History of the Ontology of Art

First published Mon Aug 29, 2011; substantive revision Thu Apr 11, 2024

Questions central to the ontology of art include the following: what sort of things are works of art? Do all works of art belong to a single category of entities? Do they have multiple instances? Do works have parts or constituents, and if so, what is their relation to the work as a whole? How are works of art individuated? Are they created or discovered? Can they be destroyed?

Explicit and extensive treatments of these topics written prior to the 19th century have yet to be found. This does not mean, however, that there is nothing relevant to these ontological questions in early writings on beauty, the arts, and related matters. For example, Aristotle’s discussion of the functions and elements of tragedy (see Gerald Else 1957) can be mined for ideas about the nature of dramatic and literary works more generally. And what can be made of the hint, in Metaphysics Eta, 6, that the unity of The Iliad is a matter of a set of words made “one” by being connected together?

Rather than attempting to make conjectures about such difficult exegetical topics, this entry focuses primarily on contributions made by authors who explicitly address themselves at length to some of the aforementioned questions pertaining directly to the ontology of works of art, either in general or with reference to such major fine-art forms as music, literature, painting, architecture, and sculpture.

One further note about the scope of this entry: instructive surveys of the subfield of aesthetics known as the ontology of art are fairly plentiful; see Nicholas Wolterstorff (1992), Gregory Currie (1998, 2010), Joseph Margolis (1998), Stephen Davies (2003a, 2020), Amie Thomasson (2004, 2006b), Guy Rohrbaugh (2005), Theodore Gracyk (2009), Robert Stecker (2010), and Carl Matheson and Ben Caplan (2011). Surveys of the history of the field have not, however, been forthcoming, and the comments on this topic that crop up in the literature are sketchy and sometimes quite misleading. One shortcoming has been a marked tendency to focus on more recent contributions, the one salient exception being due attention paid to works by Roman Ingarden (e.g., 1931, 1962, and see the entry on Ingarden). Accordingly, the present entry focuses primarily on contributions made in the 19th and 20th centuries and the first decade of the 21st.

1. Do works of art exist?

Although artists, critics, and art lovers are likely to think it absurd to deny that a work of art is as real as anything else one might encounter, many philosophers and art theorists have raised questions about the very existence or “mode of being” of works of art.

1.1 Realism

One prevalent response to the question of art’s existence is a straightforward realism to the effect that works of art figure amongst those entities that, once they have been brought into existence, do not depend on anyone’s (actual or possible) beliefs or responses. Assuming that something can only be discovered if it already exists, a striking example of a realist statement is Samuel Alexander’s claim that “Shakespeare discovered Hamlet in the English language the way the sculptor discovers his figure in the block” (1925, 28). A more prominent example of a philosopher who defends realism about works of art is Monroe C. Beardsley (1958), who seems to have espoused the disjunctive thesis that a work of art is either a particular physical object or a kind of physical object (see the entry on Beardsley’s aesthetics). Various other options for realism about artworks will be mentioned below.

1.2 Modes of being and existence

Some philosophers draw distinctions between different modes of being, and some of these philosophers have attributed modes of being other than existence to works of art.

An example is C. E. M. Joad, who included a fairly lengthy discussion of issues related to the ontology of art in his popular Guide to Philosophy of 1936. Joad denied that a work such as Shakespeare’s Hamlet could be correctly identified with any existing concrete particular, such as a script, or with a collection of events, such as those involved in a staging of the play. Nor should the title ‘Hamlet’ be taken as referring to ideas in the author’s mind, to some spectator’s experience of the work, or to some collection of experiences occasioned by performances of the play. Joad’s alternative was to say that the work of art is a subsistent object, neither mental nor material, which, like other universals, is a constituent of the universe possessing a special kind of being, subsistence, in its own right. According to Joad, then, at least some works are subsistent universals, and this is the sort of entity to which the titles of such works of art refer. For background to the distinction between existence and subsistence, see the entry on possible objects.

In his Mellon lectures presented at the National Gallery in Washington in 1955 (published in 1957), Étienne Gilson classified works of art as Aristotelian substances (for background, see the entries on substance and Aristotle’s metaphysics). Gilson also claimed that a work has aesthetic and artistic modes of existence in addition to a substantial one. A work exists artistically qua product of the artist’s activity, whereas it exists aesthetically when it is the object of someone’s aesthetic (or contemplative) experience. A similar plurality of modes of existence of works of art had been postulated by Étienne Souriau (1943, 1947), who posited thing-like [chosale], aesthetic, and transcendent modes of existence.

1.3 The Imagination and fictionalism

In attributing artistic and aesthetic modes of existence to works, Gilson adverted to a physical object’s relation to the experiences and actions of cognizing subjects. Similarly, a long series of philosophers have taken subjective relations and experiences to be crucial to answering the question of the existence of works of art. It has often been proposed, for example, that works are at least in part a product of the imagination, and this not merely in the sense that artists must imagine what sort of thing they want to make or do if a work of art is to be brought into existence. Instead, the thought is that even the existence or reality of a completed work of art continues to depend on the make-believe or imaginative activity of the artist or some other subject, such as the observer or reader who appreciates the work as a work of art.

That the imagination plays a crucial role in aesthetic responses to both art and nature was an important theme in 18th-century aesthetics (see the entries on French, British, and German aesthetics in the 18th century). Joseph Addison’s (1712) description of the “pleasures of the imagination” was influential, yet not as influential perhaps as Immanuel Kant’s idea that the activation of the power or faculty of the imagination was essential to aesthetic judgments (for more detail, see the entry on Kant’s aesthetics). In the 19th and 20th centuries, various thinkers contended that the imagination plays a crucial role in both the creation and the reception of works of art. Prominent examples of philosophers who emphasized the importance of Einbildungskraft or Phantasie in this regard include Friedrich Theodor Vischer (1857, 1898), Robert Zimmermann (1865), Hermann Lotze (1884), Eduard von Hartmann (1888), Karl Köstlin (1869, 1889), Konrad von Lange (1895, 1901, 1912, 1935), Christian von Ehrenfels (1896–1899, 318), and Johannes Volkelt (1905–1915).

Von Hartmann (1888, vol. 2, 11) rejects what he called “naïve realistic” assumptions about the objects of aesthetic or artistic judgements. Arguing for a “transcendental realism,” he contends that beauty is not a material object, but a subjective appearance, like the sweetness of sugar. Von Hartmann observes that people confidently say such things as “this book is Homer’s Iliad,” “this score is Beethoven’s Ninth Symphony,” and “this painting is Raphael’s Sistine Madonna.” Although it is often acknowledged that the first two examples are philosophically untenable, it ought to be admitted, von Hartmann contends, that the third sort of statement is also inaccurate. The painted surface in itself is not beautiful even though in some circumstances it has the capacity to contribute to a subjective appearance of beauty, which von Hartmann characterizes as Schein or Phantasie. If the work of art is the bearer or locus of beauty and other aesthetic properties, it cannot be the material object in itself. Yet Hartmann also contests what he called “subjective idealism,” and in his discussion of artistic creation emphasizes the artist’s engagement with the material constraints of artistic media. The “phantasy work” that an artist elaborates prior to the creation of an “external work of art” is never neutral with regard to media or instrumentation (1888, vol. 2, 180).

Konrad von Lange held that imaginative play and an attitude he called ‘conscious self-deception’ [die bewusste Selbsttäuschung] are necessary to both the creation and appreciation of art. He did not explicitly draw the conclusion that works of art are therefore fictions, but he did describe our commerce with them as a kind of lucid illusion in which we playfully entertain thoughts of states of affairs that we know not to exist. The artistic artifact, he proposed, is like the toy or other object that is recruited to the ends of a child’s imaginative play. A sophisticated and highly influential contemporary exponent of this kind of approach to art and, more specifically, to the philosophical analysis of depiction and fictional content, is Kendall L. Walton (1990).

Jean-Paul Sartre (1938, 1940) has often been credited with the idea that works of art are illusory (in the sense of systematically being the object of some sort of error about their mode of existence), but it is not obvious that this is the best interpretation of his remarks on the topic. Sartre declares that Beethoven’s Seventh Symphony “is outside of the real, outside of existence” (1940, 371, my trans.). He also says that we do not really hear the symphony at all, but only hear the composition in our imaginations. Such statements can be read as being meant to debunk a widespread illusory belief in the existence of musical works; they also hold open the possibility of imagining works without believing in their existence, in which case the putative illusion is not necessary. One of the possible targets of Sartre’s remarks is a kind of idealist doctrine discussed below. For an informative discussion of Sartre’s views on the subject, see Peter V. Lamarque (2010, chapter 10); and for additional background, see the entry on existentialist aesthetics.

On this topic Sartre was preceded and possibly influenced by Ingarden and Nicolai Hartmann, who was professor of theoretical philosophy in Berlin at the time of Sartre’s stint at the Institut français in Berlin from 1933–1934. In a paper presented at the International Congress of Philosophy held at Harvard in 1926 and published in 1927, Hartmann contrasted psychological and ontological approaches in aesthetics and argued for the priority of the latter. In this paper he outlined positions that he was to develop at length in a series of works, including his (1933) and an unfinished treatise on aesthetics, written in 1945 and published posthumously in 1953.

Hartmann’s central thesis on the ontology of art is that works are fictions that depend upon the perceptual and imaginative activities of artists and their audiences. In Hartmann’s view, the work of art has at least two parts or strata: the first layer, which he sometimes refers to as the “foreground,” is perceptible—Hartmann’s examples include a piece of stone, colors on a surface, and audible sounds. The perception of such items is the basis of the aesthetic experience of the higher “background” stratum, which also requires imaginings occasioned by this perceptual experience. The artistic and aesthetic qualities of the work arise from the relation between these ‘heterogeneous’ levels. Hartmann’s discussion of the artwork’s strata resembles some of the claims made by Ingarden. It would appear that the two philosophers arrived at these results independently; for a comparison of their positions, see Wolfgang Ruttkowski (1990).

Hartmann maintains that as a result of its dependence upon the imagination, the work of art lacks independent or autonomous being, or what he calls ‘Ansichsein’. A work is an observer-relative appearance or Erscheinung, experienced as such. An appearance experienced as appearance is not to be confused, however, with illusion or Schein because it involves self-reflexive awareness that something is being imagined as opposed to believed. In this regard Hartmann evokes the familiar analogy to children’s imaginative play, while commenting that for the adult such play “remains fiction” (1953, 53).

Hartmann’s concept of artistic appearance does not embrace only the depictive or symbolic contents of representational works of art, as Hartmann also applies his levels analysis to the aesthetic properties of non-figurative works, including architectural ones. A building qua material object obviously figures amongst the real entities of the world, but to experience the material building as a work of art is to engage in the imaginative apprehension of fictional qualities. Hartmann appears to be claiming in this regard that such terms as ‘grandiose’, ‘pompous’ or ‘majestic’, are, when used as labels to name the aesthetic qualities of a building, in some sense imaginative and hence fictional.

Kindred approaches to the question of the work’s existence have been developed by a number of different figures, an early instance being the American philosopher Stephen C. Pepper, who describes how the imagination contributes to a process in which “an aesthetic work of art is created out of a physical work of art” (1937a, 231; 1955). Pepper, who was a professor of philosophy at the University of California at Berkeley, was on the same panel as Hartmann at the 1926 Congress mentioned above. It is not clear, however, whether Pepper embraced Hartmann’s conclusion that works of art are in some sense fictions. Pepper argued for a relativist conception whereby ontological issues depend ultimately on such overarching rival frameworks as organicism, mechanism, and pragmatism or “contextualism.” Pepper explicitly denied that any one of these frameworks was the one true theory.

Another philosopher whose early contributions merit attention in this vein is Joseph Margolis (1958, 1959, 1961). Margolis describes a work of art as being comprised of a physical system (for example, a lump of clay) and an aesthetic design. To behold something as a work of art, it is necessary to combine a sensory perception of the physical item with an imaginative experience of the aesthetic design. The design “supervenes” upon the physical system. Margolis suggests that whereas contradictory assertions about a physical object cannot both be true, the principle of noncontradiction does not apply to the description of works of art.

1.4 Intermittence

Margolis (1958) explicitly endorses one implication of his hypothesis regarding the way of being or Seinsweise of the work of art. In the absence of the right sort of attention, the work ceases to exist, even though the physical system remains intact. Yet the same work can return to existence when the same sort of imaginative attention is directed upon the physical system that constitutes the supervenience base of the artwork, thereby “reviving” the correlative aesthetic design.

Several philosophers (e.g., Eleanor Rowland 1913, 117, Gilson 1957, Hilde Hein 1959, Andrew Harrison 1967–68, Currie 1989, 57) have questioned the wisdom of allowing that the existence of a work is intermittent. An early example is Johannes Volkelt (1905, 11), who asserts that the statue of Zeus in Otricoli was a work of art throughout the many centuries during which it lay buried and unobserved. As Wolterstorff later put it, “Have not Beethoven’s quartets, Rembrandt’s prints, and Yeats’s poems existed at least ever since their composition?” (1980, 43). As will become apparent below, a desire to find some alternative to the hypothesis of intermittent existence has influenced some of the proposals about the category of enduring or perduring entities to which artworks should be said to belong. For example, Andrew Paul Ushenko characterized works as powers so as to avoid the intermittence problem (1953, 47), and similar intuitions motivated Pepper’s (1965) “double-dispositional” account, according to which a work’s continuous existence depends on the “passive disposition” of a physical object as well as the “dynamic disposition” of the observer.

1.5 Idealism

It would be quite misleading to give the impression that all of those philosophers who thought minds and their activities have something to do with the existence of works of art also thought that this means that works were somehow less real than, say, natural physical entities and events. Idealists invert this hierarchy. This is explicit in Benedetto Croce (1913, 1965, 9–10) when he asserts that works of art cannot be physical entities because works of art are “supremely real” whereas the physical world is “unreal.”

Another proponent of an idealist ontology of art is Waldemar Conrad (1908–09). Conrad stressed Edmund Husserl’s contrast between “natural” and “phenomenological” attitudes and their objects (for background, see the entries on Husserl and phenomenology). Conrad asserts that only the latter attitude can reveal the “ideal Object” that is the genuine or intended [gemeinte] work of art. In his example, which could well have served as the counterpoint for Sartre’s discussion of Beethoven’s Seventh Symphony, the genuine work is the symphony itself as opposed to the various spatiotemporal events, such as more or less competent orchestral performances, or someone’s whistling the melody or reading the score, that might help to direct attention to some of the work’s essential features (1908–09, 77–78). Conrad does not present a detailed defense of his assumptions about the ontology of ideal objects, but clearly shared Husserl’s aversion to psychologism (for background, see the entry on psychologism).

Croce’s (1902, 1913, 1948) claims about works (and ideas) as “expressions” of experience generated a lot of controversy and did much to put ontological issues on the agenda of aesthetics and the philosophy of art (for background, see the entry on Croce’s aesthetics). British proponents of Croce-inspired aesthetics included Lascelles Abercrombie (1922), who promoted the idea that the work is an experience, and P. Leon (1931), who rhapsodized about the aesthetic object as an experienced quale. Drawing upon a broad Platonic and Romantic background, George W. Beiswanger (1939) developed the view that the “material” work is merely a means to the aesthetic object, which he characterized as “experienced experiencing,” an idea inspired, apparently, by John Dewey’s remark that “the actual work of art is what the product does with and in experience” (1934, 3).

By far the most influential Croce-inspired aesthetician was Robin George Collingwood (1925, 1938), whose several translations of Croce’s work helped make the Italian philosopher’s views more accessible to readers bereft of Italian (for background and references, see Alan Donagan 1972). As Collingwood’s philosophy of art is the subject of a separate entry as well as various commentaries (e.g., Ian Winchester 2004, David Davies 2008), we can be brief here. For some purposes talk of a “Croce-Collingwood” theory of art is good enough, but of course differences come to the fore when one reads these authors with an eye to detail. It seems fair to say that for Collingwood, the work of art is not a physical object or finished artifact, but the conscious imaginative activity through which creative expression takes place. That works are the activity of the imagination does not make them any less real in Collingwood’s opinion.

An objection to all theories that invite us to think of works of art as experiences—those of the artist and/or those of the audience—is that this is a conflation of an experience and the object of the experience. It is one thing to acknowledge that a work is the product or even the expression of an experience and that it is designed to occasion certain kinds of experiences; it is something else entirely to assert that the work is itself an experience and nothing more. Such an account neglects the physical dimensions of art, beginning with the artist’s encounter with materials and media. It is also objected that the attempted reduction of artworks to experiences would convert a public, culturally situated entity into something private. Early worries of this sort were articulated in relation to Croce’s aesthetics by Alexander (1925) and Louis Arnauld Reid (1926). More recently, these objections have been raised against Roger Scruton’s (1997) ontology of musical works by Jerrold Levinson (2000), who explicitly links Scruton’s account to the legacy of Collingwood and idealism.

Not all philosophers have agreed that all works of art must be public. In his taxonomy of the fine arts, Bernard Bolzano distinguishes between the arts of the external senses and those of pure thought (1849, 14; 2021, 96; 2023, 95–96). The latter arts produce works comprised of complex ideas or thoughts that are not linguistically articulated and that are only directly accessible to the person thinking of them. Bolzano remarks that this feature of the arts of pure thought is a great imperfection. He adds, however, that these arts play a role in the creation of those works of art, such as statues and songs, that are perceptible to audiences: “Closer reflection will make it clear that not just some but all works of art that consist in an object in external reality could never have been produced by their creator through his free and intentional action if he had not first been able to develop a very detailed representation of the object in his mind” (1849, 15–16; 2021, 98; 2023, 97).

1.6 Elimination

Given a sufficiently austere ontology, titles such as ‘Das Lied von der Erde’ and ‘To the Lighthouse’ have no real referents. Those who defend such an ontology are rarely eager to trumpet the implications for the arts, perhaps because doing so would be a poor recommendation for the austerity. A few thinkers writing about aesthetics have, however, conjectured that we would be better off without committing ourselves to the existence of works. For example, Richard Rudner (1950) distinguished between questions about the object of our aesthetic responses and questions about the referents of the names of works. The answer to the latter question is that such names are non-designative or syncategorematic. The former question, Rudner concludes, is not scientific and should be set aside.

Roland Barthes (1971) notoriously asserted that the concept of the work of art is part of a repressive ideology that should be replaced by a liberating conception of textuality. The word ‘textualité’ referred in his mind to a highly indeterminate and exciting sphere of semantic and erotic possibilities; ‘une œuvre’ [a work] stood for an ideological drag involving wrong-headed thinking about fixed meanings, ownership, and repression.

In a somewhat similar spirit but without Barthes’s poststructuralist idiom, Stephen David Ross (1977) contends that there is no work of art simpliciter, but any number of discriminable achievements or loci of artistic value.

Anders Pettersson (1981, 1984, 1990, 2009, 2012) contends that talk of a text or literary work can be eliminated. He acknowledges that the concept of a literary work forms part of ordinary language and is useful in theoretically undemanding contexts, but he also argues that it is a self-contradictory construct that creates many pseudo-problems for literary theory. We can say what we need to say about literature in a theoretically adequate way without making any ontological commitments to texts or works and without introducing any new entities by referring to such phenomena as physical copies of texts, texts in the sense of sequences of signs, or meaning in its different varieties.

A more recent proponent of an eliminativist strategy is Ross P. Cameron (2008), who contends that we need not make works of art part of our fundamental metaphysics. Even so, we can still hold our common sense statements about them to be true. For criticisms of the idea that this eliminativist position is compatible with common sense or well-entrenched practices, see Robert Stecker (2009) and Stefano Predelli (2009).

2. Monism and its rivals

In this context ‘monism’ is simply a label for the idea that all works of art fall within one ontological category, such as abstract particulars. A prevalent argument against this sort of thesis rests on the distinction between performance and non-performance works: many musical works can be performed by various persons and on various occasions; a painting cannot. Having described such distinctions amongst works of art, Wolterstorff concludes tersely that “Works of art are not all alike in their ontological status” (1975, 230). According to Stephen Davies (2001), we need not look beyond the art of music to find grounds for rejecting ontological monism. More recently, Robert Howell (2002a, 2002b) has argued that if the term ‘work of art’ covers artistic improvisations, the various utterances referred to as ‘oral literature’, and such items as paintings and scored musical compositions, then no single adequate ontological category is to be found. With reference to artists’ stipulative authority over the “features and boundaries” of their works, Sherri Irvin declares that “Any claim to the effect that all works belong to the same ontological category will thus come out false or uninformative” (2008, 1). Yet as will become clear below, monism still has its proponents.

2.1 Multiple vs. singular artistic items

Many debates over monism and rivals to that position have hinged on the question of reproduction and multiple instances, the thought being that in the case of at least some works, adequate technologies of reproduction yield more than one instance of an artistic artifact, and therefore of the work (an entailment that does not go unchallenged, as we shall see below). For example, it would be highly implausible to contend that Henri Cartier-Bresson’s famous photographic work, “Behind the Gare Saint-Lazare, Paris” (1932), consists in the negative used to make prints, or in the first or any other single print of this picture. Multiply instantiated works form one major category, then, while singular or non-reproducible ones form another.

It has been complained, however, that this distinction ought not to be taken as decisive for an ontology of art since it rests upon a contingent thesis about what is technologically possible.

The question of how technological change can influence our basic conception of works of art was raised by Walter Benjamin in a famous essay, a first version of which appeared in French in 1936 (translated literally, the title is ‘The Work of Art in the Age of its Mechanical Reproducibility’). Benjamin is generally interpreted as claiming that the advent of techniques of mechanical reproduction has undermined the quasi-religious “aura” that previously surrounded the individual work of art. Benjamin appears to have viewed such technological change as part of a liberating or progressive historical process. Whether Benjamin held that no work of art really was or could be an “authentic” concrete particular is hard to determine, however, as the history of art’s political functions is the primary focus of his somewhat obscure essay. Benjamin does declare early on (in both the first and revised versions of his essay) that “In principle, the work of art has always been reproducible. Objects made by humans could always be copied by humans” (2008, 20).

Other philosophers have argued that technological possibility should not be thought decisive with regard to the soundness of a monist ontology of art: the important philosophical question is what is nomologically or metaphysically possible. A relatively early example is C. I. Lewis’s oft-overlooked (1946) discussion of the ontology of the work of art.

Drawing on the work of Pepper and D. W. Prall (1929, 1936), Lewis held that an aesthetic appreciation of art is based on the contemplation of an “aesthetic essence” presented by the work. Lewis describes an aesthetic essence as “a certain composition of sense or qualia” and as “an immediate apprehension of sense” (1946, 188). Lewis also writes in this context of “qualitatively identical items of content (Santayana’s ‘essences’?)” (1946, 18), thereby suggesting he is not quite sure whether his notion of an essence comes close to that of George Santayana, who described essences as the immediate data of experience (1923). (For background, see the entry on Clarence Irving Lewis, and especially the section on “the given.”)

When we appreciate a painting, Lewis contends, what we contemplate is what this canvas could have in common with some optimal reproduction of it, namely, “that qualitative and abstract essence which is here incorporated, and is theoretically repeatable in some other physical object” (1946, 477). Lewis claims that an aesthetic object always depends upon some physical object, but he maintains that these dependency relations differ in degree: a poem depends on a particular inscription less than a work of visual art depends on a particular visible object. A poem, he proposes, is “an abstraction which is actualized in the instances of its presentation, through the medium of some physical vehicle. It is an entity essentially repeatable in, or common to, different physical events or things which instance it” (1946, 474–475). Lewis goes on to say that the abstractness of works is not like that of universals in that the latter “stand in contrast to anything which is sensuously qualitative and imaginal” (1946, 475). Lewis also maintains that a work or art is not just a type of visual appearance abstracted from a physical object, or in Lewis’s terms, an artistic vehicle. Instead, for Lewis, the aesthetic essence constitutive of the identity of the work of art, as opposed to the physical object, “lies in the context associated with this physical entity which presents it” (1946, 474, Lewis’s italics). Lewis holds that if the observer does not take this associated context into account in the interpretation of the vehicle, the work of art is misapprehended or not apprehended at all: “whatever the subject must bring to the presentation, in order correctly to understand the poem presented, belongs to the poem” (1946, 474).

Note that Lewis considers every aesthetic essence to be “an abstraction which theoretically could be identically presented by another physical thing” (1946, 476). Similar claims to the effect that all works of art are multiple, at least in principle and qua objects of appreciation, were subsequently made by Ushenko (1953, 21–25), Peter Strawson (1959, 231, n. 1; 1974, 183), Jeanne Wacker (1960), Anthony Savile (1971), Eddie Zemach (1966, 1986), and Currie (1989).

Many other writers have, on the contrary, stressed the singularity of at least some works of art and/or some of their constituents. Croce’s influential (1903) diatribe against the “science” of genres stands at the top of a list that includes George Boas (1937), Henri Focillon (1934, 56), Souriau (1947, 70), Stuart Hampshire (1952), Ingarden (1962), Nelson Goodman (1968), Richard Wollheim (1968), Wolterstorff (1975, 1980), Catherine Lord (1977), Mark Sagoff (1978), E. J. Lowe (1983), Levinson (1987, 1996), Gérard Genette (1994), Anthony O’Hear (1995), Irvin (2008), and Michael Weh (2010).

The diversity of arguments and positions on this broad particularist theme should be noted. For example, Ingarden reacts negatively to the prospect of a multiplicity of perfect replicas of the cathedral of Notre Dame de Paris: seeing such things side by side, he comments, would cause “the strongest displeasure, precisely because it belongs to the nature of the work of art to be an individual, in the sense of something qualitatively unique” (1989, 274; 1962, 278). O’Hear defends a “singularity thesis” to the effect that “works of distinction” are necessarily individual and unique, whereas Weh argues that artistic intentions constrained by the historical circumstances determine whether and when a work is reproducible or multiple. Wolterstorff’s line on this topic is that in the case of many paintings, the artist does not settle on a set of properties that establish criteria for correctness of instances or “occurrences” of the work (1980, 72). Genette maintains that the reproducibility of works of art is a matter of an institutionally codified consensus based on a balance between means and needs (1994, 101). For critical discussions of Genette’s art ontology, see Lamarque (2011), Livingston (2011), and Roger Pouivet (2011).

In a paper published posthumously in 2001, Frank Sibley contends that a “two-directional pull” is a pervasive feature of the practices and discourses of art, at least with regard to visual works of art such as the Mona Lisa. If a painting is a particular physical object, the work of art referred to as the Mona Lisa may or may not be a painting: “Perhaps it both is and is not, can be and need not be” (2001, 272). We are interested in the unique physical object, yet we also find that a copy can serve many of the same functions, including artistic and aesthetic ones. So either we have two distinct concepts of works of this kind, or we have inherited what Sibley calls an “uneasy composite or hybrid of two conflicting notions” (2001, 272).

2.2 Artistic vehicles vs. works of art

One source of confusion in this area is divergent assumptions about both the extension and intension of the expression ‘work of art’ and its cognates: what is it, exactly, that can or cannot be classified in a single, basic ontological category? Whereas Virgil Aldrich (1963) proclaims the term ‘work of art’ useful because of its ambivalence, others (e.g., Boas 1937) have found the pervasive ambiguity in the discourse about artworks (starting with a process/product conflation) troublesome and in need of clarification. I. A. Richards famously wrote that people “naturally talk about poems (and pictures, etc.) in a way which makes it impossible for anybody to discover what it is we are talking about” (1924, 176). Evoking the “vague” and “diverse” usage of the term, Francis Sparshott (1963) worried that the question about what sort of thing a work of art is might have no precise answer. Richard Shusterman concurs, and passes the question of the identity of the work of art along to the “piecemeal efforts of practicing art critics” (1980, 543). Claudine Tercelin (2005) develops a Peircean perspective attuned to the possibility of an irreducible, ontic vagueness in art (and elsewhere).

Thomasson (2005) argues that the relevant sortals yield only vague and incomplete identity and persistence conditions. As a result, some questions in the ontology of art admit of no precise answers. A good example would be the question of just how faulty a performance of a difficult composition can be and still count as a performance of the work. She also holds that there is no justifiable response to the question of whether a poem has actually been created when the poet has a complete sequence of words in mind but has never spoken it aloud or written it down (2005, 227). Thomasson’s skepticism, however, is a limited one: some art-ontological questions do have determinate answers about which sufficiently well-informed practitioners in the world of art could not be wrong. Thomasson reasons that competent users of the discourse successfully refer to particular novels, paintings, and symphonies, so they must have reliable concepts when it comes to the relevant art kinds. Thomasson does not, however, believe that the same argument works for the more general concept, work of art.

Dominic McIver Lopes (2007) accepts the premise that art-ontological questions find answers in sound art-appreciative practice, but conjectures, with reference to examples of Japanese architecture, that such practices vary significantly across cultures. Rafael De Clercq (2008) proposes an alternative explication of the Japanese examples; in a response to De Clercq, Lopes surveys the options and concludes that they “all challenge some widespread philosophical doctrines about the cultural invariance of ontology or reference” (2008, 196).

Pepper, who struggled with art-ontological issues for several decades, ended up proclaiming in his (1952) that ‘work of art’ is best understood as a “portmanteau” expression on which are hung significantly different conceptual garments. In his early writings on the ontology of art (e.g., 1937b, 231; 1946), Pepper had distinguished between the work of art and “the aesthetic work.” In response to published objections and queries (Nathan Berall 1951, James L. Jarrett 1952, Robert Hoffman 1962), he later drew a distinction between what he proposed to call ‘the control object’ (that he had previously referred to as the ‘physical work of art’ or ‘the vehicle’) and the object of critical evaluation (previously, ‘the aesthetic work of art’).

Various terms for a distinction in this vicinity have been employed. Hermann Siebek (1875, 7) and von Hartmann (1888, vol. 2, 35, 208) both used the term ‘Vehikel’ to refer to the material or perceptible bases of aesthetic objects and works of art. Volkelt (1905, 11) used the term ‘Ausserdinge’ to refer to the non-psychological items that make up what he called the “pre-aesthetic basis of the work of art.” H. S. Goodhart-Rendel (1934) distinguished between the material of art, the artistic vehicle, and the work of art. His idea is that the vehicle is whatever is used to “externalize” the work or to “disclose it to the world” (1934, 4). In the case of music, the sound is the vehicle; sound is not the artist’s material, however, because some musicians can compose in their heads, and on Goodhart-Rendel’s usage, only those media that are necessary to working in an art form are to be taken as materials. All that is strictly necessary to musical composition is an idea or thought of a sequence of sounds.

The term ‘vehicle’ was taken up again by Harold Osborne, who defined it as what “enables the same organization of material to enter the experience of different persons at different times” (1953, 96). A particular arrangement of pigments upon a canvas or some other surface could be the vehicle of a work, but the work itself is distinct from its material component. The work is not the vehicle alone, but “an enduring possibility, often enshrined or recorded in a material medium, of a specific set of sensory impressions” (1953, 100).

For those who dislike the medical and other connotations of the term ‘vehicle’, there are other options. Ruby Meager uses the term ‘manifestation’, commenting that “a poem is like a universal in being capable of multiple manifestations of which no single one can count as the poem itself” (1958–59, 52). Many writers have preferred the term ‘instances’. Currie, for example, defines ‘instance’ as “all those concrete things that we come into contact with when we experience a work of art” (1989, 5).

Why distinguish between the work of art and its vehicle, manifestation, or control object? Various reasons have motivated such distinctions. One line of thought is that a work is “constituted” by a material object or vehicle, where the constitution relation is not a matter of identity (for background, see the entry on material constitution, and Lamarque 2010). Pouivet (2000, 2010) has brought such arguments to bear on a number of issues in the ontology of art. Simon J. Evnine (2009, 2016) develops a constitution theory as well.

John Dilworth (2005a) distinguishes between the concrete artifact or event and the artwork. In his view the relation between them is representational. The artifact or event represents the work, which in turn represents other content, namely, the subject matter of the work.

In an analogy that some philosophers (e.g., Arthur C. Danto 1993, 199–200) have taken quite seriously, the vehicle is to the work as the body is to the person; for a very early remark in this vein, see Johan Georg Sulzer (1792, vol. 4, 727), who declares that the work of art has both body (the artistic material or Stoff), and soul or Geist (the representation or Darstellung). For a critical assessment of artwork-person analogies, see Stephen Davies (2001, 175–81). Another way of motivating the work–vehicle distinction in aesthetics is to say, along with Pepper and others, that reference to the vehicle or artistic structure alone does not suffice to identify the object of critical evaluation, or what artistic and aesthetic appreciation is really about.

The next section evokes a commonly told story about the basis of a work-object distinction, indicating some ways in which this story is misleading.

2.2.1 Indiscernibility and the story of Pierre Menard

In his widely cited 1964 paper, “The Artworld,” Danto cleverly evoked ways in which perceptually indistinguishable painted canvases could be the vehicles of strikingly different works of art bearing different titles and contrasting artistic and aesthetic qualities. It follows, Danto reasons, that the painted canvas alone is not the work of art, unless ‘is’ has a special sense.

In a reply to questions raised by Sparshott (1976), Danto claimed to have been “loosely following a famous model in the philosophy of perception” when he began to explore the implications of indiscernibles for issues in aesthetics (1976, 80). Yet at the outset of the second chapter of his 1981 book, The Transfiguration of the Commonplace, Danto commented: “the possibility was first recognized, I believe, in connection with literary works, by Borges, who has the glory of having discovered it in his masterpiece, Pierre Menard, Symbolist Poet” [sic].

It is certainly the case that many philosophers have found inspiration in Jorge Luis Borges’s 1939 story, “Pierre Menard, autor del Quijote,” an English translation of which first appeared in 1962 (for more on this topic, see Livingston and Pettersson 2016). This short story is not easy to summarize, but one relevant part of it concerns a French symbolist who sets out to create a novel by rewriting—without simply copying—the text of Cervantes’s masterpiece. The narrator of the story makes observations about ways in which Menard’s work would be different from Cervantes’s even if Menard somehow managed to produce something “verbally identical” to what Cervantes had written.

In English-language philosophical publications, the earliest reference to the tale and to its implications for the ontology of art appears in Savile’s (1971) essay on Goodman’s Languages of Art (for background, see the entry on Goodman’s aesthetics). Subsequent references to the story’s philosophical implications include Walton (1973), Wollheim (1978), Goodman (1978), David K. Lewis (1978), Levinson (1980a, 2012), Ben Tilghman (1982), Susan Wilsmore (1987), Currie (1989), Jean-Marie Schaefer (1989), Michael Wreen (1990), David Davies (1991, 2010), Christopher Janaway (1992), Lamarque (1998, 2010), Jacques Morizot (1999), and the papers in Petr Kot’átko and Karel Cisar (2004).

Savile presented what he referred to as the “Borges-paradox” in order to contest some of Goodman’s claims about the individuation of works of art. More specifically, Goodman had distinguished between “autographic” and “allographic” works, where the former, unlike the latter, are susceptible to forgery. Moving quickly, the thought is that while it is possible to make a more or less successful forgery of a particular painting, it is impossible to make a deceptive copy of a work of literature because any verbally identical instance of the text is a good copy of the work, or in Goodman’s terms, an instance produced in conformity with a system of notation (for discussion of Goodman’s distinction, see Levinson 1980b, Pillow 2003, and the entry on Goodman’s aesthetics). For a discussion of Goodman on relations between scores and musical works, see Bengt Edlund (1996).

Savile presents the Pierre Menard case as a counterexample to Goodman’s thesis that the identity conditions of allographic works are determined by a notational scheme.

Two numerically distinct tokens of the same “verbally identical” text-type could be generated by different literary authors—Menard and Cervantes—working in significantly different artistic contexts. These could, then, be the texts of two artistically different works. Ergo, the work is not the text. Turning from literature to music, Savile asks us to imagine a case where Stockhausen independently composes “an ode notationally and semantically identical” with a composition by Stamitz. Savile proposes that “We should certainly not say that they had composed the same work, for the way in which it would be appropriate to hear them would be quite different” (1971, 23; cf. Levinson 1980a).

The Borgesian narrator also floats the idea that one work could have two artistically different texts, which could be taken as reinforcing a Menard-inspired assault on a text-to-work biconditional (Livingston 2005a). Generalizing, we end up with a broad distinction between works of art and their “objects” or vehicles.

There has unsurprisingly been some skepticism about both the distinction between vehicle and work, and the idea that cogent reasoning in favor of such a distinction is really to be found in the Borges story. Tilghman (1982), Currie (1989, 134 n. 19) and Lamarque (2010), for example, raise questions about the intelligibility and coherence of that part of the Borges story that concerns Pierre Menard’s unusual intentions and putative achievement with regard to the writing of “his” Quixote. What are we supposed to imagine about Menard’s ambition in setting out to “rewrite” but not copy the text of the novel by Cervantes? Is this a psychologically coherent project? What is more, is there any good reason to think of his text as a new work? For denials, see Goodman (1978) and Goodman and Catherine Z. Elgin (1988), who contend that Menard’s text, if brought to completion, would only be a “replica” of Cervantes’s. Harry Deutsch (1991, 224) also contests interpretations of the story that find in it a cogent expression of ontological contextualism. The story should instead be read as expressing Borges’ satirical distance from the views of its narrator.

With regard to the text-work distinction and the more general arguments given in support of it, various doubts have been raised. Wollheim (1993) challenges the evidentiary value of thought experiments in a context where the concept in question—in this case, the one evoked by the expression ‘work of art’—has no determinate conditions for its application, but only some broad assumptions that can easily be “transgressed” by the apparent results of a thought experiment. Tilghman had complained a decade earlier that Danto did not specify any criteria of work constitution. Tilghman (1982) added that the ontological question of constitution is in any case not crucial to questions about criticism and appreciation.

It can also be reasonably doubted whether the Borges story truly merits the “glory” of discovery to which Danto alludes. Lamarque (1998, 2010) finds evidence of the key contextualist insight, or at least closely related points, in passages from both Shakespeare and Kant.

2.2.2 Carl Lange’s indiscernibles

Another earlier and little-known contribution on our topic was made by the Danish physician and neurologist, Carl Georg Lange (1834–1900). Lange’s book of 1899, Bidrag til Nydelsernes Fysiologi som grundlag for en rationel æstetik, the title of which can be translated quite literally as ‘Contribution to the Physiology of the Pleasures as Foundation for a Rational Aesthetics’, begins with a lengthy survey of the author’s ideas about the nature of the various sources of enjoyment or pleasure, and then moves on to apply these ideas to the arts and beauty.

Lange argues that the various sorts of enjoyments or pleasures [the Danish ‘nydelser’ is ambiguous between the two] given to us by works of art have a few basic sources, including variety [afvekslingen] and the arousal of sympathy. He also stresses the art appreciator’s admiration of the artist’s manifest overcoming of artistic difficulties in the creation of the work. The awareness that very few people, or perhaps even only a unique individual [den Enkelte], could have brought about a particularly innovative and difficult artistic achievement is a distinct source of artistic enjoyment. Lange wants to argue that this type of artistic enjoyment depends upon the appreciator’s awareness of aspects of the art object’s origins. One can only admire a work, in the special sense of artistic admiration or ‘beundring’ conceived of by Lange, to the extent that one can understand and evaluate the artistic difficulties the artist has overcome. Although Lange here repeats a claim made in earlier aesthetic treatises (e.g. Véron 1878, 63), he takes the argument one step further. He turns to an imaginary indiscernibility example in an effort to make a point about the relevant aspects “in a work” [i et Værk] that can give rise to the special kind of enjoyment he has in mind:

There are examples where people, and this includes even the experts, disagree over which of two paintings is the original and which is a copy. In such a situation one should think that the artistic pleasures these two paintings occasion must be more or less the same, and indeed they are, up to the moment when the doubt is removed. Once this happens the difference is very large, as history shows. Nothing prevents us in any case from imagining a copy that so perfectly reproduces the original that there is no way to distinguish them from each other. Yet there is all the difference in the world between the enjoyments they occasion. The enjoyment value of the copy, and with it, its economic value, is negligible compared to that of the original, and this notwithstanding the fact that they resemble each other like two drops of water (1899, 125–126, my trans.).

Lange holds, in other words, that one object of aesthetic admiration and enjoyment is the relational event of artist A in context C creating something sufficiently novel to provide an audience with a certain type of pleasure. Lange explicitly insists that the kind of value he has in mind is “in” the work, but not an intrinsic feature of the (tokens of) the visually identical image type.

As will become apparent below, the debate between monisms and their rivals in the ontology of art continues.

3. What sorts of entities are works of art?

Philosophers who have asked themselves what sorts of things works of art are have had recourse to a bewildering array of received and newly postulated ontological categories. The following survey is not exhaustive, but identifies some of the most prominent proposals published in the period focused on in this entry.

3.1 Platonism and its critics

Platonism about works of art can be understood as the thesis that some or even all works of art are abstract entities that have no spatiotemporal location (for background, see the entry on platonism in metaphysics). It is most common to conjoin a platonist account of works in some art forms, such as music and literature, with a different account, i.e. the physical object hypothesis, of works in other art forms, such as painting and dance. Recent advocates of platonism in the ontology of art include Kingsley Price (1982), Peter Kivy (1983, 1987), and Julian Dodd (2000, 2007, 2010). Noteworthy recent critiques of platonist theses in the ontology of art include R. A. Sharpe (1995, 2000, 2001), Stephen Davies (1993, 2003b, 2008), Predelli (1995, 2001, 2002, 2006), Saam Trivedi (2002, 2008), Andrew Kania (2008a, 2008b, 2012), David Davies (2009a, 2009b), Marcus Rossberg (2012), Chris Tillman (2011), and Gary Ostertag (2012).

Some of the objections to platonism in art ontology are versions of longstanding criticisms of the postulation of abstract objects, such as the objection that the instantiation relation between universals and their particular manifestations leads to a regress, or is obscure or inexplicable. Other objections are raised by philosophers who do not reject all postulations of knowable abstract objects, but who nonetheless find that works of art are not adequately classified as such items.

One worry about platonism with regard to music runs as follows: if a sound, and the hearing of a sound, are spatiotemporal events, and if a musical work is an abstract type that has no spatiotemporal location and that exists independently of particular performances of it, how could it be literally true to say that a musical work has such-and-such sounds? Do platonists about musical works have to accept the conclusion that musical works are, strictly speaking, inaudible (Davies 2009b)? Another worry concerns performances and their relation to the abstract objects of which they are a performance: if a musical work is a fully determinate abstract object, how could an interpretative performance of it be necessary to its appreciation (Predelli 1995, 2001)?

Rudner raised another objection that is often taken up in the literature (e.g., Caplan and Matheson 2004). If a work such as Beethoven’s Fifth Symphony is an abstract entity, this would have “as a counter-intuitive consequence a denial that Beethoven created the Fifth Symphony” (1950, 385).

Here we encounter a paradox, or incoherent conjunction of thoughts each of which has some intuitive appeal when examined separately. As Kania (2008a, 22) and Cameron (2008, 295) put it in the context of discussions of the ontology of musical works, the triad may be specified as follows:

(A) Works of art are created.
(B) Works of art are abstract objects.
(C) Abstract objects cannot be created.

Many philosophers (e.g., Wolterstorff 1980, Kivy 1987, Currie 1989) have thought that this paradox is best resolved by rejecting (A). For others, such as Khatchadourian (1960) and Renée Cox (1985), (A) is true; works of art should be recognized as items that come into existence and can be destroyed. Given this premise, which is defended at length by Charles Nussbaum (2003), the trio may be interpreted as a reductio of (B). Yet giving up on (B) would seem to require us to overlook the obvious fact that we commonly speak of a musical work as being repeatable. Cannot the same recorded song be replayed on multiple occasions? Another strategy is to restore coherence by revising only (C). Margaret MacDonald (1952–1953) proposes that works are abstract types that are genuinely created by the artist or author. Similarly, Thomasson argues that at least some works of art (i.e., musical and literary works) are a kind of “abstract artifact” meriting recognition as genuine creations (1999, 2005, 2006a, 2006b, 2010). Barry Smith (2008) also argues for what he calls ‘quasi-abstract patterns’, which like numbers are nonphysical and nonpsychological, but which are tied, through the actions of agents, to a time and historical context. Anthony Ralls (1972) characterizes works as created universals concretely embodied through the intentional activities of artists. Peter Alward (2004) contends that the paradox is generated by inappropriate assumptions about types, and that genuine artistic creation is compatible with a continuant/stage model of works and performances. Lee Walters (2013) argues for a solution to the paradox based on the thesis that works are created types. He responds to an array of objections to this approach, including those advanced in Allan Hazlett (2012).

3.2 Type-token distinctions

Many philosophers who have sought to say what sorts of entities works of art are have spoken of ‘types’ and ‘tokens’, an idiom which can be traced back to Charles Sanders Peirce (1931–1958, IV, para. 537, 423). (For background, including a discussion of Peirce’s statements on the topic, see the entry on types and tokens.) One idea that some art ontologists have found promising is that as a special sort of abstraction, types have features that should be kept in mind as we seek to solve the paradox of creation and other vexed issues, such as the question of how a work of art can have particular perceptible qualities if it is an imperceptible abstract object. As becomes apparent below, however, the conclusions on this score have been quite diverse.

Although Wollheim has at times wrongly been credited with this move, the earliest explicit reference to the type-token distinction in the literature on the ontology of art is to be found in Rudner (1950). Subsequent philosophers who have discussed applications of type-token distinctions in the philosophy of art include Charles Stevenson (1957, 1958), Meager (1958–59) Margolis (1958, 1959, 1961), W. D. L. Scobie (1960), Wacker (1960), Khatchadourian (1960), Ruth Saw (1961), Donald F. Henze (1957, 1961), Jay E. Bacharach (1971), Nigel Harrison (1975), R. A. Sharpe (1979, 1995, 2001), Rossberg (2012), and Davies (2012).

Rudner brought up the type-token distinction in the context of a critique of Lewis’s (1946) idea that a work of art is a contextualized abstract entity. Rudner conjectured that what Lewis had in mind in talking about the relationship between an abstract entity and its renditions or instances was the type-token relation. This conjecture makes sense given that Lewis was one of the first American philosophers to read his way through the Peircean Nachlass, which he found stored in cartons in the first office he was assigned at Harvard. Lewis indeed refers to Peirce at times in his (1946), but he did not endorse Peirce’s theses about the nature of types; nor did Lewis use the idiom of types and tokens in the passages where he tried to identify what he took to be the special character of the relations between aesthetic essences and their concrete vehicles, one of his main proposals being that some kinds of works of art depend more than others on concrete objects.

Stevenson (1957) reached for a type/token distinction in an attempt to disambiguate the intuitively appealing idea that a poem is a written or spoken sequence of words. ‘Word’, Stevenson notes, is ambiguous between the particular instance or token and the type of word. While he finds it tempting to rule that the poem is the type (of word sequence), Stevenson considers this to be incompatible with ordinary discourse about literature, as when we use the title of a work to refer to a particular token, saying “Please hand me Paradise Lost.” Stevenson considers it best to allow that the work is either a type or a token, leaving the task of disambiguation to context-sensitive usage. He explicitly rejects René Wellek and Austin Warren’s (1942) Ingarden-inspired thesis that a work is an abstract item, namely a stratified system of norms. In order to accommodate the idea that meaning is also essential to the kind of thing a poem is, Stevenson uses the term ‘megatype’ to pick out classes of word sequences having the same meaning, so that a poem is identifiable as a megatype. Megatypes, he would appear to believe, are ultimately reducible to “a special kind of physical object or event” (1958, 41 n. 2), but it is not clear how this analysis will proceed: is the conjunction of a meaningful text type and the text types of all of its past, present, and future faithful translations a physical object or event?

In an extended criticism of particularist accounts of the individuation and evaluation of works, Meager characterizes a work as either a spatiotemporal object or performance that manifests a pattern of elements that is the product of a person’s (or group of persons’) activity, where the activity was not a matter of copying or servile imitation, and where the object or performance is evaluated non-instrumentally. The concept of a work of art, she comments, “operates in a rather special way as a universal defined by a spatio-temporal particular, which may itself therefore be regarded as a type-universal” (1958–59, 59). According to Meager, the identity of the individual artist is not a factor of work individuation: should two different persons independently author poems that happen to consist in the same sequence of words, they have independently authored the same work, even if their motives, intentions, and contexts are strikingly different.

Turning now to Wollheim’s influential application of a type-token distinction (1968, 1980), what is most noteworthy about his articulation of the idea that at least some works of art are best categorized as types is the reason he gives for saying that types are different from other “generic entities,” and in particular, universals. The relation between a type and its tokens is, according to Wollheim, “more intimate” than the relation between a universal (e.g., a property) and its instances. Whereas the property being white is not itself white, all and only those properties that a token has by virtue of its being a token of a given type are “transmitted” to that type as well: as no bit of cloth that is not rectangular can be a correctly formed token of the type The Union Jack, it follows that the property of being rectangular also belongs to the type The Union Jack. This idea is endorsed by Oswald Hanfling (1992, 80–82), Linda Wetzel (2009), and others.

This contention about the “more intimate” relation between types, tokens, and their instantiations of properties leaves one to wonder how Wollheim conceived of both universals and types. Unlike Peirce, he does not hold that the existence of a type depends on that of at least one token; Wollheim seems inclined to accept types as a species of autonomously existing abstract object. Yet if any item that instantiates the property rectangular must be spatial, and if every token of The Union Jack instantiates that property, then it follows from Wollheim’s claim that The Union Jack is, qua type, rectangular. It would appear to follow from this that the type must be a concrete, spatially located entity, since anything that can literally be rectangular must be located in space. Yet one of the main reasons for going in for the theory of types in the first place was Peirce’s basic observation that while token word inscriptions of ‘the’ have their times and places, the word the, qua type, has no location. Is it sound to postulate the existence of an autonomous abstraction having spatial or temporal features?

Reicher (1998) acknowledges that if works are types, they cannot literally have spatiotemporal properties. With the aim of providing a more accurate restatement of ordinary talk about the perceptible qualities of works, she distinguishes between two different modes of predication. In an example of a first mode of predication, someone says ‘the table is rectangular’. This is contrasted to a different mode whereby we say, for example, ‘this work of art is determined as [ist bestimmt als] rectangular’. If a work of art has been determined as rectangular, then every realization of the work is rectangular. We can perceive a work’s realizations, as these are concrete objects or actions, but strictly speaking, we apprehend [erfassen] but do not perceive the type itself. (For background on this approach, see the entry on nonexistent objects.)

Guy Rohrbaugh (2003) argues that even in the case of repeatable works such as photographs, the category of types does not adequately capture at least three fundamental features of works of art: temporality (they come into existence and can cease to exist), temporal flexibility (some of their qualities can change over time), and modal flexibility (a work could have had properties other than those it actually has). According to Rohrbaugh, type theories cannot accommodate this kind of modal flexibility. He proposes instead that works of art should be conceived of as historical individuals that persist through time.

3.3 Norm-kinds

Wolsterstorff complains that Wollheim’s thesis about the sharing of properties among types and their tokens gives us “no illumination” with respect to the pattern of such sharing (1975, 239). Artistic types and their tokens cannot have all and only the same properties. For this reason Wolterstorff turns to a kind of “analogous predication” in which properties attributed to the token are analogously attributed to the type. Suppose a performance or instance of a work has the prescribed or indicated property, P. The analogous property of the work (qua type or kind) is the property: being such that something cannot be a correct or proper example of the work without having the property of being P. Shifting to the terminology of ‘kinds’ and ‘examples’, Wolterstorff focuses on properties that are necessary to “properly formed” examples of a kind, where the kind in question is a “norm-kind” that can (but need not) have both improperly and properly formed instances. For example, some seriously flawed attempts to play a difficult piece by Chopin are nonetheless performances of that work, even though they lack qualities that a proper or a good instance of the work would have. This proposal is meant to accommodate the many cases where significantly different artistic and aesthetic properties figure within the occurrences or performances of one and the same work (on this theme, see also Walton 1977).

Wolterstorff accepts the thesis that works of art neither come into nor go out of existence (1980, 88–89). A kind, K, exists if and only if the correlated property, k, exists. With regard to the existence of properties, Wolterstorff’s initial view (1970) was that for any property, being-f, this property exists just in case either something is-f or something is not-f. Criticisms (John Perry 1974) involving Russell’s paradox of unexemplified properties led him to qualify this “general predicate entailment principle.”

Wolterstorff holds that the sequences of sounds and words of which musical and literary works are made up exist everlastingly. What the artist does in creating a work, then, is to make it the case that a “preexistent kind becomes a work—specifically, a work of his” (1980, 89). Wolterstorff’s idea, then, is that a composer can select but not create a sound pattern or type of sound-occurrence. Although the latter is an entity that already exists, it is not a musical work unless some composer has determined and perhaps recorded its correctness conditions qua work. Wolterstorff remarks that the composing of a musical work is similar to the inventing of a game (1980, 63).

3.4 Capacities, artifacts, and actions

One family of views on the ontological status of works of art finds its orientation in a longstanding conception of the arts in general. The word ‘art’ derives from the Latin ’ars’, which is often taken as translating the Greek term ‘technē’, which covered various sorts of practical capacities or powers. The word derived from the Indo-European root ‘tek’, meaning to put together the woodwork of a house; a ‘tekton’ was a carpenter (Angier 2010, 1). Carpentry is something that cannot be done without some skill, and to become good at the art of carpentry requires training and practice. To exercise an art or craft is to activate a power to bring things about that otherwise would not have happened. In this vein Aristotle declares in his Metaphysics that “all arts, i.e. all productive forms of knowledge are potentialities; they are principles of change in another thing or in the artist himself considered as other” (Met. 1046a36–1046b4; 1984a, 1652). In Nicomachean Ethics he remarks that “since building is an art and is essentially a reasoned state of capacity to make, and there is neither any art that is not such a state nor such a state that is not an art), art is identical with a state of capacity to make, involving a true course of reasoning” (Nic. Eth., 1140a6–1140a11; 1984b, 1799–1800).

That the arts are a matter of the rational production and judgement of artifacts was widely accepted by medieval thinkers (for background, see Eco 1988, 164–165). For example, in the discussion of iconoclasm and idolatry in the Opus Caroli regis contra synodum (ca. 794), Theodulf of Orléans characterized pictures as manufacta (Noble 2009, 227, 347). Claims of this sort stood in opposition to Byzantine beliefs in such things as acheiropoeitoi, or miraculous sacred images not created by mortal hands.

No doubt with Aristotle in mind, in his Summa Theologica (1912, I-II, 57, 4c) Thomas Aquinas defined ‘art’ as right reason in the making of things (ars est recta ratio factibilium). In (1744, 7) James Harris identified art as “an habitual power in man of becoming the cause of some effect, according to a system of various and well-approved precepts.” Kant in turn identified a work or opus as the product of a doing [Tun] (facere), to which he contrasted the effects of nature, such as a beehive. Only what is the product of the exercise of a capacity to choose [eine Willkür] is art (2000 [1790], 182–183, paragraph 43). (For commentary on Kant’s definitions of art and fine art, see Paul Guyer 1997.) Bolzano’s (1849) essay on the nature and classification of works of art similarly emphasizes the necessity of the artist’s intentional activity to the creation of a work. Various philosophers have more recently classified works of art (or at least some works of fine art) as artifacts; examples include Marcia Eaton (1969), Gary Iseminger (1973), Denis Dutton (1979), Risto Hilpinen (1992, 1993), Thomasson (1999), and Levinson (2007) (for background, see the entry on artifacts). The next section is devoted to Levinson’s influential proposal.

3.4.1 Works of art as indicated structures

Levinson advocates a “contextualism” in aesthetics (2005), which is not to be confounded with the approach defended by Pepper (1937a, 1968, 1970) under the same label. For discussions of contextualism in aesthetics, see Gracyk (1996, 2009), Stephen Davies (2001, 1994a, 1994b), and Matheson and Caplan (2007). In his (1980a, 1990) Levinson sets forth and defends an account of “paradigm musical works,” i.e. fully notated compositions within Western culture. His proposal is motivated by the attempt to meet what he takes to be three salient requirements on an adequate ontology of works of this sort: creatability, fine individuation, and the inclusion of performance means.

The first requirement specifies that “Musical works must be such that they do not exist prior to the composer’s compositional activity, but are brought into existence by that activity” (1980, 68). Like Wolterstorff, Levinson allows that all possible sound-types, and patterns and sequences thereof, preexist anyone’s compositional activities. The creatability requirement must be compatible with this assumption, he maintains. The claim is not, then, that composers can bring musical structures into existence; what they can do, however, is “indicate” a structural type along with a performance means or manner of generating instances or tokens of sound sequences of that type. A musical work is, then, a relational entity of the sort “sound structure and performance-means as indicated by artist X at time t.”. This sort of abstract item, Levinson writes, “does not preexist the activity of composition and is thus capable of being created” (1980a, 79; cf. John Andrew Fisher 1991). Entities of this sort, it seems, only come into existence through the actual event of indication performed by a person (or persons) in some context. Terms figuring alongside ‘indicate’ in Levinson’s descriptions of what the artist does with the abstract object include ‘discover’, ‘choose’, and ‘demonstrate’ (1990). Levinson says more about how he understands the difference between ordinary and artistic indication in his (2012).

Levinson’s fine individuation requirement springs from the intuition that if two composers were to indicate the same sound-structure, they would not thereby generate the same musical work. The contrary intuition had been forwarded by Meager (1958–59, 57–58) and Wolterstorff (1975, 248); it was criticized in Walton (1977) and Savile (1971). Levinson entertains the possibility that the identity of the composer is not essential to the individuation of works; perhaps it is at least logically possible for a work to be composed by a person other than the one who actually did so. Levinson explores the thesis that something like sameness of musical-historical context is a constraint sufficient to satisfy the requirement of fine-grained individuation.

Levinson proposes, then, that some musical works may be classified as “initiated types,” that is, types that are brought into being by an intentional action of indication performed upon a pure structure. With regard to works of visual art, Levinson (1996) defends the idea that at least some such works are physical objects as intended by the artist for a certain regard or treatment. The work is the relational entity comprised of the object or structure and the artist’s action in a context.

Currie objects that Levinson’s ontological category, structure as indicated-by-artist at time t, is metaphysically obscure (1989, 58). Fleming discovered penicillin, but do we believe that in so doing he also created the entity, penicillin-as-discovered-by-Fleming? Levinson is explicitly committed to the idea that when the artist indicates or discovers or chooses an abstract structure, “something further comes into existence,” namely, an initiated type (1990, 262). Currie’s point is that if this is allowed, various unwanted ontological commitments follow. A related criticism raised by Dodd (2000), Predelli (2001), and Alward (2004) is that indicating is not really a matter of creating, and if this is correct, it follows that Levinson’s proposal does not satisfy a sufficiently robust version of the first of his three requirements on an adequate ontology of the relevant sorts of works.

Currie also raises the objection that Levinson’s account does not individuate works adequately; this objection has been further pursued by David Davies (2004), and by Matheson and Caplan (2007). Lamarque (2010) contends that there is an indeterminacy as to which tokens are of a given indicated type.

In response to James Anderson’s (1985) suggestion that Levinson’s proposal could be amplified with reference to Wolterstorff’s ideas about norm-kinds, Levinson (1990) expresses reservations about the latter, but adds that the notion that the artist makes certain features normative for a work helps to explain in what indicating a structure consists.

3.4.2 Artworks as actions

Various philosophers have explored the idea that works should be classified as actions or performances as opposed to the products or objects that may result from such actions. Croce, Collingwood, and Dewey are early and highly influential examples. In a remarkable review of Dewey’s aesthetics, Croce makes a list of familiar ideas to be found in Dewey’s work. One of these ideas, which he says was formulated much earlier in Italy, is that “there are not artistic ‘things’, but only an artistic doing, an artistic producing” (1948, 205). Jeffrey Maitland (1975) similarly suggests that the work of art is a “doing”, but also declares that a work is a “performative presence.” Denis Dutton writes that “As performances, works of art represent the ways in which artists solve problems, overcome obstacles, make do with available materials.” (1979, 305). He adds in the same context that “the work of art has a human origin, and must be understood as such.”

Sparshott (1980, 1982) conceives of a work as a performance, and more specifically, as an action when it is conceived in a certain way, namely, as the establishment of a design. Work identity is determined by both the nature of this design and the type of action that yielded it: same design and origin, same work. Sparshott’s evocation of a unity of outcome and agency is complicated, however, by the fact that he thinks in terms of reconstructed or idealized, nonfactual artistic intentions, as opposed to the actual intentions and actions of the artist or artists responsible for the production of a “system of qualities.”

Currie (1989) proposes that all artworks belong to the category of action types. Works are types of events, then, and events are said by Currie to be a “natural ontological category.” Although Currie says he wants to stay neutral on issues pertaining to the nature and individuation of events, he at least provisionally works with Jaegwon Kim’s (1976) conception of events as property exemplifications by an object or substance (or ordered n-tuple of objects/substances) at a time. As types, works could not themselves literally be events, and Currie’s event-types are individuated in ways that abstract from the “constitutive substance” figuring within Kim’s basically Aristotelian perspective on events.

More specifically, Currie’s proposal is that a work is an action type of the form: an agent, A, discovers a structure, s, via a heuristic path, H, at a time, t.

Currie allows that the artist does not create the work of art. Nor does the artist discover it. The artist can discover a preexisting abstract artistic structure, but the work is an action type that the artist “performs” in so doing.

Currie explains that the heuristic path is the “way in which the artist arrived at the final product.” Neither a particular agent nor a specific time is essential to the action type that is the work of art: someone else could discover the same structure at a different time yet instantiate the same work. Currie conjectures, for example, that if “Picasso’s twin on ‘Twin Earth’ produces a canvas indistinguishable from Picasso’s Guernica, and if he does so in the same way, then Guernica and Twin Guernica are instances of the same work” (1989, 9). Currie also introduces a similar conjecture involving Beethoven, twin Beethoven, and twin tokens of the Hammerklavier sonata.

Wolterstorff (1992) and Levinson (1992) complain that a counterintuitive implication of Currie’s proposal is that one cannot read a literary work. Levinson (1992) takes up the question of work individuation and asks whether Beethoven and twin Beethoven really make the same works, even though they act within qualitatively identical cultures and come up with tokens of the same artistic structure via qualitatively identical paths.

Questions have been raised (e.g., by Levinson 1992 and David Davies 2004) about Currie’s Lakatos-inspired notion of the artist’s heuristic path, beginning with the obvious query as to what is and is not included in the “way” the artist discovers the structure. Currie allows that the path can include facts unknown to the artist if they are deemed relevant to the appreciation of his or her achievement. For example, even if Virginia Woolf did not know of Marcel Proust’s work when she wrote Jacob’s Room, she could “in principle” have known about it, and so Proust’s prior inventions were part of her path and are relevant to our understanding of Woolf’s achievement. Currie acknowledges that his notion of a heuristic path is vague, and he entertains the possibility that describing the heuristic of a work “starts to look like writing the history of the universe” (1989, 72). Yet he optimistically predicts that there “will be wide agreement about how the idea is to be applied in particular cases” (1989, 73). More specifically, he indicates that “case studies” in the analysis of such heuristics can be found in Michael Baxandall’s (1985).

In his proposal for an alternative to contextualist ontologies of art, David Davies (2004, 2005) proposes that works of art are best classified, not as indicated structures or as action types, but as action tokens. A work of art, then, is a ‘doing’ or generative performance. Davies further analyzes the latter as a sequence of “motivated manipulations of a vehicular medium through which a particular focus of appreciation is specified” (2005a, 75). With regard to the bedeviled question of which factors in the historical context of a work’s creation do and do not determine the identity of the work (a question that is taken to be distinct from the question as to which factors are in some broad sense relevant to the work’s understanding and appreciation), Davies identifies what he calls the artist’s “primary motivation,” which governs activities that specify an artistic vehicle that articulates a given artistic content. It is these art-content-articulating manipulations of artistic vehicles that qualify as elements in the performance that is identified with the work. For example, whether an artist’s intentional ingestion of a drug during the making of the “focus of appreciation” or product of the generative performance is to be counted as part of the work depends, then, on whether this action is part of a manipulation of an artistic vehicle effectively designed to articulate some aspect of the work’s content.

Dilworth (2005b) objects that Davies’s basic contention to the effect that works are action tokens is incompatible with his claim that works, conceived of as a particular generative performance, have a kind of “modal flexibility,” which means that the same work could have had different properties (e.g., it could have been created a few minutes earlier or later, or in a significantly different art-historical context). Davies argues that his performance theory, unlike such rivals as the indicated structure theory, is compatible with a work-relative modality. For an informative discussion of this topic, see Matheson and Caplan (2008).

Some critics of Davies’ account (Kania 2005, Stecker 2005) contend that he provides insufficient grounds for the adoption of a highly revisionary ontological doctrine that gives the lie to countless ordinary statements about works of art, such as “the Mona Lisa can be seen at the Louvre.” This criticism echoes Mary McCarthy’s remark in response to Harold Rosenberg’s proposal that action paintings are not pictures but “events”: “You cannot hang an event on a wall, only a picture” (Rosenberg 1962, 5). Davies (or the proponent of any other ontological account that is incompatible with prevalent pronouncements in ordinary language) may respond that the philosopher’s goal is not to ratify all casual and unreflective utterances about the arts, but to articulate a cogent (and possibly revisionary) metaphysics. Davies in fact contends that his proposal is meant to obey a “pragmatic constraint” to the effect that “Artworks must be conceived ontologically in such a way as to accord with those features of our critical and appreciative practice upheld on rational reflection” (2004, 23). This constraint is part of a larger argument that also rests on the following “epistemological” premise: “Rational reflection upon our critical and appreciative practice confirms that certain sorts of properties, actual or modal, are rightly ascribed to what are termed ‘works’ in that practice, or that our practice rightly individuates what are termed ‘works’ in a certain way” (2004, 23).

Stecker (2009) argues that Davies’s epistemological argument does not justify settling on the performance theory or any of the other rival ontological proposals. Stecker holds that the pragmatic, referential core of our talk about musical works requires them to be audible, repeatable, and performable. This finding, he contends, is compatible with contextualism, but not with Davies’s own proposal.

Given that the practices in the spheres of art are contradictory, changing, and influenced by cacophonous theorizing, the practices alone cannot tell us which aspects of practice are and are not indicative of reliable answers to art-ontological queries. Consequently it is fair to ask how a philosopher’s rational reflection on practice can lead to accurate answers to art-ontological questions (Livingston 2005b). Two salient issues in this regard are how sufficient evidence about art-related attitudes and behavior is to be gathered by philosophers, and how this evidence can be interpreted in such a manner that it provides reliable support for general ontological claims. Art-ontologists need a reliable, principled method with which to select and interpret the practices that are meant to support their theories.


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