Feminist Perspectives on Globalization

First published Tue May 6, 2014; substantive revision Thu Mar 12, 2020

In its broadest sense, globalization refers to the economic, social, cultural, and political processes of integration that result from the expansion of transnational economic production, migration, communications, and technologies. Although both Western and non-Western feminists working in various areas of philosophy, including ethics, metaphysics, political philosophy, epistemology, and aesthetics, have made important contributions to debates about globalization, this entry focuses on one subset of these critiques. Below, we outline the ways in which predominantly Western feminist political philosophers who explicitly discuss globalization have articulated and addressed the challenges associated with its economic and political dimensions.

1. What is Globalization?

1.1 Economic Globalization

Economic globalization refers to the processes of global economic integration that emerged in the late 20th century, fueled by neoliberal ideals. Rooted in classical liberal economic thought, neoliberalism claims that a largely unregulated capitalist economy embodies the ideal of free individual choice and maximizes economic efficiency and growth, technological progress, and distributive justice. Economic globalization is associated with particular global political and economic institutions, such as the World Trade Organization, the International Monetary Fund, and the World Bank, and specific neoliberal economic policies, such as the following:

  • Trade liberalization. Free trade policies, such as the United States-Mexico-Canada Agreement (also known as the New NAFTA), seek to integrate regional or global markets by reducing trade barriers among nations. Signatory countries typically agree to eliminate tariffs, such as duties and surcharges, as well as nontariff obstacles to trade, such as licensing regulations, quotas on imports, and subsidies to domestic producers.
  • Deregulation. Trade liberalization is associated with the easing of restrictions on capital flow and investment, along with the elimination of government regulations that can be seen as unfair barriers to trade, including legal protections for workers, consumers, and the environment.
  • Privatization of public assets. Economic globalization is marked by the sale of state-owned enterprises, goods, and services to private investors in the name of expanding markets and increasing efficiency. Such assets include banks, key industries, highways and railroads, power and electricity, education, and healthcare. Privatization often also involves the sale of publicly owned, economically exploitable natural resources, such as water, minerals, forests, and land, to private investors.
  • Elimination of social welfare programs. Neoliberalism favors sharp reductions in public expenditures for social services, such as housing, health care, education, and disability and unemployment insurance, as a crucial means of reducing the role of government and making private businesses more efficient. Structural Adjustment Policies (SAPs) have been instrumental in requiring countries in the global South to eliminate social welfare spending. Since the early 1980s, the World Bank and International Monetary Fund have required debtor nations to adopt SAPs as a condition of borrowing money or improving conditions of existing loans. SAPs require debtor nations to restructure their economies along neoliberal lines, by, for example, removing government regulation, eliminating social welfare programs, and promoting market competition.
  • Restrictions on immigration. While many countries have liberalized capital markets and eased barriers to transnational trade in goods and services under globalization, most have not eliminated barriers to the flow of labor. Indeed, some affluent countries, such as the United States, have implemented more restrictive immigration policies, leading to the detention and deportation of thousands of undocumented immigrants and the militarization of national borders. Despite these restrictions, however, migration has increased along with other processes of globalization.

Political philosophers are concerned with the effects of these policies on human well-being. Proponents of globalization claim that economic liberalization has enabled many people throughout the world to move out of conditions of dire poverty. Open markets, they argue, have increased employment and productivity within developing countries, raising the standard of living and enhancing the well-being of the people living within them (Diamandis and Kotler 2012, Friedman 2012, Micklethwait and Wooldridge 2000, O’Neil 2013). Critics point out that neoliberal policies have created the widest gap between the very rich and very poor in history, with unprecedented wealth for the rich and poverty and destitution for millions of the global poor (Nikiforuk 2007, Pogge 2002). Feminists have pointed out that pockets of highly concentrated wealth in the “global South” and the high levels of extreme poverty in the “global North” mean that we cannot divide the world neatly along North/South or rich/poor lines (Silvey 2014). However, on the whole, they argue, globalization has benefitted the world’s wealthiest people—both citizens of the global North and the elite in developing countries—without substantially benefitting the majority of the world’s population.

Feminist philosophers insist that economic globalization must also be understood in terms of the effects it has had on women, who make up a disproportionate percentage of the global poor. Most agree that these effects have been primarily negative. For instance, Jaggar argues that globalization has promised many things that are crucial to feminists: peace, prosperity, social justice, environmental protection, the elimination of racism and ethnocentrism, and, of course, an increase in the status of women. However, neoliberal policies have brought about the opposite of these aspirations. Rather than peace, they have created conditions for war and increased militarism; rather than prosperity and social justice, they have increased the gulf between the rich and the poor; rather than environmental protection, they have led to the privatization and destruction of publicly-owned natural resources; and rather than eliminating racist, ethnocentric, and sexist barriers, globalization has been, ultimately, “a system hostile or antagonistic to women” (Jaggar 2001, 301).

1.2 Political Globalization

Although political and economic globalization are interconnected and mutually reinforcing, they differ in significant ways. Political globalization refers to changes in the exercise of political power that have resulted from increased transnational engagement. Prior to World War II, the international political system was understood in terms of the so-called Westphalian model. According to this model, political power is exercised primarily through governance at the level of the territorial state. The international political system is comprised of sovereign states, which enjoy a monopoly on political power within their own territories. International treaties govern relations among states; however, states generally cannot legitimately intervene in the domestic affairs of other nations. Thus, when problems, such as famines, genocides, and civil wars arise, they are seen primarily as security issues for individual states, not matters of justice affecting the global community (Fraser 2013).

In contrast to this state-centric model, political globalization must be understood as polycentric, that is, as involving non-state institutions that exercise political power from both “above” and “below” the state (So 2010). The development of supra-national institutions, such as the United Nations, the World Trade Organization, the World Health Organization, the European Union, NATO, the Association of Southeast Asian Nations, and others, can be understood as political “globalization from above.” These institutions create international rules that constrain the sovereignty of states, in some cases, through enforcement mechanisms that penalize for noncompliance. In addition to holding states accountable for adhering to mutually agreed upon norms and standards, global institutions often set the agendas that determine which issues receive international attention. Institutions such as the UN and EU have sought to draw attention to some of the injustices experienced by women around the world, such as sexual violence, lack of educational access, and other women’s human rights violations, and to develop global frameworks for addressing them. However, many feminist philosophers argue that supra-national institutions have had limited success in protecting the world’s most vulnerable people. Most global institutions privilege Western and corporate interests over those of vulnerable and marginalized people, and few have been successful in challenging the structural inequalities that give rise to gendered harms, such as deprivation, discrimination, and violence.

For many feminists, the transnational political movements that have emerged “from below” the state offer a more promising dimension of political globalization. The expansion of global communications has led to the development of new transnational political networks, comprised of individuals, non-governmental organizations, and social movements. These transnational networks, sometimes referred to as “global civil society,” connect millions of people around the world based on shared political commitments. Consequently, some feminist philosophers believe that political “globalization from below” provides women and other vulnerable people with an effective means for resisting the inequalities created by economic globalization. For instance, some feminists argue that globalization has created new transnational public spheres in which political opinion can be marshaled to hold leaders democratically accountable (Fraser 2009, Gould 2009). This transnational public sphere must be understood both in terms of physical locations, such as home, factory, and village, as well as technologically mediated spaces made possible by the internet; such modes of communication form a new layer of transnational space that allows people to build horizontal networks and communities (Youngs 2005). Others see the promise of political globalization in transnational feminist solidarity networks, such as the women’s rights are human rights campaign and groups combating sex trafficking, global care chains, and labor exploitation that enable feminist resistance to dominant political and economic forces (Copelon 2003, Gallegos 2017, Hochschild 2000, 2002, Kittay, 2008, 2009, Parekh 2009, Robinson 2003, Stamatopoulou 1995, Walby 2002, Weir 2005).

Given the complexity of globalization, how have feminist political philosophers addressed the social, political, and economic challenges posed by it? Below, we provide an overview of several feminist theoretical approaches to this task.

2. Feminist Theoretical Approaches to Globalization

‘Feminist theoretical approaches to globalization’ is an umbrella term that refers to a number of specific theoretical approaches that feminists have used to articulate the challenges that globalization poses for women, people of color, and the global poor. These various approaches include those developed by postcolonial feminists, transnational feminists, and feminists who endorse an ethics of care. In this section, we identify four key features shared by these various feminist approaches to globalization and outline some of the distinctive characteristics of each theoretical orientation.

2.1 Key Common Features

First, feminist approaches to globalization seek to provide frameworks for understanding the gender injustices associated with globalization. Rather than developing all-encompassing ideal theories of global justice, however, feminist philosophers tend to adopt the non-ideal theoretical perspectives, which focus on specific, concrete issues. Early feminist analyses focused on issues that were widely believed to be of particular importance to women around the world, such as domestic violence, workplace discrimination, and human rights violations against women. While gendered analyses of these issues have provided valuable insights into the distinctive nature of the harms involved, many feminist philosophers view this approach as too narrow, both in terms of the specific issues it addresses and its methodological approach to these issues. They contend that even apparently gender-neutral global issues often have a gendered dimension, including war, global governance, migration, southern debt, the “resource curse,” and climate change. Moreover, by addressing specific global “women’s issues” as independent phenomena, early feminist analyses failed to take into account the systematic and structural gendered injustices associated with neoliberalism. Although gender oppression takes different forms in different social, cultural, and geographical locations, women in every society face systematic disadvantages, such as those resulting from their socially assigned responsibility for domestic work (Lange 2009). Because of these structural injustices, women of all nationalities tend to suffer more from the poverty, overwork, deprivation, and political marginalization associated with neoliberal policies. Thus, more recent feminist analyses of globalization tend to understand the outcomes of globalization not as disparate or contingent phenomena, but rather as a result of systematic, structural injustices on a global scale. Indeed, some contend that the global basic structure itself is implicitly biased against women (Jaggar 2009a).

The second key feature of feminist approaches to globalization is a shared commitment to core feminist values, including an opposition to the subordination of women. Some theorists also draw upon feminist interpretations of mainstream moral and political ideals, such as equality, democracy, and human rights, to develop critiques of neoliberal policies. For instance, Jaggar appeals to liberal democratic norms to argue that many southern debt obligations are not morally binding because their citizenries were “largely uninformed and/or their options were virtually non-existent” when they undertook these supposed debts (Jaggar 2002a, 433). Many feminists also use the language of human rights to address the challenges of globalization. While they acknowledge that traditional understandings of human rights are implicitly male-biased, they contend that feminist rearticulations of these norms can help to identify the gendered harms involved in sexual slavery, forced domestic labor, and the systematic withholding of education, food, and healthcare from women and girls that follow from severe economic deprivation (Bunch 2006, Cudd 2005, Jaggar 2002a, Nussbaum 2001, Robinson 2004, Okin 1998, Reilly 2007). (See Section 3.3 below.)

However, not all feminist political philosophers agree with this approach. Some believe that new feminist ideals, such as relational understandings of power, collective responsibility, and mutual dependence, are needed to diagnose the gender injustices associated with globalization (Hankivsky 2006, Held 2004, 2007, Kittay 2008, 2009, Miller 2006, 2011, Robinson 2006, 2010, Weir 2008a, 2008b, Young 2011). For instance, Iris Marion Young argues the traditional ideal theories of justice are unable to account for the unjust background conditions that contribute to the development of sweatshops in the global South. She argues that a new relational model of responsibility, which she calls the social connection model, is needed to articulate the obligations that people in affluent northern countries have to workers in the global South. The social connection model holds that individuals bear responsibility for structural injustices, such as those suffered by workers on the global assembly line, because our actions contribute to the institutional processes that produce such injustices. In particular, northern consumers have a responsibility to organize collectively to reform the injustices associated with sweatshop labor (Young 2011).

The third key feature of feminist approaches to globalization is an emphasis on feminist methodologies. In particular, these approaches tend to embody three key methodological commitments. The first is intersectionality, which maintains that systems of oppression interact to produce injustices, and thus, that gender injustices cannot be understood solely in terms of sex or gender. Feminists who theorize about justice on the domestic level argue that women’s experiences of gender oppression are shaped by other forms of oppression, such as those based on race, class, disability, and sexual orientation. Feminist theorists of globalization contend that gender oppression interacts with these systems of oppression, along with other forms of systematic disadvantage that arise within the global context. Salient categories include nationality, geographical location, citizenship status, and socioeconomic position within the global economy (for instance, as a Southern elite, a Western laborer, or a worker on the global assembly line). Given this broad conception of intersectionality, feminist theorists of globalization insist that gender injustices arise within specific transnational contexts, such as historical relationships among nations and current global economic policies.

The second methodological commitment shared by feminist approaches to globalization is a sensitivity to context and concrete specificity. Feminist philosophers strive to accurately reflect the diverse interests, experience, and concerns of women throughout the world, and to take seriously differences in culture, history, and socio-economic and political circumstances. In this way, feminist approaches to globalization attempt to move between local conditions and global pressures, between historical realities and contemporary experiences of oppression and vulnerability, while being attentive to complex interactions among social, economic, and political forces. This has led some feminist theorists of globalization to distinguish their views from well-known feminists, such as Martha Nussbaum and Susan Okin, whom Ackerly and Attanasi refer to as “international feminists” by virtue of their methodological commitments. In their view, Nussbaum and Okin do not pay sufficient attention to the ways that justice and injustice are mediated by local conditions in their attempts to identify universal moral ideals. As a result, their theories tend to privilege Western perspectives and undermine their own commitment to reflecting women’s lived experience (Ackerly and Attanasi 2009).

Finally, feminist theorists of globalization are committed to developing self-reflexive critiques. At the heart of this methodology is a willingness to critically examine feminist claims, with particular attention to the ways in which feminist discourses privilege certain points of view. For instance, Schutte insists that ostensibly universal feminist values and ideas are likely to embody the values of dominant cultures. This helps to explain why the voices of women from developing countries are often taken seriously only if they reflect the norms and values of the West and conform to Western expectations. Thus, Schutte insists that feminists must engage in methodological practices that de-center their habitual standpoints and foreground perspectives that challenge accepted ways of thinking (Schutte 2002). Khader extends this call, urging transnational feminists to reject the problematic variants of “Enlightenment liberal” values taken to be central to Western feminism, including individualism, autonomy, and gender-role eliminativism (Khader 2019, 3). Such values not only constitute cultural imperialism when imposed on cultural “others,” as Schutte argues, but also can serve to justify militarism, political domination, economic exploitation, and white supremacy in the name of advancing gender interests (Khader 2019). Ackerly argues that feminist theory can be used not only to critique feminist ideals and values, but also to develop richer ways to evaluate the work done by women’s human rights organizations. Feminist theory is able to engage with, shape and be shaped by the work being done “on the ground” by NGOs and other groups (Ackerly 2009).

The struggle to develop feminist theories that embody these methodological commitments has been ongoing for feminists. In the 1980s, Chandra Talpade Mohanty observed that Western feminist scholarship tends to adopt an ethnocentric perspective, depicting so-called Third-World women as one-dimensional, non-agentic, and homogenous. In her often-cited words, such scholarship tends to suggest that:

the average Third World woman leads an essentially truncated life based on her feminine gender (read: sexually constrained) and her being “Third World” (read: ignorant, poor, uneducated, tradition-bound, domestic, family-oriented, victimized, etc.). This, I suggest, is in contrast to the (implicit) self-representation of Western women as educated, as modern, as having control over their own bodies and sexualities and the freedom to make their own decisions (Mohanty 2003, 22).

Mohanty claims that this perspective leads to a simplistic understanding of what feminists in Western countries can do to “help” women in developing nations. Many of the recent developments in the feminist literature on globalization can be understood as a response to this theoretical failure. In addition to recognizing the ways in which power influences the production of feminist theories, feminist critics of globalization strive to understand the ways in which Western women share responsibility for gender injustices in developing countries and at home, and to articulate their obligations to eliminate these injustices.

2.2 Distinctive Feminist Approaches

Despite these common aims and methodological commitments, feminists have analyzed globalization from a number of different theoretical perspectives. Below, we examine three prominent approaches to globalization, developed by postcolonial and decolonial, transnational, and ethics of care feminists. Although it is not possible to draw sharp boundaries around these theoretical perspectives, we identify some distinctive features of each.

2.2.1 Postcolonial and Decolonial Feminisms

Postcolonial and decolonial feminisms offer primarily critical theoretical frameworks, which analyze globalization within the context of the history of Western colonialism and imperialism. They begin with the claim that Western colonialism and imperialism have played important roles in shaping the contemporary world, and highlight their enduring effects on global relations and local cultural practices. Although postcolonial and decolonial feminists write from all over the world, they foreground non-Eurocentric epistemic standpoints and criticize North-South power asymmetries from the diverse perspectives of members of Indigenous communities and people in the global South (Herr 2013, Khader 2019, McLaren 2017, Schutte 2002, 2005).

Postcolonial and decolonial feminists make several important claims. First, they insist that it is impossible to understand local practices in developing countries without acknowledging the ways in which these practices have been shaped by their economic and historical contexts, particularly their connection to Western colonialism and imperialism. Moreover, they warn that attempts to explain the suffering of women in developing countries in simplistic terms often tend to reproduce a “colonial stance” toward the global South. For instance, as we explained above, Chandra Mohanty sees elements of imperialism in Western feminist scholarship on women in the global South. Similarly, Uma Narayan criticize feminists for unwittingly adopting a Eurocentric perspective. For example, some Western feminist scholars, such as Mary Daly, strongly criticize cultural practices, such as sati, the Indian practice of widow immolation, as self-evidently wrong. However, Narayan argues that approaching sati as an isolated, local phenomenon fundamentally misrepresents it. Understanding sati in the context of colonial history provides a richer analysis of this practice, since it gained its symbolic power during British rule as an emblem of Hindu and Indian culture (Narayan 1997). Highlighting the role that colonialism has played in shaping local practices enables feminists to avoid adopting a Eurocentric perspective. Likewise, postcolonial and decolonial feminists insist that any feminist analysis of the harms of globalization must take seriously the history and ongoing cultural, economic, and political effects of colonialism and imperialism.

Postcolonial and decolonial feminists further argue that although traditional forms of colonialism have formally ended, many aspects of globalization are best understood as neo-colonial practices. As Sally Scholz explains:

Multinational corporations and global businesses, largely centered in Western nations, bring their own colonizing influence through business models, hegemonic culture, exploitation of workers, and displacement of traditional trades. Whereas traditional forms of colonialism entailed the colonizer assuming the privilege of ruling the colony, this neocolonialism rules indirectly through the power it creates and enjoys by bringing manufacturing jobs to an area or providing consumer goods to a people – often Western inspired consumer goods as well. Old style colonialism often killed or displaced indigenous peoples; the new style of colonialism impoverishes a culture by swamping society with Western values, products or ideals (2010, 139).

More broadly, postcolonial and decolonial feminists observe that many of the conditions created by colonialism—economic inequality and exploitation, racism, cultural marginalization, and the domination of the global South by the global North—have been sustained and intensified by neoliberalism. Moreover, they argue, neoliberal policies and institutions systematically favor countries in the global North to the detriment of southern nations. International trade policies serve Western interests even while claiming to be politically neutral and fair. Global economic institutions also privilege Western culture and political norms, presenting them as models for the rest of the world, while ignoring and marginalizing the claims of women’s and indigenous movements in the global South as well as settler nations (Weendon 2002). Since appeals to so-called universal concepts, epistemologies, and values, such as freedom, rights, and autonomy, can be used to further imperialist projects, postcolonial and decolonial feminists seek to develop normative positions that criticize neoliberal and neocolonial practices while rejecting problematic ethnocentric ideals that often masquerade as universal (Alcoff 2017, Khader, 2019, McLaren 2017, Pohlhaus Jr. 2017, Weir 2017).

2.2.2 Ethics of Care

Another prominent school of feminist theoretical responses to globalization puts care, both caring labor—the work of caring for the young, old, sick, and disabled, and the everyday maintenance of households—and the moral ideal of care, at the center of its analyses. Proponents of this approach begin by observing that most mainstream analyses of globalization either ignore or devalue care. This is problematic, they argue, for at least three reasons: (1) care work, which is done almost exclusively by women, has been profoundly influenced by globalization; (2) the values and work associated with care are both undervalued and insufficiently supported, and this contributes to gender, racial, and economic inequality, both within countries and between the global North and the global South; and (3) any viable alternative to neoliberal globalization must prioritize the moral ideal of care. Thus, ethics of care approaches to globalization have both theoretical and practical dimensions.

Theoretically, ethics of care feminists aim to provide a systematic critique of neoliberal assumptions and develop moral ideals capable of guiding more just forms of globalization. In their view, neoliberalism presupposes a problematic notion of the self, which posits individuals as atomistic, independent, and self-interested, and an inaccurate social ontology, which suggests that human relationships are formed by choice rather than necessity or dependency. These assumptions lead neoliberalism to prioritize economic growth, efficiency, and profit making over other values, such as equality, human rights, and care. Ethics of care feminists reject these assumptions. In their view, human beings are fundamentally relational and interdependent; individuals are defined, indeed constituted, by their caring relationships. All persons experience long periods during which their lives literally depend on the care of others, and everyone needs some degree of care in order flourish. Thus, vulnerability, dependency, and need should be understood not as deficits or limitations, but rather as essential human qualities requiring an adequate political response.

Ethics of care feminists contend that relational values, including care, should form the basis of more just forms of globalization. In Hankivsky’s view, a global ethics of care begins with three assumptions: “1) care is considered to be a fundamental aspect of all human life; 2) all human beings are interdependent by virtue of being part of ongoing relations of care; and 3) ‘people are entitled to care because they are part of ongoing relations of care’” (9). Because a global care ethics begins with a relational ontology, it requires global political leaders to develop social and economic policies that aim to meet human needs and reduce suffering rather than to expand markets and increase economic competition (Hankivsky 2006). Held endorses a similar view. According to her, an ethic of care requires leaders to foster a global economy that is capable of meeting universal human needs (Held 2004, 2007). Similarly, Miller advocates a “global duty to care,” which requires individuals to take responsibility for their role in contributing to global oppression, and obligates leaders to advocate for institutions that embody the moral value of care (Miller 2006).

Concretely, feminist theorists who favor an ethics of care approach highlight the role of care work in the global economy and put forth recommendations for reevaluating it. For example, Robinson develops a relational moral ontology that sheds lights on the features of globalization that are usually invisible: the global distribution of care work and the corresponding patterns of gender and racial inequality; the under-provision of public resources for care work in both developed and developing countries; and the ways in which unpaid or low-paid care work sustains cycles of exploitation and inequality on a global scale (Robinson 2006a, 2006b). Similarly, Held advocates for increased state support of various forms of care work and for policies designed to meet people’s needs in caring ways (Held 2004, 2007).

2.2.3 Transnational Feminism

In its broadest sense, transnational feminism maintains that globalization has created the conditions for feminist solidarity across national borders. On the one hand, globalization has enabled transnational processes that generate injustices for women in multiple geographical locations, such the global assembly line (discussed below). Yet on the other, the technologies associated with globalization have created new political spaces that enable feminist political resistance. Thus, transnational feminists incorporate the critical insights of postcolonial, Third World and ethics of care feminists into a positive vision of transnational feminist solidarity.

Transnational feminism is sometimes contrasted with global or international feminism, a second-wave theory that emphasizes solidarity among women across national boundaries based on their common experience of patriarchal oppression. However, transnational feminism differs from global feminism in at least three significant respects.

First, transnational feminism is sensitive to differences among women. Global feminists argue that patriarchy is universal; women across the globe have a common experience of gender oppression. They promote the recognition of a “global sisterhood” based on these shared experiences, which transcends differences in race, class, sexuality, and national boundaries. This solidarity is thought to provide a unified front against global patriarchy. Transnational feminists also advocate for solidarity across national boundaries. However, their approach emphasizes the methodological commitments discussed above, specifically intersectionality, sensitivity to concrete specificity, and self-reflexivity. Transnational feminists are careful to point out that although globalizing processes affect everyone, they affect different women very differently, based on their geographical and social locations. They are also quick to acknowledge that many aspects of globalization may benefit some women while unduly burdening many others.

Second, transnational feminist solidarity is political in nature. Whereas global feminists advocate a form of social solidarity defined on the basis of characteristics shared by all women, such as a common gender identity or experience of patriarchal oppression, transnational feminist solidarity is grounded in the political commitments of individuals, such as the commitment to challenge injustice or oppression. Because transnational feminist solidarity is based on shared political commitments rather than a common identity or uniform set of experiences, advantaged individuals, including those who have benefited from injustice, can join in solidarity with those who have experienced injustice or oppression directly (Ferguson 2009, Scholz 2008). The emphasis on shared political commitments also enables feminists to resist oppressive conditions that manifest differently in different geographical locations but are nonetheless prevalent in many countries, such as racialized violence against women (Khader 2019, 44–48).

Third, transnational feminists focus on specific globalizing processes, such as the growth of offshore manufacturing, rather than a theorized global patriarchy, and often take existing transnational feminist collectives as a model for their theoretical accounts of solidarity. For instance, Ann Ferguson argues that anti-globalization networks, such as worker-owned cooperatives, labor unions, fair trade organizations, and land reform movements, are creating the conditions for North-South women’s coalition movements based on non-essentialist political commitments to global gender justice (Ferguson, 2009; see also Kang 2008, Khader 2019, Mendoza, 2002, Vargas, 2003).

3. Issues

In addition to analyzing the gendered dimensions of globalization, feminist political philosophers discuss specific issues that have been shaped by it. Below, we discuss four representative examples. First, we discuss two issues associated with economic globalization—economic justice and migration—and then we turn to two issues connected to political globalization—human rights and global governance.

3.1 Economic Justice

It is widely argued that neoliberal policies have created dramatic economic inequalities, both between the global North and global South and within countries in both hemispheres. One task for feminist political philosophers has been to identify the ways in which these policies reinforce specific inequalities based on gender, class, race, and nationality. In particular, feminists shed light on the disparate and often disproportionately burdensome consequences of neoliberal policies for specific groups of women. An additional, related task has been to identify the ways in which gendered practices and ideologies shape the processes of globalization.

Free trade policies feature prominently in such feminist critiques. Trade liberalization has led to the wide-scale movement of once well-paying manufacturing jobs in the global North to low wage, export processing or free trade zones in the global South. In the global North, the pressure on companies to “outsource” jobs to countries where labor is cheaper and working conditions are less regulated has meant that many of the workers who once relied on well-paying manufacturing jobs are now unable to make a living. These jobs have largely been replaced by contingent and part-time service-sector jobs, which tend to be poorly paid and lack health and retirement benefits. The corresponding reduction in real wages has had a disproportionate effect on women, and especially women of color, who hold a higher share of service-sector jobs (Jaggar 2001, 2002a).

In the global South, foreign-owned manufacturing and assembly production facilities have proliferated in free trade zones, forming what is often referred to as the “global assembly line.” Historically, foreign-dominated industrial expansion has meant more jobs for men; however, it is primarily women who comprise the new, “international, industrial proletariat” working on the global assembly line. Gendered and racial stereotypes have played an important role in the establishing this gendered division of labor. In particular, employers tend to perceive women, particularly Asian women, as “tractable, hard-working, dexterous—and sexy” (Jaggar 2001, 305). Governments have been quick to capitalize on these perceptions in their efforts to recruit foreign investment.

Proponents of globalization argue that the expansion of export processing has had positive consequences for women, providing jobs for thousands of otherwise unemployed women and offering new forms of agency. However, feminist political philosophers argue that jobs on the global assembly line tend to be difficult, insecure, and dangerous: working conditions are poor, hours are long, wages are low, and sexual harassment is widespread (Young 2007, 164–67). Thus, they contend, the results for women are contradictory at best. As Jaggar argues, while women’s increased economic power may provide them with some freedom within their families, they are also “super-exploited by foreign corporations with the collusion of their own governments. As employees, they often experience a type of labor control that is almost feudal in its requirement of subservience and dependence” (Jaggar 2001, 306).

Trade liberalization policies have also allowed affluent, northern countries to sell heavily subsidized agricultural products in southern markets, leading to the decline of small-scale and subsistence farming. Many of the female farmers who have been pushed off their land have sought employment in export-processing zones or as seasonal laborers, at lower wages than their male counterparts. Others have found poorly paid and often dangerous jobs in the informal economy (Jaggar 2001, 2002a).

Feminist political philosophers are also concerned with the gendered effects of structural adjustment policies (SAPs), which many poor countries have been forced to undertake as conditions of borrowing money or rescheduling their existing debts. The resulting reductions in publicly-funded health services, education, and childcare undermine the health and well-being of everyone they affect. However, the burdens of SAPs are disproportionately borne by women. Cuts in public health services have contributed to a rise in maternal mortality. The introduction of school fees has made education unavailable to poorer children, especially to girls, leading to higher school dropout rates for girls in many southern countries (Kittay 2008). Cuts to other publicly funded social services also disproportionately harm women, whose care-giving responsibilities make them more reliant on these programs. Because austerity programs decrease public support for women and increase women’s workload, programs like these put women at greater risk for some mental health disorders (Gosselin 2014).

More broadly, SAPs have contributed to increases in poverty and unemployment in developing countries, placing additional burdens on women within both the household and the public sphere. In times of economic difficulty, men tend to maintain their expenditures, while women are expected to make ends meet with fewer resources. Consequently, women have had to develop survival strategies for their families, often picking up the caregiving labor that is no longer provided by the state. Women also face intensified pressure to earn income outside the home. Some women who have been unable to find adequate employment in their own countries have turned to labor migration, which we discuss below. Sex work, including child prostitution, has also increased under these conditions (Schutte 2002).

Brock argues that reforming the international tax regime is a matter of global gender justice. In her view, global gender justice arises only when all people are able to meet their basic needs, have equal protection for basic liberties, and enjoy fair terms of cooperation in collective endeavors. Because properly funded social and political institutions are a precondition of gender justice, a fair system of international taxation and just accounting practices is needed to achieve it. Although the claim that international taxation is a requirement of global gender justice might initially seem odd, Brock argues that a fair international tax regime is necessary to prevent the harms that women in the global South suffer when public services are underfunded. In her view, all corporations should pay their fair share of taxes so countries can fund education, infrastructure development, and programs that promote gender equity. Tax havens which allow corporations to evade paying their taxes—so much so that for every dollar of aid that flows into a country, six to seven dollars of corporate taxes are evaded—must be eliminated. Without such reforms, we must conclude that the basic institutional structure of the global economy remains unjust and detrimental to women (Brock 2014).

3.2 Migration

Migration has accelerated along with the globalization of the economy and women comprise a higher proportion of migrants, especially labor migrants, and refugees than ever before. Feminist philosophical responses to the feminization of migration fall into three general lines of argument. Early work in this area highlights the ways in which gender, race, class, culture, and immigration status intersect to produce disproportionate burdens for immigrant women. Subsequent work discusses the feminization of labor migration, with a focus on domestic workers. Finally, more recent contributions explore the relationship between transnational migration and various forms of structural oppression.

Early work by feminist philosophers typically argues that in sexist, racist, and class-divided societies, such as the United States, formally gender-neutral immigration policies often work to the detriment of immigrant women (Narayan 1995, Wilcox 2005). For instance, Uma Narayan argues that U.S. immigration legislation, such as the Immigration Marriage Fraud Amendment (IMFA) heightens immigrant women’s vulnerability to domestic violence. Before the IMFA was adopted, when a citizen or legal permanent resident married a foreigner and petitioned for permanent residency status for his spouse, legal residency was granted fairly quickly. The IMFA changed this process, adding a two-year period of “conditional residency,” during which the couple must remain married, and requiring both spouses to petition for adjustment to permanent residency status at the end of this waiting period. Narayan argues that the IMFA increases the already significant barriers to escaping abusive marriages for immigrant women because it ties immigration status to marriage. This is especially problematic because immigrant women are generally “economically, psychologically, and linguistically dependent on their spouses” (Narayan 1995, 106).

More recent approaches to the feminization of global migration focus on what Arlie Hochschild refers to as “global care chains” (Hochschild 2000, 2002) These chains, which link women across the world, are established through the transnational exchange of domestic services. Global care chains typically begin when relatively well-off northern or Western women enter the paid labor force and hire other women, usually poorer women from developing countries, to care for their children and other dependents. Migrant careworkers often must leave their own children behind in their home countries to be cared for by even poorer careworkers or family members who may already have care-giving responsibilities or be engaged with paid labor. Many factors have contributed to the production of global care chains. In wealthy countries, the entry of women into the paid workforce, without corresponding increases in public provisions for childcare or the redistribution of caring responsibilities between genders, has created a high demand for paid domestic labor. In poor countries, the supply of domestic labor has been stimulated by a scarcity of well-paying jobs and in many cases, a growing reliance on remittances. Cuts in public services in southern countries have also encouraged women to migrate as a means for earning the income they need to pay for private services for their children, such as healthcare and education (Kittay, 2008, 2009).

Global care chains raise difficult issues for feminists, over and above those raised by the background injustices that help to generate them. In particular, some northern women are able to take advantage of increased opportunities in the paid workforce only because southern women take up their socially-assigned domestic work, leaving their own families in the care of others. Global care chains also contribute to a larger, neo-colonial process – a “global care drain,” in which care is systematically extracted from people in poor countries and transferred to individuals in affluent nations (Hochschild 2002).

Feminist analyses of care chains typically argue that traditional theories of justice have difficulty articulating the precise nature of the harms or injustices involved in these phenomena. Most theories of global justice focus on unjust distributions of benefits and burdens among nations; however, it is not clear that care should be understood as a distributive good. Other features of care chains also resist traditional ethical evaluation. Careworkers are not overtly coerced to migrate, and each party in the global care chain appears to benefit from her participation: women who employ migrant caregivers are able to pursue opportunities in the public sphere; migrant caregivers are able to send money home; and their children and sending nations benefit economically from these remittances. Migrant caregivers clearly are vulnerable to exploitation and workplace abuses, and they and their children suffer from their long absences. However, it could be argued that each of these harms is counterbalanced by significant gains (Kittay, 2008, 2009).

Some feminists argue that a feminist ethics of care is better suited to theorizing global care chains. In particular, care ethics emphasizes several key normative features and practices that traditional theories tend to overlook: concrete specificity; acknowledgement of human dependence and vulnerability; and a relational understanding of the self (Kittay, 2008). Care ethics focuses on the ethical significance of relationships formed through dependency, such as those between caregivers and their charges. Kittay argues that intimate relationships between specific individuals, in which caring and affection are the norm, play a vital role in forming and sustaining individuals’ self-identities. When these relationships are disrupted, people suffer harm to their sense of self and self-respect. It follows that the harm involved in global care chains lies in their threat to the core relationships that are constitutive of self-identity.

To protect dependents and caregivers from the harms that flow from fractured relationships, Kittay believes the right to give and receive care should be recognized as a basic human right. Weir agrees that dismantling global care chains requires recognizing care as “an intrinsic good, a source of identity and meaning, which should be recognized as a human right” (Weir 2005, 313). However, both also suggest that the recognition of a properly formulated right to care would not eliminate global care chains on its own. Care chains will persist until care, whether provided by professionals or within family networks, is socially recognized and economically supported. Caregiving responsibilities should also be more fairly distributed between genders and paid work should be organized with the recognition that all workers—male and female, rich and poor—are responsible for providing care. Unlocking care chains will also require mitigating the unjust background conditions that force women to choose between providing financial support for their families and being with and providing face to face care for them. To begin, immigration policies must include specific provisions that make it easier for careworkers to bring their children or return home on a regular basis. Ultimately, however, eliminating care chains will require restructuring the global economy so that no one is forced to leave her home country to find decent working and living conditions.

Finally, many recent feminist philosophical analyses of migration explore the relationship between transnational migration and various forms of structural injustice, including gender oppression, racism and white supremacy, global economic inequality, militarization, and legacies of colonialism. For instance, Wilcox argues that transnational injustices generate strong moral claims to admission for certain groups of prospective migrants. She advances two arguments for this claim. The first contends that the principle of collective political responsibility obligates states to grant admission priority to prospective migrants who have been seriously harmed by their policies, including economic policies that disproportionately harm women and marginalized workers in less affluent countries (Wilcox 2007). Her second argument maintains that a commitment to relational egalitarianism entails rejecting immigration restrictions that contribute to oppressive transnational structural relations. In the context of gendered and racialized global supply chains, this includes those restrictions on labor migration that increase workers’ vulnerability to exploitation, domination, violence, and marginalization (Wilcox 2012).

Other feminists focus on the relationship between structural injustice and refugee determination. In particular, they argue that legal definitions of refugeehood are insufficiently attentive to gender-based injustices, leading to the wrongful exclusion of vulnerable migrants who have strong moral claims to asylum. For instance, Parekh argues that despite feminist gains in expanding international refugee conventions to recognize gender-related persecution, many states sill regard some forms of gender injustice as too apolitical or insignificant to warrant asylum (Parekh 2012). Accounting for the ways in which structural injustices modulate and amplify gender-based harms can lead to more inclusive—and better justified—conceptualizations of gender persecution. Similarly, Meyers argues that an adequate understanding of the coercive nature of severe poverty supports broadening the conventional definition of refugeehood to include economic refugees, many of whom are women (Meyers 2014). Using the work of Iris Marion Young, Parekh further argues that understanding the harms from which refugees flee as forms of structural injustice grounds stronger moral obligations to help refugees, both those who remain in the global South an those who seek admission to Western states (Parekh 2017, 2020).

Feminists also warn that migration regimes tend to reinforce existing forms of domination and even create new types of oppression. More specifically, they argue that migration, refugee, and citizenship discourses, policies, and practices often draw upon pernicious stereotypes and entho-nationalist tropes to construct gendered and racialized subjects that are, in turn, mobilized to justify the domination, exclusion, and marginalization of the individuals they are thought to represent. For instance, Cisneros argues that recent U.S. political debates about so-called “anchor babies” draw upon sexist and nationalist conceptions of women as reproducers of the ethnic nation, together with the racist notion of the “illegal alien,” to portray migrant women, particularly undocumented women, as an existential threat to the (white supremacist) nation (Cisneros 2013). This fictive subject is then taken to justify coercive immigration and citizenship policies designed to exclude migrant women of color and bar even U.S. born children of unauthorized migrants from citizenship. Similarly, Reed-Sandoval argues that the U.S. immigration regime, which she views as a “social-historical racial project that served to reorganize and redistribute resources by means of branding certain bodies as ’illegals’ in the United States,” has generated a unique social identity, which she calls “being socially undocumented” (Reed-Sandoval 2020, 86). Being socially undocumented is distinct from being legally undocumented in that it does not necessarily involve a lack of legal authorization, but rather membership in the social group of people who are subject to a common set of unjust, self-legitimating, “illegalizing,” immigration-related constraints, including racial profiling and police harassment, offensive stereotypes, and exploitative and degrading employment practices, on the basis of being perceived to be undocumented, regardless of immigration status. Finally, Oliver argues that that so-called humanitarian responses to the contemporary refugee crisis are governed by a similar self-justifying logic, which she calls carceral humanitarianism (Oliver 2017a, 2017b). According to this logic, refugees can justifiably be sorted into groups based on their perceived risk to host societies, made to prove the trauma that constitutes their case for asylum, confined to detention centers and refugee camps indefinitely, subjected to violence and denied basic human rights, and in many cases, treated like terrorist threats or prisoners of war. Merged with rescue politics, which represents refugees as helpless victims to be rescued and saved, carceral humanitarianism “turns refugees into criminals and charity cases simultaneously, which, in turn, becomes the troubling justification for locking them up or locking them in, increasingly in dangerous, disease-ridden and sorely inadequate conditions” (Oliver 2017b, 185).

3.3 Human Rights

The term ‘human rights’ refers simultaneously to several things: a moral language; a set of norms and laws, both national and international; and a framework for analyzing and responding to the various serious harms experienced by men and women around the world. Feminist political philosophers argue that globalization has had contradictory effects on the extent to which women experience human rights violations.

Many feminist political philosophers have argued that globalization has contributed to human rights violations against women. Most obviously, neoliberal policies have led to infringements of specific social and economic rights, such as the right “to a standard of living adequate for the health and well-being” and the right “to security in the event of unemployment, sickness, disability, widowhood, and old age” (Universal Declaration of Human Rights, article 25). Moreover, by diminishing women’s economic security, neoliberal policies have exacerbated existing forms of gender discrimination and violence and made women and girls more vulnerable to a wide variety of additional human rights violations. Three examples are prominent in the literature. First, the economic insecurity and concomitant increase in poverty associated with globalization have made girls more vulnerable to sexual exploitation. In particular, girls are more likely to be sold as child brides or pushed into prostitution or sexual slavery in order to support their families (Okin 1998, 45). Second, when resources are scarce, women and girls are less likely to receive food than boys and men and are less likely to attend school. Finally, Shiva argues that neoliberal globalization has made women more vulnerable to sexual violence. She notes the extraordinary increase in rape in India: 800 percent since the 1970s and an additional 250 percent since the economy was liberalized (Morgan 2013). Although the reasons for this rise are complex, Shiva believes they are connected to several aspects of globalization: structural adjustment policies, which eliminated major sectors of women’s economic activity; the destruction of the natural environment, which displaced many women; and the exclusion of women from economic and political decision-making.

More positively, some feminist philosophers contend that globalization has enabled women to claim their human rights by creating “new spaces, institutions and rhetoric where the notion of universal human rights is a powerful justificatory principle” (Walby 2002, 534). Others credit globalization for the emergence of new international non-governmental organizations and feminist social movements, which have strengthened the worldwide movement for women’s human rights (Robinson 2003, 161). The “women’s rights are human rights” movement has used the language of human rights, which some proponents believe provides “the best chance of realizing the long sought after goal of gender equality,” to criticize many assaults on women’s dignity that were previously considered to be natural or inevitable (Panzer 2009, 45). For instance, the movement has shown that abuses in the private sphere, such as domestic violence, so-called “honor killings,” and violence done in the name of culture or tradition, are legitimate human rights violations. Others have argued that cultural practices like female genital cutting (FGC), which many consider to be human rights violations, can be made compatible with universal human rights if certain conditions are met (Gordon 2018). The movement also helped to codify women’s human rights in formal United Nations documents, such as the Convention on the Elimination of All Forms of Discrimination against Women (CEDAW) and the Declaration on the Elimination of Violence Against Women, which activist groups have subsequently used to challenge domestic laws and norms (Stamatopoulou 1995). However, as McLaren points out, it is important to attend to the critiques made by feminists in the global South that social and economic rights, rights that are particularly important to women in the global South, have been marginalized in Western feminist discourse. This critique can be accounted for, McLaren argues, if we adopt an integrated approach to rights that both insists on the indivisibility of human rights and acknowledges their ambivalence. If human rights are to realize their liberatory potential, we must recognize that human rights can reinforce injustice as well as undermine it (McLaren 2017b).

Women’s human rights movements have also had an impact on international understandings of the gendered consequences of war and militarization. In UN forums and other global venues, feminists have challenged international human rights laws concerning rape and sexual violence in war. As Copelon explained in 2003, “[l]ess than a decade ago, it was openly questioned whether rape was a war crime. Human rights and humanitarian organizations largely ignored sexual violence and the needs of its victims” (Copelon, 1). However, by 2002, feminists had successfully convinced the authors of the Rome Statute to include a broad range of sexually violent crimes among the gravest crimes of war. The document considers rape, forced pregnancy, sexual assault, and forced prostitution to be “crimes against humanity” if they are committed as part of a widespread or systematic attack on civilian populations, in times of war as well as peace, by non-state actors as well as official state actors. The Statute’s definition of rape goes a long way toward recognizing rape as a gender-based atrocity on par with other long-recognized atrocities, such as torture and genocide (Parekh 2009). Arguably, these changes in international law would not have been possible without transnational activism, which can clearly be seen as an example of “globalization from below.”

3.4 Democracy and Global Governance

As with human rights, feminist philosophers have argued that globalization has contradictory implications for democratic governance. On the one hand, neoliberalism has diminished national sovereignty, further excluding women and the poor from democratic processes (Herr 2003). Yet globalization also connects people across national borders, creating transnational communities that offer new avenues for democratic participation.

Globalization has been accompanied by the establishment of formal democracy in some countries and the number of women serving in national legislatures has increased in some nations. However, some feminist philosophers are quick to argue that neoliberalism has not resulted in increased political influence for women on the whole, especially at the level of global politics. One important reason is that global economic institutions are neither adequately representative nor fully democratic. Women are virtually absent from the formal decision-making bodies of institutions such as the WTO and the World Bank, and these institutions tend to be unofficially dominated by the interests of wealthy nations and multinational corporations.

Feminists argue that women’s lack of political influence at the global level has not been compensated for by their increased influence in national politics because globalization has undermined national sovereignty, especially in poor nations. Structural adjustment policies require debtor nations to implement specific domestic policies that disproportionately harm women, such as austerity measures, despite strong local opposition. Trade rules issued by the World Trade Organization also supersede the national laws of signatory nations, including those pertaining to matters of ethics and public policy, such as environmental protections and health and safety standards for imported goods, as well as trade tariffs (Jaggar 2001, 2002a).

Nor does women’s participation in NGOs or other organizations within civil society guarantee that their interests will be fairly represented. Indeed, some feminists charge that foreign-funded NGOs are “a new form of colonialism because they create dependence on nonelected overseas funders and their locally appointed officials, undermining the development of social programs administered by elected officials accountable to local people” (Jaggar 2001, 309). Even local, women-run NGOs sometimes fail to live up to their democratic aspirations. NGO projects are often shaped by the agendas of their corporate funders, to the detriment of the expressed needs of the women they serve. Demands for accountability to donors also limit the internal democracy of NGOs by encouraging the professionalization of grassroots organizations (Jaggar 2001, 2005a).

While feminist philosophers agree that globalization has concentrated power in the hands of wealthy nations and corporations, further marginalizing women and the global poor, some believe the conditions of globalization also enable new forms of democratic accountability. For instance, Gould argues that participants in transnational associations have equal rights to participate in decisions about their common activities. She also suggests that the Internet and other communication and information technologies, such open source software and online deliberative forums, can “help to increase both democratic participation and representation in the functioning of transnational institutions” (Gould 2009, 38).

Fraser (2009) further suggests that globalization has created new transnational public spheres in which public opinion can be created and marshaled to hold political leaders democratically accountable. Traditional public sphere theory, such as that developed by Habermas, defines the public sphere as an area of social life in which individuals come together to reach a common public opinion about social issues. Insofar as the process of deliberation is fair and inclusive, the resulting public opinion is normatively legitimate; because it expresses the considered will of civil society, it can be mobilized as a political force to hold public power democratically accountable.

However, Fraser points out that these essential features of publicity—normative legitimacy and political efficacy—are not easily associated with new transnational communicative arenas, in which territorially dispersed interlocutors interact through various discursive forms. The reason is that traditional public sphere theory implicitly assumes a Westaphalian political model, in which co-citizens, with equal rights to participate, create public opinion addressed to a particular state. Thus, in her words:

[i]t is difficult to associate the notion of legitimate public opinion with communicative arenas in which the interlocutors are not fellow members of a political community, with equal rights to participate in political life. And it is hard to associate the notion of efficacious communicative power with discursive spaces that do not correlate with sovereign states (Fraser 2009, 77).

Nevertheless, she argues, we should not jettison the idea of a transnational public sphere, provided that the notions of normative legitimacy and political efficacy can be reformulated to apply to communication in transnational discursive arenas.

4. Conclusion

On the whole, globalization presents a number of challenges to feminist political philosophers who seek to develop conceptions of justice and responsibility capable of responding to the lived realities of both men and women. As globalization will most certainly continue, these challenges are likely to increase in the coming decades. As we have outlined above, feminist political philosophers have already made great strides towards understanding this complex phenomenon. Yet the challenge of how to make globalization fairer remains for feminist philosophers, as well as all others who strive for equality and justice.


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Other Internet Resources

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