First published Mon Dec 9, 2002; substantive revision Fri Sep 18, 2015

The diversity, complexity, and adaptation of the biological realm is evident. Until Darwin, the best explanation for these three features of the biological was the conclusion of the “argument from design.” Darwin’s theory of natural selection provides an explanation of all three of these features of the biological realm without adverting to some mysterious designing entity, by explaining the process of “the survival of the fittest.” But this explanation’s success turns on the meaning of its central explanatory concept, ‘fitness’. Moreover, since Darwinian theory provides the resources for a purely causal account of teleology, wherever it is manifested, its reliance on the concept of ‘fitness’ makes it imperative that conceptual problems threatening the explanatory legitimacy of this notion be solved.

1. The Classical Problem of Fitness

The leading idea of Darwin’s theory of natural selection is often expressed in terms first coined by Herbert Spencer as the claim that among competing organisms the fittest survive (1864, 144). If there is random variation among the traits of organisms, and if some variant traits fortuitously confer advantages on the organisms that bear them, i.e., enhance their fitness, then those organisms will live to have more offspring, which in turn will bear the advantageous traits. Whence descent with adaptive modification, i.e., evolution. Evolution by random heritable variation and natural selection will explain ever increasing adaptation to given environments, increasing diversity in the occupation of new environments, and the complexity of organisms and their parts as their lineages adapt to one another and to their environments.

But what is fitness and how can one tell when a trait enhances fitness, or more to the point, when one organism is fitter than another? Opponents of the theory of natural selection have long claimed that the theory is so treated by its proponents as to define fitness in terms of rates of reproduction, thus condemning the principle of the survival of the fittest to triviality: the claim that those organisms with higher rates of reproduction leave more offspring is an empty, unfalsifiable tautology bereft of explanatory power. In the century and a half since the publication of On the Origin of Species biologists have all too often reinforced this objection by actually so defining fitness. For example, C.H. Waddington writes, in Towards a Theoretical Biology (1968, 19), that the fittest individuals are those that are “most effective in leaving gametes to the next generation.” It appears therefore that evolutionary theory requires a definition of fitness that will protect it from the charges of tautology, triviality, unfalsifiabilty, and consequent explanatory infirmity. If no such definition is in fact forthcoming, then what is required by the theory’s adherents is an alternative account of its structure and content or its role in the research program of biology.

2. Ecological Fitness

In an intuitive sense, ‘fitness’ can refer to the correspondence between the shape of an object and an empty volume it is placed in: a square peg fits into a square hole. In a more abstract fashion, one might refer to the properties of an entity and how they correspond to the constraints of its context. In a biological setting one could focus on an organism’s traits and how they correspond to various aspects of the environment the organism is living in. Following biological usage, call this concept ‘ecological fitness’. (It has also been called ‘vernacular fitness,’ cf. Matthen and Ariew 2002.) The ‘vernacular’ definition is fraught with difficulties. Suppose, following Dennett (1995) we characterize the relation ‘\(x\) is fitter than \(y\)’ as follows:

\(x\) is fitter than \(y\) if and only if \(x\)’s traits enable it to solve the ‘design problems’ set by the environment more fully than \(y\)’s traits do.

One may ask, What are these design problems? How many of them are there? Is there any way of measuring the degree to which \(x\) exceeds \(y\) in their solution? Answers to these questions simply reinforce the threat of tautology that faces the theory. To begin with the notion of “design problems” is vague and metaphorical; or, if treated literally, design problems will all be relative to the overarching objective of leaving more descendants. Thus the definition may simply hide the original problem of distinguishing fitness from reproductive rates, instead of solving it.

Second, the number of design problems is equal to the number of distinct environmental features that affect survival, and of course reproduction, and this number is probably uncountable. Accordingly, prima facie, the proposed definition provides no hope of cardinal or even ordinal measurement that would enable us to predict or explain quantitatively differences in rates of reproduction, and the evolutionary processes that depend on these rates. Moreover, ecological fitness accounts may not have provided a satisfactory story about how to carve up the relevant reference environment that is supposed to have an impact on the survival of said organisms (Abrams 2009). It is no wonder that biologists, sensible of the importance of predictive precision and explanatory testability, have had little truck with ecological fitness and have defined ‘\(x\) is fitter than \(y\)’ in terms of quantitatively measurable reproductive rates. This tendency of course simply adds force to the original argument. If the only way to make fitness differences scientifically tractable is to trivialize the theory, so much the worse for the theory.

3. Individual versus Trait Fitness

Some philosophers (notably Sober, 2013) have argued that evolutionary fitness is a property of populations and not of individual organisms, or alternatively that fitness is a property of traits and not of the individuals that possess them. Individual fitness values are, they argue, empirically inaccessible and predictively useless. If trait fitness is defined in terms of the average fitness value of individuals bearing the trait, then it will turn out that there are individual fitnesses and individual fitness differences, even if it is the case that evolutionary biologists’ interests are confined to trait fitnesses. This claim has been challenged (cf. Pence and Ramsey 2014): sometimes biologists estimate trait fitnesses by studying individual fitnesses (Endler 1986).

It has also been held that trait fitness and fitness difference are both something more than and different from the average of individual fitnesses and fitness differences. On this view, trait fitness is a property of populations and, in part, their population structure—that is, the ways in which traits are distributed in the population. An example (to be explored further below) is reflected in cases where the fitness of a trait depends not just on its incidence in a population, but also on its variance within. A trait’s variance in a population cannot be reflected in individual fitness any more than the entropy of a volume of gas can be reflected in the properties of any of the individual molecules that compose it and contribute to its entropy. This suggests that trait fitness is not reducible to, definable in terms of, or even entirely supervenient on the relationship between individuals (e.g., organisms) and their environments.

The disagreement about whether fitness is a property of biological individuals (genes, genotypes, organisms, families, populations and other groups or even species) as opposed to a property of traits of these individuals, has made significant another debate about the explanatory role of fitness in the theory of natural selection. Among those who endorse trait fitness (differences), and not individual fitness (differences), as a fundamental explanatory factor in natural selection, there is a dispute about whether its explanatory role reflects its causal force, or whether trait fitness is a purely statistical concept employed in the theory of natural selection to make demographic predictions about future trait distributions, without entering into any causal nexus among the objects so to speak. Thus, Matthen and Ariew (2002, 56) write, “Unlike vernacular [individual] fitness, predictive [trait] fitness is not a cause of selection, or of evolution for that matter…. [P]redictive fitness is a measure of evolutionary change not a cause.” This view confers an obligation on those who embrace it to explain how the theory of natural selection can provide contingent explanations without trading in causal relations among its explanatory variables.

4. The Propensity Interpretation of Fitness

Among philosophers of biology there has been a wide consensus that the solution to problem of defining individual ‘fitness’ is given by treating it as a probabilistic disposition. As such it causally intervenes between the relationship of environments to organisms that cause it, and the actual rates of reproduction that are its effects. Thus, fitness turns out to be a “garden-variety” dispositional concept like ‘magnetic’ or ‘fragile’. These properties, and all dispositions are distinguished both from the actual behaviour to which they give rise—e.g., attracting iron filing or breaking in the case of magnetism or fragility; some items are magnetic and others fragile without ever actually attracting iron filings or breaking. Similarly, an organism can have a probabilistic disposition to have \(n\) offspring and yet “unluckily” never actually reproduce.

Dispositional concepts such as ‘magnetic’ have explanatory power even though they are defined in terms of causes and effects from which they are nevertheless distinct, and are realized by the molecular properties of matter on which they supervene. The fact that fitness is a probabilistic disposition makes for no special difficulty on this analysis. The charge of tautology against the theory thus rests on the mistaken demand that an explanatory variable must always be defined in terms distinct from its causes and effects. This is a demand shown to be unreasonable by the failed Logical Positivists’ attempts to give the empirical meanings of theoretical terms independent of their explanatory roles.

Mutatis mutandis the same will apply to comparative fitness differences. These will be dispositions supervening on the complex of relations between organisms’ and environments’ manifest properties (Rosenberg 1978), and will give rise to differential reproductive rates. Thus, definitions such as the following were advanced by proponents of this approach (Beatty and Mills 1979, Brandon 1978):

\(x\) is fitter than \(y\) in \(E\) \(=_{df}\) \(x\) has a probabilistic propensity \(> .5\) to leave more offspring than \(y\).

Of course, if fitness is a probabilistic propensity, then the fitter among competing organisms will not always leave more offspring, and the theory of natural selection will have to be understood as making the claim that (probabilistic) fitness differences result in reproductive differences not invariably but only with some probability. With the inclusion of such propensities, the tautological nature of the explanation is dissolved since there is no deterministic path between the propensity to leave more offspring and the actual reproductive rates. But putting aside the tautology issue, there is also a scientific reason for favoring propensity approaches: since the theory of natural selection allows for drift, this qualification on its claims will be a welcome one.

The question arises however of what sort of a probabilistic propensity the definition invokes. One candidate that has not found much favour among philosophers is that the probability invoked by the definition is long run relative frequency. To begin with, owing to periods of environmental and genetic instability, actual frequencies may vary rapidly while still approaching their long run relative frequencies (conditional on the counterfactual assumption that environment and genes had been stable). This makes it difficult to confirm measures of fitness so defined. Moreover, treating single case probabilities as long run relative frequencies is subject to a long-standing objection. In the biological case it is particularly serious owing to the role of small numbers (e.g., founder effects) in evolution. Finally, if long run relative frequencies reflect dispositions of organisms or populations to leave descendants, the question arises whether these dispositions are grounded on some occurrent properties or not. If not then long run relative frequencies turn out to be or immediately give way to objective chances. (See Earman 1985, 149.)

Some philosophers have argued that fitnesses are precisely such objective chances. Brandon and Carson (1996) held that here, as in quantum mechanics, we find a brute unanalyzable probabilistic dispositional property of a particular item, which generates the long run relative frequencies. It is indeed the case that among philosophers of quantum mechanics some hold that probabilistic propensities can explain actual frequencies [cf. Railton 1978, 216], and some hold that they do so via a detour into long run relative frequencies. But few are comfortable with such arguments and adopt them only because, at the level of the quantum mechanical probabilistic propensities are indispensable and irreducible [cf. Lewis, 1983]. Proponents of probabilistic propensities in biology may envision two possibilities here. One is that probabilistic propensities at the levels of phenomena that constitute the biological are the result of quantum probabilities “percolating up” in Sober (1984) and Brandon’s and Carson’s (1996) phrase; the second is that there are brute unexplainable probabilistic propensities at the level of fitness differences (Brandon and Carson 1996). No one doubts the potential biological significance of quantum percolation. It may well be an important source of mutation [cf. Stamos 1999 for a discussion]. But the claim that it has a significant role in most fitness differences is not supported by any independent evidence [cf. Millstein 2000 and Glymour 2001 for a discussion]. The claim that there are brute probabilistic propensities at the level of organismal fitness differences is only slightly more tenable. No one has adduced any evidence that, for instance, the probabilistic generalizations about the behaviour of animals that ethology and behavioural biology provide, are irreducibly probabilistic, instead of simply expressions of the current state of our knowledge and ignorance of the causes and conditions of the behaviour in question.

Rosenberg and Kaplan [2005] advance an alternative account of the nature and source of objective chances in Darwinian processes, arguing that they are not quantum mechanical in origin but are identical to the objective chances that operate in the processes described by the second law of thermodynamics. Of course this suggestion trades one problem for another, since the source of thermodynamic chances is a vexed question in the philosophy of physics.

There is however a much more serious issue facing the propensity definition of fitness: it has long been held to be difficult to pin down the specific mathematical expression of the probabilistic propensity that is supposed to constitute fitness altogether. The difficulty reflects features of natural selection that we must accommodate. Failure to deal with these difficulties leads inexorably to the conclusion that far from providing the theoretical meaning of fitness, the probabilistic propensity “definition” is a set of an indefinitely large number of operational measures of fitness; moreover, identifying these measures often turns on assuming as understood just what the theory of natural selection sets out to explain. And if this is so, the probabilistic propensity definition will not defuse the threat of triviality facing the theory of natural selection. We review here the research program of delivering a propensity definition of fitness that has sought to deal with these difficulties.

The first thing to notice about the “definition”

\(x\) is fitter than \(y\) in \(E\) \(=_{df}\) \(x\) has a probabilistic propensity \(> .5\) to leave more offspring than \(y\)

is that it is of course often falsified. That is, there are many circumstances in which the organism of greater fitness has the propensity to leave fewer immediate offspring than the organism of lower fitness; as when for example, the larger number of a bird’s chick all die owing to the equal division of a quantity of food which would have kept a smaller number viable. More generally, as Gillespie (1977) has shown, the temporal and/or spatial variance in number of offspring may also have an important selective effect. Take a simple example from Brandon (1990). If organism \(a\) has 2 offspring each year, and organism \(b\) has 1 offspring in odd numbered years and 3 in even numbered ones, then, ceteris paribus, after ten generations there will be 512 descendants of \(a\) and 243 descendants of \(b\). The same holds if \(a\) and \(b\) are populations, and \(b\)’s offspring vary between 1 and 3 depending on location instead of period.

Accordingly, we need to change the “definition” to accommodate the effects of variance:

\(x\) is fitter than \(y\) \(=_{df}\) probably \(x\) will have more offspring than \(y\), unless their average numbers of offspring are equal and the temporal and/or spatial variance in \(y\)’s offspring numbers is greater than the variance in \(x\)’s, or the average numbers of \(x\)’s offspring are lower than \(y\)’s, but the difference in offspring variance is large enough to counterbalance \(y\)’s greater number of offspring.

It is also the case that in some biologically actual circumstances—for example, in circumstances in which mean fitnesses are low, increased variance is sometimes selected for (Ekbohm, Fagerstrom, and Agren 1979). As Beatty and Finsen (1987) further showed, our “definition” will also have to accommodate “skew” along with offspring numbers and variance. Skew “appears” when one of the “tails” of the distribution contains more observations and the median is therefore shifted away from the normal. Our “definition” of fitness must take these conditions into account on pain of falsity. One simple way to do so is to add a ceteris paribus clause to the definition. But the question must then be raised of how many different exceptions to the original definiens need to be accommodated. If the circumstances under which greater offspring numbers do not make for greater fitness are indefinitely many, then this “definition” will be unsatisfactory.

Some proponents of the propensity definition recognize this difficulty and are prepared to accept that at most a “schematic” definition can be provided. Thus Brandon writes (1990, 20):

We can … define the adaptedness [a synonym for expected fitness] of an organism O in an environment E as follows:
\[ A^*(O,E) = \sum P(Q_i^{OE})Q_i^{OE} - f(E,\sigma^2). \]

Here \(Q_i^{OE}\) are a range of possible offspring numbers in generation \(i\), \(P(Q_i^{OE})\) is the probabilistic propensity to leave \(Q_i^{OE}\) in generation \(i\), and most important \(f(E, \sigma^2)\) is “some function of the variance in offspring numbers for a given type, \(\sigma^2\), and of the pattern of variation” (1990, 20). Brandon means “some function or other, we know not what in advance of examining the case.” Moreover, we will have to add to variance other factors that determine the function, such as Beatty and Finsen’s skew, or the conditions which Ekbohm, Fagerstrom, and Agren identify as making higher variance adaptive, etc. Thus, the final term in Brandon’s definition will have to be expanded to \(f(E,\sigma^2,\ldots)\), where the ellipsis indicate the additional statistical factors which sometimes combine with or cancel the variance to determine fitness levels.

But how many such factors are there, and when do they play a non-zero role in fitness? The answer is that the number of such factors is probably indefinitely large. The reason for this is given by the facts about natural selection as Darwin and his successors uncovered them. The fact about selection which fates our “definition” either to being forever schematic or incomplete is the “arms-race” strategic character of evolutionary interaction. Since every strategy for enhancing reproductive fitness (including how many offspring to have in a given environment) calls forth a counter-strategy among competing organisms (which may undercut the initial reproductive strategy), the number of conditions covered by our ceteris paribus clause, or equivalently the number of places in the function \(f(E,\sigma^2,\ldots)\) is equal to the number of strategies and counter-strategies of reproduction available in an environment. Brandon writes, “in the above definition of \(A^*(O,E)\), the function \(f(E,\sigma^2)\) is a dummy function in the sense that the form can be specified only after the details of the selection scenario have been specified” (20). But, besides the fact Brandon admits, that the function \(f\) will differ for different \(O\) and \(E\), \(f\) will have to be expanded to accommodate an indefinite number of further statistical terms beyond variance. Schematically, it will take the form \(f(E,\sigma^2,\ldots)\). Again, adapting Brandon’s notation, none of the members of the set which express his multiply generic “definition” of “adaptedness” or “expected fitness”, \(\{\Sigma P(Q_i^{OE})Q_i^{OE} - f_1(E,\sigma^2, \ldots)\), \(\Sigma P(Q_i^{OE})Q_i^{OE} - f_2(E,\sigma^2, \ldots)\), \(\Sigma P(Q_i^{OE})Q_i^{OE} - f_3(E,\sigma^2, \ldots)\), \(\ldots\}\), is in fact a definition of either term. It is the set of operational measurements of the property of comparative fitness.

Philosophers dissatisfied with this conclusion have continued to search for a propensity definition of fitness that is counterexample-free and not schematic or generic in Brandon’s sense. A promising candidate is due to Pence and Ramsey (2013). A brief account is given here.

Consider all the possible daughter lineages or lines of descent from some individual, \(o\). Call each of the possible lineages \(\omega\) and the set of them \(\Omega\). For each lineage \(\omega_i\) the probability that \(o\)’s actual daughter population is \(\omega_i\) will be \(Pr(\omega_i)\). \(F\), the fitness of \(o\), will not be given by weighted sums of possible daughter populations at a specific generation in the future, but rather by this value over the long run, as the number of generations increases without limit. The definition of individual fitness, \(F\), is then given by the following equation (Pence and Ramsey 2013, 862; equation (4)):

\[ F = \exp \left( \lim_{t \to \infty} \frac{1}{t} \int_{\omega\in \Omega} Pr(\omega ) \cdot \ln(\phi(\omega ,t)) \mathrm d \omega \right) \]

(where \(\phi(\omega ,t)\) is a function that gives the size of a daughter population at some future time \(t\)). Of course if every possible daughter lineage becomes extinct eventually then in the limit \(F = 0\), and if some populations fluctuate wildly, \(F\) may not converge to a stable value in the limit either. But there are conditions under which the limit as the number of generations goes to infinity is guaranteed to exist and under which \(F\) is well-defined (see Pence and Ramsey 2013, 862).

This equation is also subject to some further conditions Pence and Ramsey argue are biologically reasonable, for example that selection is density dependent, that there is an extinction threshold of some population size below which extinction obtains, and most important that the population dynamics are non-chaotic. Pence and Ramsey show how their definition avoids all of the problems discussed above, as well as some other counterexamples to previous proposals, owing to its incorporating and combining all possible daughter populations over indefinitely many reproductive generations. They also show that a general version of the same equation has been independently derived by mathematical biologists, and they argue that so defined, fitness has a substantial role to play in biology, especially the field of “adaptive dynamics”. They show how standard operation fitness measures biologists employ can be derived from the definition, including the simple geometric and arithmetic means, along with their higher moments (variance, skew, etc.) when multi-generational effects are present. Thus, for example, Pence and Ramsey’s proposal has the result that an organism with a probability of reproducing one offspring per generation equal to 1 will be fitter than an organism with a .5 probability of 0 offspring and a .5 probability of 2 offspring, since the second organism’s possible lines of descent will all have a probability of extinction that approaches 1 as time approaches infinity.

Suppose that the Pence and Ramsey proposal adequately deals with the counter-example problems that confronted earlier probabilistic propensity definitions of fitness. The question of whether this definition is adequate for trait fitness as well as for individual fitness and fitness differences remains. To begin with there is matter of whether the definition merely provides units in which to measure fitness the way that plainly operational definitions do, by contrast with definitions of dispositions in terms of their occurrent bases. The supervenience of fitness on a vast and heterogeneous base makes such a reductive definition impossible and as we have seen the ecological characterization in terms of “design problems” has its limits as well. Moreover, some have argued that the propensity definition is at most only a component of the meaning of trait fitness. As noted above, some philosophers (e.g., Ariew and Ernst (2007, 296)) argue that trait fitness is often a matter of population size and structure and conditions of genetic heritability, and these factors are “extrinsic to the causal properties of the individual” in its local environment. From this conclusion it seems an easy matter to infer that as it functions in the theory of natural selection, trait fitness may not be causal force at all. It may, after all, be a “book-keeping” notion, one which allows us to make predictive inferences without having any “biological reality”.

5. Fitness as a Propensity and the Principle of Natural Selection

The Pence-Ramsey proposal holds out the prospect of dealing with a serious difficulty that long daunted the probabilistic propensity definition of fitness. For the counterexamples it deals with made impossible any attempt to turn a generic probabilistic schema for fitness into a complete general definition that is both applicable and adequate to the task of vindicating the truth of the principle of natural selection (PNS):

PNS : If \(x\) is fitter than \(y\), then probably \(x\) will have more descendants than \(y\).

Note that if we cannot give anything more than a generic schema for ‘\(x\) is fitter than \(y\)’, then the PNS cannot be expressed as a synthetic proposition with a truth-value and so cannot figure as a general law. These problems had suggested to some philosophers that we need to rethink the cognitive status of the theory of natural selection altogether.

Brandon, for example, has argued that the theory of natural selection should not be viewed as a body of general laws, but as the prescription for a research program. As such its central claims need not meet standards of testability, and fitness need not be defined in terms that assure the nontriviality, testability, and direct explanatory power of the theory of natural selection. In that sense, Brandon makes common cause with the later Popper. Popper originally argued the claim that the theory of natural selection was unfalsifiable pseudoscience. Later he came to hold that theory of natural selection was a scientifically respectable but nevertheless untestable organizing principle for biological science (Brandon 1990, 139–140).

On this view, in each particular selective scenario a different specification of the schematic propensity definition of fitness figures in the antecedent of a different and highly restricted principle of natural selection that is applicable only in that scenario. Properly restricted to the right function and the right set of statistical features of its reproductive rate for a given environment, this version will be a highly specific claim about natural selection for the given population in the given environment.

The notion that there is a very large family of principles of natural selection, each with a restricted range of application, will be attractive to those biologists uncomfortable with a single principle or law of natural selection, and to those philosophers of science who treat the theory of natural selection as a class of models. On the “semantic approach” to the theory of natural selection, each of the substitution instances of the schematic principle of natural selection generated by a particular specification of the propensity definition of fitness is treated as a definition of a different Darwinian system of population change over time. See Lloyd 1994, Beatty 1981, and Thompson 1989 for exposition of this position. The evolutionary biologist’s task is to identify which definition is instantiated by a population in an environment.

For every such definition instantiated by a population, there is the synthetic truth that the members of the population, or all of its subpopulations, instantiate the definition, and the further broader truth that many populations of otherwise diverse species instantiate a small sub-set of the models, and the yet broader truth that all populations instantiate one of this set of really quite similar models. Presumably, all these statements of varying degrees of generality need explanation. Consequently, those who resist the “semantic interpretation” of theories argue that we might as well treat each as a substitution instance of the principle of natural selection generated by a different probabilistic propensity measure of fitness as a distinct empirical generalization to begin with instead of a model-theoretic definition. But, one will want to ask, does this set of generalizations with similar antecedents and identical consequents have something in common, which in turn explains and unifies them, or are they the fundamental principles of the theory of natural selection? The question is obviously rhetorical. For each of the members of the set of functions that turn the definition-schema for fitness into a complete property is a measurement of the fitness of some actual or potential individuals or populations. Each is a measurement appropriate to its particular environmental circumstances, a measurement inappropriate for the same or different individuals at different locations or times in the same environment.

One alternative is to allow that the PNS is a necessary truth but continue to hold that it has explanatory content, and can figure in causal explanations of evolutionary outcomes. This is a view advanced by Sober (see Sober 2002) and examined in Lange and Rosenberg (2011). As we shall see in the next section, another possibility is to relativize reproductive rates in favor of another universal measure of fitness.

6. How the Problems of Defining Biological Individuality Affect the Notion of Fitness

In previous sections, we remarked on the difficulty of identifying the precise propensity that could, according to some, ground fitness ascriptions. Moreover, it is often difficult to isolate the populations where the evolutionary change is occurring. This is in part an operational problem, but for many biological systems, this difficulty may in fact reveal a deeper ontological issue. Thinking about fitness in reproductive terms depends on the possibility of identifying offspring (or successive replicators) and populations of them. For most Metazoans, this appears to be relatively straightforward. But how are we to treat the evolution of colonies, clonal organisms and symbionts (and hypothetically ecosystems)? Many philosophers have argued that our philosophy of biology’s usual bestiary does not reflect some of the complex organisation actually to be found in nature (J. Wilson 1999, D.S. Wilson and Sober 1989, Godfrey-Smith 2009, O’Malley and Dupré 2007, Bouchard and Huneman 2013) For many biological systems, organismal boundaries seem arbitrary ways to carve up the biological world. Those boundaries may merely reflect an impoverished way of thinking about biological individuality (Pradeu 2012, Haber 2013). Many biological individuals are in fact complex arrangements of other individuals. When these individuals belong to a single species (ex. some eusocial insects) a gene selectionist view according to which fitness is understood as the differential reproductive success of alleles may be available. But in the case of multi-species communities (e.g., fungus-termite colonies), allelic success will not track evolutionary change since some of the adaptations are not fully biotic (Bouchard 2009). Moreover, it has been argued (Turner 2004, Bouchard 2004, 2008) that some individuals that are adapting are not reproducing at all.

Biological individuality is much more varied and heterogeneous than previously believed and this additional complexity puts pressure on the notion that reproductive success can act as a ‘universal currency’ of fitness. The difficulties of establishing reproductive success for some clonal organisms, for collectives of organisms and for multi-species assemblages has led some biologists and philosophers to entertain alternative concepts of fitness. Leigh Van Valen, in his attempts to develop a theory of evolution that would allow for the evolution of whole communities (Van Valen 1975, 1989, 1991), suggested that fitness as energy control could explain the evolution of a broader range of biological systems. “Rather than saying that natural selection is expected differential reproduction, we should say that it is expected differential expansion” (Van Valen 1989, 7). By ‘expansion’ Van Valen doesn’t mean expansion in physical space (although that may occur) but expansion in resource or energy space. In this approach, energy is seen as the ‘universal currency’: a fitter community is one that controls more energy than another community. For ‘simpler’ biological systems such as sexual species with discrete generations, increased reproductive success is a good proxy for increased energy success and therefore previous measurements and models of reproductive output remain useful but their explanatory exhaustiveness is relativized. Although energy can seem to be a universal measure of fitness that could apply to the all the varied types of biological individuals that can emerge, it’s not clear that Van Valen’s approach can be as universal as desired since it has difficulty explaining increases in efficiency in energy control (see Bouchard 2004 chap 3 for analysis). This has motivated Bouchard (2004, 2008, 2011) to argue for an account of evolution focusing on differential persistence (reminiscent of Thoday 1953). Bouchard (2004, 2008, 2011) argues that Persistence Through Time of a lineage is the property maximized by evolution by natural selection: maximization of relative reproductive success or maximization of energy control are only two dominant strategies for persistence increase (see Bourrat 2014 and Doolittle 2014 for related approaches). In this approach (lineage) \(X\)is fitter than (lineage) \(Y\) if \(X\)has a higher propensity to persist for \(Z\) amount of time than \(Y\). Some of the problems of propensities remain, but we gain a way to assess ecological fitness (probability of persistence) in a way that can be independent of reproductive success. Persistence is the overarching design-problem. Increased reproductive potential is but one powerful way to increase one’s potential to persist.

The question of how to define biological individuality is an ontological question about what individuals can evolve in response to natural selection. Many biological systems differ in form and in function from our garden variety Metazoans. How are we to understand the evolution of symbiotic communities involving bacteria with lateral gene transfer? How are we to make sense of the complex traits of eusocial insects? Not all these emergent individuals qua individuals replicate. Whether it’s by focusing on energy or persistence (or some other account) a complete understanding of fitness should reflect that fact—or accept that it cannot alone account for some adaptive change in the biological world.

7. Ecological Fitness and the Problem of Evolutionary Drift

The difficulties that face both the subjective probability view of fitness and the probabilistic propensity definitions of fitness are serious enough to make the notion of “ecological fitness” worth revisiting. Recall that on this view ‘\(a\) is fitter than \(b\) in \(E\)’ is defined as ‘\(a\)’s traits result in its solving the design problems set by \(E\) more fully than \(b\)’s traits.’ The terms in which this definition is couched are certainly in as much need of clarification as is ‘fitness’. It is cold philosophical comfort to point out that definitions have to stop somewhere, that the definition of a theoretical term must be distinct from the operational measure of the property it names, and that testability is not a matter of theory meeting data one proposition at a time. In consequence none of these considerations have convinced philosophers of biology to accept the design problem definition, and to give up the project of defining fitness by reference to its effects in reproduction. Nevertheless, there does appear to be important biological work that the ecological fitness concept can do, and which no definition of fitness in terms of differential reproductive rates—actual, expected, or dispositional—can do.

To see what these tasks are, consider the question, How do we decide whether a divergence from a long run relative frequency prediction about fitness differences is a matter of drift, a disconfirmation of the hypothesis of natural selection, or a reflection of a mismeasurement of fitness differences to begin with? Suppose we measure the fitness differences between population \(a\) and population \(b\) to be in the ratio of 7:3 (e.g., \(w_a = 1\), \(w_b = .428\)) and suppose further that in some generation, the actual offspring ratio is 5:5. There are four alternatives: (a) the fitness measure of 7:3 is right but there was drift—i.e., the initial conditions at this generation are unrepresentative of those which obtain in all relevant generations; (b) the fitness measure of 7:3 was incorrect and there was no drift; (c) both drift and wrong fitness measure or (d) the principle of natural selection is disconfirmed. Ignoring the fourth alternative, how do we discriminate among the first three of these?

In the absence of information about the initial conditions of the divergence, there is only one way empirically to choose between alternatives (a)–(c). This way requires that there are ecological fitness differences, and that we can detect them. Suppose that fitness differences were matters of probabilistic differential reproductive success (no matter what interpretation of probability is adopted). Then the only access to fitness differences is via population censuses in previous generations (since these form the bases of the probabilities). Suppose that this census does indeed show a 7:3 ratio between as and bs in the recent past. In order to exclude the absence of fitness differences instead of drift, as the source of the current generation’s 5:5 outcome, we need to be able to establish that the 7:3 differences in previous populations were not themselves the result of drift. But this is the first step in a regress, since we began with the problem of discriminating drift from mismeasures of fitness. To solve the initial problem, we now have to assure ourselves that the 7:3 ratios in the past were not the result of drift. Whence the regress. Of course the problem does not arise if we have access to fitness differences independently of previous population censuses. And this access we have, at least in principle, if fitness is a matter of differences in the solution of identifiable design problems, that is, if there is such a thing as ecological fitness and it is (fallibly) measured by probabilistic propensities to leave offspring.

Once we have access to ecological fitness differences, we can, at least in principle, decide whether the divergence from predicted long-run relative frequencies, especially where small populations are concerned, is a matter of drift or reflects our ignorance either of ecological fitness differences or the unrepresentativeness of the initial conditions of individual births, deaths, and reproductions.

This result also has important implications for the interpretation of the theory of natural selection as one wholly about populations, and not also about individual fitness differences, discussed above (individual versus trait fitness). Note that the problem of distinguishing drift from selection in ensembles—i.e., large populations—has the same character, and is in principle susceptible to the same solution as the problem of drift makes for evolution among lineages with small numbers of individual members. We can distinguish drift from selection in ensembles as well, if we accept that there is such epistemic access to ecological fitness differences and to the initial conditions of births, deaths and reproductions, taken one at a time, and we accept that these individual-differences aggregate into ensemble-differences.

Because populations no matter how large are always finite in size, there is always some drift which needs to be distinguished from fitness differences. Thus even in population biology there is in the end no substitute for ecological fitness and no way to dispense with its services to the theory of natural selection. And since ecological fitness is ultimately a relationship between organisms (or individuals) taken two at a time, the theory is as much a set of claims about individuals as it is about populations.

This line of reasoning highlights the next phase of the debate. From a discussion about fitness, the debate has evolved into a general debate concerning the nature of natural selection and drift. A number of alternative views have emerged in thinking about these topics. Some (e.g., Walsh, Lewens, Ariew, and Matthen) think about natural selection solely as population wide patterns caused by non selective processes: this view deprives fitness of any causal or explanatory power. Others (e.g., Millstein and Stephens) see fitness and natural selection as a cause, operating at the population level, to bring about the differential reproduction rates. Finally others argue that, if it is to play an explanatory role in our theory, fitness has to be an individual and causal concept. As these debates suggest, far from being merely a 19th century slogan, understanding the meaning of the “survival of the fittest” is of philosophical and biological urgency.


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The editors would like to thank Sally Ferguson for noticing and reporting a number of typographical errors in this entry.

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Frederic Bouchard <>

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