First published Fri Jun 21, 2002; substantive revision Mon Jan 9, 2023

Covering a wide range of distinct political, economic, and cultural trends, the term “globalization” remains crucial to contemporary political and academic debate. In contemporary popular discourse, globalization often functions as little more than a synonym for one or more of the following phenomena: the pursuit of classical liberal (or “free market”) policies in the world economy (“economic liberalization”), the growing dominance of western (or even American) forms of political, economic, and cultural life (“westernization” or “Americanization”), a global political order built on liberal notions of international law (the “global liberal order”), an ominous network of top-down rule by global elites (“globalism” or “global technocracy”), the proliferation of new information technologies (the “Internet Revolution”), as well as the notion that humanity stands at the threshold of realizing one single unified community in which major sources of social conflict have vanished (“global integration”). Globalization is a politically-contested phenomenon about which there are significant disagreements and struggles, with many nationalist and populist movements and leaders worldwide (including Turkey’s Recep Erdoğan, Hungary’s Viktor Orbán, and former US President Donald Trump) pushing back against what they view as its unappealing features.

Fortunately, recent social theory has formulated a more precise concept of globalization than those typically offered by politicians and pundits. Although sharp differences continue to separate participants in the ongoing debate about the term, most contemporary social theorists endorse the view that globalization refers to fundamental changes in the spatial and temporal contours of social existence, according to which the significance of space or territory undergoes shifts in the face of a no less dramatic acceleration in the temporal structure of crucial forms of human activity. Geographical distance is typically measured in time. As the time necessary to connect distinct geographical locations is reduced, distance or space undergoes compression or “annihilation.” The human experience of space is intimately connected to the temporal structure of those activities by means of which we experience space. Changes in the temporality of human activity inevitably generate altered experiences of space or territory. Theorists of globalization disagree about the precise sources of recent shifts in the spatial and temporal contours of human life. Nonetheless, they generally agree that alterations in humanity’s experiences of space and time are working to undermine the importance of local and even national boundaries in many arenas of human endeavor. Since globalization contains far-reaching implications for virtually every facet of human life, it necessarily suggests the need to rethink key questions of normative political theory.

1. Globalization in the History of Ideas

The term globalization has only become commonplace in the last three decades, and academic commentators who employed the term as late as the 1970s accurately recognized the novelty of doing so (Modelski 1972). At least since the advent of industrial capitalism, however, intellectual discourse has been replete with allusions to phenomena strikingly akin to those that have garnered the attention of recent theorists of globalization. Nineteenth and twentieth-century philosophy, literature, and social commentary include numerous references to an inchoate yet widely shared awareness that experiences of distance and space are inevitably transformed by the emergence of high-speed forms of transportation (for example, rail and air travel) and communication (the telegraph or telephone) that dramatically heighten possibilities for human interaction across existing geographical and political divides (Harvey 1989; Kern 1983). Long before the introduction of the term globalization into recent popular and scholarly debate, the appearance of novel high-speed forms of social activity generated extensive commentary about the compression of space.

Writing in 1839, an English journalist commented on the implications of rail travel by anxiously postulating that as distance was “annihilated, the surface of our country would, as it were, shrivel in size until it became not much bigger than one immense city” (Harvey 1996, 242). A few years later, Heinrich Heine, the émigré German-Jewish poet, captured this same experience when he noted: “space is killed by the railways. I feel as if the mountains and forests of all countries were advancing on Paris. Even now, I can smell the German linden trees; the North Sea’s breakers are rolling against my door” (Schivelbusch 1978, 34). Another young German émigré, the socialist theorist Karl Marx, in 1848 formulated the first theoretical explanation of the sense of territorial compression that so fascinated his contemporaries. In Marx’s account, the imperatives of capitalist production inevitably drove the bourgeoisie to “nestle everywhere, settle everywhere, and establish connections everywhere.” The juggernaut of industrial capitalism constituted the most basic source of technologies resulting in the annihilation of space, helping to pave the way for “intercourse in every direction, universal interdependence of nations,” in contrast to a narrow-minded provincialism that had plagued humanity for untold eons (Marx 1848, 476). Despite their ills as instruments of capitalist exploitation, Marx argued, new technologies that increased possibilities for human interaction across borders ultimately represented a progressive force in history. They provided the necessary infrastructure for a cosmopolitan future socialist civilization, while simultaneously functioning in the present as indispensable organizational tools for a working class destined to undertake a revolution no less oblivious to traditional territorial divisions than the system of capitalist exploitation it hoped to dismantle.

European intellectuals have hardly been alone in their fascination with the experience of territorial compression, as evinced by the key role played by the same theme in early twentieth-century American thought. In 1904, the literary figure Henry Adams diagnosed the existence of a “law of acceleration,” fundamental to the workings of social development, in order to make sense of the rapidly changing spatial and temporal contours of human activity. Modern society could only be properly understood if the seemingly irrepressible acceleration of basic technological and social processes was given a central place in social and historical analysis (Adams 1931 [1904]). John Dewey argued in 1927 that recent economic and technological trends implied the emergence of a “new world” no less noteworthy than the opening up of America to European exploration and conquest in 1492. For Dewey, the invention of steam, electricity, and the telephone offered formidable challenges to relatively static and homogeneous forms of local community life that had long represented the main theatre for most human activity. Economic activity increasingly exploded the confines of local communities to a degree that would have stunned our historical predecessors, for example, while the steamship, railroad, automobile, and air travel considerably intensified rates of geographical mobility. Dewey went beyond previous discussions of the changing temporal and spatial contours of human activity, however, by suggesting that the compression of space posed fundamental questions for democracy. Dewey observed that small-scale political communities (for example, the New England township), a crucial site for the exercise of effective democratic participation, seemed ever more peripheral to the great issues of an interconnected world. Increasingly dense networks of social ties across borders rendered local forms of self-government ineffective. Dewey wondered, “How can a public be organized, we may ask, when literally it does not stay in place?” (Dewey 1927, 140). To the extent that democratic citizenship minimally presupposes the possibility of action in concert with others, how might citizenship be sustained in a social world subject to ever more astonishing possibilities for movement and mobility? New high-speed technologies attributed a shifting and unstable character to social life, as demonstrated by increased rates of change and turnover in many arenas of activity (most important perhaps, the economy) directly affected by them, and the relative fluidity and inconstancy of social relations there. If citizenship requires some modicum of constancy and stability in social life, however, did not recent changes in the temporal and spatial conditions of human activity bode poorly for political participation? How might citizens come together and act in concert when contemporary society’s “mania for motion and speed” made it difficult for them even to get acquainted with one another, let alone identify objects of common concern? (Dewey 1927, 140).

The unabated proliferation of high-speed technologies is probably the main source of the numerous references in intellectual life since 1950 to the annihilation of distance. The Canadian cultural critic Marshall McLuhan made the theme of a technologically based “global village,” generated by social “acceleration at all levels of human organization,” the centerpiece of an anxiety-ridden analysis of new media technologies in the 1960s (McLuhan 1964, 103). Arguing in the 1970s and 1980s that recent shifts in the spatial and temporal contours of social life exacerbated authoritarian political trends, the French social critic Paul Virilio seemed to confirm many of Dewey’s darkest worries about the decay of democracy. According to his analysis, the high-speed imperatives of modern warfare and weapons systems strengthened the executive and debilitated representative legislatures. The compression of territory thereby paved the way for executive-centered emergency government (Virilio 1977). But it was probably the German philosopher Martin Heidegger who most clearly anticipated contemporary debates about globalization. Heidegger not only described the “abolition of distance” as a constitutive feature of our contemporary condition, but he linked recent shifts in spatial experience to no less fundamental alterations in the temporality of human activity: “All distances in time and space are shrinking. Man now reaches overnight, by places, places which formerly took weeks and months of travel” (Heidegger 1950, 165). Heidegger also accurately prophesied that new communication and information technologies would soon spawn novel possibilities for dramatically extending the scope of virtual reality: “Distant sites of the most ancient cultures are shown on film as if they stood this very moment amidst today’s street traffic…The peak of this abolition of every possibility of remoteness is reached by television, which will soon pervade and dominate the whole machinery of communication” (Heidegger 1950, 165). Heidegger’s description of growing possibilities for simultaneity and instantaneousness in human experience ultimately proved no less apprehensive than the views of many of his predecessors. In his analysis, the compression of space increasingly meant that from the perspective of human experience “everything is equally far and equally near.” Instead of opening up new possibilities for rich and multi-faceted interaction with events once distant from the purview of most individuals, the abolition of distance tended to generate a “uniform distanceless” in which fundamentally distinct objects became part of a bland homogeneous experiential mass (Heidegger 1950, 166). The loss of any meaningful distinction between “nearness” and “distance” contributed to a leveling down of human experience, which in turn spawned an indifference that rendered human experience monotonous and one-dimensional.

2. Globalization in Contemporary Social Theory

Since the mid-1980s, social theorists have moved beyond the relatively underdeveloped character of previous reflections on the compression or annihilation of space to offer a rigorous conception of globalization. To be sure, major disagreements remain about the precise nature of the causal forces behind globalization, with David Harvey (1989 1996) building directly on Marx’s pioneering explanation of globalization, while others (Giddens 19990; Held, McGrew, Goldblatt & Perraton 1999) question the exclusive focus on economic factors characteristic of the Marxist approach. Nonetheless, a consensus about the basic rudiments of the concept of globalization appears to be emerging.

First, recent analysts associate globalization with deterritorialization, according to which a growing variety of social activities takes place irrespective of the geographical location of participants. As Jan Aart Scholte observes, “global events can – via telecommunication, digital computers, audiovisual media, rocketry and the like – occur almost simultaneously anywhere and everywhere in the world” (Scholte 1996, 45). Globalization refers to increased possibilities for action between and among people in situations where latitudinal and longitudinal location seems immaterial to the social activity at hand. Even though geographical location remains crucial for many undertakings (for example, farming to satisfy the needs of a local market), deterritorialization manifests itself in many social spheres. Business people on different continents now engage in electronic commerce; academics make use of the latest Internet conferencing equipment to organize seminars in which participants are located at disparate geographical locations; the Internet allows people to communicate instantaneously with each other notwithstanding vast geographical distances separating them. Territory in the sense of a traditional sense of a geographically identifiable location no longer constitutes the whole of “social space” in which human activity takes places. In this initial sense of the term, globalization refers to the spread of new forms of non-territorial social activity (Ruggie 1993; Scholte 2000).

Second, theorists conceive of globalization as linked to the growth of social interconnectedness across existing geographical and political boundaries. In this view, deterritorialization is a crucial facet of globalization. Yet an exclusive focus on it would be misleading. Since the vast majority of human activities is still tied to a concrete geographical location, the more decisive facet of globalization concerns the manner in which distant events and forces impact on local and regional endeavors (Tomlinson 1999, 9). For example, this encyclopedia might be seen as an example of a deterritorialized social space since it allows for the exchange of ideas in cyberspace. The only prerequisite for its use is access to the Internet. Although substantial inequalities in Internet access still exist, use of the encyclopedia is in principle unrelated to any specific geographical location. However, the reader may very well be making use of the encyclopedia as a supplement to course work undertaken at a school or university. That institution is not only located at a specific geographical juncture, but its location is probably essential for understanding many of its key attributes: the level of funding may vary according to the state or region where the university is located, or the same academic major might require different courses and readings at a university in China, for example, than in Argentina or Norway. Globalization refers to those processes whereby geographically distant events and decisions impact to a growing degree on “local” university life. For example, the insistence by powerful political leaders in wealthy countries that the International Monetary Fund (IMF) or World Bank recommend to Latin and South American countries that they commit themselves to a particular set of economic policies might result in poorly paid teachers and researchers as well as large, understaffed lecture classes in São Paolo or Lima; the latest innovations in information technology from a computer research laboratory in India could quickly change the classroom experience of students in British Columbia or Tokyo. Globalization refers “to processes of change which underpin a transformation in the organization of human affairs by linking together and expanding human activity across regions and continents” (Held, McGrew, Goldblatt & Perraton 1999, 15). Globalization in this sense is a matter of degree since any given social activity might influence events more or less faraway: even though a growing number of activities seems intermeshed with events in distant continents, certain human activities remain primarily local or regional in scope. Also, the magnitude and impact of the activity might vary: geographically removed events could have a relatively minimal or a far more extensive influence on events at a particular locality. Finally, we might consider the degree to which interconnectedness across frontiers is no longer merely haphazard but instead predictable and regularized (Held, McGrew, Goldblatt & Perraton 1999).

Third, globalization must also include reference to the speed or velocity of social activity. Deterritorialization and interconnectedness initially seem chiefly spatial in nature. Yet it is easy to see how these spatial shifts are directly tied to the acceleration of crucial forms of social activity. As we observed above in our discussion of the conceptual forerunners to the present-day debate on globalization, the proliferation of high-speed transportation, communication, and information technologies constitutes the most immediate source for the blurring of geographical and territorial boundaries that prescient observers have diagnosed at least since the mid-nineteenth century. The compression of space presupposes rapid-fire forms of technology; shifts in our experiences of territory depend on concomitant changes in the temporality of human action. High-speed technology only represents the tip of the iceberg, however. The linking together and expanding of social activities across borders is predicated on the possibility of relatively fast flows and movements of people, information, capital, and goods. Without these fast flows, it is difficult to see how distant events could possibly posses the influence they now enjoy. High-speed technology plays a pivotal role in the velocity of human affairs. But many other factors contribute to the overall pace and speed of social activity. The organizational structure of the modern capitalist factory offers one example; certain contemporary habits and inclinations, including the “mania for motion and speed” described by Dewey, represent another. Deterritorialization and the expansion of interconnectedness are intimately tied to the acceleration of social life, while social acceleration itself takes many different forms (Eriksen 2001; Rosa 2013). Here as well, we can easily see why globalization is always a matter of degree. The velocity or speed of flows, movements, and interchanges across borders can vary no less than their magnitude, impact, or regularity.

Fourth, even though analysts disagree about the causal forces that generate globalization, most agree that globalization should be conceived as a relatively long-term process. The triad of deterritorialization, interconnectedness, and social acceleration hardly represents a sudden or recent event in contemporary social life. Globalization is a constitutive feature of the modern world, and modern history includes many examples of globalization (Giddens 1990). As we saw above, nineteenth-century thinkers captured at least some of its core features; the compression of territoriality composed an important element of their lived experience. Nonetheless, some contemporary theorists believe that globalization has taken a particularly intense form in recent decades, as innovations in communication, transportation, and information technologies (for example, computerization) have generated stunning new possibilities for simultaneity and instantaneousness (Harvey 1989). In this view, present-day intellectual interest in the problem of globalization can be linked directly to the emergence of new high-speed technologies that tend to minimize the significance of distance and heighten possibilities for deterritorialization and social interconnectedness. Although the intense sense of territorial compression experienced by so many of our contemporaries is surely reminiscent of the experiences of earlier generations, some contemporary writers nonetheless argue that it would be mistaken to obscure the countless ways in which ongoing transformations of the spatial and temporal contours of human experience are especially far-reaching. While our nineteenth-century predecessors understandably marveled at the railroad or the telegraph, a comparatively vast array of social activities is now being transformed by innovations that accelerate social activity and considerably deepen longstanding trends towards deterritorialization and social interconnectedness. To be sure, the impact of deterritorialization, social interconnectedness, and social acceleration are by no means universal or uniform: migrant workers engaging in traditional forms of low-wage agricultural labor in the fields of southern California, for example, probably operate in a different spatial and temporal context than the Internet entrepreneurs of San Francisco or Seattle. Distinct assumptions about space and time often coexist uneasily during a specific historical juncture (Gurvitch 1964). Nonetheless, the impact of recent technological innovations is profound, and even those who do not have a job directly affected by the new technology are shaped by it in innumerable ways as citizens and consumers (Eriksen 2001, 16).

Fifth, globalization should be understood as a multi-pronged process, since deterritorialization, social interconnectedness, and acceleration manifest themselves in many different (economic, political, and cultural) arenas of social activity. Although each facet of globalization is linked to the core components of globalization described above, each consists of a complex and relatively autonomous series of empirical developments, requiring careful examination in order to disclose the causal mechanisms specific to it (Held, McGrew, Goldblatt & Perraton 1999). Each manifestation of globalization also generates distinct conflicts and dislocations. For example, there is substantial empirical evidence that cross-border flows and exchanges (of goods, people, information, etc.), as well as the emergence of directly transnational forms of production by means of which a single commodity is manufactured simultaneously in distant corners of the globe, are gaining in prominence (Castells 1996). High-speed technologies and organizational approaches are employed by transnationally operating firms, the so-called “global players,” with great effectiveness. The emergence of “around-the-world, around-the-clock” financial markets, where major cross-border financial transactions are made in cyberspace at the blink of an eye, represents a familiar example of the economic face of globalization. Global financial markets also challenge traditional attempts by liberal democratic nation-states to rein in the activities of bankers, spawning understandable anxieties about the growing power and influence of financial markets over democratically elected representative institutions. In political life, globalization takes a distinct form, though the general trends towards deterritorialization, interconnectedness across borders, and the acceleration of social activity are fundamental here as well. Transnational movements, in which activists employ rapid-fire communication technologies to join forces across borders in combating ills that seem correspondingly transnational in scope (for example, the depletion of the ozone layer), offer an example of political globalization (Tarrow 2005). Another would be the tendency towards ambitious supranational forms of social and economic lawmaking and regulation, where individual nation-states cooperate to pursue regulation whose jurisdiction transcends national borders no less than the cross-border economic processes that undermine traditional modes of nation state-based regulation. Political scientists typically describe such supranational organizations (the European Union, for example, or United States-Mexico-Canada Agreement, or USMCA) as important manifestations of political and legal globalization. The proliferation of supranational organizations has been no less conflict-laden than economic globalization, however. Critics insist that local, regional, and national forms of self-government are being supplanted by insufficiently democratic forms of global governance remote from the needs of ordinary citizens (Maus 2006; Streeck 2016). In contrast, defenders describe new forms of supranational legal and political decision as indispensable forerunners to more inclusive and advanced forms of self-government, even as they worry about existing democratic deficits and technocratic traits (Habermas 2015).

3. The Normative Challenges of Globalization

The wide-ranging impact of globalization on human existence means that it necessarily touches on many basic philosophical and political-theoretical questions. At a minimum, globalization suggests that academic philosophers in the rich countries of the West should pay closer attention to the neglected voices and intellectual traditions of peoples with whom our fate is intertwined in ever more intimate ways (Dallmayr 1998). In this section, however, we focus exclusively on the immediate challenges posed by globalization to normative political theory.

Western political theory has traditionally presupposed the existence of territorially bound communities, whose borders can be more or less neatly delineated from those of other communities. In this vein, the influential liberal political philosopher John Rawls described bounded communities whose fundamental structure consisted of “self-sufficient schemes of cooperation for all the essential purposes of human life” (Rawls 1993, 301). Although political and legal thinkers historically have exerted substantial energy in formulating defensible normative models of relations between states (Nardin and Mapel 1992), like Rawls they typically have relied on a clear delineation of “domestic” from “foreign” affairs. In addition, they have often argued that the domestic arena represents a normatively privileged site, since fundamental normative ideals and principles (for example, liberty or justice) are more likely to be successfully realized in the domestic arena than in relations among states. According to one influential strand within international relations theory, relations between states are more-or-less lawless. Since the achievement of justice or democracy, for example, presupposes an effective political sovereign, the lacuna of sovereignty at the global level means that justice and democracy are necessarily incomplete and probably unattainable there. In this conventional realist view of international politics, core features of the modern system of sovereign states relegate the pursuit of western political thought’s most noble normative goals primarily to the domestic arena (Mearsheimer 2003.) Significantly, some prominent mid-century proponents of international realism rejected this position’s deep hostility to international law and supranational political organization, in part because they presciently confronted challenges that we now typically associate with intensified globalization (Scheuerman 2011).

Globalization poses a fundamental challenge to each of these traditional assumptions. It is no longer self-evident that nation-states can be described as “self-sufficient schemes of cooperation for all the essential purposes of human life” in the context of intense deterritorialization and the spread and intensification of social relations across borders. The idea of a bounded community seems suspect given recent shifts in the spatio-temporal contours of human life. Even the most powerful and privileged political units are now subject to increasingly deterritorialized activities (for example, global financial markets or digitalized mass communication) over which they have limited control, and they find themselves nested in webs of social relations whose scope explodes the confines of national borders. Of course, in much of human history social relations have transcended existing political divides. However, globalization implies a profound quantitative increase in and intensification of social relations of this type. While attempts to offer a clear delineation of the “domestic” from the “foreign” probably made sense at an earlier juncture in history, this distinction no longer accords with core developmental trends in many arenas of social activity. As the possibility of a clear division between domestic and foreign affairs dissipates, the traditional tendency to picture the domestic arena as a privileged site for the realization of normative ideals and principles becomes problematic as well. As an empirical matter, the decay of the domestic-foreign frontier seems highly ambivalent, since it might easily pave the way for the decay of the more attractive attributes of domestic political life: as “foreign” affairs collapse inward onto “domestic” political life, the insufficiently lawful contours of the former make disturbing inroads onto the latter (Scheuerman 2004). As a normative matter, however, the disintegration of the domestic-foreign divide probably calls for us to consider, to a greater extent than ever before, how our fundamental normative commitments about political life can be effectively achieved on a global scale. If we take the principles of justice or democracy seriously, for example, it is no longer self-evident that the domestic arena is the exclusive or perhaps even main site for their pursuit, since domestic and foreign affairs are now deeply and irrevocably intermeshed. In a globalizing world, the lack of democracy or justice in the global setting necessarily impacts deeply on the pursuit of justice or democracy at home. Indeed, it may no longer be possible to achieve our normative ideals at home without undertaking to do so transnationally as well.

To claim, for example, that questions of distributive justice have no standing in the making of foreign affairs represents at best empirical naivete about economic globalization. At worst, it constitutes a disingenuous refusal to grapple with the fact that the material existence of those fortunate enough to live in the rich countries is inextricably tied to the material status of the vast majority of humanity residing in poor and underdeveloped regions. Growing material inequality spawned by economic globalization is linked to growing domestic material inequality in the rich democracies (Falk 1999; Pogge 2002). Similarly, in the context of global warming and the destruction of the ozone layer, a dogmatic insistence on the sanctity of national sovereignty risks constituting a cynical fig leaf for irresponsible activities whose impact extends well beyond the borders of those countries most directly responsible. Global warming and ozone-depletion cry out for ambitious forms of transnational cooperation and regulation, and the refusal by the rich democracies to accept this necessity implies a failure to take the process of globalization seriously when doing so conflicts with their immediate material interests. Although it might initially seem to be illustrative of clever Realpolitik on the part of the culpable nations to ward off strict cross-border environmental regulation, their stubbornness is probably short-sighted: global warming and ozone depletion will affect the children of Americans who drive gas-guzzling SUVs or use environmentally unsound air-conditioning as well as the future generations of South Africa or Afghanistan (Cerutti 2007). If we keep in mind that environmental degradation probably impacts negatively on democratic politics (for example, by undermining its legitimacy and stability), the failure to pursue effective transnational environmental regulation potentially undermines democracy at home as well as abroad.

Philosophers and political theorists have eagerly addressed the normative and political implications of our globalizing world. A lively debate about the possibility of achieving justice at the global level pits representatives of cosmopolitanism against myriad communitarians, nationalists, realists, and others who privilege the nation-state and moral, political, and social ties resting on it (Lieven 2020; Tamir 2019). In contrast, cosmopolitans tend to underscore our universal obligations to those who reside faraway and with whom we may share little in the way of language, custom, or culture, oftentimes arguing that claims to “justice at home” can and should be applied elsewhere as well (Beardsworth 2011; Beitz 1999; Caney 2006; Wallace-Brown & Held 2010). In this way, cosmopolitanism builds directly on the universalistic impulses of modern moral and political thought. Cosmopolitanism’s critics dispute the view that our obligations to foreigners possess the same status as those to members of particular local and national communities of which we remain very much a part. They by no means deny the need to redress global inequality, for example, but they often express skepticism in the face of cosmopolitanism’s tendency to defend significant legal and political reforms as necessary to address the inequities of a planet where millions of people a year die of starvation or curable diseases (Miller 2007; 2013; Nagel 2005). Nor do cosmopolitanism’s critics necessarily deny that the process of globalization is real, though some of them suggest that its impact has been grossly exaggerated (Kymlicka 1999; Nussbaum et al. 1996; Streeck 2016). Nonetheless, they doubt that humanity has achieved a rich or sufficiently articulated sense of a common fate such that far-reaching attempts to achieve greater global justice (for example, substantial redistribution from the rich to poor) could prove successful. Cosmopolitans not only counter with a flurry of universalist and egalitarian moral arguments, but they also accuse their opponents of obscuring the threat posed by globalization to the particular forms of national community whose ethical primacy communitarians, nationalists, and others endorse. From the cosmopolitan perspective, the tendency to favor moral and political obligations to fellow members of the nation-state represents a misguided and increasingly reactionary nostalgia for a rapidly decaying constellation of political practices and institutions.

A similar divide characterizes the ongoing debate about the prospects of democratic institutions at the global level. In a cosmopolitan mode, Daniele Archibugi (2008) and the late David Held (1995) have argued that globalization requires the extension of liberal democratic institutions (including the rule of law and elected representative institutions) to the transnational level. Nation state-based liberal democracy is poorly equipped to deal with deleterious side effects of present-day globalization such as ozone depletion or burgeoning material inequality. In addition, a growing array of genuinely transnational forms of activity calls out for correspondingly transnational modes of liberal democratic decision-making. According to this model, “local” or “national” matters should remain under the auspices of existing liberal democratic institutions. But in those areas where deterritorialization and social interconnectedness across national borders are especially striking, new transnational institutions (for example, cross-border referenda), along with a dramatic strengthening and further democratization of existing forms of supranational authority (in particular, the United Nations), are necessary if we are to assure that popular sovereignty remains an effective principle. In the same spirit, cosmopolitans debate whether a loose system of global “governance” suffices, or instead cosmopolitan ideals require something along the lines of a global “government” or state (Cabrera 2011; Scheuerman 2014). Jürgen Habermas, a prominent cosmopolitan-minded theorist, has tried to formulate a defense of the European Union that conceives of it as a key stepping stone towards supranational democracy. If the EU is to help succeed in salvaging the principle of popular sovereignty in a world where the decay of nation state-based democracy makes democracy vulnerable, the EU will need to strengthen its elected representative organs and better guarantee the civil, political, and social and economic rights of all Europeans (Habermas 2001, 58–113; 2009). Representing a novel form of postnational constitutionalism, it potentially offers some broader lessons for those hoping to save democratic constitutionalism under novel global conditions. Despite dire threats to the EU posed by nationalist and populist movements, Habermas and other cosmopolitan-minded intellectuals believe that it can be effectively reformed and preserved (Habermas 2012).

In opposition to Archibugi, Held, Habermas, and other cosmopolitans, skeptics underscore the purportedly utopian character of such proposals, arguing that democratic politics presupposes deep feelings of trust, commitment, and belonging that remain uncommon at the postnational and global levels. Largely non-voluntary commonalities of belief, history, and custom compose necessary preconditions of any viable democracy, and since these commonalities are missing beyond the sphere of the nation-state, global or cosmopolitan democracy is doomed to fail (Archibugi, Held, and Koehler 1998; Lieven 2020). Critics inspired by realist international theory argue that cosmopolitanism obscures the fundamentally pluralistic, dynamic, and conflictual nature of political life on our divided planet. Notwithstanding its pacific self-understanding, cosmopolitan democracy inadvertently opens the door to new and even more horrible forms of political violence. Cosmpolitanism’s universalistic normative discourse not only ignores the harsh and unavoidably agonistic character of political life, but it also tends to serve as a convenient ideological cloak for terrible wars waged by political blocs no less self-interested than the traditional nation state (Zolo 1997, 24).

Ongoing political developments suggest that such debates are of more than narrow scholarly interest. Until recently, some of globalization’s key prongs seemed destined to transform human affairs in seemingly permanent ways: economic globalization, as well as the growth of a panoply of international and global political and legal institutions, continued to transpire at a rapid rate. Such institutional developments, it should be noted, were interpreted by some cosmopolitan theorists as broadly corroborating their overall normative aspirations. With the resurgence of nationalist and populist political movements, many of which diffusely (and sometimes misleadingly) target elements of globalization, globalization’s future prospects seem increasingly uncertain. For example, with powerful political leaders regularly making disdainful remarks about the UN and EU, it seems unclear whether one of globalization’s most striking features, i.e., enhanced political and legal decision-making “beyond the nation state,” will continue unabated. Tragically perhaps, the failure to manage economic globalization so as to minimize avoidable inequalities and injustices has opened the door to a nationalist and populist backlash, with many people now ready to embrace politicians and movements promising to push back against “free trade,” relatively porous borders (for migrants and refugees), and other manifestations of globalization (Stiglitz 2018). Even if it seems unlikely that nationalists or populists can succeed in fully halting, let alone reversing, structural trends towards deterritorialization, intensified interconnectedness, and social acceleration, they may manage to reshape them in ways that cosmopolitans are likely to find alarming. Whether or not nationalists and populists can successfully respond to many fundamental global challenges (e.g., climate change or nuclear proliferation), however, remains far less likely.


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