History of Western Philosophy of Music: since 1800
This entry covers the development of Western philosophy of music since 1800—for its earlier history, see the entry on history of western philosophy of music: from antiquity to 1800.
From the beginning of the nineteenth century, Western philosophy of music starts to consider instrumental music as the key to understanding music’s place among the arts. No longer an apparent irregularity to be somehow explained away, music’s lack of representational, linguistic, or conceptual content is what confers on music its peculiar value, and sets it apart from the other art forms.
The rise of formalist approaches can be considered a normative upshot of this shift of perspective. According to formalist doctrines, it is inappropriate to the appreciation of music as an art to rely on the images it suggests, the emotions it arouses, or the concepts it may call to mind. Even philosophers who think music has a content are no longer satisfied with a musical semantics modeled after that of language or pictures. Arthur Schopenhauer is exemplary of this tendency (see §1.2).
The focus on instrumental music remains relatively unchallenged over the course of the twentieth century, but new problems emerge. Phenomenological and analytic approaches explore the ontological nature of the musical work (see §2.1 and §2.6). The philosopher and sociologist Theodor W. Adorno tackles the relationship between music’s emergence as an autonomous art and its possible role as an instrument of social critique (see §2.5).
For book-length introductions to the history of Western philosophy of music, see: Fubini 1991; Lippman 1992; Bowman 1998; Martinelli 2012 ; Young forthcoming. Excerpts from classic works are collected in: Strunk 1950; Le Huray and Day 1981; Lippman 1990; Katz and Dahlhaus 1993; Fubini 1994.
- 1. Nineteenth Century
- 2. Twentieth Century
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1. Nineteenth Century
1.1 Romantic Musical Aesthetics
At the end of the eighteenth century, a new aesthetic sensibility emerges in Europe. The imitation of nature loses ground to new values such as the expression of feelings and the autonomy of art. No longer confined to the imitation of the sensible world, art is conceived as a way to attain knowledge of a transcendent reality. This shift in attitude is of paramount importance for the position of music among the arts. If the eighteenth century had struggled to fit the growing instrumental repertoire into the clothes of imitation, the Romantics proclaimed music’s superiority precisely in virtue of its absolute nature. And while the early modern period had occasionally touted the pleasures of listening, the Romantics raised the bar, stressing that music’s value is not primarily hedonic, but rather cognitive.
The rise of this new musical aesthetics is particularly evident in the works of Wilhelm Heinrich Wackenroder (1773–1798). His Fantasies on Art for Friends of Art [Phantasien über die Kunst für Freunde der Kunst] (1799), while unsystematic and lacking argumentation, is rich in suggestions. For instance, we find in it a tell-tale comparison between music and the visual arts. The latter can at best aim at a convincing imitation of natural objects, though their productions hardly compare to the beauty of nature. Not so with music, as natural sounds have little value when compared to musical tones, since these
are of an entirely different nature; they don’t imitate, they don’t beautify, but rather represent a separate world in itself. (Wackenroder 1799: 241, my translation)
If music does not deal with the world as we know it from ordinary perception, but rather with a transcendent reality, then language will fail to describe music effectively. This is what we could call the ineffability thesis, which emerges in various forms in the writings of Romantic philosophers, critics, and musicians. The view is conveyed not so much by the weak claim that we do not currently have words to name what music means or expresses, but rather by the stronger claim that we could not possibly find them. While it is perhaps Arthur Schopenhauer who is responsible for the most influential philosophical account of ineffability (see following section), the composer Felix Mendelssohn (1809–1847) gives the ineffability thesis its most famous formulation when he states that
[t]he thoughts which are expressed to me by a piece of music which I love are not too indefinite to be put into words, but on the contrary too definite. (letter to Marc-André Souchay 15 October 1842, quoted in Fubini 1991: 307)
The composer and historian of music August Wilhelm Ambros (1816–1876), further away from the heyday of the Romantic movement, makes a somewhat weaker claim:
Poetry, much like music, is able to express feelings, for which it would be almost impossible to find a corresponding term. (Ambros 1885: 70, my translation)
The ineffability thesis was put into question around the middle of the century by the growing support for formalist tendencies, which saw in our inability to name the feelings expressed by music a symptom of its expressive poverty (see §1.6).
Precisely because of its strikingly Romantic tinge, it is tempting to brush off the ineffability thesis as a historical curiosity. However, it is worth noting that the rejection of language as a model for the understanding of music is a move that allows us to look at music as a symbol in its own right, with its own syntactic and semantic rules. Fubini writes:
Instrumental music had always been charged with indeterminacy; yet it is only indeterminate when it is viewed from the standpoint of verbal language. Herein lies the great discovery of the Romantic thinkers, that the idiom of music is of a quite different order, and is to be measured with an entirely different yardstick. (Fubini 1991: 266)
Far from being confined to a Romantic curiosity, the difference between language and music qua symbol systems will be explored in the twentieth century by proponents of semiotic approaches such as Susanne Langer and Nelson Goodman (see §2.3).
Wackenroder also voices another typically Romantic view, according to which the emotions expressed by an artwork bear a relation to the ones felt by the artist as she composed the work. In Wackenroder’s Outpourings of an Art-Loving Monk [Herzensergiessungen eines kunstliebenden Klosterbruders] (1797), the fictional Joseph Berglinger
filled his soul with the most sublime poetry, with a full and exultant hymn, and, in a marvelous inspiration, but still violently shaken emotionally, he set down a passion music which, with its deeply affecting melodies, embodying all the pains of suffering, will forever remain a masterpiece. (Wackenroder 1797 [1950: 762])
In its strongest formulation, this view holds that a work of music being sad, happy, and the like, requires the author to have been in that emotional state when composing the work. This is known today as expression theory (for a classic exposition, see Abrams 1971: chapter 4), and is sometimes paired with the further claim that, upon appreciating the work, one will be put in an emotional state similar to the artist’s. Although it is now largely discredited (Tormey 1971; Budd 1985: chapter 7), the expression theory is a paradigmatic view of artistic production as (emotional) communication between two individuals. Wackenroder, again through the character of Berglinger, is comforted by the thought that
there may be someone whom Heaven has made so sympathetic to my soul that he will feel on hearing my melodies precisely what I felt in writing them—precisely what I sought to put in them. (Wackenroder 1797 [1950: 759])
Ludwig van Beethoven (1770–1827), is arguably the most important composer who described his compositional practice in ways that are suggestive of the expression theory:
[…] like the poet who is inspired by the feelings that he transmutes into words, I too am inspired to turn my feelings into the music that sounds within me and torments me until finally it has been put down in notes on the sheet of paper in front of me. (Beethoven 1961, quoted in Fubini 1991: 288)
Wackenroder’s writings already show evidence of the change in attitude toward instrumental music. Ernst Theodor Amadeus Hoffmann (1776–1822), a writer, composer, and critic, is a crucial figure in this process. The start of his essay Beethoven’s Instrumental Music (1813) is a quintessential expression of the Romantic conception of music:
When we speak of music as an independent art, should we not always restrict our meaning to instrumental music, which, scorning every aid, every admixture of another art (the art of poetry), gives pure expression to music’s specific nature, recognizable in this form alone? It is the most romantic of all the arts—one might almost say, the only genuinely romantic one—for its sole subject is the infinite. (Hoffman 1813 [1950: 775])
The glorification of instrumental music is paired with the condemnation of imitation. Extra-musical imagery, however, is not altogether banned, at least on the listener’s side: much like Wackenroder, Hoffmann helps himself to fanciful descriptions of music, and uses these in order to bring out the differences among the three greatest representatives of the Viennese School. Thus, Haydn “leads us into vast green woodlands” (Hoffman 1813 [1950 ), Mozart “leads us into the heart of the spirit realm” (1813 [1950: 777]), whereas Beethoven’s instrumental music “opens up to us also the realm of the monstrous and the immeasurable” (1813 [1950: 777]). Hoffman’s essay also contains a version of the ineffability thesis:
music discloses to man an unknown realm, a world that has nothing in common with the external sensual words that surrounds him, a world in which he leaves behind him all definite feelings to surrender himself to an inexpressible longing. (Hoffman 1813 [1950: 775–776])
While many of these claims are advanced by early Romantics without much argumentative support, at least some of these views are given a more systematic defense by Schopenhauer.
1.2 Romantic Metaphysics of Music: Schopenhauer
The art of music occupies a central place in Arthur Schopenhauer’s (1788–1860) philosophical system, with which it is inextricably linked. A brief overview of Schopenhauer’s system is thus in order. He accepts the Kantian distinction between the world as it is in itself and as it appears to us, but rejects Kant’s claim that we cannot know reality as it is independently from its phenomenal manifestation. As representing subjects, our knowledge is bound by what Schopenhauer terms principium individuationis, which orders representations according to a spatio-temporal structure and determines causal relationships between them. Objects are thus given to us in a mediated fashion, as representations. But one object is given to us as experiencing subjects both in a mediated and in an unmediated fashion. This is our own body, which is experienced both from the outside, as a representation, and from the inside, as an incessant succession of drives and impulses. Schopenhauer claims that this reveals the fundamental noumenal essence of the world as Will. Since the Will is endless striving and desiring, and since desiring and striving are by nature sources of pain, the world is essentially characterized by suffering. Additionally, Schopenhauer claims that the Will objectifies itself in the world through a set of Platonic Ideas, which exist beyond the principium individuationis, and are ranked according to the degree in which the Will is objectivized in them.
In Schopenhauer’s system, art acquires its value from its capacity to represent the Ideas, exploiting a form of cognition that is different from rational and intellectual cognition, which by nature cannot go beyond the principium individuationis. This cognition is valuable because it removes us from the network of deterministically linked representations and motives that constitute our ordinary existence in the thralls of our desires and longings.
Schopenhauer ranks the various arts according to the Ideas they represent. The higher the degree of objectivation of the Will in a given Idea, the higher the hierarchical position of the art representing that Idea. Accordingly, architecture is found at the bottom of the hierarchy, as it deals with the Ideas of basic physical forces and inanimate matter, whereas tragedy occupies the highest position, as it represents the struggles of the human condition, where the Will is most evidently manifest.
In this hierarchy of the arts, music’s value is superior even to that of tragedy. According to Schopenhauer, music is not a representation of Ideas, but rather of the Will itself. Music and the world are expressions of the same metaphysical principle, the Will. This motivates Schopenhauer’s remark that music could exist even if there were no world at all (1819: §52). If music is an expression of the Will just as the world is, and given that the Will objectifies itself in the world through the Platonic Ideas, one can trace a parallel between music and degrees of objectivation of the Will. Particularly, Schopenhauer sets up an analogy between pitch range and degrees of objectivation. Thus, the lowest areas of the audible pitch range are associated with the lowest degrees, such as inorganic nature and physical forces, whereas the higher regions of the pitch range match with the highest level of objectivation of the Will, self-conscious human beings. Schopenhauer motivates this analysis through a rather audacious interpretation of both acoustics and music theory. This series of correspondences between music and the extra-musical world is reminiscent of the Pythagorean notion of celestial harmony (see the entry history of western philosophy of music: from antiquity to 1800, section 1.1). Schopenhauer questionably and conveniently identifies high pitch with melody. This is questionable because the melodic element in music is not determined by pitch range, but rather by relational properties, nor is a melody always composed of the highest notes in a given piece. It is convenient, because the parallel between pitch range and degrees of objectivation allows Schopenhauer to consider the unfolding of a melody as analogous to human emotional life. Much as human life is characterized by an alternation of need and satisfaction, melodies feature continuous shifts from tension to relaxation. The emotions we encounter in music have a peculiar status: they are neither particular, for they are beyond the principium individuationis, nor general, as they are not abstracted from particular cases as concepts are, and cannot therefore be captured linguistically.
It should be stressed that, according to Schopenhauer, music does not arouse such emotions in the listener, and if it did, it would not be valuable on those grounds. In fact, the value of music resides exactly in its capacity to present us with the Will in its highest degree of objectivation, without having to experience its stirrings ourselves—the latter experience would be an inherently unpleasant one, according to Schopenhauer. The value of music as art is thus, according to Schopenhauer, eminently cognitive.
From this view of music, some normative consequences follow. First, because the analogy between music and the world depends on their being expressions of the same metaphysical Will, and because the Will lies beyond the scope of conceptual knowledge, Schopenhauer condemns imitative music, as this depicts the world by imitating its sonic appearance to a subject, rather than its inner essence. Second, because the knowledge provided by music is superior to discursive knowledge, Schopenhauer dismisses works and genres in which the music is subservient to the lyrics. Third, because Schopenhauer holds the music’s melodic element to be central to its value, he is dismissive of music in which melody is inconspicuous (“In the compositions of today there is more emphasis on the harmony than the melody; I however take the opposite view and regard melody as the core of music, to which harmony relates as does sauce to a roast” Schopenhauer 1851: chapter 19, § 219).
Schopenhauer’s view of music influenced a number of composers. His impact on Richard Wagner could hardly have been greater (see §1.4; Magee 1997: chapter 17; Karnes & Mitchell 2020; on Schopenhauer’s musical aesthetics, see Alperson 1981; Budd 1985: chapter 5; Wicks 2008: 106–111).
1.3 Idealist Musical Aesthetics: Schelling and Hegel
Music’s rise to prominence among the arts is signaled by the increasing number of major philosophers who find space for it in their systems. These include Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling (1775–1854) and Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel (1770–1831). The greatest contribution of idealist philosophy to the aesthetics of music is perhaps the idea that music’s temporal nature is crucial to its peculiar status among the arts (see Johnson 1991: 159).
Schelling developed his philosophy of art in a series of lectures he gave in the years 1802–03 and 1804–05, although the result of these efforts was published only posthumously in 1859. He conceives of art as the manifestation of the Infinite in the Finite, and divides the arts into formative (bildende, often rendered as “figurative”) and verbal (redende). Formative arts function by manipulating their characteristic material, that is, their medium, whereas verbal arts convey content semantically. Music belongs to the formative arts, alongside painting and sculpture. Schelling distinguishes three elements in music: rhythm, modulation (harmony), and melody. On these he projects the triad of the formative arts, claiming that rhythm is the musical in music, modulation the painterly, and melody the sculptural. As this suggests, Schelling believes rhythm, and more generally music’s temporal dimension, to be of fundamental importance. Music’s necessary form is temporal succession. Rhythm allows us to perceive a multiplicity of temporally contiguous moments as a unity, and thereby performs a function similar to that of self-consciousness, which allows us to perceive various experiences as a unified whole (Schelling 1859: §79).
Similar ideas are developed in more rigorous and systematic fashion by Hegel, whose reflections on music are embedded in an articulated system of the arts (see Moland 2019: chapter 9). This system is itself related to a historical analysis of art’s development, which in turn is grounded in an idealist metaphysics. According to Hegel, reality coincides with a self-determining spiritual principle, or Idea (Idee). The Idea develops historically through branching triadic patterns constituted by a thesis, or positive moment, its negation or antithesis, and a synthesis of the two. Each moment may itself branch into a further triadic pattern, which is thus nested under the higher-order ones. The highest forms of development of the Idea involve self-conscious Spirit (Geist), as we find it in human life and society. Spirit’s third moment is absolute spirit, which in turn branches into art, religion, and philosophy, the latter being the culmination of the Idea’s unfolding. Art’s relative proximity to philosophy is an indication of its relatively high value in Hegel’s eyes, and its contiguity to religion will mean that at least some art will share some features with religion. Whereas philosophy expresses the Spirit through concepts, and religion does so through metaphors and representations, art is the sensuous expression of the Spirit’s freedom. Beauty is thus defined as “the pure appearance of the Idea to sense” (Hegel 1835: part I, chapter I, 3).
According to Hegel, art may be further analyzed in terms of a triadic structure, in such a way that we may distinguish its development through symbolic, classical, and romantic art. Hegel’s system of the individual arts is dependent on this historical unfolding, as the various art forms are differently suited to each of the three stages. Symbolic art falls short of art proper, and is in fact described by Hegel as pre-art (Vorkunst), as it limits itself to offering symbols of the Spirit, as opposed to giving an adequate sensory presentation of its freedom. Classical art is art at its fullest, as it gives a perfectly adequate sensuous presentation of the spiritual. Hegel holds that this is best exemplified by classical Greek art, and particularly sculpture. Romantic art (by which Hegel means Christian art from the Middle Ages onwards) is characterized by the expression of a content that transcends the visible realm, since it expresses an inward freedom, as opposed to an external one. Hegel writes:
The true content of romantic art is absolute inwardness, and its corresponding form is spiritual subjectivity with its grasp of its independence and freedom. (Hegel 1835: part II, section III, Introduction, 2)
This content will then best be represented by religion, which follows art in the triadic sequence.
Because romantic art’s content is inward freedom, sculpture is no longer adequate, as it is bound to the representation of three-dimensional figures. Painting, however, abandons the third dimension, and is further able to express interiority through the use of color. But in subjective inwardness the spatial dimension is altogether absent. Its only appreciable dimension is that of the temporal unfolding of our mental life, characterized by the rapid succession of states that replace one another in our consciousness. Music is the art that is best suited to the expression of this inward dimension, as it abandons spatial extension entirely, and develops solely through time. Music is thus the art form that is best suited to romantic art.
The perception of one’s own persistence through time requires discrete events that break the otherwise continuous and identical stream of temporality. This is achieved in music through meter and rhythm, which subdivide the music’s unfolding in ordered, discrete units. Harmony fills in this abstract structure with notes. Melody, which Hegel conceives of as a synthesis of rhythm and harmony, is the highest manifestation of music, “the sphere of its properly artistic inventions” (Hegel 1835: part III, section III, chapter II, 2.c).
Melody allows music to give sensuous manifestation to the freedom of the Spirit by presenting feelings in their temporal unfolding. Hegel does not say much as to how melody achieves its expressive task. He contrasts expression in music and painting, claiming that only the latter is concerned with the exact reproduction of expressive behavior. However, some kind of imitation of human expressions still seems to play a role in Hegel’s account, as he then adds that in music
the simple cry is analysed into a series of notes, into a movement, the change and course of which is supported by harmony and rounded into whole by melody. (Hegel 1835: part III, section III, chapter II, 3.a)
This framework allows Hegel to develop an original argument in support of the otherwise commonplace view that music moves us. The self is constituted in time, and musical sounds exist in time. It is this common medium that allows music to exert such a powerful effect on our emotional life (Hegel 1835: part III, section III, chapter II, 1.c). Poetry shares with music its temporal and aural dimension, but it separates medium from content, as the concepts conveyed by a poem are arbitrarily linked to the words that constitute it, whereas music’s content is inseparable from its sounding (Hegel 1835: part III, section III, chapter II, 1.a).
Hegel distinguishes between accompanying and independent music. To the former belongs any work that involves music and a text, whereas the latter is instrumental music. When music functions as an accompaniment, Hegel holds that the text should be subordinate to the music (Hegel 1835: part III, section III, chapter II, 3). Independent music is music at its full potential, as it is best able to express the freedom of the Spirit, for subjective experience unfolds undetermined by concepts (Hegel 1835: part III, section III, chapter II, 3.b). However, independent music also harbors a potential danger, as it may be tempted to rely on its formal complexity and forego emotional content entirely, in which case it would strictly speaking cease to be art (Hegel 1835: part III, section III, chapter II, 1.b). Here Hegel pairs a Romantic vindication of instrumental music as music par excellence with an eighteenth century suspicion of music that is not expressive of emotions.
The originality of Hegel’s musical thinking is also manifested in the few considerations he devotes to the role of the performer. These are introduced and motivated by an observation on the mode of existence peculiar to musical works: while in painting and sculpture we appreciate the product of an activity, in music we appreciate the process of production (Hegel 1835: part III, section III, chapter II, 3.c). Hegel then distinguishes two approaches to performance. The first relinquishes personal contributions on the part of the performer, and seeks to render the work as faithfully as possible, whereas the second allows the performer some initiative (Hegel 1835: part III, section III, chapter II, 3.c). Hegel claims that the two approaches bear a relation to accompanying and independent music, respectively, but does not imply that each approach is best suited to its corresponding kind of music.
1.4 Music and Drama: Wagner
Richard Wagner (1813–1883) is the most important major Western composer to have left a sizable body of philosophical writings on music. In addition to the intrinsic interest of his own views and their relation to the composer’s musical production, Wagner’s place in the history of the philosophy of music is secured by the influence Schopenhauer exercised on him, and by the one he in turn had on another major philosopher, Friedrich Nietzsche (see §1.2 and §1.5).
Despite the vast literature on Wagner’s music, relatively few works take seriously the philosophical details of his writings, and some are openly dismissive of his undeniably meandering, rhetorically charged prose (see for instance Fubini 1991: 325; significant works on Wagner’s philosophy and aesthetics are Grey 1995, Magee 2000, and Young 2014).
Wagner’s first substantial theoretical contributions are the so-called Zurich writings (1849–52), from the name of the city where he spent his exile for having taken part in the 1848 revolution, political movements inspired by democratic and liberal ideals. In these works, Wagner objects to the current state of art in society, and argues that only a new kind of artwork, a “total” artwork (Gesamtkunstwerk) uniting the various art forms, could reestablish art’s role as the “living utterance of a free, self-conscious community” (Wagner 1849a [1892: 41]). According to Wagner, contemporary art is enslaved to either political or financial power. It will become a genuine expression of the community that produces it only after its liberation from the constraints imposed by both the government and the market. Thus, Wagner claims in Art and Revolution (1849) that art is not essentially revolutionary, although it need be revolutionary given the current conditions, “because its very existence is opposed to the ruling spirit of the community” (Wagner 1849a [1892: 52]).
Wagner’s paradigm of the total artwork is the Greek tragic festival. While he does not call for its literal restoration, Wagner argues that the artwork of the future should be like the Greek one in some crucial respects. It should involve all strata of society (Wagner 1849a; Wagner 1852b: part II, 2). Most famously, it should unite the various art forms (Wagner 1849a; Wagner 1849b: IV). Aside from his reliance on the authority of the Greek model, at least two additional argument are advanced by Wagner in support of the Gesamtkunstwerk. First, Wagner argues that its multi-sensory nature is best apt to give rise to an immersive, lifelike experience (Wagner 1852b: part II, 2; for discussion, see Young 2014: 46–48). Second, Wagner holds that an art is unfree (unfrei) when in isolation, free when it cooperates with other art forms (Wagner 1849b: II, 2). The argument seems to rely on an analogy with human freedom, which Wagner conceived as possible only for an individual who is part of a collective. In both cases, absence of limitations is equated with an absence of freedom.
Wagner’s admiration for Greek tragedy is only superficially similar to the Camerata’s attempt to revive it (see the entry history of western philosophy of music: from antiquity to 1800, section 3.2). In Opera and Drama (1852), he argues that opera’s fundamental mistake has been that of subordinating opera’s end (drama) to its means (music). He then describes opera as misguided from its very origins in Italy (Wagner 1852b: Introduction).
In 1854 Wagner encountered for the first time the work of Arthur Schopenhauer. This produced a decisive and immediate influence on Wagner’s worldview, which in turn had an impact on his musical production and theoretical works. Although Wagner’s late writings are less systematic than those of 1849–52, a new view of music and drama finds expression in his essay Beethoven (1870) and in The Destiny of Opera (1871).
In the Beethoven essay, Wagner describes Schopenhauer as the first philosopher who gave a clear treatment of music’s place among the arts. Schopenhauer’s philosophy of music gives a privileged status to pure instrumental music (see §1.2), an assumption that contrasts with Wagner’s central commitment to a union of the arts, as well as with his related reservations about music alone. Under Schopenhauer’s influence, the late Wagner surrenders some central points of his earlier view, as evident from his claim that “a piece of music loses nothing of its character even when the most diverse texts are laid beneath it”, and the subsequent contention that the union of music and poetry always results in the subordination of the latter (Wagner 1870 [1896: 104). This stands in stark contrast with Wagner’s earlier characterization of melody as an element that should not attract the listener’s attention, functioning merely as “the most expressive vehicle for an emotion already plainly outlined in the words” (Wagner 1851 1852a: 372). Wagner denies a contradiction between his earlier and late views, although Young (2014: 101–107) notes that changes are evident both from Wagner’s writings as well as from the musical production that follows his encounter with Schopenhauer—especially the three works in the Ring cycle that follow Das Rheingold.
The main elements of Friedrich Nietzsche’s (1844–1900) musical aesthetics are laid out in his first book, The Birth of Tragedy (1872), which bears the clear influence of Schopenhauer and is dedicated to Wagner. The book describes the world as torn between two tendencies or principles, the Apollonian and the Dionysian.
The Apollonian element is the rational view of reality as subject to the principium individuationis, a concept that Nietzsche borrows from Schopenhauer (see §1.2). While ultimately an illusion, the Apollonian order of reality is necessary to the formation of any civilization. In opposition to the Apollonian, the Dionysian is the awareness of the fundamental unity of all beings, again in analogy with Schopenhauer’s metaphysical Will. If the former impulse is expressed in peaceful contemplation, the latter is manifested in states of ecstatic frenzy, which ought however to be contained in order to spare individuals and civilizations from self-destruction. According to Nietzsche, only in the balance between the two tendencies is life bearable.
In this picture, the arts differ in to the degree to which they embody one of these two tendencies. Sculpture is the Apollonian art par excellence, while music possesses to the highest degree the Dionysian component. The reasons for the identification of music as Dionysian are complex to reconstruct. Sorgner (20003 [2010: 147–149]) isolates three: (1) music relies on an experience of flow and temporal change; (2) music represents pain and strife through its use of dissonances; (3) music induces states of intoxication and self-forgetfulness through which we experience the fundamental unity of the world.
Greek tragedy is characterized by Nietzsche as the supreme artistic achievement because it expresses both tendencies. This, at least, is true of Aeschylus’ and Sophocles’ tragedies. Euripides, influenced by Socratic rationalism, expunged the Dionysian element from tragedy. Once tragedy lost its Dionysian element, it was also deprived of its redeeming power. According to Nietzsche, Wagner’s operas are to be credited for having brought back the synthesis of Apollonian and Dionysian elements, and thus to have made again available the redeeming power of the Greek tragedy.
The second part of The Birth of Tragedy is wedded to the Wagnerian agenda to such an extent that is has been defined as “by far the most ambitious defence of an individual artist ever mounted by a philosopher” (Ridley 2007: 31). Despite Nietzsche’s early enthusiastic endorsement of Wagner’s work, his infatuation with the composer soon began to fade, and finally turned into outright condemnation (on Nietzsche–Wagner relations, see Ridley 2007: appendix; Young 2014: epilogue; Prange 2013: chapters 1–6). While the reasons for this are complex, it seems clear that Wagner’s failure to embody the values of truly Dionysian music was crucial. This failure depended not only on Wagner’s own stylistic development, but also on Nietzsche’s reconsideration of the composer’s earlier achievement. Nietzsche later contrasts German and Romantic music with Dionysian music, which clashes with Nietzsche’s own earlier characterization of German music, and especially Wagner’s, as truly Dionysian (Nietzsche 1872: §19; about the contrast between Dionysian and Romantic art more generally, see Ridley 2007: 122–128). In Beyond Good and Evil (1886), Nietzsche contrasts the decadent music of the North to that of the South, epitomized by Bizet’s work, the chief value of which lies in its life-affirming quality (Nietzsche 1886: §554).
As is apparent from the above, Nietzsche’s evaluation of musical styles changed along with his philosophical views. Concrete examples of music he praises vary from Wagner’s Tristan and Isolde to Bizet’s Carmen. The clearest set of evaluative claims is found in The Birth of Tragedy, where opposition emerges between Apollonian and Dionysian music. The latter is obviously considered by Nietzsche as superior to the former, as he defines music as the art in which the Dionysian is present in the highest degree. Nietzsche offers little in terms of a clear distinction between the two, but he seems to think of Dionysian music as privileging melodic and harmonic components, whereas Apollonian music stresses rhythmical ones. Two other elements of Nietzsche’s view of music can be singled out, and Schopenhauer’s influence on both is evident. First, Nietzsche believes that music should never be subservient to a text (Nietzsche 1872: §19). Secondly, Nietzsche holds that music ought to avoid tone-painting, which is merely an imitation of the world’s appearance (Nietzsche 1872: §17). But if Nietzsche’s early musical aesthetics is close to Schopenhauer in his negative characterization of what is valuable in music, his positive notion of musical value departs significantly from Schopenhauer’s, as Nietzsche holds that music’s value is partly to be located in its capacity to arouse emotions or induce a certain psychological state (Nietzsche 1872: §2).
It is more daunting a task to reconstruct Nietzsche’s views on music after The Birth of Tragedy. In addition to the already mentioned distancing from Wagner, a relevant change in Nietzsche’s view is found in some remarks from Human, All Too Human (1878), which constitute a wholesale rejection of his earlier views concerning the relationship between music and language. In this work, musical meaning and expressiveness are described as a product of music’s longstanding association with poetic language and expressive gestures (Nietzsche 1878: § 215–16). Only through these associations is it possible for instrumental music to acquire meaning:
No music is in itself profound and meaningful, it does not speak of the “will” or of the “thing in itself”. (Nietzsche 1878 : § 215; on Nietzsche’s late musical aesthetics, see Higgins 1986; Young 1992: chapters 3–5; and Prange 2013: chapter 6)
1.6 Absolute Music and the Rise of Formalism
The nineteenth century witnessed the first explicit vindications of absolute music as an aesthetic ideal (for a history of this concept, see Dahlhaus 1978 , Pederson 2009, and Bonds 2014). The term was first used in 1846 by Wagner, who then employed it pejoratively in his 1849–51 writings in order to refer to music lacking any essential social function—in this sense, music is absolute insofar as it is socially autonomous (on Wagner’s uses of “absolute music”, see Grey 1995: 2; Chua 1999: 225; Pederson 2009: 241–245; Bonds 2014: 134 ff.). Wagner’s opponents appropriated the term in this second sense, to denote music that is not accompanied by a text, program, or other conceptual prompts. In this sense, the symphony was considered the paradigmatic example of absolute music (see Dahlhaus 1978 [1989: 10–11]). Absolute music is thus purely instrumental music—this is also how the expression is typically used today. The concept of absolute music may be used in a purely descriptive fashion: it denotes a subset of all musical works. However, nineteenth century aesthetics often adopted a normative view of absolute music as purely instrumental music. The view holds that music’s value is irreducible to that of other art forms, and that instrumental music is valuable for its formal properties, rather than for any content it may disclose (if it can do so in the first place), or feelings it may arouse. This is musical formalism.
While Kant was likely not a formalist (see the entry history of western philosophy of music: from antiquity to 1800, section 3.6), Young (2020: 180) observes that he was considered one from as early as the 1820s, as evident from the work of the Swiss composer Hans-Georg Nägeli (1773–1836). Nägeli gives early formulations of various standard formalist views. He argues that music does not have any determinate emotional character, as shown by the fact that people cannot agree on it if asked. Accordingly, music does not convey specific affects (Affekten), but merely moods (Stimmungen). It does not have any content (Inhalt), but merely form (Form) (Nägeli 1826: 32).
In addition to Kant’s aesthetics (or at least their interpretation of it), formalists could count on the support of a major philosopher, Johann Friedrich Herbart (1776–1841), who adopted an influential and undeniably formalist view of art. He defended the specificity of each art form, and distinguished the effects of the beautiful from the beautiful itself, the latter being the proper object of aesthetic appreciation.
To Nägeli and Herbart is indebted the greatest representative of musical formalism, Eduard Hanslick (1825–1904) (for a discussion of Hanslick’s forerunners, see Bonds 2014: 157 ff.; Wilfing 2018 debunks the widespread view that Kant exercised a decisive influence on Hanslick).
Hanslick’s brief treatise On the Musically Beautiful (1854) is one of the most influential works in history of musical aesthetics. The work gives a concise and persuasive formulation of the cardinal tenets of formalism. The book opens with a series of arguments against what he calls “the aesthetics of feeling” (Hanslick 1854 : chapter 1). This is the Romantic conception of music as concerned with the representation and arousal of emotions. The negative part of Hanslick’s work establishes that music cannot represent feelings, and that music’s arousal of feelings, while possible, is irrelevant to its aesthetic appreciation. Hanslick’s positive thesis is that the appreciation of music involves the intellect (Geist) rather than the emotions, as music’s only content is its form.
Hanslick’s negative argument against the aesthetics of feeling passes through two main lines of attack: a series of rather weak observations, and a brilliant argument grounded on a conceptual analysis of emotion.
Hanslick observes that, when instrumental music is unaccompanied by a text, music lovers are unable to indicate the feeling it expresses with any considerable degree of intersubjective agreement. He famously adapts an example from Boyé, noting that Gluck’s famous aria “Che farò senza Euridice”, expressive of dejection and despair, could express equally well joy if paired with a happy text (Hanslick 1854: chapter 2). The argument is supposed to prove that music is expressively neutral, but it only works because of the tendentious example. Music with a more clearly anguished character than Gluck’s aria is easy to find, and it would resist pairing with a happy text.
Hanslick further observes that a recitative would lose its poignant and specific expressive character if played unaccompanied by words. However, it is unsurprising that music designed to represent emotions together with a text is less able to do so on its own.
Hanslick also notes that music lovers would agree that a large and important part of the Western repertoire, exemplified by Bach’s Well-Tempered Clavier, does not represent any determinate emotion (Hanslick 1854: chapter 2). While this is a refutation of the claim that music necessarily represents emotions, it is irrelevant to the view that music may do so.
Finally, Hanslick produces what Kivy (1990b: 7) dubbed an “argument from disagreement”. Music critics will largely concur about the beauty of various works of music, but they will disagree when asked about the feeling they represent (Hanslick 1854: chapter 2). This is once more a weak argument, as it is easy to find works of music that are consistently characterized as expressive of some emotions, and not others.
Hanslick’s strongest claim against the aesthetics of feeling involves a subtle conceptual analysis of the structure of emotions. Hanslick observes that these cannot be identified by means of the feeling state they produce in us, as the same emotion may arouse different states, and two different emotions may share a similar one. The additional component that allows us to discriminate between different emotions is conceptual content. In Hanslick’s example, hope requires a concept of a future, better condition, whereas melancholy presupposes a comparison with a happier past. Hanslick concedes that music may be able to match the dynamic profile characteristic of a feeling state. However, music cannot provide the conceptual content that is necessary to the identification of specific emotions, and it cannot therefore represent them (Hanslick 1854: chapter 2; Kivy [1990b: 9] observes that Hanslick’s analysis anticipates the contemporary cognitive theory of emotions, first proposed in Kenny 1963; Alexander Malcolm [1721: 602] adumbrates the same argument, though he is discussing aroused emotions, as opposed to represented ones).
Hanslick’s positive view is that musical value is specifically musical, independent from any relation to other art forms, as well as to any concept derived from extra-musical reality. He does not give up talk of musical content entirely, but rather holds that this content is constituted by formal structures, “sonically moved forms” (tönend bewegte Formen; Hanslick 1854 : chapter 3; an earlier, influential translation [Hanslick 1986] renders the expression as “tonally moving forms”).
Although he denied that music may represent emotions, Hanslick concedes that it often arouses them. However, the emotions aroused by music are irrelevant to its aesthetic appreciation, as they do not have a bearing on the understanding of music’s formal properties.
Hanslick explicitly describes On the Musically Beautiful as a reaction to Wagner and Liszt (see Bonds 2014: 155), and the treatise is at times explicitly polemical (see for instance the end of chapter 2). There is in principle no tension between Hanslick’s claim that instrumental music’s content is limited to its form, and Wagner’s use of music in combination with other art forms. In fact, the creation of hybrid works is an obvious way to address instrumental music’s alleged semantic and expressive paucity. However, Wagner’s protestations against instrumental music and its inadequacy to his own goals were so radical that they threatened the aesthetic legitimacy of absolute music. This is what Hanslick set out to restore.
The historian and musicologist Ottokar Hostinský (1847–1910) attempted to reconcile Wagner’s and Hanslick’s views (Hostinský 1877; see also Lippman 1992: 316–317). His strategy was to argue for the possibility of hybrid art forms, while at the same time allowing for a specifically musical beauty that is manifested in absolute music.
While considerably less explored than his controversy with Wagner, Hanslick’s relation to Hegel is also interesting. Hegel’s claim regarding music’s ability to express subjective life surely falls within the scope of the negative argument laid out in On the Musically Beautiful. However, Hanslick makes a characteristically Hegelian move when he holds that musical form is music’s content. This is not a gratuitously paradoxical formulation, but rather bears the mark of Hegel’s conception of beauty as constituted by both form and content.
Hanslick’s treatise was enormously influential, and it remains widely discussed (for a review of early reactions, see Bonds 2014: appendix; recent work on Hanslick includes Landerer and Zangwill 2017, Sousa 2017, and Wilfing 2018). Recent scholarship has challenged the predominant formalist interpretation of Hanslick’s view (see Hall 1995, and Wilfing 2016).
1.7 Music and the Life Sciences: Darwin, Spencer, Gurney
The role of mathematics in the explanation of musical phenomena has been explored since Antiquity, and that of physics has become prominent since the seventeenth century. In the second half of the nineteenth century, scholars began to examine the relation of music to the life sciences. A major force behind this shift of attitude is the work of Charles Darwin (1809–1882). His theory of evolution posits two main processes responsible for changes in a living species, natural selection and sexual selection. Individual variability and random mutations introduce differences in the traits possessed by different individuals belonging to the same species. Traits that favor the survival of offspring who would themselves go on to reproduce are more likely to reappear in future generations. This is natural selection. Sexual selection concerns the selection of mating partners. Widespread preference for a given trait means that future generations will be more likely to possess that trait. In both cases, the traits in question must be heritable.
In The Descent of Man (1871) and in The Expression of Emotions in Man and Animals (1872), Darwin proposes that sexual selection is responsible for the effect of music. He observes that various species produce vocalizations or other sounds as part of courtship. For example, he identifies this as the goal of birdsong, although the consensus today is that birdsong also functions as a territorial call. In virtue of this origin, music has the power
of recalling in a vague and indefinite manner, those strong emotions which were felt during long-past ages, when, as is probable, our early progenitors courted each other by the aid of vocal tones. (Darwin 1872: 219 (chapter VIII); a contemporary defense of the view that the arts are the product of sexual selections is found in Miller 2001; for a recent review on the evidence supporting Darwin’s hypothesis, see Ravignani 2018)
Darwin’s hypothesis implies that music is likely to have predated language, as it arises from needs that are more basic than linguistic communication. The inflections typical of impassioned speech derive from those employed in courtship. Another feature of this account is that is it better able to explain music’s expression and arousal of positive emotions, such as love, tenderness, and happiness, than that of negative emotions, as only the former are typically involved in courtship.
Herbert Spencer (1820–1903) defended an explanation of the origin of music distinct from Darwin’s. Spencer holds as a general physiological principle that any emotion produces movement. When movement involves the vocal tract, emotions result in vocalizations. Music derives from an exaggeration of the usual features of vocal emotional expression. Thus, “vocal music, and by consequence all music, is an idealization of the natural language of passion” (Spencer 1857 [2015: 29]). This view of music’s origin locates its expressive value in the melodic element, rather than in harmony, as expressive vocalizations do not produce more than one sound at once. However, Spencer emphasizes that his explanation of music’s origin is not to be taken as a general theory of music’s value, and that elements of music that are not amenable to its original function (notably harmony) remain entirely legitimate (Spencer 1890: 466–467). Factual hypotheses regarding music’s origin are thus separated from aesthetic norms. This is a relevant methodological difference between Spencer’s hypothesis about the origin of music and previous ones, most notably Rousseau’s (see the entry history of western philosophy of music: from antiquity to 1800, section 3.5).
Spencer and Darwin expressed admiration for each other’s work, although Kivy (1959: 47) points out that they were also aware of their crucial methodological differences. While the former relied on general laws as ultimate explanatory principles, Darwin accepted generalizations only insofar as they were supported by empirical evidence. Exemplary of this contrast is one of Spencer’s arguments against the view that music develops out of vocalizations employed during courtship. Spencer holds that it is “one of the fundamental laws of evolution” that “[a]ll development proceeds from the general to the special” (1890: 458). To say that a subset of vocalizations (those used during courtship) has generated a more general class of sounds (all vocalizations expressing emotions, including music) is to contradict that principle.
While the figure of Edmund Gurney (1847–1888) is often discussed in association with Darwin and Spencer, and mostly exclusively in connection with their views, the scope and quality of argumentation in his work are comparable with few other works in Western musical aesthetics. In view of this, the relatively little critical attention he has received is surprising.
Gurney’s framework is a formalist one, as he holds music’s value to depend primarily on its presentation of abstract forms. This is achieved through music’s “ideal motion”, where “ideal” refers to music’s capacity to convey abstract forms (Gurney 1880: 164–165). Form and motion are thus the two essential aspects of music, and specifically of melody. Although talk of motion may suggests an analogy with physical space, Gurney is explicit in saying that this is nothing but the “faintest metaphor” (1880: 337), as the spatial character of melodic motion is radically different from that of visual arts and architecture. Through an enlightening contrast with these art forms, Gurney shows that music’s motion is ordered in time, in such a way that the succession of its elements is already fixed. Not so in the properly spatial arts, in which we apprehend elements in an order determined by our act of vision (Gurney 1880: 94). Gurney further argues the value of music must reside primarily in short sequences we are able to grasp in one hearing, and not in the understanding of large-scale structures (Gurney 1880: 96–97; a similar position, inspired by Gurney, has been recently defended in Levinson 1997).
Musical forms are not merely an object of understanding, but also arouse a distinctive emotion in us. In fact, Gurney holds that music’s most important feature is its capacity to arouse an emotion which is specifically musical,
…an emotional excitement of a very intense kind, which yet cannot be defined under any known head of emotion. (Gurney 1880: 120)
Gurney proposes a Darwinian explanation for this. Beautiful music arouses an emotion that is unlike any other because it produces an unconscious association with the sexual emotion experienced by our forebears (Gurney 1880: 116 ff.). However, Gurney points out an important limit of this explanation: the Darwinian account cannot explain why only beautiful music arouses such an emotion, as it posits a connection between musical phenomena in general and the arousal of that emotion (Gurney 1880: 121–124; 1887: 297–98).
Gurney’s formalism is more nuanced than views that entirely deny music’s capacity to express emotions. While music’s chief value resides in its capacity to be impressive, that is, to arouse the peculiarly musical emotion that is connected to musical beauty, Gurney concedes that music may be expressive, in that it may arouse emotions of the ordinary kind, or suggest extra-musical images and ideas (Gurney 1880: 312). But expressiveness is subordinate to impressiveness. First, it is not an essential or even typical element of valuable music, as much beautiful music isn’t expressive of any definite emotion. Second, it does not by itself give an explanation of the power and value of the art, as expressive qualities per se (e.g., in a face) are not a source of value (Gurney 1880: 338). Gurney’s additional claims, that impressiveness amplifies a piece’s expressiveness (1880: 339) and is even required for expressiveness to be valuable (1880: 314), are hard to make sense of unless his theory of expressiveness is further clarified (an extensive discussion of Gurney’s views is found in Budd 1985: chapter 4).
2. Twentieth Century
2.1 Phenomenology of Music
Edmund Husserl (1859–1938) developed phenomenology as a philosophical method aimed at grounding any objectivity in the first-person experiences through which it is constituted. Husserl devoted to music only passing observations, the best known of which is the illustration of his analysis of time consciousness by means of the experience of perceiving a melody (Husserl 1991). Other philosophers adopted a phenomenological methodology to carry out more systematic investigations (for a survey, see Lippman 1992: chapter 14).
In The Work of Music and the Problem of Its Identity, the Polish philosopher Roman Ingarden (1893–1970) adopted a phenomenological approach to conduct one of the first systematic investigations of musical ontology. From the methodological point of view, Ingarden embraces a descriptive approach. In his words:
However fully developed, every theory of musical works that is not mere speculation but seeks a base in concrete facts must refer to the presystematic convictions that initially gave direction to the search. (Ingarden 1973 [1986: 1])
On this basis, he rejects the identification of musical works with ideal objects, such as mathematical entities, for musical works come into existence when they are first composed (Ingarden 1973 [1986: 15]; a phenomenological account of musical works as ideal objects had been proposed by Waldemar Conrad (1878–1915) (1908), whose view Ingarden explicitly challenges). Works of music cannot be identified with their score either, as they can be composed without being notated and may even exist in the complete absence of notational systems (Ingarden 1973 [1986: 38]). Ingarden holds instead that musical works are intentional objects. While they require an experiencing subject, they cannot be identified with particular subjective experiences. This also accounts for the temporality that is characteristic of musical works. While a work’s performance is extended in time, the work itself is not a temporal object. It merely specifies an order of succession between its elements. The musical work is thus “quasi-temporal” (Ingarden 1973 [1986: 70]). Ingarden also accounts for the apparent change of a work through time, a change that may seem evident when one considers the radical differences in the performance of the same work at different historical times. However, insofar as the set of legitimate interpretations of a work is determined by its score, this change is one not in the work itself, but merely in what is considered valuable about it (Ingarden 1973 [1986: 156]) (on Ingarden’s musical ontology, see Mitscherling 1997: chapter 5).
The phenomenologist Alfred Schutz (1899–1959) is another philosopher whose work on music deserves mention. Schutz’s Fragments Toward a Phenomenology of Music was written in 1944, but published posthumously in 1976, and can be found in the fourth volume of his collected papers (Schutz 1996: 243–275). Schutz starts from the rather commonplace observation that music is meaningful though it lacks a conceptual or representational content. This feature he connects with a less obvious property of musical works. Some ideal objects may be grasped both monothetically as well as polythetically, that is, through a series of passages as well as in one glance. For instance, I could follow the steps that lead to the demonstration of Pythagoras’s theorem and come to understand it, but once I have done that I may also grasp the theorem in one single act, by grasping the proposition that expresses it (Schutz 1996: 247–248). But this is only possible because the theorem has a conceptual content that may be grasped once it has been understood. Precisely because it lacks such content, music can only be grasped polythetically by following its development as we listen to it, or when we recollect its unfolding. Thus,
the statement that music cannot be caught monothetically is merely a corollary of the thesis that the meaning-content of music is not related to a conceptual scheme. (Schutz 1996: 249)
This conclusion allows Schutz to break some ground in quite a different area, one that remains relatively underexplored in Western philosophy of music. In the essay Making Music Together (1951), Schutz considers the “mutual tuning-in relationship” (Schutz 1951: 79) that is necessary to the interactions between the various actors involved in music-making (composer, performers, and listeners). The polythetic constitution of the musical object is what ultimately allows this relationship, as the various participants in music-making share a common “flux of experiences in inner time” (Schutz 1951: 96).
Phenomenology remains a widely adopted philosophical method. A more recent phenomenological analysis of musical experience is found in Clifton 1983.
2.2 Music, Language, and Culture: Wittgenstein
Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889–1951), possibly the most influential philosopher of the twentieth century, was a musically talented individual. He played the clarinet and had extensive knowledge of the German classical repertoire.
Wittgenstein’s philosophical development is normally divided into two periods. The earlier one revolves around his Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus (1921), in which Wittgenstein claims that language is only meaningful when it describes contingent states of affairs. The propositions of logic, philosophy, ethics, and aesthetics are thus strictly speaking meaningless, in that they are normative or otherwise non-factual. In these early works, Wittgenstein is predictably almost entirely silent about art. Wittgenstein’s late philosophical views found expression in the posthumously published Philosophical Investigations (1953), as well as other writings. In these works, Wittgenstein conceives of linguistic meaning as dependent on the way words are used within particular situations or activities—this he terms a “language-game” (Sprachspiel). Language-games are countless and defy systematization, because they depend on the constantly changing practices that constitute our form of life (Lebensform).
Wittgenstein’s late philosophy contains significant, if characteristically unsystematic, treatments of aesthetic issues, in which music figures prominently. In an interesting reversal of the usual strategy, Wittgenstein sometimes uses analogies with music to shed light on the workings of language. The most famous instance of this is the remark:
Understanding a sentence is much more akin to understanding a theme in music than one may think. What I mean is that understanding a sentence lies nearer than one thinks to what is ordinarily called understanding a musical theme. (Philosophical Investigations, §527)
Here Wittgenstein is using an analogy between language and music in the attempt to move away from a conception of linguistic understanding as an inner process (see Lewis 1977 and Worth 1997). In both language and music, as in art more generally, understanding is manifested in our ability to act in appropriate ways. For example, a criterion for the understanding of genre pictures could be the ability to describe or mime the actions that occur in them (Philosophical Grammar, III, 37). In the musical case, an obvious reaction that evinces understanding is the ability to competently describe or perform the music. More interestingly, Wittgenstein holds that the understanding of music is also manifested in our capacity to draw appropriate comparisons between music and extra-musical reality, particularly the linguistic domain—a musical phrase may be described as a question, or remind us of the intonation we use when we utter a certain sentence (Philosophical Investigations, §527; Zettel, §175; for discussion, see Budd 2008, 263–67).
The role of extra-musical references in the understanding of music raises the issue of whether Wittgenstein should be considered a formalist (see Ahonen 2005, and Szabados 2006; 2014). A decidedly formalist element in Wittgenstein’s aesthetics is his separation of the understanding and appreciation of music from the effect it has on us—the move is similar to Hanslick’s (see §1.6; on Wittgenstein and Hanslick, see Szabados 2014, 39–57; 94–97). Aesthetic value in general, and music’s value more specifically, is not reducible to an object’s effect (Lectures on Aesthetics, IV, 2). Thus, an artwork is not valuable because it conveys this or that emotion, but because it conveys itself (Wittgenstein 1977 [1998: 67]).
However, the late Wittgenstein’s view of musical understanding does not seem fully compatible with a formalist view (see Szabados 2014: chapter 4). This is partly suggested by his comments on the appropriateness of extra-musical comparisons. A musical theme, Wittgenstein observes,
makes an impression on me which is connected with things in its surroundings—e.g. with our language and its intonations; and hence with the whole field of our language-games. (Zettel, §135)
Much like the understanding and mastery of language presupposes its competent use in countless situations and activities, the understanding of music depends on our ability to use it and describe it appropriately in ways that are ultimately determined by our form of life (see Hagberg 2017).
Finally, it is worth mentioning that Wittgenstein’s main contribution to the philosophy of music is probably something he almost never relates to music. This is the concept of aspect perception, exemplified by Joseph Jastrow’s famous duck-rabbit ambiguous figure, but also replicable in the auditory domain—e.g., hearing the metronome’s ticking as groupings of two or three. Contemporary philosophers of music have appealed in various ways to aspect perception, to shed light on issues that range from musical understanding to the phenomenology of musical expressiveness (see for instance Kivy 1989 and Arbo 2009; Guter 2020 observes that Wittgenstein’s interest in aspect perception was likely spurred by empirical studies on musical rhythm he made as a student).
2.3 Music as Symbol: Langer and Goodman
A recurring feature of twentieth century reflection on music is the attempt to consider it as a symbol system, and the related interest in the analogies and differences between music and language.
An early and influential effort in this direction is that of Susanne Langer (1895–1985). In Philosophy in New Key (1942), she rejects the idea that music is connected to emotional life in virtue of a causal connection with emotions in the composer, performer, or listener. Music is neither a “stimulus” to emotions, nor a “symptom” of them, but rather their symbol:
if it [music] has an emotional content, it “has” it in the same sense that language “has” its conceptual content—symbolically. (Langer 1942: 218)
While music and language are alike in that they both have a semantic function, the analogy does not cut any deeper, according to Langer. She distinguishes between discursive and presentational symbol systems. Discursive symbolisms possess a vocabulary composed of identifiable elements, to which a fixed meaning is associated. Presentational symbolisms lack such discrete meaningful units. Language is an example of the former, painting of the latter—both a sentence and a painting symbolize something, but the sentence may be broken down into component parts with a fixed meaning, whereas the painting cannot.
According to Langer, musical symbols are presentational symbols of a particular sort. The commonplace descriptions of music in emotional terms (“sad”, “happy”, “melancholy”, etc.) are due to an isomorphic relation between the dynamic form of music and that of feelings. For instance, the musical expression of anxiety is achieved by prolonged, unresolved tensions, and this is the form of anxiety as we experience it. Because music matches the form of feelings much more closely than language may even aspire to do, musical symbols cannot be replaced by linguistic ones without loss in precision—this is Langer’s version of the ineffability thesis (see §1.1).
However, Langer acknowledges that radically different feelings may share a common dynamic form, as may happen with an outburst of anger and one of joy. This means that music cannot have a definite emotional meaning, but rather ranges over a variety of possible interpretations. Thus, music is an “unconsummated symbol”, the exact import of which is not fixed (Langer 1942: 240).
Langer’s view has been attacked on various grounds (see Budd 1985: chapter 6 and S. Davies 1994: chapter 3). Perhaps the most obvious objection is that music’s dynamic structure matches that of emotions just as well as that of many other phenomena, but Langer’s view does not explain why music is not a symbol of them too (Budd 1985: 114; Green 2007 offers a more plausible view of the congruence between music and emotions).
Nelson Goodman’s (1906–1998) Languages of Art (1968) is both a product of the already established theory of symbols, exemplified by Langer and Ernst Cassirer (1874–1945), and a foundational work in the development of analytic philosophy of art (see §2.6). This is borne out by the tightly-knit weave of semiotics and ontology that characterizes the book: Goodman develops a general theory of notation that should account for the ontological status of works in different art forms. He introduces a crucial distinction between autographic and allographic arts. Painting and sculpture are autographic, as only a determination of the work’s history of production (that is, an attribution) guarantees the work’s authenticity. Music and literature are allographic, as work identity depends on the presence of essential features as determined by a notation—a word sequence in the case of a work of literature, and a score in the case of music. Forgeries of autographic works are works that claim a false history of production. Forgeries of allographic works are impossible, as notation provides a test for work-identity. If the candidate object meets it, it is an instance of the work, if not, it is a different work.
For a notation to perform this function, it must meet certain strict syntactic and semantic requirements (Goodman 1968: chapter 4). Goodman thinks that these requirements are met by most elements in Western modern musical notation, with the important exceptions of dynamics, tempo indications, and others, which therefore become irrelevant to the work’s identity (but see Webster 1971). A performance counts as an instance of a given work if and only if it complies with its score, and a work of music is nothing other than the class of performances compliant with that score.
The notational systems that characterize allographic arts prescribe absolute compliance, as a series of minor deviations could otherwise result in a completely different work being considered an acceptable instance of the original one. This means that only a note-for-note accurate performance of a musical work should count as an instance of it (see Predelli 1999).
This result is in tension not only with a sensible view of successful performance, but also with one of Goodman’s stated methodological principles. He holds that the notational systems characteristic of allographic arts should provide rigorous identity conditions, while at the same time respecting our intuitive notion of what counts as a given artwork (Goodman 1968: 121–122, 197–198). But Goodman’s account of compliance between score and performance is both too strict and too permissive to respect our intuitions: It fails to make room for pre-theoretically valid performances (e.g., a rendition with a single wrong note), while accepting ones that we would consider incorrect (e.g., a performance that is note-for-note correct, but played at a tempo that renders the work unrecognizable). Subsequent work on the ontology of music has inherited from Languages of Art the notion of compliance and the related idea that some features are determinative of a work’s identity, while also attempting to avoid Goodman’s notational strictures (see S. Davies 2001).
Goodman’s semiotic analysis also accounts for musical expression. In his nominalist framework, for an object to possess a property is for it to be denoted by a predicate. If the object refers back to that predicate, it exemplifies it—a red swatch of cloth is denoted by the predicate “red”, but it also exemplifies it when it is used as a sample by a tailor. But properties may also be possessed metaphorically—a cloth is literally red, but a work of music is only metaphorically sad. When an object exemplifies a property it possesses metaphorically, it expresses it. Expression is metaphorical exemplification (Goodman 1968: 95). Note that this view explains the logical structure of the description of music in emotional terms, but it does not attempt an explanation of why emotion terms are applied to music in the first place. In the philosophy of music, as in the philosophy of art more generally, Goodman was a pivotal figure in setting the methodological tone of the subsequent inquiry in the English-speaking world, although his preferred solutions have been largely disputed.
2.4 Music and the Emotions: Pratt, Meyer, Cooke
Over the course of the twentieth century, Anglophone philosophy of music produced various accounts of music’s relationship to the emotions. In addition to the contributions of Langer and those of analytic philosophers (see §2.3 and §2.6), it is important to mention the views put forward by psychologist Carroll C. Pratt (1894–1979) and musicologists Leonard B. Meyer (1918–2007) and Deryck Cooke (1919–1976).
Pratt clarifies that he is not interested in music’s arousal of emotions (Pratt 1954: 291–292). We apply emotional words to music without implying that the music is arousing or may arouse such emotions in us or others. If this is the case, we need to explain why we describe music, an inanimate object, using words that refer to psychological states.
Pratt argues that some dynamic qualities are common to both music and the subjective experience of emotions. Thus, the agitation we hear in fast-paced, wayward music is an external, objective counterpart of the subjective, internal sensation we experience when we feel agitated. This correspondence between psychological states and perceptual features of external objects is what grounds the description of the latter in emotional terms. Pratt’s view, conveyed in nuce by his slogan “the music sounds the way the emotions feel”, shares with Langer’s theory the idea of an isomorphism between the structure of music and the phenomenology of emotional life. However, Pratt does not conceive of music as a sign of the emotions, as their correspondence in terms of dynamic structure does not imply any representational relation from the former to the latter (Pratt 1954: 290). This claim, along with Pratt’s separation of musical emotions from those it arouses in the listener, gives his view a clear formalist slant. The persuasiveness of Pratt’s hypothesis is ultimately dependent on whether we can produce clearer evidence for the structural correspondence that is central to the account (criticism of Pratt’s view is found in Budd 1985: chapter 3, and S. Davies 1994: chapter 3; Green [2007: 206] advances a theory of expressiveness that partly vindicates Pratt’s intuition).
Meyer’s influential Emotion and Meaning in Music (1956) attempts to makes sense of musical emotions by holding that these depend on the syntactical features of the music itself. Meyer’s view rests on the questionable assumptions that emotions arise when a tendency to respond is inhibited. A tendency to respond is one’s inclination to behave in a certain way. For instance, a smoker who feels like smoking but is unable to find any cigarettes will feel increasingly frustrated and upset. This person’s emotion is generated by the inhibition of his tendency to respond (Meyer 1956: 13–14; for criticism, see Budd 1985: 155–157). In music, a tendency to respond is generated by the expectations that naturally arise in more or less sophisticated listeners with regard to the syntactic development of the piece. Music, and valuable music especially, momentarily frustrates our expectations whenever it develops in unforeseen ways, and thereby arouses emotions without requiring any reference to extra-musical reality.
Meyer claims that his theory is able to reconcile two apparently opposite solutions to the problem of musical value and understanding. These are the “formalist option”, according to which emotions are irrelevant to the appreciation of music, and the “absolute expressivist” one, which holds music valuable for the emotions it arouses in us. Meyer proposes that, if the expectation is a conscious one, the response will be intellectual, rather than emotional. But if it is an unconscious expectation, as is the case for most listeners, then its frustration will give rise to an emotional response. The formalist and the expressivist are thus two different modes of engagement with music, as opposed to being incompatible views of its meaning and value (Meyer 1956: 38–40).
In The Language of Music (1959), Cooke proposes that Western classical composers have utilized an identifiable stock of melodic, harmonic, and rhythmic structures in order to convey emotion through their works. Cooke’s model is linguistic not only in that it attempts to identify a vocabulary of musical expressiveness, but also because it conceives of music as a form of communication, and specifically as the composer’s communication of emotional states to the listener. It is thus a version of the expression theory (see §1.1; Gabriel 1978 provides empirical evidence against Cooke’s view).
2.5 Marxist Approaches: Adorno and Bloch
The development of the sociology of music, as well as that of Marxist societal critique, gave rise to an interest in the socio-political nature of music-making that is unmatched in previous Western philosophy (for an overview, see Fubini 1991: chapter 8).
Theodor W. Adorno (1903–1969) is the foremost example of this approach, and one of the most significant philosophers of music in the Western tradition. A philosopher and sociologist, in 1958 he became director of the Frankfurt Institute for Social Research. His dense writing is made more difficult by his frequent and highly technical musicological observations—he was a trained musician and an active composer, having studied with Arnold Schoenberg’s pupil Alban Berg (Paddison 1993 and Witkin 1998 are book-length studies of Adorno’s philosophy of music; for a shorter overview, see Hamilton 2007: chapter 6).
A central theme in Adorno’s work is represented by the tension between the autonomy of the artwork as an aesthetic object and its social function (Adorno 1970 [1997: 252]). As a member of the Frankfurt School, Adorno’s outlook is broadly Marxist, in that he is interested in art as a product of society, as well as in its potential as vehicle of social critique.
However, Adorno’s advocacy of music as a critical tool does not result in an endorsement of politically engaged music. The critical function of music is achieved once societal contradictions are embodied in the formal features of artworks, as opposed to being explicitly denounced (see for instance Adorno 1970 [1997: 257]). Adorno writes:
In all art that is still possible, social critique must be raised to the level of form, to the point that it wipes out all manifestly social content [Inhalt]. (1970 [1997: 250])
According to Adorno, art achieves this critical capacity by becoming autonomous, that is, by rejecting direct social functions, including explicitly political ones. However, it is not obvious how societal dynamics or contradictions could be embodied in works of pure instrumental music (Zangwill 2012: 380–381 is skeptical about this possibility).
It is this framework that grounds Adorno’s endorsement of Schoenberg against Stravinsky, which he develops in his Philosophy of New Music (1949). Schoenberg’s atonal music is true to the society that generated it because it rejects tonality, the possibilities of which Adorno considers thoroughly explored. Musical material is thus historically “pre-formed”, in that the use of tonal structures has a fundamentally different significance today than it had when tonal music was still developing. Schoenberg’s music is progressive because it follows the laws of development intrinsic to the musical material he inherited from tradition. Stravinsky instead pulls musical structures from an irretrievable past, thereby producing music that is well-crafted, but ultimately untrue (for a detailed analysis of Adorno’s view of Schoenberg and Stravinsky, see Witkin 1998: chapters 7 and 8).
The attitude just described grounds Adorno’s notorious reservations regarding popular music, which he elaborated in a number of essays, as well as in his influential Introduction to the Sociology of Music (1962 ). His view of “jazz”, a label he employed liberally and at times confusingly (see Gracyk 1992), and of popular music in general, is that its primary function is that of easily available entertainment, despite jazz’s attempts to dissimulate this behind musical structures that are only apparently novel. Standardization is the essential feature of popular music (Adorno 1962 [1976: 25]), and its result is music that “listens for the listener” (Adorno 1962 [1976: 29]), as it does not require any effort. The invisible hand that standardizes taste and produces art having the sole function of entertaining the masses is the culture industry, a concept which Adorno had elaborated in Dialectic of Enlightenment (1947), co-authored with Max Horkheimer (1895–1973) (Horkheimer & Adorno 1947: chapter 4).
Adorno’s qualms with regard to popular music may understandably appear elitist (see Baugh 1990). However, as Martin Jay points out,
The real dichotomy, Adorno contended, was not between “light” and “serious” music—he was never a defender of traditional cultural standards for their own sake—but rather between music that was market-oriented and music that was not. (Jay 1973: 182)
Thus, although popular music possesses standardized features that favor its commodification, the culture industry also includes music from the past that has been commodified and reduced to a mere distraction.
Music is also related to social change in the thought of the unorthodox Marxist philosophy of Ernst Bloch (1885–1977). The concepts of utopia and hope are fundamental to his view, which finds its chief expression in The Spirit of Utopia (1918) and in The Principle of Hope (1954). “Utopia” refers to a potential future state to which humanity aspires, whereas hope is the process of striving toward that utopic state. Art creates visions of alternative realities which, far from being mere illusions or distractions, have utopian potential.
Bloch devotes a central chapter of his Spirit of Utopia to music, which he conceives of as a concerned with the inward side of the utopian dimension, and thus with humanity’s striving toward self-awareness and understanding. The chapter traces the unfolding of music’s utopian potential in the Western tradition. This restriction in focus seems to follow from an intentionally narrow conception of music, motivated by Bloch’s characterization of this art as concerned with the manifestation and development of interiority. He thus denies that civilizations such as the Greek and the Egyptian produced any music worth of interest, because their worldview was focused on exteriority and visuality (Bloch 1918, “The Mystery”).
In Bloch’s reconstruction, Western music develops through three stages, or “carpets” (Teppiche), a concept he borrows from Georg Lukács (1885–1971) (Bloch 1918, “The Problem of a Historical Philosophy of Music”). The first stage is represented by dance and chamber music, the second by the music of Bach and Mozart, and particularly by the fugue, while the third culminates in the symphonies of Beethoven and Bruckner. It is over the course of this development that music progressively realizes humanity’s awareness of itself (on Bloch’s philosophy of music, see Zabel 1990, Korstvedt 2010, and Vidal 2003 ).
2.6 Analytic Philosophy of Music
Analytic approaches are presented in detail in the entry on the philosophy of music (for a book-length introduction, see Kania 2020). Here I shall focus on two representative debates and indicate some general trends.
Analytic philosophy of music is at times regarded as exclusively centered on linguistic and conceptual analysis, and dismissed on the grounds of this narrow focus (see for instance Lippman 1992: 353). But this picture is only faithful to its first stages of development. Analytic philosophy of music has evolved, hybridized, and fragmented, much like analytic philosophy at large. In fact, contemporary analytic work on music often includes sustained discussion of scientific or historical research (see for instance Robinson 2005, Nussbaum 2007, Dyck 2014). A different feature is perhaps distinctive of the analytic approach, namely its systematic and often tacitly assumed veto on value judgments regarding the works, traditions, styles, etc. under investigation. Artistic value is not discovered or ascertained through philosophical speculation, it is merely accounted for. This is in quite striking contrast with the approach of many other figures discussed in this entry, who first developed philosophical theories, and then on that basis produced sweeping dismissals of music that is widely regarded as valuable—think of Rousseau on French music or Adorno on jazz (on the differences between analytic and continental philosophy of music, see Roholt 2017).
The systematic development of musical ontology is perhaps the most characteristic thematic focus of analytic philosophy, as the area had been almost entirely neglected by previous philosophical theories. The most popular ontological views are type theories, according to which musical works are repeatable entities, tokened by multiple sound events. Some type theorists are Platonists. They hold that musical works are abstract objects that do not come into existence (Kivy 1983a, 1983b; Dodd 2007). A different approach holds that musical works are created types, a feature that proponents argue makes sense of music as a human, contingent practice (Levinson 1980).
Against Platonism, nominalist theories reject types and construe musical works as collections of particulars (Goodman 1968; Predelli 2001; Caplan & Matheson 2006). A less popular option is to consider musical works as actions. Gregory Currie (1989) and David Davies (2004) have defended such a view with respect to artworks in general, including musical ones. It has also been proposed that musical works are best regarded as useful fictions that sustain our critical and appreciative discourse about music (Kania 2008; Killin 2018; for a recent overview of analytic ontology of music, see S. Davies 2020).
Recent work has tackled meta-ontological questions, asking what principles should guide the construction of ontological theories (see for instance Stecker 2009; Dodd 2013; D. Davies 2017). A useful distinction is the one between descriptive and revisionary ontologies (Kania 2008), the former adhering to pre-theoretical conceptions of what a musical works is, the latter sacrificing intuitions for the sake of theoretical virtues.
Though she ultimately rejects analytic approaches to the ontology of music, it is worth mentioning here Lydia Goehr’s The Imaginary Museum of Musical Works (1992), an extraordinarily influential study on the origin of the concept of musical work. Goehr argues that this concept emerged relatively recently in Western music history.
Along with ontology, musical expressiveness is probably the most frequently discussed issue in analytic philosophy of music (for an introduction to the debate, see Matravers 2007). An important advance in this area is represented by the distinction between the emotions music expresses and those it is expressive of (Kivy 1989, elaborating on Tormey 1971). The saggy features of a Saint Bernard dog make it look sad, but they do not stand in a causal relation with a psychological state of sadness. The dog’s face is expressive of sadness, but does not express sadness. Likewise, sadness is attributed to music regardless of whether it is the expression of sadness or of any other emotion—that Mozart’s Requiem Mass in D minor is expressive of anguish is something we can determine independently from the anguished state its author may have found himself in when composing it. The emotions the music is expressive of are also conceptually distinct from those it may arouse in the listener—the Requiem may arouse anguish in me, but it would be an anguished work even if it didn’t. As intuitive as these distinctions may appear, previous accounts of the relationship between music and emotions did not trace them explicitly, and at times seem to move from one notion to the other.
We thus have (1) the emotions a composer may have felt when writing the piece (2) the emotions music may arouse in the listener, and (3) the emotion we attribute to the music itself. Accounts of expressiveness that construe it as dependent on (1) or (2) are named, respectively, arousal and expression theories. Both approaches are generally considered as discredited, although a sophisticated version of the arousal theory has been defended by Derek Matravers (1998), and a qualified defense of the expression theory has been advanced by Jenefer Robinson (2005). Accounts of expressiveness that regard it as independent from (1) and (2) need to explain why we use emotion words to describe a non-sentient object. Resemblance theories of musical expressiveness argue that this is because of a perceived similarity between the music and the characteristic vocal and behavioral human expressions of emotions (S. Davies 1980, 1994; Kivy 1989). Appeal to such resemblance in accounting for musical expressiveness is as old as philosophy of music itself, but the careful separation of the emotions in the music from those aroused in the listener distinguishes these views from virtually all their predecessors. The same distinction allows Peter Kivy (1934–2017) to develop a formalist view of musical appreciation that recognizes the role of expressive properties but unties them from the emotions aroused by music (Kivy 1990a). Jenefer Robinson (2005) has developed a sophisticated hybrid theory of expressiveness, arguing that the music’s arousal of emotions at the sub-personal level is partly responsible for the resemblances we perceive in the music.
An alternative way to flesh out the view of musical emotions as properties of the music itself is the so-called persona theory of expressiveness, according to which expressive music is experienced as the emotional expression of a fictional persona (Levinson 2006). This proposal sidesteps the problems generated by the puzzling description of a non-sentient being in emotional terms, by positing that music is the emotional expression of a fictional individual.
Analytic philosophy has so far manifested relatively little interest in matters of musical value and music’s connection with moral, social, and political issues. Roger Scruton (1944–2020) deserves mention in this connection. His work shares with analytic philosophy some broad thematic areas of interest, but generally defies categorization. The sustained discussion of matters such as the socio-cultural dimension of music and musical value sets his humanistic approach apart from much other philosophical writing on music in the Anglophone world (see particularly Scruton 1997).
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- –––, 1886, Jenseits von Gut und Böse: Vorspiel einer Philosophie der Zukunft, Leipzig; translated as Beyond Good and Evil: Prelude to a Philosophy of the Future, Rolf-Peter Horstmann (ed.) and Judith Norman (ed./trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
- Nussbaum, Charles O., 2007, The Musical Representation: Meaning, Ontology, and Emotion, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
- Paddison, Max, 1993, Adorno’s Aesthetics of Music, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511549441
- Pederson, Sanna, 2009, “Defining the Term ‘Absolute Music’ Historically”, Music & Letters, 90(2): 240–262. doi:10.1093/ml/gcp009
- Prange, Martine, 2013, Nietzsche, Wagner, Europe, Berlin: De Gruyter. doi:10.1515/9783110315233
- Pratt, Carroll C., 1954, “The Design of Music”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 12(3): 289–300. doi:10.2307/426972
- Predelli, Stefano, 1999, “Goodman and the Wrong Note Paradox”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 39(4): 364–375. doi:10.1093/bjaesthetics/39.4.364
- –––, 2001, “Musical Ontology and the Argument From Creation”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 41(3): 279–292. doi:10.1093/bjaesthetics/41.3.279
- Ravignani, Andrea, 2018, “Darwin, Sexual Selection, and the Origins of Music”, Trends in Ecology & Evolution, 33(10): 716–719. doi:10.1016/j.tree.2018.07.006
- Ridley, Aaron, 2007, Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Nietzsche on Art and Literature, London: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203964859
- Robinson, Jenefer, 2005, Deeper Than Reason: Emotion and Its Role in Literature, Music, and Art, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0199263655.001.0001
- Roholt, Tiger, 2017, “On the Divide: Analytic and Continental Philosophy of Music”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 75(1): 49–58. doi:10.1111/jaac.12331
- Schelling, Friedrich W. J., 1859, Philosophie der Kunst, Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft; translated as The Philosophy of Art, Douglas W. Stott (trans./ed.), Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press, 1989.
- Schopenhauer, Arthur, 1819, Die Welt als Wille und Vorstellung, Leipzig; translated as Schopenhauer: The World as Will and Representation, Christopher Janaway (ed.), Judith Norman and Alistair Welchman (eds/trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511780943
- –––, 1851, Parerga und Paralipomena, Berlin; translated as Schopenhauer: Parerga and Paralipomena: Short Philosophical Essays, Volume 2, Adrian Del Caro (ed./trans.) and Christopher Janaway (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2015. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139016889
- Schutz, Alfred, 1951, “Making Music Together: A Study in Social Relationship”, Social Research, 18(1): 76–97.
- –––, 1976 , “Fragments Toward a Phenomenology of Music”, Fred Kerstein (ed.) in In Search of a Musical Method, F. J. Smith (ed.), London: Gordan and Breach Science Publishers, pp. 5–72. Originally written 1944; reprinted in Schutz 1996: 243–275.
- –––, 1996, Collected Papers: Volume IV, Dordrecht: Springer.
- Scruton, Roger, 1997, The Aesthetics of Music, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/019816727X.001.0001
- Sorgner, Stefan Lorenz, 2003 , “Nietzsche”, in Sorgner and Fürbeth 2003 [2010: 141–163].
- Sorgner, Stefan Lorenz and Oliver Fürbeth (eds.) 2003 , Musik in der deutschen Philosophie. Eine Einführung, Stuttgart: J. B. Mezlersche; translated as Music in German Philosophy, Susan H. Gillespie (trans.), Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
- Sousa, Tiago, 2017, “Was Hanslick a Closet Schopenhauerian?”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 57(2): 211–229. doi:10.1093/aesthj/ayx008
- Spencer, Herbert, 1857, “The Origin and Function of Music”, Fraser’s Magazine, October; reprinted in The Routledge Reader on the Sociology of Music, John Shepherd and Kyle Devine (eds.), New York; London: Routledge, 2015, pp. 27–33.
- –––, 1890, “The Origin of Music”, Mind, old series 15(60) : 449–468. doi:10.1093/mind/os-XV.60.449
- Stecker, Robert, 2009, “Methodological Questions about the Ontology of Music”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 67(4): 375–386. doi:10.1111/j.1540-6245.2009.01367.x
- Strunk, Oliver, 1950, Source Readings in Music History: From Classical Antiquity through the Romantic Era, New York: Norton & Company.
- Szabados, Béla, 2006, “Wittgenstein and Musical Formalism”, Philosophy, 81(4): 649–658. doi:10.1017/S0031819106318062
- –––, 2014, Wittgenstein as Philosophical Tone-poet: Philosophy and Music in Dialogue, Amsterdam: Rodopi.
- Tormey, Alan, 1971, The Concept of Expression: A Study in Philosophical Psychology and Aesthetics, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
- Vidal, Francesca, 2003 , “Bloch”, in Sorgner and Fürbeth 2003 [2010: 165–186].
- Wackenroder, Wilhelm Heinrich, 1797 , Herzensergiessungen eines kunstliebenden Klosterbruders, Berlin: Johann Friedrich Unger. Extract translated as “The Remarkable Musical Life of the Musician Joseph Berglinger”, in Strunk 1950: 750–763.
- –––, 1799, Phantasien über die Kunst für Freunde der Kunst, Ludwig Tieck (ed.), Hamburg: Perthes.
- Wagner, Richard, 1849a , “Die Kunst und die Revolution”, Leipzig; translated as “Art and Revolution”, in Wagner 1892: volume 1, pp. 21–65.
- –––, 1849b , “Das Kunstwerk der Zukunft”, Leipzig; translated as “The Artwork of the Future”, in Wagner 1892: volume 1, pp. 69–213.
- –––, 1852a , “Eine Mitteilung an meine Freunde”; translated as “A Communication to my Friends”, in Wagner 1892: volume 1, pp. 267–392.
- –––, 1852b , Oper und Drama, Leipzig: Weber; translated as Opera and Drama, in Wagner 1893: volume 2.
- –––, 1870 , Beethoven, Leipzig: E. W. Fritzsch; translated in Wagner 1896: volume 5, pp. 61–126.
- –––, 1871 , “Über die Bestimmung der Oper”, Leipzig: E. W. Fritzsch; translated as The Destiny of Opera in Wagner 1896: volume 5, pp. 131–155.
- –––, 1892–1912, Richard Wagner’s
Prose Works, in 8 volumes, William Ashton Ellis (trans.), London:
- 1892, Volume 1, The Art-Work of the Future, etc.
- 1893, Volume 2, Opera and Drama
- 1894, Volume 3, The Theatre
- 1895, Volume 4, Art and Politics
- 1896, Volume 5, Actors and Singers
- 1897, Volume 6, Religion and Art
- 1898, Volume 7, In Paris and Dresden
- 1899, Volume 8, Posthumous, etc.
- Webster, William E., 1971, “Music Is Not a ‘Notational System’”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 29(4): 489–497. doi:10.2307/429194
- Wicks, Robert L., 2008, Schopenhauer, Malden, MA: Blackwell.
- Wilfing, Alexander, 2016, “Tonally Moving Forms: Peter Kivy and Hanslick’s ‘Enhanced Formalism’”, Principia, 63: 5–35.
- –––, 2018, “Hanslick, Kant, and the Origins of Vom Musikalisch-Schönen”, Musicologica Austriaca, 2018-06-18. [Wilfing 2016 Available online].
- Witkin, Robert W., 1998, Adorno on Music, London/New York, Routledge. doi:10.4324/9781315006048
- Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1921, “Logisch-Philosophische Abhandlung”, Annalen der Naturphilosophische, XIV (3/4); translated as Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, C. K. Ogden (trans.), London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1922.
- –––, 1953, Philosophical Investigations, G. E. M. Anscombe (trans.), London: Macmillan; revised fourth edition by P. M. S. Hacker and J. Schulte (eds), Oxford: Blackwell, 2009.
- –––, 1966, Lectures and Conversations on Aesthetics, Psychology and Religious Belief: Compiled from Notes taken by Yorick Smythies, Rush Rhees and James Taylor, Cyril Barrett (ed.), Oxford: Blackwell.
- –––, 1967, Zettel, G. E. M. Anscombe and G. H. von Wright (eds.), G. E. M. Anscombe (trans.), Oxford: Basel Blackwell. Fragments of Wittgenstein writings from about 1929 until 1948.
- –––, 1974, Philosophical Grammar, Rush Rhees (ed.), Anthony Kenny (trans.), Oxford: Blackwell, 1974; originally written during the years 1931 through 1934.
- –––, 1977 , Vermischte Bemerkungen, Georg Henrik von Wright (ed.), Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp Verlag; translated as Culture and Value, Peter Winch (trans.), Oxford: Blackwell, 1980; revised and expanded German edition in 1994 which was translated, Peter Winch (trans.), in 1998, Oxford: Blackwell.
- Worth, Sarah E., 1997, “Wittgenstein’s Musical Understanding”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 37(2): 158–167. doi:10.1093/bjaesthetics/37.2.158
- Young, Julian, 1992, Nietzsche’s Philosophy of Art, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511586316
- –––, 2014, The Philosophies of Richard Wagner, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
- Young, James O., 2020, “Kant’s Musical Antiformalism”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 78(2): 171–182. doi:10.1111/jaac.12712
- –––, forthcoming, History of Western Philosophy of Music, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Zabel, Gary, 1990, “Ernst Bloch and the Utopian Dimension in Music”, The Musical Times, 131(1764): 82–84. doi:10.2307/966394
- Zangwill, Nick, 2012, “Listening to Music Together”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 52(4): 379–389. doi:10.1093/aesthj/ays038
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Thanks to Stephen Davies, Andrew Kania, James O. Young, and an anonymous reviewer for helpful comments on a draft of this entry.