Genetic Drift

First published Thu Sep 15, 2016; substantive revision Wed Feb 17, 2021

In the 1950s, a lively debate broke out among biologists that continues to this day, over what might seem like the most unlikely of organisms: the land snail, Cepaea nemoralis. Yet, there are in fact some interesting aspects to C. nemoralis. This species of snail is polymorphic; the snail’s shell varies in color (pink, brown, and yellow) as well as the number of visible bands (anywhere from 0–5). But the colors and bands are not equally distributed across populations. In some populations, pink predominates, whereas in others, yellow or brown, and similarly, some banding numbers are more prevalent in some populations than in others. Thus, not only are there variations within populations (it is rare to find a population that is all one color or where all the snails have the same number of bands), but there are variations between populations. What is the explanation for this distribution of forms? Those whose knowledge of evolution familiarized them only with the theory of natural selection might assume, for example, that in the populations where yellow snails were the most prevalent, it was because they were fitter than the other colors—that there was some environmental factor that favored yellow over brown and pink. And that in the populations where brown snails were the most prevalent, there was some difference in the environment that led them to be favored over yellow and pink snails. But is there some other explanation? Perhaps the distributions are in some sense due to chance, perhaps even in a way that can be modeled mathematically. What would that mean, and how would you determine which explanation was correct? The attempt to develop “chancy” explanations that are alternatives (perhaps complementary alternatives) to those due to natural selection is what led biologists to develop models of genetic drift.

Genetic drift (variously called “random drift”, “random genetic drift”, or sometimes just “drift”) has been a source of ongoing controversy within the philosophy of biology and evolutionary biology communities, to the extent that even the question of what drift is has become controversial. There seems to be agreement that drift is a chance (or probabilistic or statistical) element within population genetics (see entry on population genetics) and within evolutionary biology more generally, and that the term “random” isn’t invoking indeterminism or any technical mathematical meaning, but that’s about where agreement ends. Yet genetic drift models are a staple topic in population genetics textbooks and research, with genetic drift described as one of the main factors of evolution alongside selection, mutation, and migration. Some claim that genetic drift has played a major role in evolution (particularly molecular evolution), while others claim it to be minor. This article will examine these and other controversies.

In order to break through the logjam of competing definitions of drift, this entry begins with a brief history of the concept, before examining various philosophical claims about the proper characterization of drift and whether it can be distinguished from natural selection; the relation of drift to debates over statisticalism; whether drift can be detected empirically and if so, how; and the proper understanding of drift as a model and as a (purported) law.

1. Origins of the Concept of Genetic Drift

Although Charles Darwin invoked “chance” in various ways in the Origin of Species (Beatty 1984), he seems not to have included a concept of drift in his account. He does note in passing that

[v]ariations neither useful nor injurious would not be affected by natural selection, and would be left either a fluctuating element, as perhaps we see in certain polymorphic species, or would ultimately become fixed, owing to the nature of the organism and the nature of the conditions. (Darwin 1872: 63; see similar claims on p. 120 and p. 176)

As the reader will see, this is tantalizingly similar to contemporary conceptions of drift. But Darwin does not develop the idea further; in particular, he does not tell us why the distributions of such variations would be fluctuating over time or how it is that they would ultimately become fixed. The first serious (and mathematical) treatments of drift are usually traced to two of the founders of population genetics, Sewall Wright and R.A. Fisher, although neither claimed to have developed the ideas behind drift (Beatty 1992). Wright (1951) credits John Gulick (1873) with the genesis of the idea whereas Fisher (1922b) first discussed the idea as derived from the work of A.C. and A.L. Hagedoorn (1921), although Wright (1931a) cites the Hagedoorns too. It is unclear who first uses the term “drift” in this context; it appears as early as Wright (1929). So, let us briefly examine Gulick and the Hagedoorns in order to understand the origins of the term “drift”.

Gulick (1873) points out that with natural selection, one can assume that where different forms are found, different external conditions will also be found (with the different forms having adapted over the course of generations to the different external conditions). However, there seem to be cases (e.g., among snails) where the external conditions are very similar, yet the organismic forms are very different. He notes that these species tend to occupy very small areas, even though there is reason to believe it is not because they lack the ability to migrate further. He then postulates a scenario: Suppose some members of a species migrate to a new area where they are free from competition and largely separated from the original population. New variations will arise in the new population, but unless they are “decidedly malformed”, they will persist. The new population will thus come to differentiate itself from the original population (e.g., with new shades of color or with variations of shape), perhaps rapidly if there is a “preexisting tendency to rapid variation”.

Some points to note here that become relevant in later discussions of drift: 1) Drift is described in contrast to natural selection. 2) The variations increasing in the population are those that are neutral, or at least not severely deleterious. (Note that 1 and 2 are also present in the quote from Darwin above). 3) Drift is associated with small populations (although it is not fully clear why). 4) Drift is associated with the founding of a new population in a new area. 5) Changes in the population are the result of movements of organisms and their tendency to produce new variations, both of which are physical processes and not purely mathematical constructs (something that becomes an issue in later debates). 6) The changes described are of organisms in a population.

Hagedoorn and Hagedoorn (1921) similarly point out that some traits of organisms are “trivial”, i.e., “cannot possibly be accounted for as useful”, such as “the shape and arrangement of small hairs on the seeds of some cereals” (p. 107). They likewise maintain that such traits, which can be stable (“pure”, i.e., fixed) within a species, cannot be the product of natural selection; instead, the Hagedoorns assert, they must be “due to some process which accompanies selection” (p. 108). The Hagedoorns then proceed to describe several ways in which variability in a population can be reduced: a new population is founded which lacks some of the variability of the original population; a population is split in half (with the variability in the daughter populations differing from each other and from the original); and “random sampling” where even though the size of the population remains relatively constant from year to year, only a small fraction successfully reproduce. On this last point, they state,

The group of organisms chosen by fate to become the parents of the next generation is usually, but always occasionally, considerably smaller than the number of individuals of their species. (1921: 120)

Thus, the Hagedoorns endorse points 1–5 above, while describing two additional processes besides #4 (the founding of a new population), namely the splitting of a population and the random sampling of parents. They further explain the relevance of #3 (small populations): “the smaller the group, the more limited its potential variability, the sooner it will be pure altogether” (p. 123). And finally, they maintain that drift can produce fixation (“purity”), or the complete loss of variation within a population, even in the absence of selection. Fisher (1922b) reads the Hagedoorns as claiming that “random survival is a more important factor in limiting the variability of species than preferential survival” (p. 321), a claim that he challenged by attempting to show that such a process would be too slow to overcome the rate of mutation (and thus the introduction of new variability—but he seems to say otherwise in 1922a).

An essay published by Wright in 1931 provides what is perhaps one of the earliest explicit characterizations of drift:

It has seemed to me that another factor should be much more important in keeping the system of gene frequencies from settling into equilibrium. This is the effect of random sampling in a breeding population of limited size. The gene frequencies of one generation may be expected to differ a little from those of the preceding merely by chance. In the course of generations this may bring about important changes, although the farther the drift from the theoretical equilibrium, the greater will be the pressure toward return. (Wright 1931b: 205; emphasis added)

The paper from which this quote is taken was meant to be a summary of a longer paper, also published in 1931 (Wright 1986: 88). In the longer paper (1931a), Wright specifies that the random sampling is of gametes. (Gametes are cells that fuse together during fertilization, such as an egg and a sperm). So, even though Wright (1931a) notes that the Hagedoorns had “urged the importance of such random fixation as a factor in evolution”, and states that Fisher (1922b) had analyzed the issue, has he changed the subject to be random sampling of gametes rather than of “parents” (i.e., organisms)? In short, no: Wright (1932 and elsewhere) makes it clear that he considers drift to encompass both random sampling of gametes and random sampling of organisms. In other words, he has expanded the phenomena that the concept of drift is meant to cover from that discussed by Gulick, the Hagedoorns, and Fisher. But Wright’s 1932 paper also emphasized what would become a persistent confusion between drift and inbreeding; both inbreeding and drift are more significant in small populations, so it can become easy to conflate them. But you can have random sampling of parents (say, through a population split) without inbreeding, and inbreeding without random sampling of parents. That alone shows that drift and inbreeding are not the same. So, not all of the expansions of drift were productive ones.

It should be noted that while Wright and Fisher had numerous back-and-forth discussions and disagreements about each other’s claims concerning the role of drift in evolution (Provine 1986, Skipper 2002), they did not seem to disagree about what drift was. Wright (1948) considered the following to be an “acceptable statement” of his view from Fisher and E.B. Ford:

Great evolutionary importance has been attached by Sewall Wright (1931, 1932, 1935, 1940) to the fact that small shifts in the gene-ratios of all segregating factors will occur from generation to generation owing to the errors of random sampling in the process by which the gametes available in any one generation are chosen to constitute the next. Such chance deviations will, of course, be greater the smaller the isolated populations concerned. (Fisher and Ford 1947)

On the other hand, Wright’s later incorporation of fluctuations in mutation rate, fluctuations in migration, and fluctuations in selection (see, e.g., Wright 1949) as types of drift was challenged by Cain and Currey, who asserted that “the worker on actual examples must classify processes according to their biological significance” and that such lumping together would produce confusion and prevent proper analysis of actual situations (Cain & Currey 1963: 59). They thus urged the use of the term “sampling drift”, which Wright adopted in the fourth volume of his 1978 magnum opus, Evolution and the Genetics of Populations.

In short, drift’s founders exhibit a diversity of views about drift, which John Beatty helpfully describes as follows:

drift is a heterogeneous category of evolutionary causes and effects, whose overall significance relative to other modes of evolution (especially evolution by natural selection) has been greatly disputed. (Beatty 1992: 273)

Potential causes invoked in the discussion above include sampling of gametes, sampling of parents, founding of new populations, splitting of populations, each of which is intensified when populations are small, while potential effects mentioned include fluctuations of gene frequencies from one generation to the next, loss of variants from a population, and fixation of a (possibly non-adapted) type in a population. Are these causes and effects all drift? With that sort of confusing heterogeneity, there is little surprise that the concept has drawn philosophical attention. But at least we have our starting point for philosophical discussion (see Beatty 1992 and Plutynski 2007 for additional historical overview).

2. What Is Drift, and Can It Be Distinguished from Natural Selection?

Philosophers have taken a variety of approaches to characterizing drift and distinguishing it from natural selection, including a causal process approach that derives from the history just presented, approaches that are mathematically derived, and other sorts of approaches. These are discussed in turn.

2.1 A Historically-Derived Account of Drift: The Causal Process Account

Reflecting on the historical uses of the term “drift”, Beatty states that

what most of the phenomena so designated [as drift] have in common is one or another biological form of random or indiscriminate sampling, and consequent sampling error. (Beatty 1992: 273; see also Plutynski et al. 2016 on the modern synthesis authors’ agreement on this point)

Let’s begin with indiscriminate sampling. Beatty states that parent sampling is

the process of determining which organisms of one generation will be parents of the next, and how many offspring each parent will have (1984: 188; italics in original)

Beatty maintains that this parent sampling can be discriminate, that is, with regard to physical differences, or indiscriminate, that is, without regard to physical differences (1984: 189). Discriminate parent sampling is generally considered natural selection; indiscriminate parent sampling is random drift. Beatty characterizes gamete sampling similarly, as

the process of determining which of the two genetically different types of gametes produced by a heterozygotic parent is actually contributed to each of its offspring (1984: 189; italics in original)

He continues:

This sort of sampling might be indiscriminate in the sense that any physical difference between the two types of gametes produced by a heterozygote might be irrelevant to whether one or the other is actually contributed to any particular offspring. (1984: 189)

And again, the indiscriminate form of sampling is drift while discriminate gamete sampling would be selection.

Several illustrations of indiscriminate sampling are common in the literature, but some are more helpful than others. One is a hypothetical scenario in which two genetically and phenotypically identical twins are walking together; one is struck by lightning whereas the other lives to reproduce. (The example seems to have its origins in Scriven 1959 and Mills and Beatty 1979, although these authors were making a point about fitness, not about drift). This is an unfortunate illustration in part because it is too easy to get caught up in the question of whether the twins are really genetically and physically identical, but, more importantly, it is misleading because in fact, drift requires heritable variation, just as selection does. The lightning example is also problematic because it makes drift seem exceptional and catastrophic, whereas it is generally considered to be pervasive (i.e., occurring in all populations) and not necessarily due to catastrophic or unusual events. Others (e.g., Matthen and Ariew 2002; Walsh, Lewens, and Ariew 2002) use a series of coin tosses as an illustration of drift, but this could be challenged because it encourages binary thinking, instead of allowing for multiple variants with multiple outcomes, and because it is unclear what the “population” of coin flips amounts to.

A better illustration of drift has its origins in Theodosius Dobzhansky’s (1937) discussion of Dubinin and Romaschoff’s (1932) model, which asks us to imagine an urn filled with different colored balls. If the balls are drawn from the urn without respect to color, e.g., by a person drawing balls while blindfolded, then the balls are being indiscriminately sampled (unlike discriminate sampling, where someone deliberately tries to pick balls of a certain color). If a large sample of balls is taken, we expect the frequencies of colored balls in the sample drawn from the urn to be very close to the frequencies in the urn. If only a small sample of colored balls is drawn from the urn, then our sample may very well have different proportions of colored balls than the urn does. Multiple samplings taken over time, which would correspond to multiple generations, would tend to exhibit a pattern of fluctuating frequencies (recall the quote from Darwin above). The illustration thus models the population, its variants with their physical differences, and gives a clear understanding of the possible outcomes. It is also easily extrapolatable to, e.g., colorblind predators (Hodge 1987) and other indiscriminate sampling agents. It does, however, have some limitations; for example, it lacks an analogue for reproduction, since the balls do not produce offspring, multiple or otherwise.

Although the characterization of drift and selection in terms of indiscriminate and discriminate sampling seems straightforward, with Beatty’s explication of indiscriminate sampling an important clarification of what the Hagedoorns, Fisher, and Wright seem to have meant by “random” sampling, Beatty (1984) raises a problem for the conceptual distinction between natural selection and random drift. The problem is as follows: For every population of organisms in a given environment, with a certain distribution of types and associated fitnesses, there is a range of possible outcomes of natural selection, with some more likely than others. It is, of course, more likely that the fitter organisms will have greater reproductive success in the next generation than the less fit, but it is also possible that they will not. (Darwin repeatedly emphasized this chance element of natural selection). So, what do we say about the outcomes where the less fit outreproduce the more fit? Beatty states:

To the extent that those outcomes are less representative of the physical abilities of those organisms to survive and reproduce in the environment in question, any evolutionary change that results will be more a matter of random drift,

concluding that it is

conceptually difficult to distinguish natural selection from random drift, especially where improbable results of natural selection are concerned (Beatty 1984: 196; emphasis in original)

As will be discussed further below, much of the twentieth century was marked by debates among biologists about the relative importance of drift and selection in evolution. Were those debates at least in part the result of conceptual unclarity? Millstein (2002) argues that we need not accept this inadvertent consequence of Beatty’s argument, and that selection can, in fact, be distinguished from drift. In order to do this, three extensions should be made to Beatty’s account. First, similar to Hodge (1987), Millstein suggests that a proper distinction between drift and selection relies on causation, specifically, that drift processes are indiscriminate sampling processes in which any heritable physical differences between entities (organisms, gametes, etc.) are causally irrelevant to differences in reproductive success, whereas natural selection processes are discriminate sampling processes in which any heritable physical differences between entities (organisms, gametes, etc.) are causally relevant to differences in reproductive success. These more precise characterizations of “indiscriminate sampling” and “discriminate sampling” are intended to replace the metaphorical “sampling” talk, retaining the term “sampling” as a useful shorthand only. Second, we should be careful to distinguish the process of drift from the outcomes that drift produces, and the process of selection from the outcomes that selection produces. (Of course, the importance of distinguishing process from outcome is not a novel insight; what is novel here is its application to the problem of distinguishing drift from selection. The distinction has sometimes been rendered as “process vs. product” rather than “process vs. outcome” in the philosophical literature, but given the teleological and other misleading connotations of “product”, the term “outcome” is preferable and “product” should be avoided). Third, we should characterize drift and selection as processes rather than outcomes (as in the first of the three points). If we do these three things, then drift and selection are conceptually distinct and the problem Beatty raises is dissolved; discriminate sampling processes where unlikely outcomes obtain are still selection processes. On this view, it is further acknowledged that it is possible for drift and selection to produce the same outcomes, which helps explain the persistence of biologists’ debates over the relative importance of drift and selection without making them seem trivial (see Millstein 2002 for additional discussion of Beatty’s arguments).

And what are these drift processes? They are the same physical indiscriminate sampling processes that Gulick, the Hagedoorns, Wright, and Fisher (and later, Kimura, who will be discussed further below) sought to characterize: the sampling of gametes in the formation of zygotes, the sampling of parents, the founding of new populations, and the splitting of populations. (Note that this is not intended to be an exhaustive list). The outcomes are likewise those mentioned by drift’s founders: fluctuations of gene frequencies from one generation to the next, loss of variants from a population, and fixation of a type in a population. (Again, this is not an exhaustive list). Each of these outcomes is affected by population size, as any indiscriminate sampling process is; smaller populations undergoing drift tend to experience greater fluctuations in gene frequencies, a faster loss of variants from the population, and faster fixation of types in a population. Thus, the Beatty/Hodge/Millstein account of drift—the Causal Process Account of Drift—is one that is grounded in the historical development of the term and in biological practice, with the philosopher’s role being one of clarification and elaboration. Christopher Stephens (2004), Robert Northcott (2010), and Chris Haufe (2013) also seem to endorse the bare bones view of drift as a sampling process, if not the Causal Process Account of Drift in all of its details.

2.2 Reactions to and Varieties of Sampling-Based Accounts of Drift

However, the Causal Process Account of Drift has not gone unchallenged. Robert Brandon (2005) argues that it “does not map well onto the ways biologists differentiate drift from selection” (2005: 156), that selection and drift are the same process (i.e., sampling), and that the large majority of biological cases are not cases of indiscriminate sampling. He maintains that “Drift is any deviation from the expected levels of reproduction due to sampling error” whereas “Selection is differential reproduction that is due to (and in accord with) expected differences in reproductive success” (2005: 168–9). These definitions include both process and outcome. Millstein (2005) responds to each of these challenges and defends her view over his. For the purposes of this essay, it is important to note, as Millstein (2005) acknowledges, that Brandon is certainly correct in his descriptive claim that many biologists incorporate both process and outcome in their definitions of drift (see Millstein, Skipper, and Dietrich (2009) for examples). Indeed, the plurality of definitions of drift offered by contemporary biologists—some process-oriented, some outcome-oriented, some both, and some alternating within the same work—gives rise to the need for philosophical analysis, even if the result, in the end, is to accept that pluralism. The Causal Process Account of Drift is making a prescriptive claim on the grounds of 1) increased clarity, 2) the ability to conceptually differentiate biologically very different phenomena, such as selection in a fluctuating environment from fluctuating gene frequencies due to indiscriminate sampling, which have the same outcomes, while 3) maintaining a grounding in biological practice and (some) biological usage.

Jessica Pfeifer (2005) weighs in on the disagreement between Millstein and Brandon, arguing that it is reasonable to think that the source of probabilities in natural selection are at least partly a result of abstracting from or ignoring certain features of the environment and that, if this view is adopted, it is not conceptually confused to treat selection and drift as causally distinct. On Pfeifer’s view, drift is caused by the distribution of ignored factors, whereas selection for the trait in question is caused by those features that are not ignored.

Peter Gildenhuys (2009) argues that the term “drift” is used to refer to causal influences over a population that have three features: they are non-interactive, non-pervasive, and indiscriminate (NINPICs). Thus, he endorses drift as indiscriminate sampling; the other modifications he makes to the view seem to stem from thinking that the Causal Process Account precludes drift and selection from co-occurring and from thinking the view needs to account for location (e.g., an organism being in the wrong place at the wrong time) as an irrelevant causal factor. In any case, he acknowledges that his account and the Causal Process Account probably agree in practice over what sorts of things should be characterized as constituting drift. Larry Shapiro and Elliott Sober (2007) also endorse the view that selection and drift are distinct processes, but Sober, at least, has backed off this view in a recent paper co-authored with Hayley Clatterbuck and Richard Lewontin (Clatterbuck, Sober, and Lewontin 2013). Like Gildenhuys, they seem to suggest that if selection and drift are distinct processes that they cannot co-occur, and they seem to think that the mere introduction of finite population size introduces drift.

To be clear, however, there can be indiscriminate sampling processes and discriminate sampling processes occurring in the same population, even with respect to the same trait. For example, in a study of over 900 populations, biologist Maxime Lamotte acknowledged that camouflage gave appropriately colored Cepaea nemoralis land snails a selective advantage in their respective environment while simultaneously maintaining that foundings of new populations are “of considerable importance because of the chance variations in the composition of the first colonizers” (Lamotte 1959: 80); the variations he refers to are variations in the colors of the snail colonizers (Millstein 2009). Moreover, since the Causal Process Account requires that variations be heritable, the non-heritable locations of organisms are simply irrelevant for the purposes of deciding on drift vs. selection; for example, the founders of a new population may all hail from the geographic edge of the original population, but they can still be an indiscriminate sample of the whole. Finally, historically, at least (as discussed above), small population size has always been associated with drift, but it was never the main phenomenon to be represented. Thus, the variant sampling accounts of drift should be evaluated in light of these considerations.

2.3 Mathematical Approaches to Drift

Walsh, Lewens, and Ariew (2002) provide a good entrée into understanding a mathematical approach to drift. They begin by acknowledging the historical uses of the term drift, identifying four: 1) a “Sewall Wright Effect”, 2) a “Hagedoorn Effect”, 3) “Indiscriminate Sampling”, and 4) “The Finiteness of Natural Populations” (with some of their characterizations not fully accurate; e.g., with the first, they conflate Sewall Wright’s Shifting Balance Model where drift plays a role with drift itself). They suggest that these phenomena are “disparate” although they acknowledge, citing Beatty (1984), that the first three can be understood in terms of sampling. But the fourth form, they assert, cannot. They describe the fourth phenomenon as follows:

The Hardy-Weinberg Law says that in infinite populations (of diploid organisms) there is no change in gene frequencies when there is no variation in gene fitnesses. But natural populations are finite in size; often they are small. In finite populations there will always be some non-negligible chance that trait frequencies will diverge from expectation. (Walsh, Lewens, and Ariew 2002: 456)

With respect to this understanding of drift as the Hardy-Weinberg Law conjoined with a finite population, Walsh, Lewens, and Ariew maintain that “there is no larger population literally being sampled” (2002: 459). Instead:

…in these cases what happens is that the distribution of fitnesses in the population yields a prediction concerning the way in which a population will change. Drift is manifested as a difference from the outcome predicted by the fitnesses in the population. The law of large numbers tells us that the likelihood of significant divergence from these predictions is an inverse function of the size of the population. The small size of a population increases the chances of error. (Walsh, Lewens, and Ariew 2002: 459)

Walsh, Lewens, and Ariew then state that this is the common feature that the four types of drift they outline all share; thus drift, on their view, is when a series of births, survivals, deaths, and reproductions diverges from the outcome predicted by differences in fitness. Note that, using the terminology introduced in the previous section, this is a purely outcome-oriented (“outcome-only”) definition of drift. Whatever type of process (if any) might have produced the outcome plays no role in the definition. Matthen (2010) defends a similar characterization of drift: “Departures from expected values are what population geneticists call ‘drift’” (Matthen 2010: 3).

However, notice that the fourth drift “phenomenon” that Walsh, Lewens, and Ariew identify isn’t really a phenomenon. Rather, it refers to a model from population genetics, the Hardy-Weinberg model, and predictions based on that model. It is true that as a consequence of the model, there would be no deviation from fitness expectations with an idealized infinite population (if we make some philosophical assumptions about what happens in infinity; Sober (1984) raises questions about these assumptions), but that there would likely be such deviations with a finite population. But this is a purely mathematical approach. The purely mathematical approach doesn’t ask what phenomena the model is supposed to be modeling and why it is that finite populations are of interest. There is also no explanation of why a Hardy-Weinberg model with an assumption of finite population size should count as drift; perhaps this is because of a philosophical tradition of referring to this as drift (e.g., some parts of Sober 1984 read that way), or perhaps it is because of the previously-noted longstanding association between drift and small population sizes. In contrast, on the Causal Process Account of Drift, drift would occur even in infinite populations as long as there is indiscriminate sampling; drift-like outcomes (deviation from fitness expectations) are not required.

Millstein, Skipper, and Dietrich (2009) challenge the outcome-only approach to defining drift and the purely mathematical approach that it is based on. Thus, there seem to be some meta-disagreements between the process-only and outcome-only approaches to drift; should our definitions of drift look to the history of biology or should they look to mathematics? Should we glean our understandings of drift from the phenomena that biologists have sought to understand (the phenomena that they developed models for) or from the models alone? If from the models alone, are we inadvertently drawing on the measure or operationalization of drift rather than drift itself (Plutynski 2007)? Differing answers to these questions seem to be at the heart of the differing definitions of drift.

If one doesn’t interpret the model purely mathematically, but instead considers what phenomenon the Hardy-Weinberg Principle with-finite-populations is seeking to model, then there is indeed a larger population being sampled. The equation models the changes from one generation to the next; the original generation is the population that is being sampled, and the next generation is the “sample”. That sample may or may not be representative of the original population, e.g., a heterozygote Aa of the original generation may or may not have offspring in the proportions 25% AA, 50% Aa, and 25% aa.

The mathematical-oriented outcome-only definition of drift is often associated with the so-called “statisticalist” approach to evolutionary theory, but since it is simply a definition of drift and not a metaphysical thesis it need not be. For example, a non-statisticalist could consistently hold that natural selection is causal (and thus, evolution would not be purely statistical, as it is on the statisticalist interpretation), but that drift occurs when and only when there is a deviation of the actual outcome from fitness expectation. Indeed, Frédéric Bouchard and Alexander Rosenberg (2004) seem to hold such a view. The intersection between issues of drift and the debates over statisticalism will be discussed further below.

2.4 Other Accounts of Drift

Other accounts of drift are not so easily classified. For example, Timothy Shanahan (1992) argues that conceptually, random drift and natural selection are the ends of a continuum. However, to reach this conclusion, Shanahan must reject heritability as a necessary condition for natural selection. As evolutionary biologist John Endler has argued, this has the effect of trivializing natural selection to the claim that “there are differences among different phenotypes” (Endler 1986: 13).

Grant Ramsey (2013) develops a concept he calls “driftability”, which locates drift in individual organisms rather than in a population. Ramsey points out that the possible lives that an organism can lead is a large and heterogeneous set; thus, the actual life that any particular organism leads will probably not be a representative sample (which he seems to equate to an average) of the set. Differences within the set of will lead to different evolutionary outcomes; this intra-organismic heterogeneity within the set of possible lives of an organism is driftability.

Peter Godfrey-Smith (2009) characterizes drift as changes where two parameters, the smoothness of fitness landscapes and dependence of reproductive character on fitness differences, are low. (However, when he needs to explicate why drift has special importance in small populations and why it can be mathematically described in particular ways, he appeals to indiscriminate sampling. Perhaps, then, indiscriminate sampling is at the core of Godfrey-Smith’s view of drift).

Again, these accounts, which seem to deviate significantly from biological usage and practice, raise meta-philosophical issues about how we ought to go about characterizing a scientific concept like “drift”. How far can the definition of a term deviate from scientific usage and practice and still be considered to be a definition of the same thing?

One could also be a pluralist about drift, arguing that there is reason to accept more than one definition of drift, although it is unclear if anyone has actually endorsed this position. Marshall Abrams seems to come the closest, stating:

If random drift is anything, it is not one thing…The term applies to many effects on populations or organisms which are said to be due to “chance,” and to factors which are thought to help to produce such effects. (2007: 673)

3. Intersection of Genetic Drift with Statisticalist-Causalist Debates

Recent debates about random drift are often entangled with debates over the purported purely statistical (non-causal) nature of evolutionary biology, but the issues are separable. There are issues concerning random drift that do not involve questions of statisticalism (as this article seeks to document), and there are issues concerning statisticalism that do not involve random drift (e.g., much of the literature focuses on natural selection rather than random drift). The statisticalist claim, generally traced to a pair of papers by Walsh, Lewens, and Ariew (2002) and Matthen and Ariew (2002), is essentially that evolution is a population-level phenomenon, and that although there are causes at the level of individual organisms (births, deaths, etc.), there are no causes at the population level, only a statistical summary of the individual events. Note that it is widely acknowledged that the models in evolutionary theory are statistical ones, so the distinctive statisticalist claim is that evolutionary biology is purely statistical. There are at least three alternatives to the statisticalist claim; one challenges the claim that evolutionary biology is a population-level phenomenon, arguing that it is constituted by causes at the level of individual organisms (e.g., Bouchard and Rosenberg 2004), a second defends the view that there are population-level causes (e.g., Millstein 2006; Shapiro and Sober 2007), while a third argues for causes at both levels (Pence 2017).

It was already noted above (see section 2.3) that the outcome-only definition of drift is often adopted by statisticalists, but not exclusively so; it can also be endorsed by a causalist who, e.g., believes that natural selection is a causal process but that drift is simply deviation from selective expectations. Perhaps surprisingly, it would also be possible for someone to endorse a version of the Causal Process Account of Drift and yet still accept the basic statisticalist premise—if one thought that drift should be understood in terms of indiscriminate sampling, and also thought that indiscriminate sampling should be understood in terms of causes at the level of individual organisms, then the evolutionary changes wrought by drift would just be be the statistical summation of individual level causes. In short, it would be a mistake to infer one’s position on the statisticalist debate from one’s definition of drift, although such slippage is common and the issues are in truth often entangled.

What, then, are the statisticalist issues that random drift is entangled with? The concerns raised by Walsh, Lewens, and Ariew (2002) and Matthen and Ariew (2002) have their origins in claims made by Sober (1984) in his classic The Nature of Selection. Sober characterizes evolutionary theory as a theory of forces, with its zero-force state described by the Hardy-Weinberg equation of population genetics (see the population genetics entry for an explanation of the equation); in such a state, there is no selection, no mutation, no migration, no meiotic drive, random mating, and infinite population size. Thus, the Hardy-Weinberg equation is an idealized model that never obtains in the real world. It is a bit difficult to see where drift fits into the equation, which is no doubt the source of much of the confusion over how to define drift. In his 1984 book, Sober alternatively characterizes drift in terms of random sampling (the process, which occurs, Sober explains, during gamete formation and the founding of new populations) and sampling error (the outcome, i.e., the deviation from fitness expectations). From the point of view of process, at least some types of sampling could be understood to be part of the Mendelian process. The Mendelian process includes the “process wherein organism produce gametes and gametes produce organisms” (Sober 1984: 35), which Sober says is not treated as a force, but rather as the background against which evolutionary forces are described. But Sober does not take this route. Instead, Sober contrasts drift as sampling error (again, the outcome—presumably introduced when one relaxes Hardy-Weinberg assumptions to allow for finite populations) with selection, mutation, and migration; all are forces, Sober asserts, but drift is a different sort of force. It is not “deterministic” and it does not have a definite direction (although it does have a magnitude, determined by the population size). That is, given trait frequencies and fitness values, Sober suggests, selection predicts a specific outcome for the next generation in a specific direction (and is in this sense “deterministic”), whereas drift could yield an increase any of the types present in the population (and is in this sense directionless). Moreover, Sober states, you cannot say how much drift has contributed a change relative to the change introduced by selection; to do so would be as impossible as trying to say, when flipping a fair coin ten times and obtaining six heads, how much of the result was due to the fairness of the coin and how much was due to the fact that it was tossed ten times. He thus concludes that “if drift is an evolutionary force, it is a force of a different color” (1984: 117); he calls it a force, he says, mainly to indicate its causal role.

These metaphysical claims about drift (and selection and other evolutionary processes—but it is just drift that interests us here) set the stage for the statisticalists’ challenge. Matthen and Ariew (2002) challenge the claim that there is a defensible sense in which drift is a force. Aside from the fact that it does not have a predictable or constant direction (as Sober readily acknowledges), they point to a case of two similar populations subject to the same selective pressures, one in which the trait \(T\) becomes fixed and the other in which the alternative trait \(T'\) becomes fixed. What explains the outcome in the two cases? Exactly the same thing, Matthen and Ariew assert, just as exactly the same coin setup explains two heads and four heads in two series of ten coin tosses. Thus, they seem to suggest, there is no additional cause or force, “drift”. Walsh, Lewens, and Ariew (2002) similarly attack Sober’s claim that drift is a force; following Rosenberg (1994), they assert that “the events that are labelled ‘drift’ events, like lightning strikes, etc. are no different in kind from selection events” (Walsh, Lewens, and Ariew 2002: 457)—and thus, drift is not a distinct sort of force. Moreover, they argue, drift is best interpreted statistically as statistical error (see argument in section 2.3), and so again, it is not a force.

To be clear, there is a historical component to the statisticalists’ claims; on their view, Darwin’s evolutionary theory was causal, but with the introduction of population genetics, evolution became purely statistical. (It is sometimes unclear whether the statisticalists are making claims about models/theories or whether they are making ontological claims, or whether they think that the latter can be inferred from the former). Hodge (2016; see also Plutynski et al. 2016) challenges this historical claim by arguing that in fact Darwin—although he liked to think that his epistemological and nomological ideals were in descent from Newton’s—never understood natural selection to be a lawful force along with gravitation or inertia. Hodge further argues that biologists today compare and contrast natural selection with artificial selection and with drift in ways directly descending from Darwin’s view of natural selection as a causal process.

A number of other philosophers have sought to challenge the statisticalists’ claim that drift is not a force. For example, Stephens (2004) defends the claim that drift is both a force and a cause. He asserts that if we understand drift properly as a process of indiscriminate sampling (instead of as an outcome, as the statisticalists do), we can see that it is a force, but that in a population of a given size it always has the same force, regardless of whether there is a large or a small deviation from expectation. (It may be that Sober’s inadvertent vagueness in his 1984 book on the process/outcome question contributed to the confusion, since the statisticalists were responding to Sober). He clarifies that, “because drift is a probabilistic cause, the same causal force can have two different outcomes” (Stephens 2004: 557; emphasis in original). Stephens further defends the claim that drift can be understood as a force or a cause by arguing (contra Matthen and Ariew) that drift does have a direction, namely, eliminating heterozygosity; that it can “make a difference” by affecting the probability of evolutionary change (more in small populations, less in large); and that we can cogently speak of the relative importance of drift in an ensemble of populations or in a population, albeit not at the level of individuals (see Walsh 2007 for a response to Stephens 2004, 2010 and Gildenhuys 2014 for a response to his response).

Brandon (2006), however, argues that “eliminating heterozygosity” is not sufficient to show that drift is directional, given that (as Stephens would readily acknowledge) if there were two alleles at a locus, beginning at equal frequencies, we could not predict which of the two alleles would go to fixation, only that one of them would; Brandon likens this to saying that “a 20-Newton force is acting on object A”, (2006: 325), which, he seems to imply, is not a directional claim. Moreover, he argues, drift is not a separate process from selection. Thus, drift, on Brandon’s view, is not a force (but it is a law; more on that below). Joshua Filler (2009) responds to Brandon by defending a more elaborated account of what a force is (in part drawing on Bigelow et al. 1988); on that elaborated account, drift’s direction can be seen as less specific than selection, mutation, and migration, but it gives some directional information. Thus, Filler argues, it can be seen as less “forcelike” than selection, mutation, and migration, but it is still a force. Charles Pence (2017), however, worries that Filler’s modifications to our understanding of “force” may be ad hoc, so he offers an alternative defense of the claim that drift is a force. First, Pence argues, we already countenance forces that have stochastically specified directions, such as Brownian motion, and drift is analogous. Second, we can create an evolutionary thought experiment where drift is absent, showing that it is not constitutive of all evolving systems; this is intended to respond to Brandon’s claim that drift is not separable. Importantly, however, Pence points out that there are essential questions that the entire debate has yet to address: “what exactly the use of ‘forces’ is to do for us, and when explanations utilizing a force metaphor are useful or perspicuous” (Pence 2017: 1975).

On the other hand, Kenneth Reisman and Patrick Forber (2005) separate the question of whether drift is a force from the question of whether drift is a cause, arguing only for the latter while not taking a stand on the former. In a related paper, they rely on Woodward’s (2003) manipulability account of causation and a 1957 study of drift by Dobzhansky and Pavlovsky to argue that

decreasing the number of founding members in replicate populations produces an increase in the variability of evolutionary outcomes across those replicate populations. (Forber and Reisman 2007: 617)

In other words, they argue that the conditions of the study can be seen to satisfy the conditions of the manipulability account, showing that drift ought to be understood as a (population-level) cause. Shapiro and Sober (2007) state that they endorse Reisman and Forber’s arguments as well as the view of drift as a process. However, it’s unclear whether Shapiro and Sober (or Reisman and Forber) actually do endorse the view of drift as a process. That is, it’s unclear why population size as a causal factor should count as a process.

This is because it’s a bit unclear if drift is actually what is being manipulated in Dobzhansky and Pavlovsky’s (1957) experiments, or if it is just population size—and population size does not seem to be a process. Perhaps Reisman and Forber have simply shown that population size is a causal factor of evolutionary change in populations undergoing drift. They also seem to be taking Woodward’s account very literally, in that they seem to think that the “variable” that has to be manipulated must be a variable in a mathematical model; otherwise, one could (at least in principle) manipulate the sampling process by manipulating the population rather than simply the population size; Clatterbuck’s (2015) account, discussed in section 5, gives an example of this. (Population size is a variable in mathematical models of drift, whereas sampling, as discussed above, is implicit). One could also conceivably manipulate the environment so that sampling was discriminate rather than indiscriminate or to change the nature of the indiscriminate sampling.

Pierrick Bourrat (2018) offers an alternative response to Reisman and Forber; he implies that Reisman and Forber (2005) have overlooked Woodward’s criterion of invariance when they invoke the manipulability account in support of drift as a population-level cause. Invariance in an intervention, Bourrat states, “measures the extent to which a relationship between two variables satisfying the manipulation condition remains stable or unchanged as various other changes are made in the background of this relationship” (2018: 162), and, again invoking Woodward, he asserts that causal relationships that are more invariant provide better explanations. But, Bourrat argues, causal explanations in terms of individual-level variables are more invariant under intervention than causal explanations in terms of population-level variables, and thus should be preferred for that reason. In other words, similar to Bouchard and Rosenberg (2004) who are briefly mentioned above, Bourrat defends a causalist position, but at the level of individuals rather than at the level of populations. However, Bourrat does concede that it is reasonable to conceive of drift and natural selection as population-level causes when they depend on indeterministic events, as well as for some cases of frequency-dependent selection. Moreover, Bourrat does not discuss Clatterbuck’s (2015) alternative and arguably superior understanding of the relevant manipulation for drift; had he done so, it is not clear that his claim for the superiority of individual-level causal explanations with respect to drift would follow. Again, though, these are disagreements within the causalist camp.

Other challenges to the statisticalists’ claims about drift as a cause neither endorse the view of drift as a force nor drift as a distinct process. For example, Brandon and Ramsey (2007) see drift and selection as “copossible” outcomes of the same process. But because there is a causal process—albeit only one rather than two—the statisticalists’ claims are not upheld. Abrams (2007) likewise seems loathe to adopt “force” talk about drift, at least in a strong realist sense. He argues that “both selection and drift are aspects of a probability distribution over future frequencies of genotypes or phenotypes in a population” (2007: 667). Yet selection and drift can be distinguished:

Selection is the aspect of the distribution controlled by differences in fitness, while drift is the aspect of such a distribution controlled by population size (apart any from effects of population size on fitness). (2007: 667)

This makes it sound as though Abrams is adopting a view of drift akin to that of Reisman and Forber, with its focus on population size, and indeed Abrams does elaborate on the causal role of population size, but (as noted above) his views on drift are more accurately pluralist ones.

More generally, Pence (2017) suggests one way of categorizing the different causalist approaches (although not all of these have explicitly addressed drift):

At the very least, we need to distinguish between (1) the force interpretation, as discussed here; (2) the causal process approach (elaborated most notably by Millstein 2002, 2006, 2013); (3) the causal mechanism approach, first deployed for natural selection by Barros (2008) and building on the work of Machamer et al. (2000); (4) the manipulationist approach, discussed by Reisman and Forber (2005), Forber and Reisman (2007), and Shapiro and Sober (2007), building on the work of Woodward and Hitchcock (2003); and (5) the counterfactual approach, deployed for natural selection by Glennan (2009) and Huneman (2012) and utilizing a notion of counterfactual causal dependence or “relevance”. (Pence 2017: 1983)

4. Detecting Drift Empirically

Throughout the 20th and 21st centuries, biologists have struggled to detect drift empirically. In particular, they have experienced challenges in differentiating cases of drift from cases of selection. The Causal Process Account of Drift in particular can help to make sense of why this is so, as will be discussed below. Drift and selection may be different sorts of causal processes (indiscriminate and discriminate sampling, respectively), but they can produce similar outcomes. Biologists have thus struggled to identify distinctive outcomes for drift and selection, only to find underdetermination re-emerge after biologists modified or added to their assumptions about the relevant processes (for a clear characterization of this, see Dietrich and Skipper 2007). Relatedly, biologists have also disagreed over the relative prevalence of drift and selection (Beatty 1995, 1997); as noted above, these disagreements were there almost from the outset with Fisher’s response to the Hagedoorns.

4.1 Classic Studies

The disagreements over the prevalence of drift and selection began almost immediately after Wright and Fisher incorporated drift into their evolutionary models (see Provine 1986 for an extended discussion of their disagreements, to which this discussion is very much indebted). Wright (1931a, 1932), drawing on his experience with animal breeding, developed the Shifting Balance Theory (SBT), which consisted of three phases; these have been understood either as empirical claims about actual conditions (Provine 1986) or descriptions of the ideal conditions for evolution (Skipper 2002). Skipper provides a clear description of the SBT as Wright would eventually formulate it (see Hodge 2011 for discussion of early formulations):

In the first phase, random genetic drift causes gene frequencies to change and pull subpopulations semi-isolated within the global population into adaptive valleys because random fluctuations in gene frequencies are almost always maladaptive. In phase two, mass selection will then act within subpopulations and increase their fitness, dragging them from adaptive valleys to adaptive peaks. In the third phase, selection between subpopulations, which Wright called interdemic selection, driven by differential dispersion (migration of organisms from more fit subpopulations to less fit subpopulations) would then enable the global population to be raised to its optimal peak. (Skipper 2002: 345)

Drift, then, on Wright’s view, plays an essential role in the evolutionary process. Fisher, by contrast, thought that mass selection on large populations was the predominant and most effective mode of evolution, leaving very little role for drift given the large population sizes. (This disagreement about the relative role of drift in evolution is one of several things that Wright and Fisher disagreed about; e.g., as is clear from the above, they also disagreed about population structure and effective population size. See Skipper 2002, 2009 and Plutynski 2005 for analyses of contemporary biologists who continue to argue the Wright-Fisher debate).

Another, related issue arose concerning the character of the traits that were said to be subject to random drift. Wright’s early writings, in particular, emphasized the nonadaptive character of the traits undergoing drift and produced by drift (as can be see in Skipper’s characterization of Wright’s SBT above). But a number of potential confusions arise here (Provine 1986; Millstein 2009): First, “nonadaptive” does not necessary mean “maladaptive”; it can also mean “neutral”. Second, “nonadaptive” can refer either to the lack of adaptive differences between organisms or species, or it can refer to the lack of adaptation to the environment (but authors are not always clear about which meaning is intended). So, one’s views on the prevalence of drift can be—and historically often have been—tied to one’s beliefs about the prevalence of adaptive traits (in either sense) in populations. Strictly speaking, however, there is no necessary connection between nonadaptive traits and drift; there can be indiscriminate sampling on organisms that are adapted to their environment and which differ in fitness, and the outcomes of that indiscriminate sampling can pull the population in an adaptive direction or a nonadaptive one. Thus, the proper contrast between selection and drift does not map onto “adaptive” and “nonadaptive”, but rather to “adaptive” and “possibly nonadaptive” (but also “possibly adaptive”).

These theoretical considerations were soon followed by field examinations of drift (there were also laboratory studies, but these were less contentious). Two sets of studies of natural populations are particularly notable. One set, referred to in the introduction to this essay, is composed of the studies of the polymorphic land snail, Cepaea nemoralis; these studies, and debates over the prevalence of drift, began in the 1930s and became quite heated in “The Great Snail Debate” of the 1950s and 1960s (Millstein 2008, 2009 gives more extensive discussion, from which the following is drawn; the moniker “The Great Snail Debate” is due to Provine 1986). Early researchers, most famously Arthur J. Cain and Philip M. Sheppard (1950, 1954), sought to demonstrate the adaptedness of the color and banding morphs of the snails as well as the sizes of the populations in which they lived. But these were challenging to determine; adaptedness was primarily studied indirectly, by seeking correlations between variants and their backgrounds (presuming camouflage and selection by predator), and population sizes varied considerably. And any correlations found were statistical ones, with lots of “noise”. This left the door open for drift; Maxime Lamotte (1959) argued that by examining the populations as a whole, one found greater variation among the small populations than among the large. This was a distinctive signature for drift, but such outcomes are hard to find and require a very special set of circumstances to obtain (large numbers of populations of varying sizes that are easy to count). However, Lamotte’s study is not the only classic evolutionary study to exploit this unique drift outcome; Cavalli-Sforza’s studies of blood groups in humans did so as well (Richardson 2006). Notably, this was not drift as an alternative to selection (Cain and Sheppard had suggested that selection precluded much of a role for drift), but rather, an argument for a substantial role for drift in addition to a substantial role for selection.

Another important set of studies is of the polymorphic Scarlet Tiger Moth, Panaxia dominula (see Provine 1986 for extended discussion, to which the following is indebted). Fisher and Ford deliberately chose P. dominula because of its small population sizes, figuring that if they could make the case for selection against drift in its worst case, they could make a decisive case against Wright, who they saw as advocating a form of nonadaptive evolution. But rather than trying to make a case for selection, as Cain and Sheppard did, Fisher and Ford (1947) tried to make a case against drift by arguing that the fluctuations of gene frequencies across generations were too large to be accounted for by drift and that the size of the fluctuations did not differ between the small and the large populations, as you would expect if they were undergoing drift. Therefore, they concluded, the populations were undergoing selection. Wright’s (1948) reply challenged both the logic of this conclusion (disproving drift does not prove selection) as well as their characterization of his views, but more significantly, he pointed out that Fisher and Ford had not included data on population sizes for the years in which the gene frequency fluctuations were statistically significant, so, in fact, it was possible that the populations had been undergone constrictions in those years, in which case drift would have been able to produce the observed fluctuations. He also pointed out that fluctuations in selection or migration (which he very problematically suggested could be part of an expanded understanding of drift) could have produced the same outcomes.

In short, the P. dominula studies turned on a slightly different but related proposed unique outcome for drift, that of fluctuations over time rather than variation at a time as for C. nemoralis, in both cases comparing small populations to large (as well as considering the capability of populations to produce large fluctuations), but with P. dominula, drawing definitive conclusions ran into difficulty from lack of data concerning the key variable of population size. There is also the recognition that fluctuating selection can produce the same outcome of fluctuations of gene frequencies across generations as drift can, making it difficult to resolve the empirical case. Finally, note that biologists have continued to study both C. nemoralis and P. dominula, with the result that additional processes have been identified that further complicate the empirical analyses (Millstein 2008; Skipper 2009).

4.2 Studies of Drift and Molecular Evolution

As Dietrich (1994) has documented, early work in molecular evolution was focused almost exclusively on selection, something that changed with the advent of the neutral theory of molecular evolution and the work of Motoo Kimura, Jack King, and Thomas Jukes. Dietrich writes:

The basis of its challenge was Kimura’s proposal that most changes detected at the molecular level were not acted upon by natural selection; they were neutral, and the mechanism of their change was random genetic drift. (1994: 22)

To be clear, however, both selection and drift play an essential role in the neutral theory; on Kimura’s view, selection will quickly eliminate the large number of deleterious mutants and fix the small number of advantageous ones, leaving the remaining mutant alleles as neutral, whereupon they undergo a process of drift (Dietrich 2006). Drift would eventually cause the neutral (and nearly neutral) mutants to either go to fixation or be lost (although they would be polymorphic in the meantime), so that observed molecular differences would be

the outcomes of a random process of mutation, which Kimura understood as produced largely from DNA replication error, processes of directional selection, and processes of random drift produced by gamete sampling. (Dietrich 2006: 670)

Many of the debates about the neutral theory contrasted this approach (the “neutralist” approach) to evolution with a more selectionist (or sometimes, “panselectionist”) approach, causing many to refer to a “neutralist-selectionist controversy”.

The advocates of the neutral theory initially proposed it as an unrealistic simple model only to have subsequent data on the prevalence of neutral alleles convince them of its realism. That led to more explicit testing of the neutral theory and debates over the molecular clock (Dietrich 2006). To focus on the first of these, Dietrich (2006) suggests that although the neutral theory promised to generate numerous quantitative testable predictions—and did—testing it has in fact proved difficult. Is this because of the difficulty in identifying outcomes that are unique to drift? Perhaps so. For example, the neutral theory predicted a certain measure of heterozygosity, but when Francisco Ayala and colleagues failed to observe that predicted outcome in a study of natural populations of Drosophila, Jack King responded by saying that many of the assumptions made by the model could be the source of the discrepancy. In other words, as has been well-discussed in the philosophy of science, there are no “crucial experiments” between two theories because theories are always tested together with their assumptions, any one of which can be given up rather than rejecting the theory. Debates over the so-called “molecular clock” can also be understood in terms of the search for distinctive outcomes for drift. At first, it was thought that only drift could make sense of an apparent constant rate of evolution—that only drift would produce such an outcome—yet this time it is the selectionists who modified their assumptions such that their models would also predict a molecular clock outcome (Dietrich and Skipper 2007).

Subsequently, Tomoko Ohta began to argue for a more significant role for weakly selected mutants (Ohta 1973). Essentially, Ohta’s definition of “nearly neutral” includes mutants that are less neutral than Kimura’s “nearly neutral” mutants, and larger amounts of them as well (Dietrich and Millstein 2008). Later refinements included both slightly deleterious and slightly advantageous mutants. This changes the processes that one would expect to be acting. With the (strictly) neutral theory, only drift would act on the neutral mutants. With the nearly neutral theory, the nearly neutral mutations (whether advantageous or deleterious) would subject to very weak selection (discriminate sampling) and to drift in the form of indiscriminate gamete sampling (Dietrich and Millstein 2008). Because the selection is weak, it would be swamped by the effects of drift, but both processes would still be occurring. Ohta believed that the nearly neutral theory could better account for the results found by Ayala and his colleagues (with its large number of relatively rare alleles), and also, that it could better explain some features of the molecular clock (Dietrich and Millstein 2008). However, it has proven much more difficult to find unique outcomes for the nearly neutral theory than the neutral theory. This makes the nearly neutral theory more difficult to test for and less useful as a null hypothesis as compared to the neutral theory, even as it might account for the available data better.

4.3 Recent Empirical Issues Concerning Drift

Hayley Clatterbuck, Elliott Sober, and Richard Lewontin (2013) argue that it doesn’t make sense to talk of drift “dominating” selection or being “stronger than” selection. (Among many such claims, this would challenge Dietrich and Millstein’s (2008) claim, discussed in the previous section, that the best way to understand the nearly neutral theory is as weak selection dominated by drift). Clatterbuck, Sober, and Lewontin take selection and drift to be a population-level process or processes (they don’t take a stand on whether there is a one process or two, but they are clearly “causalists” rather than “statisticalists”), but they raise concerns for the way that biologists have understood the value \(Ns\), which is the effective size of the population multiplied by the selection coefficient. After some initial controversies over how to interpret this value, most biologists eventually came to the view that

selection “dominates” drift when \(Ns\) is much greater than some specified number and that drift “dominates” selection when \(Ns\) is much less than that number,

with proposed numbers including 1/4, 1/2, and 1; in between values are thought to be where the two causes are more or less equal (Clatterbuck, Sober, and Lewontin 2013). Clatterbuck, Sober, and Lewontin point out that on the standard picture, the values of N and s do not predict one gene frequency outcome; rather, they predict a probability distribution of possible gene frequency outcomes. But, they argue, you can change this distribution by changing N or by changing s, with values “chosen so that the first change makes more of a difference, or less, or the same, as you please”; thus, it is “arbitrary to focus on comparisons that give drift the upper hand, or that do the same for selection” (Clatterbuck, Sober, and Lewontin 2013: 538). Here, the suggestion seems to be that N represents the drift cause and that s represents the selection cause—although it’s not clear why drift-as-cause should be equated with population-size-as-a-cause—with the conclusion that the causes are not separable. To say that they are separable would, Clatterbuck, Sober, and Lewontin say, would be akin to asking whether the result of four heads of a fair coin tossed ten times is due to the fairness of the coin or the number of tosses. They also suggest that it is impossible to have a population that is not undergoing drift, since even in an infinite population there could be deviation from selective expectations (again, making it hard to separate the causes). Finally, they argue that it doesn’t make sense to say that with identical setups that producing differing outcomes, that selection dominates in some (when the favored allele increases in frequency) and drift in others (when the favored allele decreases in frequency).

Robert Brandon and Lenore Fleming (2014) point out, however, that Clatterbuck, Sober, and Lewontin’s analysis of a seemingly empirical question is not based on an empirical discovery, but rather, a conceptual analysis, and that as a conceptual analysis, it is not fully consistent; that is, they do not consistently treat drift as a causal process, but sometimes treat it as an outcome (as in the last point described in the previous paragraph). Brandon and Fleming cite several recent empirical studies where biologists seek to provide evidence that drift dominates selection, not relying on the simple \(Ns\) to come to that conclusion, and point out that there are other methods for testing the relative strengths of drift and selection, such as the McDonald-Kreitman (MK) test. In Brandon and Fleming’s view, “drift is not a process. It is, however, a predictable result of a process, namely probabilistic sampling” (2014: 581). It is somewhat unclear, however, how on their view the drift outcome (which outcome?) is “swamping” or “overriding” the selective outcome (presumably by the outcome being the cause of some further, as yet unidentified, outcome). Further elaboration on this point would be useful.

It has also been suggested, most notably by John Gillespie (2000a,b, 2001), that many purported instances of genetic drift are in fact due to “genetic draft.” Genetic draft is a process of linked selection (a hitchhiking process) where it is a matter of chance which of two neutral alleles (in a two-locus model) happens to be linked to a site that undergoes an advantageous mutation, and where the timing of these mutations, followed by a rapid selective “sweep” to fixation, is random. As Skipper (2006) discusses, one of the interesting properties of genetic draft is that it can produce an outcome similar to that which one would expect from genetic drift in small populations, namely, a reduction in genetic variation (thus the similar name). Gillespie argues that draft is less sensitive to population size than drift, which leads him to claim that draft is a more significant cause of evolution than drift (Skipper 2006). Thus, draft introduces yet another relative significance debate (Beatty 1995, 1997) to add to the others discussed in this article: drift vs. selection, Wright’s SBT vs. Fisher’s mass selection, neutralist vs. nearly neutralist vs. selectionist molecular evolution. However, it is worth noting that while draft can produce one of the same outcomes that drift can (reduction in heterozygosity), it would not give rise to fluctuating gene frequencies from one generation to the next. So, not all drifty outcomes can be accounted for by draft.

William Provine (2014) has taken the reduction of drift’s role a step further, calling random genetic drift a “fallacy” and arguing that no such phenomenon exists in nature, period. Provine notes that for both Fisher and Wright (and even Kimura), drift was deeply intertwined with inbreeding, to the extent that one was sometimes confused for the other, which seems warranted—or, at least, that the relationship between the two was never fully clarified (see, e.g., Wright 1931a). Provine defines random drift as “fortuitous extinction of genes” at a genic locus on a chromosome. According to Provine,

Wright believed that random sampling of gametes in Mendelism produced “random genetic drift” at every locus [on every chromosome] in small populations, and also that inbreeding led to rampant “random genetic drift” in small populations (Provine 2014: 54).

Here, Provine treats drift as an outcome, and as that outcome seems physically unlikely or even impossible due to gene linkage, there is, on his view, no drift. Wright did assert that

[j]ust because the direction of drift is accidental, the result is a kaleidoscopic shifting of the average characters of the population through predominant types which practically are never repeated, (1931b: 207; see also Wright 1930: 354)

but that makes drift sound like a cause, not an outcome, and it does not explicitly state that the “shifting” occurs at every locus on every chromosome. But even if he did, Wright could certainly have been mistaken about the effects of drift without being mistaken about the phenomenon itself; notably, Provine does not deny the existence of the random (i.e., indiscriminate) sampling of gametes, although he does object to the seeming reification of the term “gene pool” and the neglect of the relevance of chromosomes, points that are well-taken.

5. Drift as Models, Drift as a Law

As noted above, the phenomenon of drift is represented in mathematical models of population genetics. The standard mathematical model of drift found in textbooks is the Wright-Fisher model, the core of which is the binomial distribution, and it is the model that philosophers of biology typically appeal to. In the Wright-Fisher model—an idealized model, as all models are—there are assumed to be \(N\) diploid adults in a population, mating randomly, with an allele \(A\) that has a frequency of \(p_0\) and an alternate allele at the same locus. The model further assumes that adults produce an infinite number of gametes having the same allele frequency. \(2N\) gametes are drawn from the “gamete pool” at random to constitute the \(N\) diploid individuals of the next generation. (See Ishida and Rosales 2020 for important clarifications on the historical development of the Wright-Fisher model).

However, as Millstein, Skipper, and Dietrich (2009) point out, the Wright-Fisher model is quite idealized, since, of course,

populations do not reproduce by calling in their local statistician and asking her to pick exactly \(2N\) gametes at random (with replacement) and toss them into the next generation (Gillespie 2004: 49)

—but there are more realistic alternatives. John Gillespie’s model, for example, similarly assumes a diploid population of \(N\) members and a two-allele locus, with frequencies \(p\) and \(q = (1 - p)\); it also similarly assumes random mating. Where it differs from the Wright-Fisher model is that each of the \(2Np A\) gametes constitutes the next generation with a random number of offspring gametes. There is no restriction on the distribution of the numbers of offspring nor on the total number of offspring gametes. Thus, unlike the Wright-Fisher model, Gillespie’s model is not tied to binomial sampling, although sampling more generally is still being modeled. Millstein, Skipper, and Dietrich suggest that the philosophical significance of such alternative models (including others such as the Moran model, the Cannings model, or the coalescent) is that we need to be careful about drawing conclusions about drift from any one particular mathematical model, always keeping in mind Giere’s (1988) point that models are built as representations of specific aspects of physical systems.

Clatterbuck (2015) similarly reminds the philosophical community that it is a mistake to just focus on the Wright-Fisher model, highlighting the Eldon–Wakeley model in particular. She emphasizes that different drift models are not predictively equivalent, so that details of the causal network (represented by the differing assumptions of the different models) underlying a population can be seen to change the outcomes of drift. This challenges statisticalists’ assumptions that drift is purely mathematical. Relatedly, she argues that broadening our conception of drift to include alternative models reveals novel ways of intervening on drift that strengthen the causal argument against its statisticalism. For example, by intervening

on the population in such a way as to increase the probability that individuals have a far greater number of offspring (relative to the population size) than allowed by the Wright–Fisher model

we would increase the probability of a neutral allele increasing in frequency (2015: 3501). This is an improvement over Reisman and Forber’s manipulationist arguments (discussed above), since it is more clearly the drift (the sampling process) that is being manipulated rather than just population size.

But perhaps drift is more than just a model (or a set of models); perhaps it is a scientific law of evolutionary biology. Or so Brandon (2006) argues, dubbing a “Principle of Drift” analogous to the Principle of Inertia in that both are intended to be “zero-force” laws. According to the Principle of Drift,

  1. “A population at equilibrium will tend to drift from that equilibrium unless acted on by an evolutionary force”


  1. “A population on evolutionary trajectory t, caused by some net evolutionary force F, will tend to depart from the extrapolated path predicted based on F alone (in either direction or magnitude or both) even if no other evolutionary force intervenes, unless F continues to act” (Brandon 2006: 328).

On this view, drift—and thus change—is the default state of evolutionary systems, challenging Sober’s view (discussed previously), that the Hardy-Weinberg Principle characterizes the zero-force state in evolutionary biology. In defending the Principle of Drift, Brandon challenges those who would argue that there are no laws of biology (e.g., Beatty 1995; see cites within), although Brandon (1990) had already done so by defending a Principle of Selection (see also the related work by McShea and Brandon 2010, in which drift is characterized as a special case of what they dub the “Zero-Force Evolutionary Law”, or ZFEL).

6. Conclusions

Philosophical discussions of random genetic drift have been lively and fruitful. But as they are still relatively recent, there are many issues yet to be explored or explored fully. Although much energy has been diverted toward debating statisticalism, there are many debates over drift that biologists are engaged in that philosophers could profitably weigh in on, both historical and contemporary. With respect to the last two sections of this article in particular (empirical issues concerning drift and models of drift), we may have only begun to scratch the surface.


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Thanks to Jon Hodge, Charles Pence, Anya Plutynski, and an anonymous referee for extremely helpful comments on an earlier drift, and also to John Beatty, Michael Dietrich, Jon Hodge, and Robert Skipper for ongoing discussions about the nature of drift.

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Roberta L. Millstein <>

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