First published Sat Jul 21, 2018; substantive revision Mon Oct 16, 2023

The notion of fundamentality, as it is used in metaphysics, aims to capture the idea that there is something basic or primitive in the world. This metaphysical notion is related to the vernacular use of “fundamental”, but philosophers have also put forward various technical definitions of the notion. Among the most influential of these is the definition of absolute fundamentality in terms of ontological independence or ungroundedness. Accordingly, the notion of fundamentality is often associated with these two other technical notions, covered under ontological dependence and metaphysical grounding in this encyclopedia.

Why are philosophers interested in fundamentality? One reason comes from a certain view of science. It is not uncommon to think that particle physics has some special role in our inquiry into the structure of reality. After all, every material entity is made up of fundamental particles. So, one might think that particle physics aims to describe the fundamental level of reality, which contains the basic building blocks of nature. We can then employ the notion of relative fundamentality, which enables us to express the hierarchical nature of reality disclosed by science, according to which the facts of biochemistry depend on the facts of elementary chemistry, which depend in turn on the allegedly fundamental facts of fundamental particle physics.

The thought that this priority ordering terminates at the fundamental level is often expressed with the notion of well-foundedness. The view that reality is well-founded in the relevant sense is called metaphysical foundationalism, in contrast with metaphysical infinitism. A further option, which undermines the priority ordering and suggests that dependence chains can form loops, is called metaphysical coherentism.

We can identify two key tasks for the notion of fundamentality. The first is to capture the idea that there is a foundation of being, which consists of independent entities. The second is to capture the idea that the fundamental entities constitute a complete basis that all else depends on. These tasks are related. In fact, the first would seem to require the second, but not the other way around. We will see that prioritizing one or the other of these tasks may result in different accounts of fundamentality. The second task may be applied to relative fundamentality and used to express the idea that there is a hierarchy of being whereby some entities are more fundamental than others, although strictly speaking this hierarchical picture is independent of the notion of a complete basis.

This entry will focus on the contemporary discussion, but many of the ideas debated in the contemporary literature have been around for millennia. We now have the tools to make these important ideas much more precise. Relevant historical issues include ancient atomism (e.g., Leucippus and Democritus, see the separate entry on ancient atomism), Aristotle’s many discussions of priority (see, e.g., Peramatzis 2011 and the articles in Sirkel & Tahko 2014), Aquinas’s discussion of the first cause (see the entry on the cosmological argument and Oberle 2022b), the principle of sufficient reason, as discussed by Spinoza and Leibniz, among others, and Bolzano’s work as a precursor to some contemporary work on metaphysical grounding and related notions (see Roski and Schnieder 2019 and Schnieder 2020a).

1. Varieties of Fundamentality

There are many senses in which a thing may be said to be fundamental—some technical, some relatively intuitive. A very common way to think about fundamentality is in terms of independence, whereby for any notion of dependence D, an entity is D-fundamental if and only if it does not dependD on anything else (or on anything else that does not depend on it). This independence-based characterization of fundamentality will be discussed in sections 1.1 and 1.2. There are also other ways to understand fundamentality; these include fundamentality as a complete description of reality (section 1.3) and as primitive (section 1.4). So, there are many ways to understand fundamentality and whether there is any single idea of fundamentality that these different ways are trying to capture is a substantial issue. But even if there is no unified sense of fundamentality, one interesting question is whether there are any fundamental entities, where “fundamental” is understood in one of the different ways that will be specified below. We might also ask whether we need such entities, whether given theories are committed to their existence, and what the role of fundamentalia is in explanation. Before we get started, a few preliminary issues need to be mentioned.

For present purposes, we are interested in the notion of a fundamental thing, or type of thing. The candidates for fundamentality may include objects, such as electrons, but they may also include properties, or facts. The choice regarding the relevant type of entity may depend on one’s preferred account of fundamentality. However, there is often an acceptable translation between different views.[1] For instance, let’s say that we take the fact <electrons have unit negative charge> to be fundamental. Someone who does not wish to ascribe fundamentality to facts (e.g., because they do not have facts in their ontology), could understand this to be saying that the property unit negative charge is fundamental and instantiated in electrons. The translation here is from electrons have unit negative charge to the fundamental property unit negative charge that is instantiated in electrons (and only them). So, the disagreement between those who consider fundamentality to concern facts and those who regard objects and properties as fundamentalia may not be as serious as it looks.

One important distinction in the usage of the notion of fundamentality is worth highlighting: fundamentality as a general metaphysical notion and fundamentality in physics and physical theories (see Morganti 2020a, 2020b; Allori 2022). These two ways to use the notion are of course related, but the focus of this entry is on the first, broader notion of fundamentality. The remit of the latter notion includes questions such as whether physics is a more fundamental science than the other natural sciences, what makes a physical theory fundamental, and what particular physical theories to regard as fundamental (Morganti 2020b). The notions of fundamentality in metaphysics and fundamentality in physics can overlap, especially for naturalistically inclined philosophers who wish to turn to our best science as a guide to the structure of reality. However, there are at least two important differences in the usage of the notion of fundamentality in these two contexts. First, when we consider fundamentality in physical theories, there is a further question about how we link what the theory describes or represents to reality. Second, some discussions of fundamentality in physics are framed in a more epistemic fashion. For instance, Crowther (2019) suggests that a theory should be considered fundamental if and only if it possesses a particular set of epistemic features, such as being predictive at all scales (see Morganti 2020b for discussion).

We should also distinguish between the fundamentality of entities belonging to a certain ontological category and the fundamentality of the ontological category itself (see Hakkarainen 2022). It is one thing to say that certain properties are fundamental; another to say that the category property is a fundamental category. We are mostly concerned with the former issue, but the debate about which ontological categories are fundamental and how many such categories there are has been lively throughout the history of Western philosophy. For instance, Aristotle may have thought that substances are the only category that is separate from and hence more fundamental than other categories, such as the category universals (Aristotle Physics 185a31–32; Metaphysics 1029a27–28; on the status of the category of substance in contemporary metaphysics, see O’Conaill 2022).[2] Another example is the category of natural kinds, which is one of the four fundamental categories in Lowe’s (2006) four-category ontology, and definitive of the view that we may call natural kind fundamentalism (Tahko 2021a: Ch. 4.3). Some philosophers (e.g., L. A. Paul 2017) have also defend a view according to which there is just one fundamental category, by way of collapsing the distinction between substance and property. On this view, substances would be mereological complexes of properties and hence not an ontological category in their own right (see Keinänen & Tahko 2019 for discussion).

Since one key task for the notion of fundamentality is to help us articulate the view that there is a hierarchical structure to reality, it is usually assumed that the dependence relation we are dealing with must be asymmetric. Typically, the relation would also be considered transitive and irreflexive, hence producing a strict partial ordering. However, each of these formal characteristics can in fact be questioned, albeit whether this undermines the layered conception is up for debate (see Rabin 2018).[3]

We have noted that relative fundamentality is a very important notion, since the second key task for fundamentality identified above concerns the hierarchy of fundamentality. Moreover, relative fundamentality could arguably be used to define absolute fundamentality (some entity x is absolutely fundamental if and only if it is not relatively fundamental to any entity y). In contrast, relative fundamentality cannot be defined in terms of absolute fundamentality, so there are reasons to think that we should focus on relative fundamentality, insofar as the notion makes sense. Given this, it is perhaps surprising that there are relatively few explicit accounts of relative fundamentality in the literature so far, but we will refer to it where relevant, and there are signs that the literature is maturing in this regard (see Wilson 2012, 2016; Zylstra 2014; Koslicki 2015; Bennett 2017: Ch. 6; deRosset 2017; Correia 2021a, 2021b, 2021c; Werner 2021). One complication, as observed by Correia (2021c), is that the notion of relative fundamentality comes in two varieties: being more fundamental than and being as fundamental as. The notion of metaphysical grounding has been used to characterize both notions of relative fundamentality (Correia 2021b, 2021c; Werner 2021), but interestingly, Correia (2021a) has also explored the possibility of characterizing the notion of metaphysical grounding in terms of relative fundamentality. In what follows, a variety of grounding-based characterizations of fundamentality will be discussed, but this is not the only way to characterize fundamentality. In any case, the systematization of relative fundamentality is now proceeding at a fast pace, especially due to the recent efforts by Correia and Werner, who are partly reacting to Bennett’s (2017) earlier attempts (see also Shumener 2019 and Wilson 2019 on Bennett’s views).

Finally, the notion of naturalness and the related notion of sparseness, familiar especially from Lewis’s work (see Lewis 1986, 2009; Schaffer 2004; Dorr & Hawthorne 2013; McDaniel 2013, 2017; Thompson 2016a; Sánchez forthcoming) is sometimes connected with fundamentality. Sider’s (2011) influential notion of structure is closely related to the notion of naturalness (cf. Fine 2013, Mathers 2019, Tahko 2020). Perfectly natural properties might seem to be good candidates for absolutely fundamental entities. Naturalness is no doubt a close cousin of fundamentality, but there are some reasons to think that the two notions cannot do the same jobs (see Bennett 2017: Ch. 5.7). Most strikingly, there may be perfectly natural entities that are dependent in ways that are clearly ruled out by many of the definitions of fundamentality that we will shortly consider.[4] For further discussion, see the supplement on the natural/non-natural distinction in the entry on David Lewis’s metaphysics.

We should also briefly address another, related notion, familiar from Sider’s work, which links the notions of structure and metaphysical grounding: purity (Sider 2011: Ch. 7.2). According to the principle of purity, fundamental facts involve only fundamental notions. Sider gives the following example, where C* is a predicate giving a complete microstructural account of the city of Hamburg (cf. Sider 2011: 108):

  • (C) The proposition that there is a C* grounds the proposition that there is a city.

Since the notion of city is clearly not fundamental, purity dictates that (C) is not fundamental. Since C* is here taken to be a fundamental fact, the status of (C) becomes problematic if we accept purity – (C) must either be fundamental itself or something needs to ground it. If it is fundamental, it violates purity. But if it is not fundamental, then it needs to be grounded. What could possibly ground (C)? This is the problem of meta-ground, as discussed, e.g., by Dasgupta (2014a), Litland (2017, 2018b), and Correia (forthcoming). Unless a satisfactory answer can be given, one must either abandon purity or sever the link between grounding and Sider’s conception of fundamentality via structure (see Tahko 2020 for discussion).

1.1 Absolute Independence

The first definition of fundamentality to be considered may be labeled Absolute Independence:

  • (AI) x is absolutely independent if and only if, for all metaphysical dependence relations D, there is no such y that Dxy.

What is included in D? We can give an open-ended list of candidate relations: grounding, dependence between wholes and their parts (known as mereological or compositional dependence), realization, existential dependence, essential dependence, and, controversially, even causal dependence (on the link to causation, see Bernstein 2016; Koslicki 2016; Schaffer 2016b; Shaheen 2017). The list is open-ended partly because there is disagreement about what counts as a metaphysical dependence relation in the relevant sense and partly because there may be metaphysical dependence relations that we wish to rule out. A possible criterion (i.e., the “relevant sense”) to be included in the list is that the dependence relations in question must have at least some features in common, such as, perhaps, transitivity. Furthermore, two philosophers may disagree, say, about whether compositional dependence is a genuine metaphysical dependence relation. So, for these two philosophers, (AI) will produce a different definition of fundamentality, because the scope of D is different. We will not attempt to give a complete list or to define all these different kinds of metaphysical dependence, but for further details on some of them, see the separate entries on ontological dependence and metaphysical grounding.[5]

What is important is that (AI) is an attempt to define fundamentality in the most general terms possible, using a very broad notion of metaphysical dependence. There is, however, at least one kind of dependence that we will likely wish to exclude from D, namely, modal dependence =df Necessarily, x exists only if y exists. The reason for this is simple: nothing will be independent in the sense of (AI) if modal independence is required (cf. Wang 2016). This is evident if we consider some necessary existents, such as numbers (assuming that numbers exist necessarily), for it is necessarily the case that the number 2 exists if Socrates does. Hence, the existence of Socrates necessitates the existence of the number 2. Moreover, the number 2 necessitates the existence of the number 3 and the other way around. This obviously generalizes, resulting in no entity whatsoever being “absolutely existentially modally free”, as Wang (2016) puts it.

Even if we rule out modal dependence, (AI) is a very strong sense of fundamentality, probably much too strong. Accordingly, it may not be a very popular option. Indeed, it is difficult to find a direct endorsement of (AI) in the literature. That being said, there are some potential if controversial candidates for absolutely independent entities, such as God. Perhaps it is also possible to think of the universe as a whole as absolutely independent in this sense. This might reflect something like Georges Lemaître’s theory of the “primeval atom” or the “Cosmic Egg” hypothesis—an idea now better known as the Big Bang theory. Lemaître’s hypothesis was that the observed expansion of the universe may have started from a single point, the primeval atom, which would have contained the entire mass of the universe. Now, one may of course postulate that the primeval atom itself could depend on something else, such as God, but this nevertheless gives us an entirely naturalistically motivated idea of absolute independence. The metaphysical position that comes closest to this idea would be a type of monism, perhaps motivated by considerations emerging from quantum holism (Calosi 2013; Ney 2015; Ismael & Schaffer 2020; Calosi 2020; Kovacs 2021; and the entry on monism).

Why does fundamentality defined in terms of (AI) seem too strong? One major reason for this is that many things that we might normally regard as fundamental turn out to be dependent on other things in one sense or another. For instance, let us suppose that there is a mereologically fundamental level, that is, there are mereological atoms that do not have any proper parts. If mereological dependence runs from the wholes to their parts contra priority monism of the type defended by Schaffer (2010a), these mereological atoms are clearly independent in a mereological sense and most philosophers would probably want to regard them as fundamental. But even if these mereological atoms are mereologically independent, they could still metaphysically depend on other entities in another sense.

Consider symmetry principles in physics. Symmetries can be understood as a type of invariance under transformation. Some of the simplest cases of symmetries can be found in familiar examples from the natural world, such as sunflowers, where we observe both radial and bilateral symmetry. Symmetry principles play an especially important role in fundamental physics, such as in conservation laws: for each conserved quantity, such as energy or linear momentum, there is a corresponding symmetry property or invariance. This gives rise to a complicated network of dependencies among the variables that feature in conservation laws. How strong are these dependencies? In particular, are they merely causal or perhaps necessary in some stronger sense? This may depend on the type of symmetry in question, as some symmetries do allow violations. However, in the case of symmetries associated with conservation laws, Lange (2016) has argued that there is a stronger type of necessity in effect, stronger than the natural necessity usually associated with laws of nature. Whether or not Lange is correct about this, it clearly important to consider the possibility of non-causal dependencies such as those imposed by symmetry principles because they may hold between entities that are independent in some other sense (such as the mereological sense).

Relatedly, Giannotti (2021a) has discussed the possibility of fundamental yet mutually grounded entities in more detail, mentioning the case of quarks as well as Leibnizian monads as potential examples (cf. also Wilson 2016: 192–193; Wilson 2020: 293). As Giannotti correctly observes, supposed examples of fundamental yet mutually grounded entities are controversial, and he even labels the possibility of such entities as a “heresy”, given the departure from the standard view, whereby an entity is fundamental if and only if it is ungrounded. Giannotti argues that even if there are fundamental yet mutually grounded entities, this does not prevent a grounding-based account of fundamentality. However, Giannotti’s solution requires accepting non-asymmetric grounding, which itself goes against the grounding “orthodoxy” (see Raven 2013). Giannotti (2022b) has recently expanded on this and proposed the labels of radical brutalism for the view according to which the fundamental facts are those which are wholly ungrounded and moderate brutalism for the view according to which the fundamental facts are those which are partially ungrounded (see also Bader 2021 on bruteness and fundamentality). The upshot of Giannotti’s discussion is that the choice between radical and moderate brutalism is currently underdetermined by empirical evidence, leading Giannotti to recommend pluralistic brutalism, according to which some fundamental facts are moderately brute whereas others are radically brute.

Whichever way we go here, it appears that many intuitive candidates for fundamentalia would not be fundamental on the (AI) definition of fundamentality. A key issue, as with Giannotti’s analysis, concerns the possibility of fundamentalia being mutually grounded or symmetrically dependent on each other (see also Priest 2018).[6]

There are two further issues to note. Firstly, as it is formulated, (AI) rules out fundamental entities that depend on themselves. It could be easily revised to accommodate such entities, but this is an issue that the proponent of fundamentality should consider further, and there may be reasons to leave room for self-dependent entities (see Bliss & Priest 2018b).

Secondly, there is a speculative class of entities that would be fundamental according to (AI), but are in tension with other plausible theories. These entities are sometimes known as “idlers” (e.g., Lewis 2009: 205; Bennett 2017: 123). For Lewis, idlers are fundamental properties, which are instantiated in the actual world, but “play no active role in the workings of nature”. So, idlers are at least causally isolated. However, we can further postulate that “absolute idlers” are absolutely isolated: they depend on nothing, and nothing, at least nothing concrete, depends on them. Absolute idlers might thus be absolutely independent in the sense required by (AI). Whether there are any such absolute idlers is of course another question. If there are any absolute idlers, they are rather uninteresting entities—indeed, they are presumably completely beyond our ken given their isolation. Moreover, for the idea of absolute idlers to have any plausibility, we would surely have to restrict their isolation in such a way that they may participate in abstract constructions such as sets. This is because classical set theory, and indeed many other theories, entail that all entities have at least some entities that depend on them. This may be a good reason to think that no idler could be absolute in the strongest possible sense.

1.2 Restricted Independence

The second definition of fundamentality to be considered is much more versatile and weaker than (AI). We call it restricted independence. This produces a relativized sense of fundamentality, where fundamentality is relative to a certain variety or varieties of metaphysical dependence. One should not confuse this with relative fundamentality, which concerns the priority ordering between two (non-fundamental) entities. So, restricted independence starts from the idea that for each metaphysical dependence relation there is a corresponding notion of fundamentality and we must relativize the notion of fundamentality accordingly:

  • (RI) x is restrictedly independent if and only if there is one or more metaphysical dependence relation(s) \(D_{1}\), \(D_{2}\) … \(D_{N}\) such that there is no y such that \(D_{1xy}\) or \(D_{2xy}\) or … or \(D_{Nxy}\).

(RI) is restricted to concern one or more specific kinds of metaphysical dependence, because it is plausible that some metaphysical dependence relations, such as modal dependence (as we saw in section 1.1), would immediately rule out fundamental entities. Notice that (RI) allows the possibility of including several dependence relations, but we can easily define a more restricted sense of dependence for each of \(D_{1}\), \(D_{2}\) … \(D_{N}\).

We have already discussed some kinds of metaphysical dependence that (RI) could apply to, such as grounding and mereological dependence. (RI) concerns the subset of those metaphysical dependence relations that are considered relevant to fundamentality, so here two philosophers could disagree about which dependence relations to include in that subset. Variations of this conception of fundamentality can be found throughout the literature and it is probably as close to a standard conception as we are likely to find (a few examples: Schaffer 2009: 373; Dixon 2016: 442; Bennett 2017: 105; see also Tahko 2015: Ch. 6; Bliss & Priest 2018b). There are, of course, many differences between the various accounts. Variations of (RI) are standard enough to have been picked up by most of those critical towards this conception of fundamentality as well (Bliss 2013: 413; Morganti 2015: 559; Raven 2016: 608).[7]

Both (AI) and (RI) could be understood as putting forward the idea that fundamental reality needs a relational underpinning (on the notion of a relational underpinning, compare Fine 2001: 25). In other words, whatever fundamentality amounts to, it must be the case that one (or several) of the various relations of metaphysical dependence may be used to define fundamentality. But since (RI) leaves completely open which of the metaphysical dependence relations are in fact relevant to fundamentality, we should mention some examples. At one point in the early 2000s, it may have been the case that most philosophers using the notion of fundamentality had in mind what we might call mereological fundamentality whereby the relevant kind of dependence is mereological dependence (see especially Schaffer 2003). A concise definition of mereological dependence is offered by Kim:

the properties of a whole, or the fact that a whole instantiates a certain property, may depend on the properties and relations had by its parts. (2010: 183; see also Markosian 2005; Thalos 2010, 2013)

However, even though mereological dependence is still sometimes considered to be relevant to fundamentality, it is becoming less common to view it as the only relevant kind of dependence (Wilsch 2016; Bennett 2017: 8–9). Be that as it may, there is certainly an esteemed history for this type of idea, given that (mereological) atomism of the type defended already by ancient philosophers such as Leucippus and Democritus would appear to be an instance of the view (see the separate entry on ancient atomism for details, and compare with Schnieder 2020a, where Bolzano’s version of atomism is discussed).

It is important to see that the thesis that some things are mereologically fundamental does not entail a commitment to atomism. Here it may be helpful to introduce the distinction between (priority) pluralism and monism. We have already seen that a monist might be attracted to a view about fundamentality where there is just one fundamental entity, such as the cosmos or universe as a whole (Schaffer 2010a is a good exposition and defense of this Spinoza-inspired view; see also Newlands 2010). This view does not directly entail anything about the relative fundamentality relations among the non-fundamental, but it enables us to better understand that the converse of mereological dependence, as Kim defines it, might hold: instead of wholes depending on their parts, the parts could depend on the whole. This contrasts with the more familiar idea, often associated with but not entailed by atomism, that mereological dependence must run from the larger to the smaller, mereological atoms being the fundamental entities. So, the choice concerning the direction of the relevant dependence relation is often reflected by the choice between priority pluralism and monism, although strictly speaking these issues are independent (Miller 2009; Trogdon 2009; Cotnoir 2013; Steinberg 2015; Tallant 2015). Two proponents of (RI), even if they agree on which proper subset of metaphysical dependence relations is relevant to fundamentality, may disagree on the direction of the relevant dependence relation(s).[8]

Moving on to a different subspecies of (RI), we see a clear link between grounding and fundamentality, where grounding is understood as expressing a non-causal connection between two things. For example, a certain act might be considered evil because it causes harm. The “because” in this statement does not express a causal link; instead, it tells us what grounds the evilness of the act. Similarly, one might think that mental states hold in virtue of neurophysiological states or that a substance is prior to its tropes. The notions of “in virtue of” and “prior to” in these cases may be understood in terms of grounding. What is likely to be the most common contemporary understanding of (RI) is that the most important (if not the only) relation of metaphysical dependence that is relevant to fundamentality is grounding. Note, however, that grounding as well could be understood as a family of dependence relations (Trogdon 2013), and there is an on-going discussion about the relationship between grounding and ontological dependence more generally (e.g., Schnieder 2020b; Rydéhn 2021). Furthermore, since our discussion of fundamentality has focused on entities, it is worth noting that bridging fundamentality and grounding suggests a commitment to entity grounding, whereby all sorts of entities can stand in grounding relations. However, some prefer to restrict grounding to facts only, and this would accordingly require a somewhat different formulation of the relevant fundamentality claims (see the separate entry on metaphysical grounding and especially the section on regimentation for further details).

On the grounding-based characterization of fundamentality, the fundamentalia are ungrounded entities: everything is either ungrounded or ultimately grounded in the fundamental, ungrounded entities (Schaffer 2009: 353; Audi 2012: 710; Dasgupta 2014a: 536; Raven 2016: 613). For instance, Audi (2012: 710) explicitly distinguishes between the explanatorily fundamental and the compositionally fundamental where the first is associated with grounding and the second with mereological dependence. As Audi correctly notes, one would think that often these two notions of fundamentality would overlap. But recall that we’ve just observed that the converse of mereological dependence, running from the smaller to the larger, could hold. For the priority monist, this dependence relation running from the smaller to the larger is grounding, so it would also produce a different understanding of fundamentality.

If explanatory fundamentality and compositional fundamentality are genuinely two different notions corresponding to two independent notions of fundamentality, then (RI) does allow the overlap of explanatory and compositional fundamentality. But there could certainly be other considerations that count against this. For instance, if (RI) is understood to mean that to be fundamental is just to be at the termination point of some dependence relation, then the debate between monism and pluralism could just be a debate about the direction of compositional fundamentality, where compositional fundamentality terminates in the mereological atoms and its converse terminates in the whole cosmos. In other words, this could be understood as a debate about whether explanatory fundamentality aligns with compositional fundamentality or its converse. Whichever way we go here, we would seem to end up aligning some notions of fundamentality and misaligning others.

An important question arises: should we indeed postulate several independent notions of fundamentality, relativized to each of the metaphysical dependence relations, or should we aim to define only one sense of fundamentality, either to be defined in terms of just one relation of metaphysical dependence or in terms of some privileged proper subset of these relations?

Given that there are good reasons to exclude some notions of dependence, such as modal dependence and perhaps causal dependence, it would appear that there is an additional question about why only some notions of dependence are such that we want to define a corresponding notion of fundamentality for them. There is an obvious challenge for the view that we should postulate several relativized notions of fundamentality. The challenge is simply that the notion of fundamentality would seem to do little in addition to the various relativized notions of (in)dependence. Indeed, this is likely to cause confusion, because the notion of fundamentality is sometimes used in the literature without any mention of which relativized sense of independence is in question. Moreover, since different types of metaphysical dependence have different formal properties (e.g., some are strict partial orders, but some might be symmetric, reflexive or non-transitive) and they can perhaps even run in different directions, it is difficult to see what could unify the different notions of fundamentality, i.e., the proper subset of those dependence relations that we consider to be relevant for fundamentality.[9]

Those who think that grounding is strongly unified often appeal to its formal properties (but for a different approach, see Trogdon 2018a). These properties may be debated, but if grounding is strongly unified, then one could hold that for a relation to count as grounding, it should at least fit these properties. Relevant formal properties include the following: grounding is a strict partial order, non-monotonic in the sense that we cannot add arbitrary grounds and expect that grounding still holds (i.e., if A is grounded in B, then it does not follow that A is grounded in B and C), and it is thought that grounds metaphysically necessitate what they ground (although see Leuenberger 2014; Skiles 2015 against necessitation). In contrast, Bennett’s building relations (see note 10) do not share all their formal properties. She holds that they’re all antisymmetric and irreflexive, but not necessarily transitive (Bennett 2017: 46). Another example of this type of “multi-dimensional” approach to fundamentality can be found in Koslicki’s (2012, 2015, 2016) work.[10]

It’s important to see that on a multi-dimensional view whereby the various dependence relations relevant to fundamentality might even run in different directions, one must be very careful indeed to specify which relativized notion of fundamentality one has in mind. If it turns out that some entity is independent in all the relativized senses of independence relevant to fundamentality, then it would seem that we are back to absolute independence (AI) (or independence “full stop”, as Bennett 2017: 106 calls it).

Here we would do well to systematically distinguish between those proponents of (RI) who hold that only one metaphysical dependence relation, e.g., mereological dependence or a strongly unified notion of grounding, is relevant to fundamentality and those who think that a proper subset of these relations is relevant to fundamentality. Sometimes the labels monism and pluralism are used to distinguish between the singular fundamentality view and the multi-dimensional view, but in the interest of clarity we should introduce different terms, as we have already used these labels for another purpose.[11] So, let us use the labels (RI-one) and (RI-many) to distinguish between those who think that there is only one notion of fundamentality and those who think that there are several. Typically, there is an easy translation between these views. Let us say that a proponent of (RI-one) thinks that only mereological dependence is relevant to fundamentality. Well, a proponent of (RI-many), provided that mereological dependence is one of the relations they consider relevant to fundamentality, can simply translate the (RI-one) notion of fundamentality into their (RI-many) notion of mereological fundamentality. Hence the disagreement is that from the (RI-one) point of view, there is a single notion of fundamentality, and they would think that (RI-many) mistakenly holds other notions of fundamentality to be genuine, whereas from the (RI-many) point of view, there are many relativized notions of fundamentality, and (RI-one) mistakenly picks just one, or indeed none depending on whether the relevant (RI-one) relation is included.[12]

We conclude this section by posing a further question to all proponents of (RI): is there a relativized notion of fundamentality for every metaphysical dependence relation, or only some of them? Further, if only a proper subset of metaphysical dependence relations are relevant to fundamentality, then what makes these dependence relations relevant in this way? A proponent of (RI) may refuse to answer this question, since it would be an additional commitment to privilege some metaphysical dependence relations in this way. However, given that one major task for the notion of fundamentality is often thought to be related to the idea of the hierarchical structure of reality, it seems that we may have to accept only a proper subset of metaphysical dependence relations as being relevant for fundamentality if this task is to be preserved (of course, it could also be abandoned!). For instance, perhaps only those metaphysical dependence relations that are asymmetric and transitive would qualify. Still, there may also be dependence relations that are relevant to fundamentality that fail to be transitive. At this point, it could be helpful to move on to the third potential definition of fundamentality, as something along the lines of this definition is often used to characterize fundamentality defined in terms of (RI) as well.

1.3 Complete Minimal Basis

The conception of fundamentality to be considered in this section is often used to explicate the second key task for the notion of fundamentality, that of the fundamental entities acting as the basic building blocks of reality. According to this approach, the fundamental entities determine everything else. By giving a complete list of the fundamental entities, we can provide a minimal complete description of reality. So, we are now shifting our focus from that which everything else depends on to that which, as it were, supports everything else. This idea is often invoked to characterize fundamentality, but not necessarily to define it (Schaffer 2010a: 39n14; Sider 2011: 16–18; Jenkins 2013: 212; A. Paul 2012: 221; Tahko 2014: 263; Wilson 2014: 561; Raven 2016: 609; Bennett 2017: 107ff.). The idea is that fundamentality can be understood in terms of a complete minimal basis:

  • (CMB) x is fundamental if and only if x belongs to a plurality of entities X and X forms a minimal complete basis that determines everything else. The complete basis is minimal if no proper sub-plurality of the entities belonging to X is complete.

The obvious notion to be clarified in (CMB) is “determines”. This should be understood as a placeholder, which is meant to encompass the various ways in which fundamentalia may give rise to higher-level phenomena. So, “determines” could be replaced, e.g., by “grounds”, “realizes”, “composes”, or “builds”.[13] Importantly, this type of determination is supposed to be more than mere necessitation or supervenience, although the idea is closely related to traditional discussions of a minimal supervenience base (see Schaffer 2003; compare also with Schaffer’s notion of “generation” in Schaffer 2016b: 54).[14]

There are some preliminary issues to be specified before we can move on to a more general discussion about (CMB).

  1. (CMB) is compatible both with monism and the idea that reality may have an irreducibly plural underpinning whereby if X forms a complete minimal basis, no proper sub-plurality of X will be complete.[15]
  2. We have included a minimality condition in the definition of (CMB). This is an important addition, because otherwise we could take the plurality of all the entities in the world and call it complete, given that this plurality as well would include all the fundamental entities. So, according to (CMB), the complete minimal basis must include all and only the fundamental entities.
  3. There is an open question concerning uniqueness. Could there be several distinct pluralities that are minimal and complete? In other words, could there be distinct minimal pluralities that are each complete and hence capable of determining everything else? Bennett (2017: 112ff.) leaves the possibility of distinct minimal complete pluralities open but makes some use of the notion of a unique minimally complete plurality, whereas Tahko (2018) speculates about the possibility of several “ontologically minimal descriptions”, dropping the requirement of uniqueness.[16]
  4. It is, in principle, possible to define relativized versions of (CMB), just as we did in section 1.2 with (RI). So, one could distinguish between absolute completeness and restricted completeness. It is easy to see how the restricted notion of completeness is supposed to work. For instance, the mereologically minimal complete basis is the minimal complete plurality of mereological elements that determine everything mereological. This could leave out something determined, say, by a potential non-mereological notion of composition or parthood, such as Armstrong’s notion of states of affairs (see Armstrong 1997: 118–127). However, taking this route does not only invite the challenges observed with regard to (RI), but may also diminish the potential initial attractiveness of (CMB) (Bennett 2017: 110). So, we will set aside the relativized sense of (CMB).

We can now move on to some further issues.[17] One of these issues concerns how, exactly, we should interpret (CMB). We can find a common line of interpretation gestured at by Schaffer (2003: 509), Jenkins (2013: 212), Raven (2016: 609), and Tahko (2018) whereby the complete minimal basis should be understood as giving a complete minimal description of reality. This may be compared to Schaffer’s “fundamental supervenience base”, Jenkins’s “by appeal to which all the rest can be explained”, Raven’s “ineliminability”, and Tahko’s “ontological minimality”; see also Lewis (1986: 60). On this reading, less emphasis is put on the active role of the fundamentalia, the focus being instead on making sure to include a basis for everything in reality.

To have the broadest possible appeal, a characterisation of fundamentality should ideally be applicable in different scenarios regarding what the world is like. One such scenario is a “flat world”, a world where everything is independent, either in the sense of (AI) or (RI), and nothing is built, to use Bennett’s notion (Bennett 2017: 123–124). In a flat world, nothing determines anything else in the sense of (CMB), since nothing depends on anything else. Initially, it may seem that (CMB) is not plausible in this type of scenario, since everything is included in the unique minimally complete plurality. However, as noted in the previous paragraph, the definition of (CMB) does not require any “active” contribution from the fundamentalia; it’s not crucial that the fundamentalia do any determining. So, the upshot is that, in flat world, everything is fundamental both in the sense of (AI) or (RI) as well as in the sense of (CMB).

Accordingly, it would be an additional commitment to (CMB) to require that the fundamentalia must “actively” determine something in order to count among the fundamentalia, call it (CMB+). So, while (CMB) is vacuously true in a flat world, the proponent of this more “active” version, (CMB+), requires something more. Driven by the flat world example, one might then think that (AI) and (RI) are prior to (CMB+). According to (CMB+), a flat world—rather than being a world where everything is fundamental—would be a world where nothing is fundamental (or derivative), since nothing is “actively” determining anything. A world which contains no such structure would then turn out to be a world which contains no priority, hence no fundamentality (cf. Wilson 2016: 199).

Another difference between (CMB) and (RI) concerns the possibility of metaphysical coherentism, where loops of dependence are possible (see Bliss 2014, 2018; Barnes 2018; Morganti 2018, 2019; Nolan 2018; Thompson 2018; Swiderski forthcoming). (CMB) can accommodate the possibility of metaphysical coherentism, but (RI) would seem incompatible with it. The primary reason for this is that metaphysical coherentism, as it is usually understood, violates asymmetry and hence drops the idea that the structure of reality is hierarchical. While this requires abandoning one of the key tasks that the notion of fundamentality is often thought to have, it does help in accommodating the idea that we should adopt a more holistic approach whereby entities can be mutually related and form loops or cycles. Sometimes an analogy from epistemology is offered, as these loops of dependence could resemble a Quinean web of belief, so that each entity depends on one or more other entities. Perhaps the most plausible example of the possibility of loops of dependence comes from ontic structural realism (OSR). (OSR) suggests that objects may be reduced to—or more moderately, are ontologically on a par rather than prior to—relational structures. If (OSR) is true, we might have to revise our views about what the fundamentalia could be, as they might be relations rather than objects (for discussion on OSR and fundamentality, see Wolff 2012; McKenzie 2014; Morganti 2018, 2019; Tahko 2018). What exactly happens to (CMB) on this type of view depends on the details of the coherentist framework, but one possibility—on a moderate understanding of (OSR)—is that the fundamentalia would include mutually dependent relations and objects, which then determine everything else. Metaphysical coherentism is beginning to receive increasing attention. For instance, Calosi and Morganti (2021) have recently put forward a coherentist account of quantum entanglement, and Swiderski (forthcoming) has made an important effort to systematize the literature by defining four different conceptions of coherentism, namely (we refer the reader to the original paper for illustrative diagrams):

  • Holism: For any x and any y, x (partially) grounds y and y (partially) grounds x (ibid., p. 5).
  • Insularism: For any x, there is some y such that y grounds x (and xy ) and some z such that x does not ground z (and xz ). In addition, all grounding relations are regarded as symmetric (ibid., p. 10). This view suggests that there are more than one networks of symmetric or coherent grounding, where no grounding between these different insular classes of facts takes place, but we have maximal coherence within each class.
  • Hierarchism: For any x, there are some y’s such that each of the y’s grounds x and x grounds each of the y’s, and either (i) there are some z’s (distinct from the y’s) such that each of the z’s grounds all the other z’s, and the z’s ground the y’s, or (ii) there are some w’s (distinct from the y’s) such that each of the w’s grounds all the other w’s, and the y’s ground the w’s (ibid., p. 17). This view suggests that there is a hierarchy of facts that mutually ground each other which form a level, and any level has got either (i) a level below it or (ii) a level above it. (Swiderski also specifies two further varieties of hierachism depending on whether one wishes to include or rule out infinite descent.)
  • Rebarism: For any x, the following exclusive disjunction is true: either (i) there are some y’s such that each of the y’s grounds x and x grounds each of the y’s, or (ii) there are some z’s such that each of the z’s grounds all the other z’s, and the z’s ground x (ibid., p. 21). This view suggests that only the fundamental level involves symmetric or coherent grounding, while everything else (on higher levels) stands in asymmetric grounding relations, generating the familiar hierarchical picture of reality.

While Swiderski does not explicitly defend any of these versions of coherentism, his discussion does point out some crucial decision points. Most importantly, Swiderski demonstrates that while holism and insularism are not compatible with asymmetric grounding, hiearchism and rebarism do allow for (limited cases of) asymmetric grounding. However, all four views retain a commitment to what Swiderski (ibid., p. 4) calls the Coherentist Canon: “(i) For any x, there is some y such that y grounds x, and (ii) there is some z and some w such that z (perhaps indirectly) grounds w and vice versa”. This also suggests a commitment to the idea of mutual grounding (cf. Giannotti 2021a), which was briefly discussed in section 1.1.

Finally, a specific form of metaphysical infinitism, where the same structure repeats infinitely, to be discussed in more detail in section 4, could motivate (CMB) (Bliss 2013; Tahko 2014; Morganti 2014, 2018). On this type of view, it could turn out that nothing is independent in the sense of (RI), but a sense of completeness could nevertheless be retained.

1.4 Primitivism

According to primitivism about the fundamental, we cannot define fundamentality. But we may be able to characterize it, and it is to be expected that (RI) and (CMB) are likely candidates in this regard. This type of view may be what Fine (2001: 26) gestures towards, when he remarks that it is the world’s intrinsic structure that is fundamental. One way to develop the idea is by defining absolute fundamentality in terms of relative fundamentality and introducing a primitive notion of “Reality” as it is in itself (Fine 2001; see also Fine 2009). Note however that Fine proposes this notion in connection to the debate between realism and anti-realism, whereby “Reality” may be understood as objectivity. So, it is not entirely clear that we can understand fundamentality in terms of this notion.

More generally, we may think that the absolute notion of fundamental reality is not in need of a relational underpinning (Fine 2001; Wilson 2014: 561). This is in contrast to the various comparative or relational notions of dependence that we have been discussing (see also Fine 2015). Note that primitivism must also be contrasted with (CMB) insofar as it is understood as a definition of fundamentality, even though it is not uncommon to see primitivist characterizations of fundamentality that resemble (CMB). For instance, a primitivist who accepts Fine’s notion of “Reality” would like to distinguish between what is Real in itself and what may be true (i.e., objective) even if it does not concern the way that things are fundamentally. As Fine puts it,

even though two nations may be at war, we may deny that this is how things really or fundamentally are because the entities in question, the nations, and the relationship between them, are no part of Reality as it [is] in itself. (Fine 2001: 26)

The idea behind the primitivist view is actually very simple and it may be prudent to try to capture it without the controversial notion of “Reality”. One way to do so would be to understand the entities in the fundamental base to be basic in the sense that they play a role analogous to axioms in a theory, or that the fundamental entities are all that God had to bring about to make the world (Wilson 2014: 560; 2016; see also Dorr 2005). We can find several occurrences of this type of heuristic in the literature on fundamentality, e.g.,

The primary is (as it were) all God would need to create. (Schaffer 2009: 351)

all God had to do when making the world was fix the qualitative facts; (Dasgupta 2014b: 14)

We often explain the notion of fundamental reality in intuitive terms by saying that all God had to do in order to create the world was fix the fundamental facts. (Glazier 2016: 35)

To drive the idea home, consider the following passage from Kripke:

Suppose we imagine God creating the world; what does He need to do to make the identity of heat and molecular motion obtain? Here it would seem that all He needs to do is to create the heat, that is, the molecular motion itself. If the air molecules on this earth are sufficiently agitated, if there is a burning fire, then the earth will be hot even if there are no observers to see it. God created light (and thus created streams of photons, according to present scientific doctrine) before He created human and animal observers; and the same presumably holds for heat. How then does it appear to us that the identity of molecular motion with heat is a substantive scientific fact, that the mere creation of molecular motion still leaves God with the additional task of making molecular motion into heat? This feeling is indeed illusory, but what is a substantive task for the Deity is the task of making molecular motion felt as heat. To do this He must create some sentient beings to insure that the molecular motion produces the sensation S in them. Only after he has done this will there be beings who can learn that the sentence “Heat is the motion of molecules” expresses an a posteriori truth in precisely the same way that we do. (Kripke 1980: 153)

Now, Kripke is of course not trying to put forward an account of fundamentality here, but rather to specify that the qualitative experience of feeling heat is something additional to molecular motion. The idea, however, is strikingly close to the primitivist account of fundamentality, whereby the important thing is to find a sufficiently rich basis for everything in the world—this is of course reminiscent of (CMB), but here the heuristic is simply used to characterize fundamentality, not to define it.

Since the primitivist thinks that we cannot define fundamentality, one might wonder how it is that she can decide on what the fundamental entities are. In other words, what is our epistemic access to issues concerning fundamentality? A possible answer is that we proceed the same way as we do with other primitives in metaphysics. That is, by asking how the view that x is fundamental fits in our overall theory. How does it fare with regard to our other commitments? These are issues where theoretical virtues such as simplicity and explanatory power might be employed (for a related discussion, see Schaffer 2014). However, this is not the place to tackle the admittedly difficult epistemic questions surrounding metaphysical theories in general, or the criteria that are to be employed in theory-choice. The primitivist about fundamentality may have one more primitive in their overall theory, and this, of course, calls for justification. But conceiving of the fundamental as primitive is no more mysterious than conceiving of, say, naturalness or grounding as primitive. This is not to say that postulating naturalness or grounding as primitives wouldn’t also require some justification though.

The primitivist about fundamentality does, however, face some challenges that are specific to fundamentality. Some of these challenges have been raised by Schaffer (2016a), targeting Wilson’s proposal. A potentially helpful clarification from Schaffer is the following: there is something primitive in each of the theories on offer, but the primitivist about fundamentality takes being-absolutely-fundamental as that primitive, whereas at least certain proponents of the relative independence (RI) view (such as Schaffer himself and, e.g., Rosen 2010) take the “linking notion” of grounding, being-relatively-more-fundamental-than-and-linked-to, as the primitive (Schaffer 2016a: 157). As Schaffer notes, one may also take both to be primitive, as Fine perhaps does. Schaffer argues that while absolute fundamentality can be quite easily defined in terms of grounding, as we’ve seen with (RI), it may not be so easy to define grounding in terms of absolute fundamentality. As observed earlier, there have also been recent attempts to define grounding in terms of relative fundamentality (Correia 2018), as well as attempts to define notions of relative fundamentality in terms of grounding (Correia 2021b, 2021c; Werner 2021), but none of these options are directly available to the primitivist.

A further issue arises if there is no fundamental level at all. In this scenario, the primitivist has no way to account for relative fundamentality, and hence one of the two key tasks for fundamentality would be lost. In contrast, the friend of (RI) could still construct a priority ordering using her favorite notion of dependence, since no absolutely fundamental level is needed to get the ordering started (Schaffer 2016a, 158).[18] How can the primitivist reply?

One possibility is to try fixing the direction of priority even in the absence of an absolutely fundamental level (Wilson 2016: 196ff.). Drawing on a suggestion from Montero (2006: 179), Wilson proposes that analogously to an infinite sequence of numbers such as 1/2, 1/3, 1/4 … being still “bounded below” by zero, there could be an infinite descent of fundamental entities that approaches a limit whereby the limit acts as the fundamental level even though it is never reached. Related ideas may be found elsewhere in the literature (Tahko 2014; Morganti 2015; Raven 2016). One difficulty with this proposal is that applying the notion of a limit assumes that we can assign a numerical measure to the descending entities that approach this limit. So, we would need to be able to construct the hierarchical structure of relative fundamentality in such a way that this numerical measure applies to it. Moreover, even if approaching a limit does not necessarily need to be constructed numerically, the notion of a limit itself requires postulating the (fundamental) limit, in this case zero. While zero is not part of the sequence, it does seem to be part of the ontology.

Another possible strategy to address this challenge to primitivism is to argue that fixing the fundamental is not (always) enough to fix the priority ordering. Rather, we should pay close attention to the various dependence relations that interest us, such as the parthood relation, and assess the nature of the non-fundamental entities that these relations relate. Importantly, we might get different answers depending on which view about these natures is correct (see Wilson 2016: 200ff.).

This concludes our discussion of the different ways to understand absolute fundamentality. We will now move on to discuss a variety of important views that are often expressed in terms of fundamentality, putting the notion into use.

2. Well-Foundedness

As we noted in the very beginning of this entry, one of the two key tasks for the notion of fundamentality is to capture the idea that there is a foundation of being and that everything else depends on the fundamental entities. This idea about fundamentality is often expressed in terms of well-foundedness (Morganti 2009: 272; Orilia 2009: 333; Fine 2010: 100; Schaffer 2010a: 37; Bennett 2011a: 30; Bliss 2013: 416; Trogdon 2013: 108; Tahko 2014: 260; Raven 2016: 614; Bohn 2018; Jago 2018; Pearson forthcoming). But the notion of well-foundedness itself is sometimes used without much further qualification, and there are many instances where another term is used instead for what is clearly the same general idea (e.g., Lowe 1998: 158; R. Cameron 2008; Paseau 2010; Rosen 2010). A common formulation of this general idea is as follows: a priority/dependence chain is well-founded if and only if it terminates, i.e., has an end constituted by one or more entities that do not depend on any other entity. But not all the above-mentioned authors would be happy with this particular formulation, and it turns out that sometimes philosophers may even have talked past each other due to having slightly different formulations of well-foundedness in mind. Fortunately, the literature has matured, and we now have a number of much more precise accounts of the various potential formulations of well-foundedness (see especially Dixon 2016; Rabin & Rabern 2016; Litland 2016b; Wigglesworth 2018).

Let’s start with the origin of the term “well-foundedness”. The term is familiar from mathematics, especially set theory; no doubt it was adopted from set theory with the hope of making the metaphysical idea more precise. A simple formulation of set-theoretic well-foundedness can be found in Cotnoir and Bacon (2012: 187):

An order < on a domain is said to be wellfounded if every nonempty subset of that domain has a <-minimal element.

The first thing to notice here is that well-foundedness is relativized to a giver order, a given relation of dependence, just like (RI) in section 1.2. So, strictly speaking, we ought to specify which relation we have in mind and consider the various complications that this introduces, which we discussed in section 1. However, much of the literature on well-foundedness (although not all of it) focuses on grounding, and for purposes of exposition it is easiest to focus on this literature, also assuming that grounding establishes an absolute order of priority.

The set-theoretic formulation of well-foundedness is the sense in which, e.g., Fine (2010: 100) appears to use the notion. Applied to chains of grounding, the proposal is that well-foundedness would rule out infinite, non-terminating grounding chains and entail that “the grounds of any truth that is grounded will ‘bottom out’ in truths that are ungrounded”. We can see slightly different but equivalent formulations in Schaffer (2010a, 37), Bennett (2011a, 30), Trogdon (2013: 108), Tahko (2014: 260), Dixon (2016: 452), and Jago (2018).[19] As Dixon (ibid.) puts it, the attraction of using the set-theoretic notion of well-foundedness is that it is a straightforward application of the standard mathematical definition of a well-founded relation (this is also recognized by Morganti 2015: 556fn2). The only problem is that the standard understanding of well-foundedness may be too strict for the task at hand. Many authors have considered weakened versions of the well-foundedness requirement, which may be more suitable for expressing the desired limits on infinite grounding chains (R. Cameron 2008: 4; Trogdon 2013: 108; Leuenberger 2014: 170–171). So, to summarize, it might at first seem intuitive to interpret well-foundedness simply as a ban on infinite chains and cycles of grounding, in accordance with set-theoretic well-foundedness. But this would seem to go against the intuition that there are cases of infinite chaining which are acceptable for the foundationalist metaphysician (R. Cameron 2008; Bliss 2013). This has recently been made explicit by Dixon (2016) and Rabin & Rabern (2016).[20]

To get us started on the idea that foundationalist metaphysicians could accept violations of well-foundedness, consider an important observation by Bliss (2013: 416), which also comes up, e.g., in Rabin & Rabern (2016: 362). She distinguishes between finite and well-founded grounding chains where a finite grounding chain not only terminates in something fundamental, but is also such that we can reach the fundamental entities in a finite number of steps from anywhere in the chain. According to this approach, a well-founded grounding chain is indeed one that is grounded in something fundamental, but it may itself be infinitely long. So, on this terminology, finite grounding chains are always well-founded, but a well-founded grounding chain could be infinite. But note that this already violates set-theoretic well-foundedness as defined above. To demonstrate this, consider an infinite chain of dependence \(f < \ldots d_{3} < d_{2} < d_{1}\), where the chain of dependent entities \(d_{n}\) terminates in some minimal element f. Now, if we take a subset of that chain of dependence without the minimal element f, then we are left with a chain that lacks a <-minimal element, hence violating the set-theoretic definition of well-foundedness.

To get clearer on what is at issue here, let us introduce another notion, being “bounded from below” or “having a lower bound”. We can say that an order < on a domain is bounded from below if any subset of that domain has a lower bound. More precisely, a lower bound of a given set is any element that is more minimal or equal to all of the elements of the set. For example, 1, 2, and 3 are all lower bounds of the interval [3, 4, 5]. A lower bound of a set does not need to be an element of the set itself. Consequently, the chain \(f < \ldots d_{3} < d_{2} < d_{1}\), is bounded from below. More generally, any finite chain is set-theoretically well-founded and bounded from below. We’ve just seen that some infinitely descending chains of dependence may be bounded from below yet fail to be set-theoretically well-founded. As Rabin & Rabern (2016: 360) put it, an infinitely descending chain may or may not have a “limit”, where limit is the greatest lower bound of a set. In the previous example, 3 is the greatest lower bound of the interval [3, 4, 5]. So, one might suggest that the relevant sense of metaphysical well-foundedness is captured either by this idea of being bounded from below or by having a limit, a greatest lower bound. But it turns out that even these may be too strong. This is the key insight in the recent work of Dixon and Rabin & Rabern. If this is right, then we need to have a sense of a metaphysical foundation that is not only compatible with infinite chains of dependence, but also with infinite chains that do not have a lower bound (i.e., “unbounded” chains).[21]

It might be helpful to present a somewhat simplified example of a case where well-foundedness and being bounded from below come apart. Let us use a variation of Trogdon’s (2018b) reconstruction of an example by Rabin & Rabern (2016: 361; this is an example of what Dixon 2016: 448 calls a “fully pedestalled chain”). Consider a spherical region of space S, which we divide up in such a way that each of the proper sub-regions of S has a proper sub-region, and each of those sub-regions in turn has a proper sub-region. In principle, we can continue this process infinitely. Now, let us assume that each region of space derives its being in part from (or is partially grounded in) its sub-regions. Here we would seem to have an infinite regress where, to use the familiar phrase, being is forever deferred, never achieved. But suppose in addition that there are spatial points and that these points are fundamental. Then we might like to say that S and indeed each of its infinitely many proper sub-regions fully derives its being from (or is fully grounded in) spatial points. In this case, the infinite regress of the sub-regions would appear to be innocuous since each of them is after all fully accounted for by the fundamental spatial points. Still, the case for a sense of fundamentality that is compatible with at least some kind of non-well-founded infinite descent or other seems to have been made sufficiently clear in recent work. Metaphysical foundationalism does not seem to be properly captured by the idea of set-theoretic well-foundedness. So, what is it about?

We can find numerous formally precise attempts to capture the relevant sense of a metaphysical foundation in recent work. Dixon’s (2016: 446) preferred understanding (which he calls “full foundations”) suggests that every non-fundamental fact is fully grounded by some fundamental fact(s). Rabin & Rabern (2016: 363) attempt to capture the idea of a metaphysical foundation with the phrase “having a foundation”, whereby a grounding structure has a foundation if and only if there is some set of facts that (i) together ground all the derivative facts and (ii) are themselves ungrounded. Raven suggests (2016: 612) that metaphysical foundationalism could be understood in terms of ineliminability (to be discussed in section 3). Tahko (2014: 263) tries to analyze metaphysical foundationalism in terms of an “ontological” sense of well-foundedness, which requires that an ontologically well-founded chain terminates in a fundamental supervenience base. Trogdon (2018b) follows the recent suggestions for a weaker understanding of metaphysical foundationalism and defines it as the view that, necessarily, any non-fundamental entity is fully grounded by fundamental entities. Even though the terminology varies, it’s quite clear that there are weaker senses of metaphysical foundationalism than the one defined in terms of set-theoretic well-foundedness. We arrive at the following definition of metaphysical foundationalism:

  • (MF) Every non-fundamental entity is dependentD1, D2 … DN on some fundamental entity or entities that fully account for its being/reality.

This definition of metaphysical foundationalism is somewhat vague since it attempts to capture the idea for all the different varieties of fundamentality that we have discussed, but it may be supplemented with an appropriate restriction on the type of entities it concerns (e.g., facts) and the subscripts \(D_{1}\), \(D_{2}\) … \(D_{N}\) may be replaced with one’s preferred kind or kinds of dependence, exactly as with the schemas proposed in (AI) and (RI) in section 1. Furthermore, we need to understand “fully account for” correspondingly, for instance, in the case of grounding it should be parsed as “fully grounds” and in the case of compositional dependence it should be parsed as “fully composes” (albeit in some cases it may not be entirely clear that a full/partial distinction properly applies). Now that we have a working notion of metaphysical foundationalism, we may proceed to discuss arguments in favor and against this view.

3. Metaphysical Foundationalism

Metaphysical foundationalism is the view that reality has a foundation—that there is a “fundamental level”, in a sense that needs to be specified. The most common way to specify the idea of having a foundation is in terms of well-foundedness, but as we have seen in section 2, set-theoretical well-foundedness may be too strong to capture metaphysical foundationalism. Metaphysical foundationalism comes in a variety of strengths, depending on how much the well-foundedness requirement is weakened. It seems reasonable to say that until quite recently metaphysical foundationalism was the default position (R. Cameron 2008; Schaffer 2009; 2010a; Bennett 2011a). The relevant intuition is often captured with the much-cited phrase that without a foundation, “a ground of being”, “[b]eing would be infinitely deferred, never achieved” (Schaffer 2009: 376; 2010a, 62).

Sometimes the foundationalist intuition is explicitly tied to composition (i.e., mereological dependence) and the (im)possibility of gunk, namely, the idea that everything has a proper part: “the anti-gunk worry is that composition could never have got off the ground” (R. Cameron 2008: 6). The worry is that complex objects are not possible in gunky worlds, so given that there is composition, there must be a foundation. However, we’ve seen that fundamentality need not be tied to compositional/mereological dependence. Moreover, others (McKenzie 2011; Bliss 2013; Tahko 2014; Morganti 2014, 2018; Bohn 2018; Trogdon 2018b) have been suspicious of the driving intuition behind this sense of metaphysical foundationalism, and now even some of those who have earlier defended metaphysical foundationalism opt for agnosticism on the question (Bennett 2017: 120ff; Rosen 2010: 116). Indeed, there is, perhaps, now a consensus that it is very difficult to come up with a proper argument in favor of metaphysical foundationalism, something that would go beyond the just stated intuition. The idea has a status closer to a type of metaphysical axiom or law as Bohn (2018) puts it (see Morganti 2018 for a good overview). This conclusion seems even more warranted given that defining metaphysical foundationalism simply in terms of set-theoretical well-foundedness turned out to be too strict. To establish a clearer sense of metaphysical foundationalism which is in accordance with the most recent literature, we shall understand “metaphysical foundationalism” as it was defined in section 2 (MF) (see Oberle 2022a for an overview of the most recent debate).

Can we be clearer on the core idea of metaphysical foundationalism? If we can, then perhaps potential arguments for the view would also be more easily available. One interesting attempt to do so is Raven’s.[22] Raven’s version of metaphysical foundationalism relies on the notions of “eliminability” and “ineliminability” whereby an entity is eliminable if reality is described no worse without mentioning it and ineliminable if reality cannot be completely described without mentioning it. To demonstrate this, let us take advantage of Raven’s own terminology (2016: 614–5). Ineliminable entities “persist” in some fact about them, whereas eliminables “disappear” from all facts about them. For an entity to “disappear” is for there to be a bound in the grounds of some fact about it, a last occurrence of it after which the entity never recurs. So, for an entity to persist is for some facts about it to be unbounded. Importantly, there are two ways to be unbounded: being ungrounded or having grounds but forever recurring. The first type of persistence is the familiar sense of relative independence (RI) as defined in section 1.2. But the second type of persistence, where an entity forever recurs in the chain of dependence, is novel.[23]

A potentially helpful way to illustrate the options available to us and clarify the relationship between metaphysical foundationalism and infinite descent is Morganti’s (2015: 562) “emergence model of being”. This model may be contrasted with the “transmission model”, which is, perhaps, what the much-quoted phrase from Schaffer that we led with reflects. According to the transmission model, the ungrounded entities are the “ground of being”. But the emergence model suggests that something may act as a foundation in the absence of ungrounded entities; the infinite “starts playing an active role, and progress is made as the chain lengthens” (Morganti 2015: 562). The emergence model draws inspiration from an analogy with epistemology where the “emergence of justification” from an infinite chain of reasons has recently been an area of active research (Klein 2007; Peijnenburg & Atkinson 2013). Thus, the core of the emergence model seems to be that there is no privileged fundamental level of reality that serves as the basis for being. Instead, we should understand being more holistically, as it were, and explore the idea that it may emerge gradually. Let us call this emergentist infinitism. On the face of it, emergentist infinitism looks like the denial of (MF) and hence metaphysical foundationalism. However, there is some room for interpretation here, because the holistic model suggests that the whole infinite chain could perhaps be considered to ground its “parts”.

We might compare this line of thinking to Leibniz’s principle of sufficient reason (PSR), which states that for every entity that exists, there is an explanation or reason for its existence (Della Rocca 2010; Guigon 2015; Dasgupta 2016; Amijee 2020) and the separate entry on principle of sufficient reason). In the contemporary literature, we may compare (PSR) with the inheritance principle discussed in Schaffer (2016b) and Trogdon (2018b). An open question, although not one that we will pursue here, is whether emergentist infinitism is compatible with (PSR).

We should clarify one further issue regarding the analogy with epistemology. Both with epistemic infinitism and epistemic coherentism, it is typical to consider foundational justification to be impossible: all possible cases of epistemic justification must conform to the infinitis/coherentist picture. It is not immediately clear whether the corresponding metaphysical views (metaphysical infinitism and metaphysical coherentism) would need to hold by necessity in a similar way. In fact, some of the arguments in the literature suggest that this may not be the case, e.g., where the possibility of different types of infinite decent is considered (cf. Tahko 2014). If the structure of reality is contingent in this regard then there may be a principled difference between the epistemic and the metaphysical cases.

To conclude this section, it should be noted that not all the views discussed above have been put forward under the label of metaphysical foundationalism. But once it is made clear that the foundationalist idea is not tied to the strong, set-theoretic sense of well-foundedness, the requirement for a foundation is much weaker than it may once have seemed. If we broaden the scope of metaphysical foundationalism accordingly, is there still an interesting sense of metaphysical infinitism to be discussed?

4. Metaphysical Infinitism

To endorse metaphysical infinitism is to reject metaphysical foundationalism (MF). But as we’ve seen, the sense of metaphysical foundationalism defined at the end of section 2 does not require accepting strong, set-theoretic well-foundedness, and hence it is compatible with at least some types of infinite descent. Accordingly, metaphysical infinitism is a somewhat stronger view than it may first have seemed.

Using the technical notion of being bounded from below or having a lower bound introduced in section 2, we can start with the simple idea that, for a given notion of dependence, a chain has a lower bound only if there is an element that every element in the chain depends on (Rabin & Rabern 2016: 366). As we saw earlier, infinitely descending chains of dependence may have a lower bound, that is, terminate in an independent element that may or may not be part of the chain itself, yet fail to be set-theoretically well-founded. But there is an even weaker condition than having a lower bound that can satisfy (MF), namely, Rabin & Rabern’s (2016: 363) “having a foundation” or Dixon’s (2016: 446) equivalent “full foundations”. Both of these are based on the idea of having an infinitely large foundation. An example of this type of foundation can be constructed with the help of infinitary disjunctions, as both Rabin & Rabern and Dixon demonstrate (Litland 2016b discusses the problems associated with this and constructs further examples). In such a case, (MF) is satisfied because every element depends on some independent element, despite there being no lower bound. There is no lower bound because the chain does not terminate if the foundation is infinitely large. In contrast, if the foundation is finite, then there is a lower bound and hence the weaker requirement of (MF) is also entailed. In decreasing order of strength, we have the requirement of set-theoretical well-foundedness, having a lower bound, and having a foundation or full foundations. We defined (MF) in terms of the weakest of these three requirements in section 2, but a proponent of metaphysical foundationalism may of course make a stronger requirement as well, such as having a lower bound.

In this section, we are interested in the possibility of the type of strong metaphysical infinitism that denies all of the three requirements. The denial of (MF) entails that there are at least some entities that are non-fundamental yet do not depend for their being on any fundamental entity or entities. There may be several ways in which this could happen, but the most extreme possibility is a type of infinite complexity whereby there is an infinite descent of different kinds of entities, each depending on entities further down the chain but never terminating and never being “fully accounted for”. We might think of this in terms of a violation of the principle of sufficient reason (PSR), at least if (PSR) is thought to require that we must reach an ultimate reason rather than just a reason at each layer below the previous one. Accordingly, infinite complexity entails a lack of structure with the type of explanatory import that (PSR) requires. This type of view would be more radical than the various, potentially innocuous types of infinite descent outlined so far. The view might strike many as implausible, at least when it comes to the actual world.[24]

Infinite complexity is a strong version of metaphysical infinitism, but what if, instead of infinite complexity, we had some kind of infinite repetition? This type of idea has been discussed under the label of boring infinite descent (Schaffer 2003: 505, 510; Tahko 2014). A boring or repetitive structure entails that somewhere down the chain of dependence we stop encountering novel types of entities or novel structure. The boring part of the structure that repeats infinitely could be of any length as long as it starts anew eventually. A description of the repetitive part only needs to be supplemented with an instruction to continue as before. For example:

The world stands on four elephants, the four elephants stand on a turtle, the turtle stands on two camels, the camels stand on four elephants, the four elephants stand on a turtle … and repeat ad infinitum. (Tahko 2014: 261)

The idea is that the boring structure, whatever shape it may take, can be fully described in terms of the mentioned entities (or types of entities, and perhaps the “standing” relations between them): four elephants, a turtle, and two camels. It has been suggested that this produces a “minimal” description of reality, but it is debatable whether it satisfies (MF) or is a case of strong metaphysical infinitism (Raven 2016; Tahko 2018).

It seems that this type of infinite descent is less radical than infinite complexity, but some open questions remain. For instance, is the type of infinite regress at hand innocuous or vicious? Can we capture the difference between metaphysical foundationalism and metaphysical infinitism in terms of the non-viciousness or viciousness of the regress (Nolan 2001; Bliss 2013; R. Cameron 2022; Oberle 2022b)? We will leave these issues open, but to improve on the toy example, we might briefly discuss a more concrete case. Sometimes the Nobel Prize winner Hans Dehmelt’s (1989) model is mentioned as a potential example (Schaffer 2003, Morganti 2014, Tahko 2014). Dehmelt speculated that there could be a quark/lepton-like substructure beyond the known level of quarks, based on the model of the triton, the nucleus of hydrogen’s radioactive isotope tritium:

I propose to extend the triton substructure scheme to an infinite number of layers. Below the four layers listed above [up to subquarks], they contain higher order \(d_N\) subquarks, with \(N = 5 \rightarrow \infty\). In each layer the particles are not identical but resemble each other in the same way as quarks and leptons do, with masses varying as much as a factor 108. In an infinite regression to simpler particles of ever increasing mass, they asymptotically approach Dirac point particles. (Dehmelt 1989: 8618)

Up to \(N = 3\), the level of electrons, Dehmelt’s model is motivated by current physics, but it is speculative from \(N = 4\) onwards, where electron substructure is postulated. However, it’s not entirely clear whether Dehmelt’s model is a genuine case of boring infinite descent, given that the regress appears to terminate in Dirac point particles. What matters here is whether these Dirac point particles are treated as genuine entities, but there is no suggestion in Dehmelt’s model that this should be the case. Rather, as the above quote suggests, the infinite regression of non-point particles asymptotically approaches the ideal limit of Dirac point particles. This is a type of mathematical abstraction not unlike the one we find in the case of gunky space, where regions asymptotically approach “points” (see Zimmerman 1996). Just like Dirac point particles in Dehmelt’s model, the points in the gunky space are not considered real entities; they are merely a mathematical abstraction.[25]

A final argument to be considered in this section challenges the “transmission model”, whereby derivative entities derive their “being” from the fundamental entities. Bohn (2018: 170) makes a helpful observation, aimed against the transmission model (applied to grounding):

Grounding is like a synchronic, static mathematical relation (like in arithmetic), not like a diachronic, dynamic physical relation (like in thermodynamics, or action theory).

The thought here is that the transmission model illegitimately assumes a dynamical “starting point” to any grounding chain. If we abandon the transmission model and the dynamical view, we arrive at the idea of indefinitely descending ground whereby all facts have a ground and hence there are no fundamental facts (Bohn 2018). This violates even the weakest of the three requirements that a metaphysical foundationalist might impose, so it is a strict denial of (MF). Note, however, that this concerns only the precisification of (MF) in terms of grounding. So, this type of metaphysical infinitism targets the conception of fundamentality as ungroundedness (as specified in terms of (RI) in section 1.2).

If (MF) does not require the transmission model, the choice between foundationalism and infinitism is difficult. There is, perhaps, one test case: the possibility of gunk (everything has a proper part), junk (everything is a proper part), and hunk (everything both is and has a proper part). There is an on-going debate about the modal status of these scenarios, and one might appeal to their possibility in defense of indefinitely descending ground (as Bohn 2018 does).[26] However, these scenarios of course concern only the relation of proper parthood (mereological dependence), and hence even if mereological infinitism were coherent, there may be other notions of dependence for which the corresponding notion of infinitism is incoherent.

This concludes our discussion of metaphysical infinitism and fundamentality. This survey has focused on a subset of the growing literature on fundamentality with the aim of clarifying the various terminological issues surrounding the key notions and identifying some common themes. The ideas behind these notions are old as are the intuitions associated with the various arguments that we’ve seen for and against metaphysical foundationalism and infinitism. Recent helpful efforts to systematize some of the central ideas, especially that of well-foundedness, have made it much easier to have constructive discussions about the topic of fundamentality. It can be expected that further attempts to formulate arguments for and against different strengths of metaphysical foundationalism and infinitism will emerge in the near future. The literature is also paying more attention toward the notions of relative fundamentality and metaphysical coherentism. Finally, there is an increasing amount of literature that applies more technical notions of fundamentality to various other debates in metaphysics: e.g., Morganti (2019) on ontic structural realism, Calosi and Morganti (2021) on quantum entanglement, Giannotti (2021b) on powers, Scarpati (2021) on haecceitism, Tahko (2021) on logical realism, Allori (2022) on quantum theory, Hamri (2022) on causation, Rabin (2022) on the physicalism debate, and Spencer (2022) on relativity.


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Other Internet Resources


The author would like to thank Umut Baysan, Karen Bennett, Einar Bohn, Christina Conroy, Martin Glazier, David Mark Kovacs, Jon Litland, Matteo Morganti, Donnchadh O’Conaill, Jan Plate, Gabriel Rabin, Mike Raven, Kelly Trogdon, Jessica Wilson, and Justin Zylstra for many helpful comments and suggestions. Special thanks to two anonymous referees for SEP for very detailed comments.

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