  • 1976, Plato and Platonism, New York: New York Times Book.
  • 1981, Kant and the Transcendental Object, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • [W] 1984, Wittgenstein: A Critique, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.

Articles by Findlay

  • 1940, “Some Reactions to Recent Cambridge Philosophy (I)”, Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy, 18(3): 193–211. Reprinted LMV: ch 1. doi:10.1080/00048404008541153
  • 1941a, “Some Reactions to Recent Cambridge Philosophy (II)”, Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy, 19(1): 1–13. Reprinted LMV: ch 1. doi:10.1080/00048404108541503
  • 1941b, “Time: A Treatment of Some Puzzles”, Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy, 19(3): 216–235. Reprinted LMV: 39–56 (ch 2). doi:10.1080/00048404108541170
  • 1942, “Goedelian Sentences: A Non-Numerical Approach”, Mind, 51(203): 259–265. Reprinted in LMV: ch 3. doi:10.1093/mind/LI.203.259
  • 1944, “Morality by Convention”, Mind, 53(210): 142–169. Reprinted LMV: ch 4. doi:10.1093/mind/LIII.210.142
  • 1948a, “Can God’s Existence Be Disproved?”, Mind, 57(226): 176–183. Reprinted LMV: 96–105 (ch 5). doi:10.1093/mind/LVII.226.176
  • 1948b, “Recommendations Regarding the Language of Introspection”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 9(2): 212–236. Reprinted in Clarity Is Not Enough: Essays in Criticism of Linguistic Philosophy, Hywel David Lewis (ed.), London: Allen & Unwin., 1963, ch. 15. doi:10.2307/2103390
  • 1949, part 3 of “Symposium: Is There Knowledge by Acquaintance?”, H. L. A. Hart, G. E. Hughes, and J. N. Findlay, Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 23: 111–128. doi:10.1093/aristoteliansupp/23.1.69
  • 1950a, “Linguistic Approach to Psycho-physics”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 50: 43–64. Reprinted LMV: ch 7. doi:10.1093/aristotelian/50.1.43
  • 1950b, “Values in Speaking”, Philosophy, 25(92): 20–39. Reprinted in LMV: 105–128 (ch 6). doi:10.1017/S0031819100007774
  • 1952, “Probability Without Nonsense”, The Philosophical Quarterly, 2(8): 218–239. doi:10.2307/2960096
  • 1953, part 1 of “Symposium: The Notion of Infinity”, J. N. Findlay, C. Lewy, and S. Körner, Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 27: 21–44. Reprinted in LMV: ch 8. doi:10.1093/aristoteliansupp/27.1.21
  • 1954, “The Justification of Attitudes”, Mind, 63(250): 145–161. Reprinted LMV: ch 9. doi:10.1093/mind/LXIII.250.145
  • 1955, “The Logic of Bewusstseinslagen”, The Philosophical Quarterly, 5(18): 57–68. Reprinted in LMV: ch 10. doi:10.2307/2217046
  • 1956a, “An Examination of Tenses”, in Contemporary British Philosophy, H. D. Lewis (ed.), London: Allen and Unwin, pp. 165–189.
  • 1956b, “Some Merits of Hegelianism: The Presidential Address”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 56: 1–24. doi:10.1093/aristotelian/56.1.1
  • 1957 [1961], “The Structure of the Kingdom of Ends”, Henrietta Hertz Lecture, read at the British Academy, 20 March 1957. Reprinted as appendix in Values and Intentions [VI].
  • 1959a [1963], “The Contemporary Relevance of Hegel”, Colloquium on Contemporary British Philosophy in London, 1959. Printed in LMV: ch 13.
  • 1959b, “Some Reflections on Meaning”, Indian Journal of Philosophy, vol. I, issue 1 (August). Reprinted in LMV: ch 12.
  • 1960, “Some Neglected Issues in the Philosophy of G. E. Moore”, Presented to the Cambridge Moral Sciences Club and the Royal Institute of Philosophy, 1960. Reprinted in LMV: ch 14 and in G.E. Moore, Essays in Retrospect, Alice Ambrose and Morris Lazerowitz (eds), London: Allen and Unwin, 1970, pp. 64–79.
  • 1961a, “The Methodology of Normative Ethics”:, Journal of Philosophy, 58(24): 757–764. Reprinted in LMV: ch 15. doi:10.2307/2023601
  • 1961b, part 2 of “Use, Usage and Meaning”, Gilbert Ryle and J. N. Findlay, Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 35: 231–242. Reprinted in Clarity Is Not Enough: Essays in Criticism of Linguistic Philosophy, Hywel David Lewis (ed.), London: Allen & Unwin., 1963, ch 19. Reprinted in The Theory of Meaning, G.H.R. Parkinson (ed.), London: Oxford University Press, 1968, ch 5. doi:10.1093/aristoteliansupp/35.1.223
  • 1962, “The Teaching of Meaning”, Logique et Analyse, (Thinking and Meaning: Entretiens d’Oxford 1962), 5(20): 169–172. Reprinted in AA: ch 4.
  • 1963, “Metaphysics and Affinity”:, Monist, 47(2): 159–187. Reprinted in AA: ch 7. doi:10.5840/monist196347212
  • 1964a, “The Diremptive Tendencies of Western Philosophy”, Philosophy East and West, 14(2): 167–178. Reprinted in AA: ch 9. doi:10.2307/1396984
  • 1964b, “Freedom and Value”, in Memorias Del XIII Congreso Internacional de Filosofía, Universidad Nacional Autónoma de México, 7: 285–290. Conference held Mexico City, 1963. Reprinted in AA: ch 6. doi:10.5840/wcp131964VII145
  • 1964c, “Hegel’s Use of Teleology:”, Monist, 48(1): 1–17. Reprinted in AA: ch 8. doi:10.5840/monist19644811
  • 1967a, “Essential Probabilities”, in Phenomenology in America: Studies in the Philosophy of Experience, James M. Edie (ed.), Chicago: Quadrangle Books. Reprinted in AA: ch 11.
  • 1967b, “The Logic of Mysticism”, Religious Studies, 2(2): 145–162. Reprinted in AA: ch 10. doi:10.1017/S0034412500002717
  • 1967c, “The Logic of Ultimates”, The Journal of Philosophy, 64(19): 571–583. Reprinted in AA: ch 11. doi:10.2307/2024534
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  • 2005a, “Philosophy as a Discipline”, The Philosophical Forum, 36(2): 141–148. doi:10.1111/j.1467-9191.2005.00196.x
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  • 2006a, “Aristotle and Eideticism II”, The Philosophical Forum, 37(3): 333–386, doi:10.1111/j.1467-9191.2006.00244.x
  • 2006b, “Notes on Spinoza and Absolute Theory”, The Philosophical Forum, 37(4): 427–437, doi:10.1111/j.1467-9191.2006.00246.x
  • 2007a, “Notes on Plato’s Timaeus”, The Philosophical Forum, 38(2): 159–171, doi:10.1111/j.1467-9191.2007.00261.x
  • 2007b, “Notes on Kant’s Prolegomena”, The Philosophical Forum, 38(3): 289–308, doi:10.1111/j.1467-9191.2007.00268.x
  • 2007c, “Hegel’s Philosophy: The Logic”, The Philosophical Forum, 38(4): 387–459, doi:10.1111/j.1467-9191.2007.00276.x
  • 2008, “Wittgenstein and His Tractatus”, The Philosophical Forum, 39(1): 85–94, doi:10.1111/j.1467-9191.2007.00283.x
  • 2018, “Notes on the Ideen of Husserl”, The Philosophical Forum, 49(3): 283–307, doi:10.1111/phil.12193

Translations and Prefaces

  • 1970, translation of Logical Investigations (Logische Untersuchungen), by Edmund Husserl, with an introduction by J.N. Findlay, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • 1970, foreword to Hegel’s Philosophy of Nature, A.V. Miller (trans.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1971, foreword to Hegel’s Philosophy of Mind, William Wallace and A.V. Miller (trans.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1975, foreword to Hegel’s Logic, William Wallace (trans.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1977, analysis and foreword to Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit, A.V. Miller (trans.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.

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