Henricus Regius

First published Tue Aug 12, 2008; substantive revision Mon Oct 21, 2019

Henricus Regius (in Dutch: Hendrik de Roy) may be recognised today primarily as one of Descartes’ correspondents. However, he was also the author of a textbook of natural philosophy, Fundamenta physices (1646), which offered a significant alternative to Cartesian epistemology and metaphysics. His correspondence with Descartes, and his simultaneous controversy with G. Voetius during the 1640s, reflected Regius’ efforts to establish his intellectual independence from scholastic philosophy and Cartesian metaphysics.

1. Life and Works

Regius was born in Utrecht, The Netherlands (the Republic of the Seven United Netherlands at the time), on 29 July 1598, into a wealthy family of brewers, and died on 19 February 1679 in the same city. Following initial studies in Arts at the University of Franeker, he studied medicine at Groningen and Leiden, and subsequently at the University of Montpellier (France). In 1623 he received his MD from the University of Padua (Italy). Regius was appointed town physician in Utrecht on his return there in 1625 and, following a period as headmaster of the Latin School at Naarden (where he was challenged about his religious orthodoxy as a Calvinist), he returned to Utrecht in 1634 and was re-appointed town physician in 1637. The Illustrious School of Utrecht had become a university in 1636 and, two years later, Regius was appointed ‘extraordinary’ Professor of Theoretical Medicine and Botany (equivalent to an associate professor, who was paid a significantly reduced salary). The following year, 1639, he was promoted to full professor. In 1640 Regius was awarded a salary increase, on the understanding that he would provide extra lectures to his students on natural philosophy. Since there were already professors of philosophy, mathematics, and theology in place at Utrecht, all of whom were senior to Regius, this extension of his contract included the seeds of subsequent controversies about philosophical and theological theses, and of disputes about disciplinary boundaries at the University.

Regius first came to Descartes’ attention through a mutual friend, Henricus Reneri (1593–1639), and almost immediately (in August 1638) began a correspondence with Descartes, which continued until 1645. In keeping with the custom at that time, he also presided as a professor over disputations at the University (the equivalent of research seminars, presented by students in the form of a defence of theses that were composed by their supervisor). The texts of disputations were normally printed and distributed in advance of their oral presentation, and some rare copies of Regius’ disputations survive. These were initially concerned with medical matters, such as a controversial disputation supporting Harvey’s theory of blood circulation (Regius 1640a). During the year 1641, Regius considered publishing a book on natural philosophy, and consulted both Descartes and Gisbertus Voetius (1589–1676), the Professor of Theology and University Rector, about his plans. While Descartes recommended that Regius develop his ideas in the form of disputations, Voetius initially advised publication as a monograph, possibly to avoid conflict with faculty members in theology or philosophy. Regius adopted Descartes’ advice and, in April 1641, he began a series of disputations under the title Physiologia sive cognitio sanitatis (Regius 1641a).

In November 1641, however, Regius initiated a new series of disputations, De illustribus aliquot quaestionibus physiologicis (Regius 1641b), in which he challenged Aristotelian theses that were taught by his colleagues in philosophy and theology at the University. This attracted a very negative response from Voetius, who relied on Aristotelian philosophy to articulate his version of Calvinist theology. The resulting lengthy controversy, during which Regius lost the support of Descartes while simultaneously continuing the conflict with Voetius, is discussed below. He published the first edition of his book on natural philosophy under the title Fundamenta physices (1646); Chapter XII, entitled De homine (Regius 1646, 245–306), provided a synoptic exposition of his controversial views about human nature.

Despite the bitter and extended controversy in which Regius engaged with Voetius and the university authorities, he was later appointed Rector of the University of Utrecht (a one-year honorary position) in 1649, and again in 1662. He published an amended, enlarged edition of the Fundamenta physices under the title Philosophia naturalis in 1654, and a third edition in 1661. A French translation appeared in 1687. He remained in Utrecht, except for a brief period when he was captured as a hostage by the French army in late 1673, and died there in 1679.

2. Dispute with Voetius and Descartes

Regius attributed his appointment at Utrecht University to his familiarity with and support for Cartesian philosophy, which was acquired initially by reading Descartes’ first book, the Discours de la Méthode … plus la Dioptrique, les Météores et la Géometrie, 1637 (AT, vol. VI). Regius was sympathetic to Cartesian natural philosophy from his initial reading and began to teach it to students, in private lessons, and to dictate notes with a view to publishing his own summary of natural philosophy based on Cartesian principles. This objective was further encouraged when he read a copy of Descartes’ unpublished manuscript, Le Monde (AT, vol. XI), in 1641. The natural philosophy of Le Monde rejected scholastic forms and qualities as philosophical entities that contributed nothing to an explanation of natural phenomena. There was a significant difference, however, in a university such as Utrecht between not relying on scholastic forms and criticizing them publicly. The transition from the former to the latter, in the case of Regius, occurred in 1641.

While preparing Physiologia (Regius 1641a), Regius sent advance copies of draft disputations to Descartes. Since they were being presented in Utrecht as examples of Cartesian philosophy, Descartes recommended various changes, both to avoid needless controversy (for example, concerning blood circulation) and, more importantly, to avoid accusations of heresy against himself or Regius. Accordingly, he asked Regius to correct the thesis that the human soul is three-fold, and to argue instead that “in human beings the soul is one, namely a rational soul” (AT III, 369–74: Bos 2002, 63–69). During the year 1641, this pattern of prior consultation with Descartes continued; Regius accepted many of Descartes’ suggestions, and incorporated them into the final versions of the disputations.

In November 1641, however, the Utrecht professor inaugurated another series of disputations in which he transgressed from medicine to philosophy and, by implication, into theology, and thereby provoked a controversy that continued for more than a decade. The most explicit challenge to established Aristotelian teaching occurred when one of Regius’ students, Henricus van Loon, claimed in a disputation (8 December 1641) that the human mind and body are two distinct substances which are joined together in an accidental union [unum per accidens]. This thesis addressed, perhaps inadvertently, one of the most contentious issues in Christian philosophy and theology, viz. how to understand the unity of human nature, as experienced by each subject, and at the same time defend the traditional Christian beliefs in the immortality of the human soul or mind and the resurrection of the body. The immortality of the soul seemed to presuppose that the mind or soul was capable of existing without the body and, for that reason, that it should be classified as an Aristotelian substance. When Descartes was informed about this disputation (when it was already too late to recommend amendments), he responded that there was hardly anything more likely to offend or antagonize theologians than to say that a human being “is an accidental being” (AT III, 460: Bos 2002, 90–91).

Voetius, with the support of his professorial colleagues in theology, replied to Regius by appending corollaries to his own theological disputations, in December 1641, in which he accused proponents of the ‘new philosophy’ [i.e., Cartesianism] of a number of errors: teaching that a human being is an accidental being, defending Copernicanism, and supporting scepticism and irreligion by denying substantial forms. In the course of these replies to Regius, Descartes’ name was also mentioned, and it was clear that Regius and Descartes were perceived by Voetius as jointly attempting to undermine the philosophical foundations of Calvinist theology as taught at Utrecht. Initially, Descartes joined the debate merely by advising Regius how to respond appropriately to Voetius. One part of that advice was that Regius should have dealt with substantial forms as Descartes had done in the Météores (AT VI, 239): that he should not have rejected them explicitly but, instead, should merely have omitted them as redundant to genuine explanations.

However, Descartes also provided Regius with philosophical arguments in reply to Voetius. He outlined a number of reasons why they were jointly opposed to describing the human mind as a substantial form. To say that human beings think because they have a ‘thinking form’ explains nothing; secondly, those who postulate the existence of substantial forms are unable to say more precisely what they are, and thus they appeal to ‘occult’ realities that they do not understand; and, perhaps most importantly, if the alleged substantial forms of other natural phenomena were made redundant by developments in physics, there would be a danger that the spirituality of the mind or soul would be compromised by similar advances in the sciences. “All the arguments that are used to prove substantial forms may be applied to the form of a clock, although no one claims that it is substantial” (AT III, 505: Bos 2002, 115). Many of Descartes’ suggestions were incorporated, as amendments, into the final version of the Regius’ reply to Voetius, which appeared as Responsio, sive notae in Appendicem (Regius 1642) on 16 February 1642. This further inflamed the situation. The following month, Regius was forbidden by the University to teach natural philosophy in public or in private, and was restricted to lecturing in traditional medicine. The Academic Senate, with the approval of the town council, also issued an official condemnation of Cartesian philosophy.

Descartes later joined the controversy in a more public way. He included a letter to a French Jesuit, ‘A Letter to Father Dinet,’ in the second edition of the Meditations (1642), which was published in Amsterdam and thus became readily available to his critics in Utrecht. While the letter to Dinet criticised Voetius without naming him explicitly, Descartes’ subsequent Epistola ad Voetium (1643) went further by removing the apparent anonymity of his target in the first letter. The complex history of the next few years, which is summarized in Verbeek 1992, included an official ban on the teaching of Cartesian philosophy by the local authority in Utrecht (the Vroedschap), and the establishment by the same authority of a committee of inquiry into the public controversy that resulted from Regius’ teaching of Cartesian philosophy. The official report of the university committee on the whole affair, to date, was published in 1643 as the Narratio historica (Verbeek 1988, 71–123). Meantime, Voetius arranged for one of his supporters, Martinus Schoock (1614–69), to write an extensive critique of Descartes and Cartesianism, which was published as Admiranda methodus (The Admirable Method) in Utrecht in 1643 (Schoock 1643). The Admirable Method listed, among the most serious charges against Descartes, that he was an atheist and a sceptic, and it implied that he deserved the same treatment as heretics, such as Giulio Cesare Vanini (1585–1619), who had been burned at the stake in Toulouse. While the authorship of this book, Descartes’ replies to it, and various legal charges of defamation and libel continued for some years, Descartes concluded his contribution to the controversy with Voetius in the Apologetic Letter to the Magistrates of Utrecht, which was written in 1647 and sent to Utrecht in February 1648 (Bos 1999).

The intensity of the dispute between Voetius and those whom he identified as proponents of a ‘new philosophy’ might suggest agreement, at least between Descartes and Regius, on a common philosophical position. In the course of the Utrecht controversy, however, an irretrievable breakdown developed in relations between Descartes and his former supporter. The epistemology favoured by Regius, which reflected his disciplinary expertise in medicine and physiology, left little room for Cartesian metaphysics. When he wrote to Descartes, in July 1645 (AT IV, 254–6: Bos 2002, 189–90), that many reputable people believed that Descartes secretly held views about the human mind and God that differed from those that he published, and that he had discredited his philosophy by publishing the Meditations, it seemed to Descartes that Regius was endorsing the same criticisms that Voetius and Schoock had made earlier. The following year, against Descartes’ advice, Regius published the Fundamenta physices, in which he rejected a number of Descartes’ metaphysical theses and thereby incurred the wrath of his former mentor. The French philosopher denounced Regius, as misrepresenting his philosophy, in the preface to the French edition of the Principles of Philosophy (1647). Regius planned to reply by adding twenty-one Corollaries to a medical disputation that was scheduled for 2 October 1647, concerning a forty-year old man who had inflammation of the feet and legs (Regius 1647b). These Corollaries included three of the more contentious claims about the mind and God that Regius had earlier removed from Fundamenta physices in an unsuccessful attempt to appease Descartes. Although the disputation was banned by the University rector, Regius had already disseminated copies of the text, including the controversial Corollaria. Descartes replied with Notae in programma quoddam (1648)—i.e., Notes on a Certain Manifesto—to which Regius replied with an extended version of the Corollaria, in A Brief Explanation of the Human Mind or the Rational Soul, in which is explained what it is and what it may be (Regius 1648).

The main source of disagreement between Descartes and Regius was their respective accounts of human nature. This had emerged as early as 1640, when Regius commented on a draft of the Meditations, and more explicitly in the disputation (December 1641), which proposed the thesis that the human mind and body are united in an ‘accidental unity.’ In July 1645, when Descartes responded to a draft of the Fundamenta physices, he argued that Regius had gone too far in the opposite direction by making the union of mind and body so close that the mind was merely a ‘mode’ of the body—which was an even greater error than his earlier mistake (AT IV, 250: Bos 2002, 188). This issue, of how to conceive of the mind and body as united and yet separable, dominated the series of claims and counter-claims made by both philosophers up to 1648. Between 1648 and February 1650, when Descartes died, the two philosophers did not engage directly with each other. Descartes discussed a range of questions with Burman in 1648, and in response to one query he provided another reminder of the extent to which Regius allegedly misunderstood his metaphysics. “As far as Regius is concerned … in physics he has always been anxious to follow the views of the author [i.e., Descartes] … whereas in metaphysics he has done everything possible to contradict the author’s views” (Descartes CB, 38: AT V, 170). Descartes’ last publication, Les Passions de l’Ame (1649: AT, vol. XI), may be read as his final attempt to address the source of their disagreement, and Regius 1650 may be seen as Regius’ response (Verbeek 2017).

3. Theory of Knowledge and Philosophy of Science

Once Regius had publicly established his independence vis-à-vis Descartes in 1647, he began to publish a theory of knowledge that reflected his medical interests (Bellis, 2013) and complemented the account of human nature that he adopted in opposition to his former mentor. The result was an epistemology that was closer to that which appeared, almost four decades later, in Locke’s Essay than anything that he had read in Descartes. This transition had begun while drafting Fundamenta physices, in which Regius denied the need for any innate ideas, including even the idea of God.

The mind, in order to think, does not seem to need innate ideas, images, notions or axioms; rather, its innate faculty of thinking is sufficient on its own in order for it to complete all its thinking activities. This is evident in the perception of pain, colour, taste, and other similar perceptions, which are genuinely perceived by the mind, although none of those ideas is innate. Nor is there any reason why some ideas rather than others should be innate by their very nature. (Regius 1646, 251)

Regius supported this with the claim that a young person who had not been educated would, if asked, deny knowledge of things of which they had no experience (1654, 251). Since an innate idea of God was central to the Cartesian project, Regius made his own position explicit by also denying that the idea of God is innate: “Even the idea of God … does not seem to be innate in us, but is produced in us initially by observing things or is passed on to us by others” (Regius 1646, 252).

Regius rejected the innateness of ideas for the same reason that Descartes had rejected various scholastic entities: it was redundant to an adequate explanation of thinking.

It is evident from the perception of titillation and of pain, of sounds and light, which arise from the motion of an objective body, that the stimulation of the senses does not require intentional species, nor spiritual qualities, nor any other unintelligible things, but that local motion alone and its variations suffice for this purpose. (Regius 1646, 253–4)

He repeated the denial of innate ideas in the Corollaries of 1647: “The mind does not need innate ideas, or notions, or axioms; its faculty of thinking alone is enough for it to perform its own actions” (Regius 1647b, Corollary 12). Descartes’ reply, in the Notae (Descartes 1648), conceded the validity of Regius’ claim by accepting that their disagreement was merely verbal: “I never wrote or claimed that the mind needs innate ideas which are anything other than its faculty of thinking” (AT VIII-2, 357). Regius subsequently generalized his claim, in Philosophia naturalis (1654: 335); apart from what is revealed in Scripture, he argued, all thoughts originate in sensory experience.

All those [i.e., conscious acts], which do not originate in divine revelation, are sensations or derive their origin from sensation. For we cannot will, judge, or remember anything, nor imagine anything, nor otherwise perceive anything, unless some idea of that thing had been immediately or mediately produced in us by sensation, or subsequently triggered and presented to the mind.

This unequivocally empiricist claim was compounded by the denial of any ‘pure intellect.’ Regius had never appealed to a ‘pure understanding’ as a source of ideas, and had often asserted the ‘organic’ connection between mind and body. He had defined ‘organic’, in the first of his Physiologia disputations (Bos 2002, 200), in contrast with ‘inorganic’ as almost a synonym for ‘bodily dependent’. Organic parts of the body, such as the nerves, veins, or muscles, required a certain physical conformation of the body in order to perform an action. When applied to the mind, therefore, the term ‘organic’ suggested that the mind could perform mental operations only on condition that various bodily parts functioned appropriately at the same time.

These early hints, which were short of an outright denial of a pure understanding, were interpreted correctly by Descartes in 1647. Regius had defined perception in his banned disputation as ‘sensation, remembering and imagining’ (Regius 1647b: Corollaries, no. 18), and Descartes concluded that he was implicitly denying the reality of pure understanding: “One could draw the conclusion that he does not accept any pure understanding, that is, an understanding that is not concerned with physical images; and therefore he thinks that we have no knowledge of God or the human soul, or of other non-physical things” (AT VIII-2, 363). Regius confirmed that interpretation in his reply: “The human mind, although it is a substance that is really distinct from the body, is however organic in all its actions while it is in the body … it cannot perform any of its actions without bodily organs” (Regius 1648, 10). Perhaps he had been applying Descartes’ previous advice about substantial forms—to ignore them rather than deny their existence explicitly—when he refrained from denying a pure understanding in his earlier writings. By 1654, however, he was ready to publish an explicit denial: “Since … we are able to explain all its operations [i.e., those of the mind] by those faculties of the intellect, which were already explained, there is no need to add to them a pure intellect or anything similar as something that is distinct from them” (Regius 1654, 404). Nonetheless, the denial of a pure intellect did not imply denying that human beings have an idea of God; the latter is acquired in the same way as other ideas, namely by using an intellect that is organically dependent on the human body.

Since all ideas originate in sensation, Regius had to acknowledge that we often come to have ideas that originate from imagined realities and that, in the case of veridical and non-veridical perceptions, the subjective experiences are often sufficiently similar that one cannot be certain of a correspondence between ideas and reality. In contrast with the Cartesian rational defence of the reliability of our cognitive faculties, Regius claimed that one must rely on Scripture for this purpose (Regius 1646, 249). However, Scripture does not guarantee that our perceptions are always certain. This issue was particularly acute when the realities in question were unobservable (Regius 1646, 4). Regius thought it was obvious that physical bodies are composed of insensible particles, and that their description is a matter of hypothesis. When faced with the task of explanation, therefore, he took refuge in some of the central themes of Cartesian natural philosophy. He borrowed the ‘fable’ used by Descartes in Le Monde, that the natural world is composed of one matter, that it is divided into parts of various sizes and shapes in motion, and that all natural phenomena may be explained by the laws of nature that apply to those parts (Regius 1646, 4).

This is the positive side of Regius’ account of explanation. The negative side, as with Descartes, is a rejection of forms and qualities as understood by scholastic philosophers. For example, Regius had argued in 1641 that one does not explain how the heart works by introducing a ‘sentient and vegetative soul.’ He commented: “That is saying nothing more than this: that the heart is moved by whatever is the principle by which we live, sense and move (for that is how the soul is defined), which begs the question as to what that is” (Regius 1641b, Disputatio VI, Corollary, par. V). Such an explanation of the heart’s motion is similar to explaining the motion of a clock by ‘a faculty of a certain kind.’ Regius proposed instead that we think of the world as a great machine, and that we explain natural phenomena by hypothesizing how that machine works.

The world, therefore, is a great machine and each of its parts is a small machine, in which it can be observed and easily demonstrated that there is nothing other than motion or rest, together with size, position, and shape (I wish to make a unique exception of our soul). However, I regard the forms which are said to be substantial and likewise qualities of a corporeal substance, whether occult or manifest … as mere non-entities, which conceal our ignorance of causes. (Regius 1641b, para. ix)

It follows from this kind of speculative reasoning about the unobservable inner structure of natural phenomena that scientific knowledge is only more or less probable. If we imagine a likely cause of some phenomenon as a configuration of unobservable particles and, despite further research, cannot discover another possible cause that is either as likely or more likely, we should rest content with the first hypothesis until something better is discovered.

When any question in physics is proposed for resolution, one should first think of an intelligible cause by which the effect that is observed in the proposed problem could be explained intelligibly and appropriately. One should then look to see if a more appropriate or equally appropriate cause can be found. If a more appropriate cause is found, it should be preferred. If one that is equally appropriate is found, it should be treated as equally confirmed. However, if none is found that is equally or more appropriate, the solution found should be adopted until a better or equally good one is found. (Regius 1654, Epilogue)

The acceptance of probable hypotheses as the best available was a significant revision of a model of human knowledge, originally derived from Aristotle, according to which genuine knowledge must achieve the degree of certainty that is provided by intuition and demonstration (Clarke 2011). While other natural philosophers, even at the conclusion of the seventeenth century, refused to classify explanations of natural phenomena as knowledge, because they were uncertain, Regius had accepted in mid-century that such uncertainty is inevitable except in the case of divine revelation. “Although, apart from divine revelation, there is no apodictic certainty about things that exist outside our mind, but only moral or probable and likely certainty, that is still sufficient to perform adequately and to control all the activities of human life, since nothing more is required for them apart from moral or probable truth or the certainty and likelihood of knowledge” (Regius 1654, 351).

4. Theory of Human Nature

Regius acknowledged objections, as early as 1641, to scholastic descriptions of human nature, according to which the human mind or soul was the substantial form of the body that was capable, after death, of existing on its own. As indicated above, he accepted Descartes’ general objections to the intelligibility and explanatory usefulness of substantial forms. It was unclear to him, therefore, how such forms could be used to describe or explain human nature. His reservations about substantial forms were articulated in the draft copy of Fundamenta physices, which he had sent to Descartes prior to publication. The latter’s objections caused Regius to delete three of the more controversial claims about God and the soul from the published text. However, they re-appeared in the Corollaries of Regius 1647b, and in the second edition of the text, Philosophia naturalis (1654).

Descartes had defined material substance in terms of its principal attribute, extension. Regius endorsed that position when he rejected any distinction between a corporeal substance and its extension.

There is no need to imagine that there is a substance in a body in which extension exists, and that it is something which in its nature or in reality is distinct from extension, because realities should not be multiplied without necessity. Extension does not need such a subject, as something that is distinct from itself; but it is capable of existing on its own. (Regius 1646, 2; the phrase in italics was added in Regius 1654, 3.)

One would expect the same logic to apply to thinking, as an attribute that does not require a distinct substance. Nonetheless, Regius initially stopped short of saying that. While accepting that divine revelation teaches that the mind is a substance, he emphasized that it is organically united with the body. “The human mind, although it is a substance that is really distinct from the body, is however organic as long as it exists in the body” (1646, 246). The mind was also described as being “united most closely with the body in one substance” (Regius 1646, 248).

However, once he had been rebuked publicly by Descartes, Regius was free to express himself more explicitly. In the Corollaries (Regius 1647b), he wrote:

As far as the nature of things is concerned, it seems possible for the soul to be either a substance or a mode of a physical substance. Or, if we follow some other philosophers [i.e., Descartes] who stipulate that extension and thought are attributes which are present in certain substances as their subjects, then since these attributes are not opposites but are just different from each other, there is nothing to prevent the mind from being an attribute of some kind which applies to the same subject as extension, even though neither attribute is included in the concept of the other (thesis 2).

This is further developed in Regius 1654, in which he argues that the concepts of extension and thinking are not incompatible and, “accordingly, they [the attributes] may both be present in the same simple subject” (337). This anticipates the question (and the implied answer) that was discussed by Locke, in the Essay IV, iii, 6, whether God may have superadded thought to a material substance. In the version proposed by Regius, there are no reasons why it would be impossible for a material entity to have the property of thinking because, although thinking and extension have nothing in common, they are not incompatible.

Regius also included in the Corollaries two other theses that were critical of Descartes and had been omitted from the Fundamenta Physices: in thesis 3, he claimed that ‘those who assert that we conceive of the human mind clearly and distinctly as necessarily and really distinct from the body are mistaken’, and in thesis 13 that ‘all common notions that are engraved in the mind derive their origin from the observation of things or from tradition’. Regius also claimed that these conclusions from experience and reason, within the scope of natural philosophy, were consistent with thesis 4, that divine revelation provides indubitable evidence for belief that the human mind is a distinct substance.

These early statements in thesis form of criticisms of Descartes were subsequently expanded in Regius 1654. Many of Descartes’ contemporaries had understood him as arguing that there must be a real distinction between mind and body because it is possible to doubt having a body although it is impossible to doubt having a mind. Regius addressed this argument explicitly:

The fact that we can doubt the body but cannot possibly doubt the mind does not prevent the mind from being a mode of the body. That merely proves that, while we are doubting the body, we cannot say with certainty that the mind is its mode. In the mean time, since the body about which we doubt may nevertheless subsist and since there is no reason why it may not be modified by the mind—which is evident from what has been said earlier—this is enough to show that the mind of which we are certain may be a mode of that doubtful body. (1654, 338)

Given Regius’ disagreement with Descartes about the concept of a human mind, and his rejection of innate ideas, it was not surprising that he also rejected the ontological argument for God’s existence that Descartes had proposed in the Fifth Meditation (AT VII, 65). The Dutch philosopher accepted that the “actual and necessary existence of God is comprehended in the idea or concept of God.” He argued, however, that it does not follow from that concept that God exists actually and necessarily. “It merely follows that, if he existed anywhere, he would exist necessarily rather than contingently or that, in that case, he would not be capable of not existing” (Regius 1654, 357).

One could interpret the gradual dissociation between Regius and Descartes, and the rejection by the former of the latter’s metaphysics, as an endorsement by Regius of one dominant feature of the Cartesian enterprise, namely, the new natural philosophy that was inaugurated in Le Monde. Regius had followed the logic of Descartes’ natural philosophy by denying any explanatory value in the hypothesis of souls in animals. “Since indeed the actions of beasts … can be explained simply by the disposition of their spirits and other bodily parts, and since entities should not be multiplied without necessity, we have no reason to attribute any intellect to beasts” (Regius 1646, 241–42). He might have followed the same logic in the case of human intelligence, had he not been restrained by his understanding of the teaching of Scripture, and his apparent acceptance on biblical grounds that the human mind is an immaterial substance. Rather than endorse Cartesian metaphysics, as found in the Meditations, which seemed to return its author to the scholastic philosophy that he explicitly rejected, Regius struggled with the competing demands of Scripture and the logic of Cartesian natural philosophy. The challenge of this conjunction is evident in Regius’ repeated attempts to describe the unity of mind and body ‘in a single substance’ (1646, 248) while maintaining that the mind is “something that is really distinct from the body and is separable from it in reality” (1646, 246). This epistemic dualism, to the effect that we acquire some beliefs from natural knowledge and others from Scripture, has been understood, by some readers, as intellectually dishonest and as a typical libertine camouflage for cryptic materialism (Hallyn, 2005). But, as Bos (2013) shows, Regius may have accepted the limits of human knowledge, based on reason and experience, and also adopted a commonplace understanding of the certainty of Scripture. By doing so, he became a reluctant dualist without endorsing Cartesian metaphysics.


Works by Regius

  • 1640a. Disputatio medico-physiologica pro sanguinis circulatione, Utrecht: Aeg. Roman; reprinted in AT III, 727–34.
  • 1640b. Spongia qua eluuntur sordes Animadversionum, quas Jacobus Primirosius, Doctor Medicus, adversus Theses pro Circulatione sanguinis in Academia Ultrajectina disputatas nuper edidit, Leiden: W. Christiaens. [Available online.]
  • 1641a. Physiologia, sive Cognitio sanitatis. Tribus disputationibus in Academia Ultrajectina publice proposita, Utrecht: Aeg. Roman; reprinted in Bos 2002, 195–248.
  • 1641b. Disputatio medica prima [–tertia] De illustribus aliquot quaestionibus physiologicis, Utrecht: Aeg. Roman.
  • 1642. Responsio, sive Notae in Appendicem ad Corollaria Theologico-Philosophica Viri Reverendi et Celeberrimi D. Gisberti Voetii, SS. Theologiae Doctoris et Professoris, et in Academiâ Ultrajectina p.t. Rectoris Magnifici, verbique Divini in Ecclesia Ministri, Utrecht: J. van Doorn. [Available online.]
  • 1646. Fundamenta physices, Amsterdam: L. Elsevier. [Available online.]
  • 1647a. Fundamenta medica, Utrecht: Th. van Ackersdijck. [Available online.]
  • 1647b. Medicatio viri cachexia leucophlegmatica affecti. Corollaria, Utrecht: J. van Noortdyck.
  • 1648. Brevis explicatio mentis humanae, sive animae rationalis: ubi explicatur, quid sit, & quid esse possit, Utrecht: Th. van Ackersdijck and G. van Zijll. [Available online.]
  • 1650. De Affectibus animi dissertatio, Utrecht: Th. van Ackersdijck. [Available online.]
  • 1654. Philosophia naturalis, Amsterdam: L. Elsevier (2nd enlarged edn. of Regius 1646). [Available online.]
  • 1657. Brevis explicatio mentis humanae, sive animae rationalis: antea publico examini proposita, et deinde operâ Henrici Regii Ultrajectini nonnihil dilucidata, et à notis Cartesii vindicata, Utrecht: Th. van Ackersdijck and G. van Zijll (2nd enlarged edn. of Regius 1648). [Available online.]
  • 1661a. Philosophia naturalis, Amsterdam: L. and D. Elsevier (3rd edn. of Regius 1646). [Available online.]
  • 1661b. Epistola Henrici Regii ad V. Cl. Clerselierum JCtum Parisiensem, Utrecht: Th. van Ackersdijck and G. van Zijll. [Available online.]
  • 1687. Philosophie naturelle, Utrecht: R. van Zyll (French translation of Regius 1661a). [Available online.]

See also Erik-Jan Bos (ed.), The Correspondence between Descartes and Henricus Regius, Utrecht: ZENO, The Leiden-Utrecht Research Institute of Philosophy, 2002. This includes significant changes to the correspondence as published in Descartes 1964–76. [Available online.]

Related Early Works

  • Andreae, Tobias, 1653. Brevis Replicatio Reposita Brevi Explicationi Mentis Humanae, sive animae Rationalis, D. Henrici Regii, Medici ac Philosophi Ultrajectini, Amsterdam: L. Elzevier. [Available online.]
  • Descartes, René, 1648. Notae in Programma quoddam, sub finem Anni 1647 in Belgio editum, cum hoc titulo: Explicatio Mentis humanae, sive Animae rationalis, ubi explicatur quid sit, & quid esse posset, Amsterdam: L. Elzevier.
  • Descartes, René, [AT]. Oeuvres de Descartes, revised edition., Ch. Adam and P. Tannery (eds.), 12 volumes. Paris: Vrin/CNRS, 1964–76.
  • Descartes, René, [CB]. Descartes’ Conversation with Burman, trans. J. Cottingham. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1976.
  • Descartes, René, The Correspondence of René Descartes 1643, T. Verbeek, E.-J. Bos, and J. van de Ven (eds.), Utrecht: Zeno Institute of Philosophy, 2003. [This is the first volume of a projected complete edition of Descartes’ correspondence.] [Available online.]
  • Medical Dissertations 1636–60, A compilation at the British Library in which some of Regius’ disputations are bound.
  • Schoock, Martinus, 1643. Admiranda Methodus novae philosophiae Renati des Cartes, Utrecht: J. van Waesberge. [Available online.] French trans. in Verbeek 1988, 157–320.
  • Voetius, Gisbertus, 1648–69. Selectarum Disputationum Theologicarum, 5 volumes, Utrecht and Amsterdam: J. van Waesberge.

Modern works

  • Alexandru, Vlad, 2013. ‘Regius and Gassendi on the Human Soul,’ Intellectual History Review, 23: 1–20.
  • Bitbol-Herpéries, Annie, 1993. ‘Descartes et Regius: leur pensée médicale,’ in Verbeek 1993, 47–68.
  • Bellis, Delphine, 2013. ‘Empiricism without Metaphysics: Regius’ Cartesian Natural Philosophy,’ in Cartesian Empiricisms, M. Dobre and T. Nyden (eds.), Dordrecht: Springer, 151–83.
  • Bos, Erik-Jan, 1999. ‘Descartes’s Lettre Apologétique aux Magistrats d’Utrecht: New Facts and Materials,’ Journal of the History of Philosophy, 37: 415–33.
  • –––, 2013. ‘Henricus Regius et les limites de la philosophie Cartésienne,’ in Qu’est-ce qu’être cartésien?, D. Kolesnik-Antoine (ed.), Lyon: ENS Editions.
  • –––, 2015. ‘Regius and the diffusion of Cartesianism in the early 1640s –– and beyond’,’ in Les Pays-Bas aux XVIIe et XVIIIe siècles: Nouveaux regards, C. Secretan and D. Antoine-Mahut (eds.), Paris: Champion.
  • –––, 2017. ‘Descartes and Regius on the Pineal Gland and Animal Spirits, and A Letter of Regius on the True Seat of the Soul,’ in Gaukroger and Wilson 2017, 95–111.
  • Clarke, Desmond M., 2006. Descartes: A Biography, New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2010. ‘The Physics and Metaphysics of the Mind: Descartes and Regius,’ in Mind, Method, and Morality: Essays in Honour of Anthony Kenny, J. Cottingham and P. Hacker (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 187–207.
  • –––, 2011. ‘Hypotheses,’ in The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy in Early Modern Europe, D. Clarke and C. Wilson (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 249–71.
  • Farina, Paolo, 1975. ‘Sulla formazione scientifica di H. Regius: Santorio e il ‘De statica medicina’,’ Rivista Critica de Storia della Filosofia, 33: 363–99.
  • Fowler, Colin F., 1999. Descartes on the Human Soul. Philosophy and the Demands of Christian Doctrine, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Gariepy, Thomas P., 1991. Mechanism without Metaphysics: Henricus Regius and the Establishment of Cartesian Medicine, PhD dissertation, Yale University, New Haven: Yale University.
  • Gaukroger, Stephen, and Catherine Wilson (eds.), 2017. Descartes and Cartesianism: Essays in Honour of Desmond Clarke, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hallyn, Ferdinand, 2005. ‘La Philosophia naturalis de Regius et l’écriture athée,’ Libertinage et philosophie au XVIIe siècle, 9: 37–46.
  • Kolesnik-Antoine, Delphine, 2013. ‘Le rôle des expériences dans la physiologie d’Henricus Regius: les ‘pierres lydiennes’ du cartésianisme’, Journal of Early Modern Studies, 1: 125–45.
  • Olivo, Gilles, 1993. ‘L’homme en personne,’ in Verbeek 1993, 69–91.
  • Schmalz, Tad M., 1997. ‘Descartes on innate ideas, sensation, and scholasticism: The response to Regius,’ Oxford Studies in the History of Philosophy, 2: 33–73.
  • –––, 2017. Early Modern Cartesianisms: Dutch and French Constructions, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2018. ‘The Curious Case of Henricus Regius,’ in The Oxford Handbook of Descartes and Cartesianism, S. Nadler, T.M. Schmaltz, and D. Antoine-Mahut (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 434–49.
  • Verbeek, Theo, 1988. La Querelle d’Utrecht, Paris: Les impressions nouvelles.
  • –––, 1992. Descartes and the Dutch: Early Reactions to Cartesian Philosophy, 1637–1650, Carbondale and Edwardsville: Southern Illinois University Press.
  • ––– (ed.), 1993. Descartes et Regius: Autour de l’Explication de l’esprit humain, Amsterdam-Atlanta: Rodopi.
  • –––, 1994. ‘Regius’s Fundamenta Physices,’ Journal of the History of Ideas, 55: 533–51.
  • –––, 2000. ‘The Invention of Nature: Descartes and Regius,’ in Descartes’ Natural Philosophy, S. Gaukroger, J. Shuster and J. Sutton (eds.), London and New York: Routledge, 149–67.
  • –––, 2016. ‘Henricus Regius (Hendrik de Roy) (1598-1679),’ in The Cambridge Descartes Lexicon, L. Nolan (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 641–44.
  • –––, 2017. ‘Regius and Descartes on the Passions,’ in Gaukroger and Wilson 2017, 164–76.
  • Vrijer, M.J.A. de, 1917. Henricus Regius: Een ‘cartesiaansch’ hoogleraar aan de Utrechtsche hoogeschool, The Hague: Nijhoff.
  • Wilson, Catherine, 2000. ‘Descartes and the Corporeal Mind: Some Implications of the Regius Affair,’ in Descartes’ Natural Philosophy, S. Gaukroger et al. (eds.), London and New York: Routledge, 659–79.


Although this entry was written by the late Desmond Clarke, the ‘Bibliography only’ update published in October 2019 was by Erik-Jan Bos, who as a consequence is now listed as a coauthor.

Copyright © 2019 by
Desmond Clarke
Erik-Jan Bos <erik-jan.bos@xs4all.nl>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free