Jacques Lefèvre d’Étaples

First published Fri Apr 10, 2015; substantive revision Wed Jul 3, 2019

Jacques Lefèvre d’Étaples (c. 1450–1536) taught philosophy at the University of Paris from around 1490 to 1508, and then applied his erudition and textual scholarship to biblical studies and religious reform. Lefèvre traveled to Italy in 1491, 1500, and 1507. There he sought out Ermolao Barbaro, Giovanni Pico della Mirandola, Marsilio Ficino, Angelo Poliziano, and other famous humanists. He himself became famous for the many introductions, commentaries, and editions relating to philosophical works he published in Paris. These repackaged the full range of philosophical studies, from his early interests in mathematics and natural magic, to the entire curriculum of university logic, natural philosophy, moral philosophy, and metaphysics.

Early modern scholars, from Francesco Patrizi da Cherso in the sixteenth century to Johann Jacob Brucker in the eighteenth, hailed Lefèvre as a leading humanist, particularly praising his replacement of scholastic questions with humanist eloquence. Modern scholars have taken a more nuanced view, studying Lefèvre’s historical context: he pursued a humanist project from within the university. Even after he retired from teaching philosophy, his versions of Aristotle were published in new editions, sometimes with new commentaries, for several decades—for historians of Renaissance philosophy, they mark the northward, university-based movement of a humanist approach to Aristotle which earlier scholars such as Leonardo Bruni and Ermolao Barbaro had pioneered in Italy. The university environment gave Lefèvre’s vision of philosophical reform a broad scope, extending even to mathematical works of the quadrivium. He also contributed to Renaissance philosophy beyond the university with important editions of the corpus attributed to Hermes Trismegistus, various Church Fathers, the Catalan mystic Ramon Lull, and the opera omnia of Cardinal Nicholas of Cusa.

Lefèvre’s wide-ranging publications and their philosophical import require more scholarly analysis than they have yet received. Since, however, his primary contribution to the history of philosophy was pedagogical and entailed reformulating older works to serve new audiences, the following survey focuses more on the broader outlines of his project than on his specific philosophical doctrines.

1. Life and Works

Little is known about Lefèvre’s family and early training. He came from Étaples, on the coast of Picardy, and by the early 1490s he was teaching in the Collège du Cardinal Lemoine in Paris. In an unusually long teaching career of nearly two decades, he became the college’s most revered teacher, elevating it out of relative obscurity. His reputation as a philosopher was cultivated in the classroom and in countless editions of philosophical works; any account of his thought must first place this diverse body of work within the context of his life.

Lefèvre’s early publications are punctuated by his three journeys to Italy. Colleagues mentioned his contact with the great humanists of fifteenth-century Italy as much as they lauded his encyclopedic learning. He undertook these journeys, apparently, to pursue models of scholarly inquiry which might leaven his teaching in Paris. In 1491 he traveled to Venice, ostensibly to meet Ermolao Barbaro, who was famous as an eloquent translator of Themistius, the fourth-century paraphrast of Aristotle. (Barbaro was in Rome at the time, so Lefèvre changed his travel plans to include Rome and Florence.) On his return, he published his first work in print, Totius philosophiae naturalis paraphrases (1492). In these 600 octavo pages, he presented students with short epitomes and digested paraphrases of Aristotle’s Physics, On the Heavens, the minor works of natural philosophy (i.e., Parva naturalia or Little Naturals), and On the Soul. The next few years were immensely productive, and with the help of colleagues and students, Lefèvre published similar epitomes for the standard university course on logic (1496b), Aristotle’s Metaphysics (1494a), and the Nicomachean Ethics (1494b).

In the 1490s, Lefèvre also published works for the university class room which went beyond Aristotle, notably in mathematics (Oosterhoff 2018). For astronomy, he wrote an important commentary on the standard introduction, John of Sacrobosco’s Sphere (1495). In print, arguably Lefèvre’s most original contribution to any field was a systematic treatise on music theory (Elementa musicalia) which he published with three other works: an edition of the Elementa arithmetica of Jordanus Nemorarius (13th century), his own popular introduction to the Arithmetica of Boethius, and an arithmetical game, Rithmomachia (1496a; see also Oosterhoff 2013, Moyer 2012). These mathematical works served pedagogical uses, first of all, helping students through an often-neglected part of the Paris cursus. But they also served philosophical aims of Lefèvre which became more evident in works unrelated to the university curriculum. Consider three examples: in 1494 he published Ficino’s Latin translation of most of the Hermetic Corpus, along with his own brief annotations; in 1498, he printed the first edition of the Works attributed to Dionysius the Areopagite, in Latin translation, along with an extensive commentary; and in the mid-1490s he composed On Natural Magic (De magia naturali ), which circulated in manuscript (Lefèvre [MN]). Inspired partly by Ficino’s Three Books on Life (De triplici vita), this treatise incorporated Pythagorean, cabbalistic, and Presocratic themes, for example in a section on “Pythagorean Magic” (Copenhaver 1977; Mandosio 2013). His reflections on magic especially included numerological excurses.

By 1500, Lefèvre had begun to produce more philologically oriented editions—typically he placed the newer translations alongside the traditional medieval versions, with his own commentary and occasional emendations informed by his modest command of Greek. The earliest example of this method was his three-fold edition of Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics (1497), which included the medieval Latin version along with the translations of Johannes Argyropolus and Leonardo Bruni. This approach also defined Lefèvre’s ground-breaking editions of the Psalms (1509), the letters of St Paul (1512), and Euclid’s Elements of Geometry (1517a).

He returned to Italy in 1500, meeting the famous humanist printer Aldus Manutius in Venice and attending Roman celebrations of the papal jubilee. At a monastery near Padua, he copied out some of Ramon Lull’s Blaquerna, and in Rome he found a treatise on a miniature astrolabe; he published both in Paris (1505 and 1500 respectively). On his return, perhaps stimulated by the Greek editions of Aldus, Lefèvre’s Aristotelian program took on new dimensions, with fuller editions and translations than those of his earlier handbooks. The most significant of these was probably a large folio Latin edition of Aristotle’s Organon, with a full suite of detailed commentaries. Another unusual publication combined Aristotle’s Politics and the pseudo-Aristotelian Economics with 700 sentences taken from Plato’s Republic and Laws, digested as the Hecatonomia (1506).

After his final trip to Rome in 1507, Lefèvre’s interest in philosophy receded into the background, as he retired from teaching at the Collège du Cardinal Lemoine. Philosophy did not disappear entirely, however. In 1514, he finally published the opera omnia of Cardinal Nicholas of Cusa, the fruit of many years spent gathering together manuscripts; and in 1515 he published Argyropoulos’s translation of Aristotle’s Metaphysics together with the translation of Cardinal Bessarion, which Pico had given him in manuscript in 1491. But his primary energies were now focused on biblical studies; and, as one of the most prominent intellectuals of the day, Lefèvre was drawn reluctantly into several controversies. When the Paris faculty of theology charged his friend Johann Reuchlin with Judaizing in 1514, he wrote a plea to Rome for help from the like-minded Giles of Viterbo, Vicar General of the Augustinian Order. Then, Erasmus of Rotterdam sought to take the aging pedagogue down a notch by criticizing his work on the Pauline epistles for shaky Greek. In 1517 Lefèvre found himself at the heart of another academic culture war: the debate over the Three Maries, in which he took the skeptical view that the three figures of that name in the New Testament were not, as tradition held, the same person. The final, devastating controversy began in 1521, when his patron, Cardinal Guillaume Briçonnet, invited him to lead an experiment in diocesan reform at Meaux, near Paris. The Paris faculty of theology, already concerned about Lefèvre’s incursions into the field of theology, found the experiment smacked too much of Lutheranism—which they had already condemned in 1520. In a few years the experiment at Meaux disintegrated, and in 1525 Lefèvre fled to Strassburg. The following year François Ier recalled Lefèvre to France. He tutored the royal children and served as chaplain at the court of Marguerite de Navarre, the king’s sister, for the final decade of his life (Reid 2009).

2. Epitome as Philosophical Style

Lefèvre’s reputation rested on the manner in which he introduced philosophy in commentaries, paraphrases, and editions—in other words, on a style of philosophical epitome. The late sixteenth-century critic of Aristotelianism Francesco Patrizi observed that Lefèvre was the first to read Aristotle without scholastic quaestiones, and historians frequently cite Lefèvre’s desire, following the translations of Aristotle by Leonardo Bruni, to

draw up and taste the purest waters from the very spring of Aristotle’s works (Nunc ergo O iuvenes ex Aristotelico opere, ceu ex proprio fonte purissimas haurite, delibateque aquas),

as he exhorted students on the title-page of his 1503 edition of the logical works (see Bianchi 2007: 57n19; Schmitt 1988). He hoped to return to the source itself, convinced that this would cure philosophy of its ills—he described mathematics and the “ancient wisdom”, for example, as medicines which would prepare students’ minds properly to approach philosophy (Lefèvre 1496a: h7v). He denounced the more innovative elements of traditional university logic such as sophismata and instead suggested that students should read his own shorter handbook on logic (1496b) to learn just enough before moving on to more profitable studies. Instead of addressing specialized topics or staking out a position within a university “school”, Lefèvre favored handbooks which introduced a discipline through brief explanations of terms and basic concepts, ostensibly leaving students with a conceptual vocabulary and enough time to read Aristotle on their own.

Lefèvre’s textbooks often deployed several genres in the same volume (Lines 2007). Most visually striking are the synoptic tables before each introduction, which at a glance supply a roadmap to the whole work. The table was followed by a paraphrase of the work, chapter by chapter, in an effort to reorganize the sinewy contours of Aristotle’s works in simpler form. Usually Lefèvre prefaced paraphrases with notae, which encapsulated his judgement on the most interesting or important insights in the chapter; these might be added to philological, historical, or topical remarks. Another genre Lefèvre occasionally used was the dialogue, which not only catechized young students in philosophical doctrine, but also demonstrated how teacher and pupil should engage with each other. Finally, when he published an edition of an Aristotelian treatise, Lefèvre also wrote a more traditional commentary. Again, he normally proceeded chapter by chapter through Aristotle’s text, keeping “literal” comments on philological questions and obscure phrases separate from notae on literary, doctrinal, or methodological issues raised in the work.

In aggregate, this range of epitomizing formats or genres defined a Renaissance philosophical style, which Lefèvre’s works remodeled for northern universities. Kessler has argued that when Lefèvre met Barbaro and Poliziano in Italy, he also encountered a new Aristotle: Barbaro had promised his students that he would make all of Aristotle accessible to them (Kessler 1999). This was not Aristotle taken piecemeal, but instead as an author to be digested in his entirety, systematically and compendiously. In his paraphrases Lefèvre thus presents an encyclopedic Aristotle. Poliziano, who was lecturing on Aristotle when Lefèvre visited Florence in 1491, stands out as a possible precedent for the philological side of Lefèvre’s encyclopedic enterprise (Celenza 2010). Poliziano promised to explain both facts and words, res et verba, in Aristotle, giving the account of a “grammarian”, which would represent Aristotle better than the “philosophical” comments of his university competitors. This approach to the philological commentary can to some extent be traced in Lefèvre’s literary notes and interpretive comparisons. The idea that Poliziano was a central influence, however, needs to be treated with caution, since Poliziano (as far as we can tell from his surviving praelectiones) focused on what knowledge of Greek could reveal about Aristotle’s meaning, word by word, with little concern for a synoptic vision of Aristotle’s works, whereas Lefèvre aimed to reconstruct Aristotle systematically, as a whole, laying emphasis, furthermore, on his coherence with Christian teaching.

3. Aristotle’s Method and the “Schools”

Lefèvre saw his concordist and source-based approach to philosophy as a way to steer clear of the late medieval philosophical “schools”, which modern scholarship has often divided between realists (Thomists and Scotists) and nominalists (Ockham and others). But, as Hoenen (2003) observes, late medieval scholars often saw themselves as occupying a place in a given tradition, following Thomas Aquinas, John Duns Scotus, or other leading philosophers; yet this does not mean that a Scotist was a “realist” in all fields of study, and a philosopher’s view on universals does not systematically predict his views on other doctrines. Rather, a school of thought is identified by a processus or method, of which particular figures such as Albert the Great or Duns Scotus were historical exemplars.

Lefèvre’s central claim was that Aristotle himself should be the exemplar of method, not any “Aristotelians”. He exhorted students to read Aristotle’s own works, rather than to make a career out of studying commentaries on them. His first contribution to logic was a short epitome of the major logical operations found in Peter of Spain’s Summule logicales, which he prefaced by entreating students not to get caught up in exponabilia, insolubilia, and sophismata, which “should be rejected from philosophy”, but instead to pass through them quickly, as if scouting in a barbarian land (1496b: a1v; Rice 1972: 39). In his 1503 edition of Aristotle’s logical works, Lefèvre presented an emended text of the standard Latin translations of Boethius, with a brief commentary. The textual work was necessary, he said, because previous generations,

although they dealt with logic, did not actually make use of logic, but of certain factious and extraneous matters, which should be condemned rather than refuted. (1503a: a1v; Rice 1972: 88)

The result was that books of logic had become full of errors, “novelties” (novitia), and “lifeless matters, like so much hay” (ibid.). In contrast, the commentary in his corrected edition would be brief and would explain Aristotle’s meaning, instead of that of his commentators.

Lefèvre’s textbooks were designed to help students gain access to Aristotle by quickly familiarizing them with the elementary definitions of each discipline and setting these in a larger schematic framework. In a comment on Aristotle’s Politics, he stressed that the integrity of different disciplines requires identifying the components proper to each—for example, the point in geometry, the monad in arithmetic, or the letters which make up words in grammar (1506: a2v). This respected Aristotle’s own methodical admonition not to make the mistaken assumption that conclusions from one discipline could be applied to another—his prohibition of metabasis. Similarly, from his earliest writings, Lefèvre insisted that each discipline should follow a distinctive kind of reasoning: thus

logic should be left to deal with logical matters, mathematics with mathematical matters, and divine discipline with metaphysical matters. (Lefèvre 1492: b4v; Rice 1970: 12)

Lefèvre’s textbooks often divided disciplines into their constituent parts, sometimes visually simplified in synoptic tables; the goal of such tables was to provide students with swift access to the individual elements, as well as to the more general headings, of a given discipline—a vision of methodical philosophy popularized by Peter Ramus later in the sixteenth century (Ong 1958; for an overview of recent literature, see Hotson 2007: 16–37).

The fact that each discipline had its own form of reasoning did not mean they could not be compared or did not point to an ultimate unity. According to Lefèvre, Aristotle also taught that disciplines bore an analogical relationship to one another—the distinctive method of each discipline was the starting-point to this higher knowledge. Frequently he (and his students after him) alerted readers to what they believed were “traces” (vestigia) or “analogies” (analogiae) which could help them to find the deeper unity beneath apparently diverse phenomena. In his earliest introduction to natural philosophy, Lefèvre claimed that there was a

kind of secret analogy lying hidden and underneath the whole of Aristotle’s philosophy, without which philosophy is inanimate and lifeless, like a body without the sense of touch. (1492: b2r; Rice 1970: 6)

Though he regularly draws attention to analogies, Lefèvre does not systematically describe this “secret analogy”. Instead, he often uses analogy to compare the constituent parts of different disciplines (Oosterhoff 2018: 77–85). More circumstantial evidence suggests that members of his circle at least toyed with the idea that analogy could be a more universal science. A student of his, Beatus Rhenanus, included in his course notes several theses concerning how “analogy is the science of sciences”, that “Aristotle claims he finds the secrets of the sciences by analogy”, and “what is known by analogy is known more firmly than by demonstration” (Beatus Rhenanus’s Cahier d’étudiant, Bibliothèque humaniste de Sélestat, MS 50, 253r). This fascination with analogies may explain why Lefèvre appreciated mathematics so much, since ancient number theory focused on the ratios (proportiones in Latin, analogia in Greek) between numbers. For him, analogia sometimes had the ancient Greek meaning of a proportion or ratio between two mathematical objects; at other times, it reflected analogies between the subjects of lower and higher disciplines, as when he argued that mathematical reasoning provided

certain steps, … especially if one knows the method (modus) of analogies and uplifting exercises [assurrectiones]. (Lefèvre 1517a: a2v; Rice 1972: 380)

He then praised mathematics as a model for such a method:

What, I ask, can give quicker, more abstract, purer analogies for rising to divine matters … than mathematical learning? (ibid.)

In other cases, he based analogies on structural similarities between the elementary parts of an area of study (e.g., Lefèvre 1497 a3r, where he discusses the analogies of elementary parts of disciplines).

A method in the sixteenth century was a way of approaching a given discipline—according to the Paduan school, for example, one properly approached natural philosophy through the logical method of regressus. But Lefèvre believed that this kind of prioritizing of logic over other disciplines undermined the distinctive modes of reasoning proper to each discipline. In the sixteenth century, one of the many uses of the word methodus was to indicate a short cut, perhaps a compendious textbook, by which a student might approach a discipline (Gilbert 1960: 59–60). Indeed, there is some evidence of this usage in Lefèvre’s own circle. Guillaume Gontier, his student and amanuensis, explicitly referred to Lefèvre’s collection of introductions on logic as a “method”, telling readers that

by this extremely brief method [you] will swiftly land at the port of the disciplines. (hac methodo etiam quam brevissima ad disciplinarum portus ocissime appelere, 1496b: d6r–v)

In 1502, Bruno Amerbach informed Johannes Amerbach in Basel that he was attending the “cursus Fabri”. He assured his worried father, who preferred him to study with the Scotists, that the bare text of the Fabrists, “without commentary” (nihil comentarii), would profit him in examinations (Hartmann 1942: 146; Renaudet 1953: 404–406). Among Lefèvre’s students, his manuals with their epitomes, paraphrases, and short descriptive notes defined philosophical study at the Collège du Cardinal Lemoine, and he began to be treated as an exemplar of method.

Although Lefèvre’s introductions were intended to facilitate direct access to Aristotle and other authorities, bypassing the “schools”, they were themselves reproduced, studied, and commented on, becoming, in effect, an alternative to the “schools”. The most commonly reproduced version of Lefèvre’s Paraphases philosophiae naturalis included, for example, Josse Clichtove’s extensive commentary; Lefèvre’s introductions to logical and mathematical works were likewise accompanied by similar super-commentaries. The circle of “Fabrists” might be seen, in this sense, as an unwitting humanist via on the Renaissance philosophical roadmap.

4. Philosophical Themes

Lefèvre’s place on the map of late medieval and Renaissance philosophy is difficult to pinpoint in a single key doctrine or even a single work. He never composed his own synthetic or systematic overview of philosophy. Nor did he write large commentaries on select, individual questions, as did major university philosophers of the preceding centuries such as Jean Buridan or Paul of Venice. The following themes thus represent more the state of current research than a synoptic perspective on all Lefèvre’s philosophical positions.

4.1 Logic

In logic or dialectic, Lefèvre belongs to a tradition going from Lorenzo Valla, Rudolph Agricola, and Juan Luis Vives to Peter Ramus—in 1508 Lefèvre also published the Dialectica of the Byzantine émigré humanist George of Trebizond. These figures sought to diminish the hold of scholastic logic on philosophy and replace it with a clearer, simpler logic that would respect the ordinary meanings of words and how they point to things in the world. The standard logical curriculum was roughly organized around two phases in the reception of Aristotle’s works. First, the “old logic” (logica vetus) comprised several works inherited from late antiquity, primarily Boethius’s translations of and commentaries on Aristotle’s Categories and On Interpretation, as well as Porphyry’s Isagoge (for a complete list of available works, see Ebbesen 1977: 105). From the twelfth century on, a second group of works were either newly read after long neglect, such as Aristotle’s Prior Analytics, Topics, and Sophistic Refutations, or were newly translated from Arabic sources, most importantly Aristotle’s Prior Analytics (Marrone 2010: 66; Ashworth 2010: 161). Together this second group made up the “new logic” (logica nova), which in turn became the source of handbooks or textbooks known by the late fifteenth century as the “logic of the moderns” (logica modernorum; see de Rijk 1962–67). In fact, late medieval university students encountered these subjects through the textbook tradition, usually Peter of Spain’s Summule logicales (Little Logicals). The first part of the Summule dealt with the “old logic” of the Categories, on universals and Aristotelian categories. But humanist philosophers like Lefèvre reacted especially against the logica modernorum: Lefèvre’s short Logical Introductions to Suppositions, Predicabilia, Divisions, Predicaments, Enunciations, … Fallacies, Obligations, and Insolubilia (1496b) was meant to give students a brief alternative to the Summule, instead of making it the focus of study.

In 1503, Lefèvre published an edition, with introductions, paraphrases, and commentary, of Aristotle’s logical works. Rather than, as Valla had done, reconstructing the “old logic” of Aristotle, Porphyry, and Boethius and ignoring the “logic of the moderns” (logica modernorum) with its categoremata, sophismata, and insolubilia, Lefèvre tried to clarify the sources of the “old logic” (Vasoli 1968). He called logic a disciplina disserendi (1503a: 2r, 228v), similar to Agricola’s earlier redefinition of dialectic as the ars disserendi, later taken up by Ramus (though Lefèvre probably did not read Agricola’s book, first published in 1515; see Agricola 1515, as cited by Mack 1993: 346). Like Agricola before him and Ramus later on, Lefèvre divided logic into three parts: proloquia, judgement, and invention. The first part, using the works of the logica vetus, classifies things in the world according to substances and their various qualities by considering how propositions (proloquia) are formed. The second and third parts belong to the logica nova: in the area of judgement, the Prior Analytics teach how to organize statements into a valid argument; in the area of invention, the Topics and the Sophistic Refutations teach how to find the subject matter to form an argument. Lefèvre’s terminology of proloquia, judgement, and invention (Lefèvre 1503a: 228v), though traditional, says much: Agricola had used it, and Ramus would also take it up. Where Agricola had focused on invention, Ramus would emphasize judgement. In contrast, Lefèvre thought the first part of logic—categorizing the world according to the language of substance, quality, and the other proloquia of Porphyry’s Isagoge and Aristotle’s Categories—needed the most attention, if we judge by where he most carefully and thoroughly introduced his sources. For example, instead of offering a complete paraphrase of the Topics, as he did for the Categories and the Prior and Posterior Analytics, Lefèvre supplied only scholia “ad litteram” in a format which was unusually brief, even for him.

In logic, Lefèvre therefore bestowed his greatest energies on the first pars proloquendi of logic. The notion of proloquium sometimes had, for him, its more basic sense of “introduction” (e.g., 1503a); but he also used the term in its more technical sense of an axiom or proper principle of demonstration. In the Posterior Analytics I, Lefèvre glossed Aristotle’s account of principles for a demonstration as dealing with proloquia (1503a: 189v; see also 187r). He thus emphasized the logica vetus precisely because he hoped to ground the certainty of knowledge in trustworthy starting points. In contrast, he believed that the logica modernorum or more rhetorical portions of the Organon such as the Topics—the part most properly called dialectic—encouraged sophistic debate, i.e., developing arguments out of uncertain premises. Aristotle considered dialectic to be merely “probable” in its reasoning; as Lefèvre put it, rather than finding certain knowledge (scientia), which deploys syllogisms and enthymemes, topical dialectic is useful for directing “opinions” by means of less certain techniques as well, such as induction and example (Libri logicorum, 1503a: 229v). Aristotle had said the subject of the Topics was “exercises, colloquies, and the disciplines according to philosophy”. For Lefèvre, this meant the Topics were more appropriate for entertainment:

exercises: we ought to understand these to be school contests, done as a literary game; colloquies, as happens during our conversations, dining together, and when we engage one another in this way, discoursing for the purpose of recreation or usefulness; disciplines according to philosophy: these are the sciences which make up the various parts of [Aristotle’s] own philosophy. (Exercitationes, conflictus gymnasticos, qui in ludo litterario fiunt, intelligere debemus. Colloquia: ut cum confabulando aut convivando aut in huiusmodi congressionibus ocurrit quicque, aut recreationis, aut alicuius utilitatis gratia, disserendum. Discipline secundum philosophiam: sunt scientie que partes sunt ipsius philosophie, 1503a: 229v)

Lefèvre, thus, did not emphasize the roots of logic in the rhetorical structure of ordinary discourse, as Agricola or Valla might have done (Nauta 2009). Instead, he focused on the “starting points”, principia, or proloquia which ground reasoning. The importance he assigns to proloquia seems to be connected to his pedagogically sensitive introductions, intended to convey clear, immediate learning of the foundational principles of any discipline or art. The utility of this method also appears to be rooted in metaphysical assumptions about universal harmony and analogy. In his annotations on Hermes Trismegistus, Lefèvre stressed the harmonious structure of creation, reflected in the symmetry between macrocosm and microcosm (Lefèvre 1505b). As discussed above, such a harmonious structure justified making inferences from one domain to another.

4.2 The Question of Universals

Since the nineteenth century, Lefèvre has often been thought of as a nominalist of some sort. The evidence is of two kinds. Because he wrote a short introduction to the topics found in Peter of Spain’s Summule logicales, Prantl (1870: 4:278–280) implied that he had sympathies with the genre, which Vasoli (1959: 233) expanded into “traces of a nominalist formation”. Vasoli also quoted Renaudet, who had cited the student notes of Beatus Rhenanus, which recorded Lefèvre’s view that the nominalist position on universals was “vera et pulchra” (Vasoli 1959: 226; Renaudet 1953: 131). Yet Lefèvre’s actual position is much more ambiguous. One indication is his short Introductiones to logic, intended to help students bypass “new” terminist approaches to the discipline. Moreover, although he appreciated certain nominalist positions, this hardly shows that he believed universals to be simply a matter of convention. Instead, he sought a via media, as he so often did. For example, in his notes on Porphyry’s Isagoge, Lefèvre observed that there are two extreme errors when speaking about Aristotle’s category of substance:

some consider things by themselves, completely ignoring notions and reasons; others only care for notions and reasons, and entirely flee from things themselves and considerations of things. Neither the former nor the latter can ever genuinely understand Aristotle and other authors. (Quidam enim res solas considerantes, notiones rationesque prorsus abnuunt; alii solas notiones rationesque curantes, res ipsas rerumque considerationes penitus refugiunt. Et neque hi neque illi poterunt unquam sincere Aristotelem ceterosque auctores intelligere, 1503a: 22r–v)

Instead, those who “penetrate analogies” realize that disciplines deal with different subjects: logicians address words and names, as if looking at things through a mirror; natural philosophers address things themselves.

By pursuing a via media on the problem of universals, Lefèvre followed Boethius, the first of the Latins to set the terms of the medieval debates on the topic—as Lefèvre put it,

the whole Latin school owes as much to Boethius as rhetoric owes to Cicero. (cui [Boetii] latine philosophie schola tantum debet quantum Tullius rhetorice, 1503a: 6v)

This tradition began with the prooemium to Porphyry’s Isagoge, in which he explicitly refused to discuss whether genus and species depend on thought alone, are incorporeal or inseparable, as a realist interpretation of universals would have it—that discussion should be left, he said, to a “greater work”. The medieval tradition followed Boethius in reading the Isagoge as an introduction to Aristotle’s Categories, and took Porphyry’s skirting of the ontological status of genera and species as an invitation to explore universals. Boethius himself adopted a moderate realist position on universals in his second commentary on the Isagoge. There he argued that the mind abstracts universals from concrete reality: abstraction involves gathering or collecting the likeness (similitudo) of concrete, individual things. Boethius claimed that, understood in this way, universals have a certain kind of separate, incorporeal reality:

genus and species subsist in one way, they are grasped by the intellect in another way, and they are incorporeal, but they are joined to sensible things and subsist in sensible things. But they are grasped by the intellect as subsisting in themselves and not having their being in anything else. (quotation from Marenbon 2003: 30; see also Nauta 2009: 38).

Lefèvre was sensitive to the divergence between Porphyry and Boethius. He highlighted Porphyry’s approach to universals in the Isagoge, namely

these questions about Platonic genera and species, about the matter of ideas….

But Lefèvre followed Porphyry in turning such questions out of logic, for

as you see Porphyry teach, the place for dealing with these should be sought elsewhere, namely metaphysics. (Et he questiones de generibus et speciebus platonicis, que ad materiam idearum pertinent …. Sed discutiendi locus (ut scite Porphyrius ammonet) alio ex loco metaphysica scilicet est expectandus, 1503a: 2r)

A few pages later he described how Boethius differed from Porphyry on this issue, saying that:

It is to be assumed that Boethius considered the notion and concept, whereas Porphyry considered the thing and subject itself. (Igitur notionem rationemque Boetius, rem autem ipsam et ipsum subiectum considerasse, ponendus esset Porphyrius, 1503a: 6v)

Thus, for Lefèvre, the moderate realist position regards universals as distinct concepts or notions (rationes or notiones; similar terminology is discussed in de Libera 1996: 48).

But is this “moderate realist” position Lefèvre’s own? Resolutely emphasizing the auctores themselves, he rarely deploys his own authorial voice to argue for a “Fabrist” position. In his notes on Aristotle’s Categories, however, dealing with the key category of substance, Lefèvre presents a rare quasi-treatise, a short dialogue on universals between two students of the ancient academy of Chrysippus (entitled in the margin “Disceptatio de universali”, 1503a: 23v). In the course of an amiable debate, the disputants use Aristotle’s distinction between primary and secondary substance to consider the status of universals such as species or genus. One youth presents the view that universals are what particular classes of things share; the other youth argues that universals are, in fact, what those who reason say they share—universals, in other words, are decided by convention. The position that stands, at the end of the dialogue, looks something like Boethius’s moderate realism. The youths agree that there is something conceptual that is “added” to the qualities of both the thing and the word signifying that thing.

For when I give the name “man” and look at the thing itself, I do not properly name the thing itself, or the species, or the universal, simply and without addition. Instead, I do so with an addition, namely of the universal, by reason. (Proinde cum hominem nomino et rem ipsam respicio, non proprie rem illam aut speciem aut universalem appello et simpliciter et sine addito, sed cum addito—scilicet universalem, ratione, 1503a: 23v)

This moderate realism resurfaces in Lefèvre’s account of Aristotle’s category of quantity, to choose just one example. In the Categories, Aristotle primarily recapitulated the commonly held ancient distinction between discrete number and continuous magnitude. Lefèvre’s commentary, however, recalls that Aristotle further divided number into two kinds: counting number (numerantia) and counted number (numerata). The distinction was taken from Physics IV.10, 219b5–10; but Lefèvre uses it in the context of Aristotle’s Categories to suggest that numbers have extramental existence as universals—not merely as a product of mental abstraction, as Aristotle held. For Aristotle, when we experience “counted” numbers (two ice creams, two legs), we abstract from those experiences a “counting” number (“2”), which exists only abstractly. For Lefèvre, this picture is not quite complete, because it does not take account of how people share the experience of counting—while they may apply “counting numbers” to countable objects in the same way, there is a concept or “reason” (ratio) shared by different minds. So he offers a third category:

Hence, there are counting numbers, counted numbers, and numbers [themselves]. Counting numbers are minds applying numbers to things; counted numbers are those things to which the mind properly and suitably applies numbers; and numbers are those discrete concepts of counting. (Unde sunt numerantia, sunt numerata, sunt numeri. Numerantia sunt anime numeros suos rebus applicantes. Numerata sunt ea quibus anima numeros apte accommodeque applicat. Numeri sunt discrete ille rationes numerandi, 1503a: 27r).

With this third category of reasons or concepts (rationes) of counting, similar to Boethius’s view of universals as real notions, Lefèvre can suggest that number has extramental reality in some sense. He affirms this point a few lines later, repeating the ancient view of number as multiples of the primordial “unity”. There is something shared between the unit “1” in the counting mind and the unit “1” of a single palm of counted length. This underlying shared unity indicates that “true numbers [i.e., 2, 3, etc.] are gathered and composed from units” in a way that belongs not merely to the mind or to the physical world (Unde fit ut non sola in mente sufficiat unitas ad numerandum, perinde ac unus palmus ad dimetiendum id quod etiam multorum fuerit palmorum, sed sunt veri numeri ex unitatibus coacervati compositique, 1503a: 27r).

Lefèvre’s language of numbers as composed of units is commonplace, but it serves a realist interpretation of Aristotle’s category of discrete quantity. As discussed in the next section, the category of quantity and the language of measuring occupied a central place in Lefèvre’s approach to Aristotle’s natural philosophy.

4.3 Natural Philosophy

As we have seen, in his first published paraphrases (1492), Lefèvre reorganized natural philosophy under the influence of Ermolao Barbaro’s translations of Themistius’s Paraphrases of Aristotle. His own epitomes were of the Physics, On the Heavens, the Parva naturalia, and On the Soul. As with other disciplines, it is difficult to identify a cohesive, distinctive set of Fabrist “doctrines” in these works, because the explicit goal was to digest Aristotle himself faithfully, not to identify and counter potential rivals. Characteristically, his paraphrase of the Physics begins with a diagram of the terms basic to Aristotelian natural philosophy: the elements; the four causes; nature; the many kinds of motion; and problematic terms such as place, vacuum, the infinite, and time. The paraphrase itself proceeds to reorganize Aristotle’s doctrines into opinions, conclusions, and arguments—and, very occasionally, questions and doubts—which closely follow the contours of Aristotle’s own work.

Nevertheless, distinctive emphases do surface. In these paraphrases, Lefèvre is most distinctive when framing natural philosophy within its goals rather than its constituent parts. This attention to the larger philosophical role of particular disciplines has led some scholars to dismiss him as “safely wrapped in clouds of mysticism” (e.g., Guerlac 1979: 31). In fact, he is careful about methodological distinctions. At the end of his account of Book 1 of the Physics, for example, he refuses to answer the question whether all things are produced from one or many forms. Lefèvre is clearly tempted by this topic to discuss the Christian creator, but he determinedly remains within the boundaries of natural reason:

this belongs to first philosophy; let it wait until the right time to study it. (primi philosophi est, et in illud tempus id querendum differatur, Lefèvre 1502a: 20v)

This methodological restriction is intended to keep students from applying limited tools (such as logic or natural philosophy) indiscriminately and thus confusing instead of clarifying knowledge. But reflections on natural philosophy can offer traces of the divine, and philosophy is not doing its job if it does not draw students to reflect on these too.

An example of the higher goals of natural philosophy are found in Lefèvre’s Dialogue on the Introduction to the Physics (Dialogus Physice introductionis), which is intended to present basic terms and convince students of the value of this discipline. A discussion of the physical elements leads him to consider at length the chain of nature—and the teacher in the dialogue, at the student’s request, self-consciously “digresses” on the chain of being in order to suggest that the highest activity of humanity, the highest part of nature itself, is to contemplate “heavenly realities”. Then the discussion of final causes leads Lefèvre to sum up the point of the exercise:

This, my son, is the end of philosophy; this is the whole endeavor of Aristotle and the philosophers: to prepare us, from the correct notion of sensible things (as from rather distant likenesses of external things), to enter the intelligible world, and hence, insofar as they can lead us, to know our blessed place. (Hic fili nostre Philosophie finis; hic totus Aristotelis et Philosophorum conatus: ex recta rerum sensibilium cognitione (ut ex eternorum quibusdam remotissimis simulacris) mundi intelligibilis nobis parare introitum, et hinc nos utcumque possunt ducere, nostrum scilicet felicem regionem cognoscere, Lefèvre 1502a: 124r [wrongly foliated 123])

But to attain this happy goal, the student of philosophy first must wade through the details of natural philosophy.

Lefèvre’s natural philosophy is also distinctive for its attention to mathematical examples. In his Dialogues on Physics he displayed far more autonomy from Aristotle than he did in shorter introductions and paraphrases; and in the Introductory Dialogue on Difficult Physics (Dialogus difficilium physicalium introductorius) he began squarely with the problem of quantity. While never departing dramatically from the Aristotelian discussion of matter, weight, rarefaction and condensation, and the intension and remission of qualities, at each step, Lefèvre offers points, lines, and ratios as examples. An interlocutor marvels that he has learned to “philosophize about qualities through quantities” (per quantitatem de qualitate philosophor, Lefèvre 1502a: 146v).

Take, for example, Lefèvre’s discussion of the intension and remission of qualities in his Introductory Dialogue on Difficult Physics. This question is interesting because, despite Aristotle’s meager account (Physics V.22.26b1–8), it became a foundational question in medieval natural philosophy. Moreover, by the fourteenth century, the calculatores of Oxford and Parisian natural philosophers such as Nicole Oresme used mathematics to clarify their thinking on the topic. The notion of remission and intension is meant to explain how qualities change gradually, as we experience them to do. In order to resolve the problem, it was necessary to ask several questions. Are such qualities forms? Can different qualities or forms mix together in the same subject? Does change involve a series of new forms (the succession theory), or instead is it a changing mixture of qualities, so that a gray object is a mix of white and dark contraries (admixture theory)? Or do qualities gradually change as infinitesimal parts are gained or lost (addition theory)? (For the range of positions, see Kirschner 2000 and Di Liscia 2010.) In the Difficult Physics, Lefèvre’s view seems to be that qualities are not forms, since he never calls them anything other than qualities (a view similar to that of Buridan and Oresme; see Kirschner 2000). Moreover, he seems to adopt a version of an addition theory: a quality is intensified by adding another part or degree of that quality. Finally, he argues that contraries can be in the same subject only in a limited way—a certain amount of one quality would drive out (expellere) an excess of the other. Given a scale of heat from minimum to maximum, say from 1 to 10, one could also imagine a similar scale for cold from 10 to 1. Maximal cold could not coincide with maximal heat; but a low heat of 1 would coincide with a strong cold of 9. Increasing the heat to 4 would expel the cold, reducing it to 6.

In this example, Lefèvre repeatedly claims that he applies quantitative reasoning to qualities:

Therefore, you see how to philosophize about dimensions is to philosophize about qualities. So also vice versa: to philosophize about qualities is to philosophize about dimensions. (Vides ergo quomodo philosophari de dimensionibus est de qualitatibus philosophari. Et retro agitur: de qualitatibus philosophari, est philosophari de dimensionibus, 1502a: 145r)

It is not easy, however, to see what exactly “quantities” mean in this context. Some clarification can be gained from his argument for why quantities in a subject are limited by their contrary, which he illustrates with a quasi-geometrical figure representing the twin scales of hot and cold mentioned above. He imagines a range of heats in an object, from minimum to maximum heat, arranged along a line (ak in the figure below). Then, he uses a reductio ad absurdum: if the smallest amount of coldness (l) from some other object (lu in the figure below) were to be added to the maximum heat (k), a new degree of heat (x) would have to be added in the original object to create a new maximum.



But (x) is impossible. The new maximum (x) would be greater than the previous maximum (k), which is absurd—a maximum cannot be increased. Therefore, he concludes, the amount of contraries is limited by the absolute maximum degrees of the quality measured. Qualities and their contraries, consequently, cannot be intensified in the same object beyond this maximum limit. There are undeniable quantitative features to this argument, comparable to the geometrical intuitions that animated fourteenth-century theorists such as Oresme. At the same time, the qualities of heat and cold are not reimagined as mathematical objects and are still firmly in the realm of Aristotelian natural philosophy. Indeed, the point of the example is to defend rather than undermine Aristotle’s account of contraries (found, inter alia, in Topics 2). Like his predecessors, then, instead of making natural philosophy mathematical, Lefèvre used mathematics to clarify and exemplify Aristotelian physical concepts. (On this example see further Oosterhoff 2018: 190–199.)

Lefèvre’s mathematical examples in natural philosophy are all the more remarkable because he elsewhere disparaged the calculatores who followed in the tradition of Thomas Bradwardine (Lefèvre 1510: 2r; Rice 1972: 227). Clearly, he did not oppose the mathematical nature of the so-called Merton school’s natural philosophy, but rather certain aspects of their exposition. Lefèvre mistrusted the genre for which the calculatores were famous, the sophismata; he saw them as mere logical puzzles, sophistry rather than truth-telling examples—a prejudice perhaps inherited from Ermolao Barbaro (Dionisotti 1955). This suggests that Lefèvre thought his own use of mathematical reasoning in natural philosophy was different—that it was not sophistry, but truly depicted nature. What then were the sources of Lefèvre’s mathematical approach to natural philosophy, if not among the fourteenth-century calculatores? One possibility is the school of Albertists, who became especially powerful in fifteenth-century Paris, partly in opposition to the nominalists and calculatores whom they believed had profaned the university (Kaluza 1988). The Albertist textbook tradition of natural philosophy placed a high value on mathematics for understanding the physical world (Hoenen 1993: 328–330).

More compelling similarities between Lefèvre and the Albertists can be found in their psychology. After all, both Albertists and Lefèvre expressly valued mathematics because they thought it provided training in rational abstraction. As Lefèvre put it in his Introductory Dialogue on Difficult Physics, the soul is unique as the medium between “higher and lower” things because it can rationally measure (dimetiri) the bodily world in abstract terms (1502a: 128v). Albertists valued mathematical objects as examples of the separate substances the mind can think—without depending on physical images or phantasms. The standard Aristotelian picture of intellection began with the senses, which provide phantasms, taken up by the intellect as singular, concrete species (intellectual species). Commentators commonly distinguished a second movement of the soul which reflects on this first activity. In this second moment, the soul produces abstract and universal notions. But the question then arises: can the intellect think about separable objects without depending on sensible phantasms? Albertists believed that it could, inspired by the Neoplatonic perspective of Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite, Averroes, and the fifth-century paraphrast Themistius. They subscribed to the doctrine that the soul can know separate substances without the mediation of physical images, a position which they defended against the more standard view that this was not possible, found in early fifteenth-century polemical works such as Heymeric de Campo’s “Problems between Albert the Great and Saint Thomas” (Problemata inter Albertum Magnum et Sanctum Thomam, Cologne, 1496: 37r–46r) and in basic handbooks on natural philosophy (Hoenen 1993: 332–333; see also Park 1980). Lefèvre does not explicitly place his account of On the Soul within this Albertist tradition, but he certainly makes room for it. Describing the objects of the intellect, he notes that

separable objects are considered in the same way that they exist. For if they exist entirely separate from matter, then matter is entirely irrelevant in considering them. (Unde fit ut quomodo res separabiles sint, eo modo eas contempletur. Si enim omnino abiuncte sint, omnino materiam a sua contemplatione reiicit, 1502a: 341v; see also Spruit 1995: 38–41

In his commentary on this passage, Josse Clichtove explained that there are four such modes of intellection, the fourth of which understands

abstractly and universally … and here the intellect takes nothing from the senses. (Quartus est modus intelligendi abstracte et universaliter … et hunc intellectus a sensu minime accipit, 1502a: 343v)

He further explained how mathematical objects offer a paradigm case of such separable intelligible objects.

Affinities with Neoplatonic perspectives raise the question of whether Lefèvre was influenced by the new Latin versions of Greek commentators, especially Themistius, whose paraphrases of Aristotle were translated by Barbaro. He was certainly aware of these new texts, but he did not invoke their authority to take sides in debates. Some have seen Themistius as a Neoplatonic source of light imagery in explaining the relation between the active and passive intellect, based on Aristotle’s tantalizingly short comments at On the Soul III.5 (Mahoney 1982). Lefèvre did argue for the unity of the intellect, explaining the active and passive intellects as “powers” (potentie) of the same faculty. He also used the Themistian image of light to explain how the agent intellect acts on the passive intellect (1502a: 344v). But he never mentions Themistius on this topic—and similarities may be due to the broader medieval commentary tradition, which had had access to Themistius’s paraphrase of On the Soul in William of Moerbeke’s translation since the thirteenth century. And Lefèvre’s psychology puts him in a tradition, with Ramon Lull and Nicholas of Cusa, that was hospitable to Platonic views on universals—such thinkers adopted a psychology especially open to mathematical metaphors as examples of universal cognition. Nevertheless, Lefèvre never identified as a platonist (Oosterhoff 2019b).

4.4 Moral Philosophy

It was only on Aristotle’s moral philosophy treatises—the Ethics, Economics and Politics—that Lefèvre wrote full-scale commentaries. In addition to his brief Ars Moralis, an introduction to Aristotle’s ethics (1494b), he devoted considerable energy to making available the recent translations of Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics by the Byzantine émigré Johannes Argyropolus and the Florentine humanist Leonardo Bruni, as well as the “old” translation, now known to be by Robert Grosseteste (1497). Beginning a tradition of editing philosophical works which would span the sixteenth century, Lefèvre typically encouraged readers to compare texts, publishing the three translations of the Ethics together in one volume (his own commentary accompanied the translation of Argyropolus). These editions and commentaries have been seen as the origin of a distinctively humanist tradition of moral philosophy (Kraye 1995: 104–105).

Lefèvre’s engagement with ethics was not limited to the recovery of Aristotle. Like many other Renaissance philosophers, he began his treatment of the discipline with an anthropology of man as microcosm, a “little world” who mirrors or encompasses the features of the “greater world” or macrocosm. This theme resurfaced in his paraphrase of the Physics and especially in his notae on Hermes Trismegistus. Ethical behavior should be in intellectual harmony with God and the universe, which should be mirrored in human intellectual communities—perhaps Lefèvre should be seen as promoting a monastic, rather than civic, humanism (Stegmann 1973).

His early synoptic introduction to ethics (1494b) closely follows the major divisions of Aristotle’s treatise. Lefèvre begins with a description of the ethical life as one which has to be learned: virtues are acquired through long habituation rather than being innate to the human soul. Humanity possesses many kinds of good: exterior (acquired), interior (given by nature), and useful goods (those instrumental for pursuing other goods). Virtue is defined as

the habitus of the soul perfecting itself and directing its work to the good. Duty is the action of virtue (Virtus est anime habitus ipsam perficiens atque eius opus bonum reddens. Officium est virtutis operatio, 1507: 3v)

The remainder of the introduction discusses each of the moral virtues pertaining to the active life (such as liberality and friendship), followed by the intellectual virtues and then heroic virtue. These in turn lead to the final topic of contemplative happiness, where Lefèvre presents his conviction that human fulfillment or happiness is most fully achieved in contemplation of divine matters—a point of agreement, he believed, between Aristotle and Christianity.

Lefèvre therefore went beyond a mere ad fontes search for the “pure Aristotle”. As with other disciplines, his moral philosophy presented Aristotle as the authority because he was most useful to Christians. His notae to the Ethics are filled with exempla carefully selected from the Roman poets, especially Horace, Virgil, and Ovid. The virtues of the gentiles regularly presage Christian morality, according to Lefèvre. So, for instance, the Pythagorean and Roman ideals of chaste virginity are helpful for urging temperance. To illustrate the excellence of ancient morals, Lefèvre quoted Ovid’s Metamorphoses 15.367–36, where the waters of the river Clitorius caused men to flee from wine. Ovid evoked this image in his discussion of the Pythagorean way of life, leading Lefèvre to reflect on Dama, the virgin daughter of Pythagoras, as well as the chaste self-sacrifice of Lucretia and the heroic Spartan virgins who killed themselves after being raped. Observing that the value of virginity is “not foreign” to Christians, who know the Virgin birth, Lefèvre went on to contrast this with the image of intemperance and false virginity of the harpies in Virgil, Aeneid 3.214–218 (see notae on NE III.10, in 1497: d7v). At times Lefèvre even uses such notae to reframe Aristotle entirely. He reorients the discussion in the last book of the Ethics, where Aristotle begins with the question of whether pleasure is the supreme ethical goal, by recalling the New Testament image of Jesus Christ rebuking the scribes and Pharisees for their hypocrisy. Living a good or “true life”, Lefèvre asserts, is primarily about uniting word and deed, for

the simplicity of the wise is more useful for life than eloquence. (et simplicitatem sapientum eloquentia ad vitam esse efficaciorem, 1497: m7v).

Having reminded his reader of what true pleasure is, Lefèvre then rehearses Aristotle’s argument. The strategy is typical of many of his notes: he alerts the reader to the Christian use or context of the passage, and then presents the author’s meaning. Rather than bowdlerizing, he generally prefers to frame pagan wisdom with a Christian structure.

Lefèvre most aggressively retooled ancient philosophy for contemporary concerns, however, when dealing with Plato’s ethical philosophy. Again, he proceeded as an editor. Alongside Aristotle’s Politics and Economics, Lefèvre presented one of his most enigmatic works, the Hecatonomiae (1506). In seven hundred lines, loosely taken from Marsilio Ficino’s translations of Plato’s Laws (600 lines) and Republic (100 lines), he reconstructed something like a Platonic dialogue to complement Aristotle’s works. His purpose seems to have been primarily pedagogical: to present a Plato safe for student consumption, complete with occasional marginal admonitions to “beware” (caute) and a list of Platonic opinions which should be rejected (such as possessing women and children in common). The work represented those parts of Plato which Aristotle had frequently discussed in his own moral philosophy and therefore had evidently found useful, as Lefèvre explained in his prefatory letter (Rice 1972: 156; cf. Boisset 1973). It was, without apology, “Aristotle’s Plato”.

4.5 Metaphysics

Throughout his commentaries and epitomes, Lefèvre often briefly observes that the findings of a particular discipline have metaphysical implications, but then leaves this line of thought aside, typically saying “enough about this, at this point” (de hac adhuc satis est). These implications are meant to be treated in metaphysics or theology. (Like many Christian philosophers after Boethius, Lefèvre often identifies theology and metaphysics; Oosterhoff 2019a.) In this sense, then, Lefèvre belongs to a natural theological tradition which sees the philosophical arts as studying the traces of the divine in the natural world, and then as steps leading upward to divine matters, as he put it in his side-by-side edition of the medieval and humanist translations of Euclid’s geometry (1517a: a2r).

Such a reconstructive project could especially be open to creative, synthetic impulses. Rice (1970) brilliantly captured Lefèvre’s project by suggesting that what Ficino had done for Plato, Lefèvre intended to do for Aristotle. Drawing on a long-standing medieval topos that Plato was the closest of ancient philosophers to Christian truth, Ficino had interpreted him as broadly in line with Christian teaching, all the while drawing on the natural philosophy, medicine, and mathematics of his day to present him as a healer of souls (Celenza 2007: 86). Early in his work on Aristotle, Lefèvre similarly presented Aristotle as all things in all disciplines, even theology:

in his logical works he was most subtle and rational, in the Physics a worldly philosopher, in the Ethics entirely prudent and active, in the Politics a lawyer, and in the Metaphysics a priest and theologian. (Fuit namque in logicis rationalis subtilissimus, in physicis mundanus philosophus, in ethicis totus prudens et activus, in polyticis iurisconsultus, in metaphysicis sacerdos atque theologus, Letter to Germain de Ganay, In Aristotelis Ethica Nicomachea introductio, 1494b: a2r; Rice 1970: 138)

Lefèvre’s Aristotle, like Ficino’s Plato, knew something of the Christian God. In his introduction to the Metaphysics (1494a: d1v), he suggested that Aristotle had prayed to the ens entium, begging for mercy. This emphasis on the coherence of Aristotle’s works throughout the arts cycle and his agreement with Christianity sustained the scholarship of Lefèvre and his students for decades.

It also meant that Lefèvre could find in Aristotle the basis for the concord of all knowledge. He thus held together two potentially divergent approaches: his editorial efforts to “purify” Aristotle accompanied his efforts to find a pious metaphysical framework for philosophy, including elements that clearly belonged to Neoplatonic traditions. At first, Lefèvre’s encyclopedic projects extended to the Neoplatonic texts revived by Ficino and Bessarion, among others. In 1494, as mentioned above, he published Ficino’s important translation of the writings attributed to Hermes Trismegistus, along with his own short argumenta. Around the same time, he published De magia naturali, which drew on Ficino’s medical cosmology in the Three Books on Life, as well as Giovanni Pico della Mirandola’s cabbalistic interests. But by 1505 his optimism about the fruitfulness of this esoteric approach had lessened. As Pantin (1988) has shown, Lefèvre’s 1505 edition of the Hermetic corpus includes, among its additions, more cautions against unorthodox readings than the previous edition, just as he would do the next year when recompiling Plato’s Laws and Republic in his Hecatonomiae.

In 1514 he produced a major edition of Nicholas of Cusa, arguably the most original philosopher of the fifteenth century—and one certainly influenced by Plato. But Lefèvre had his own take on the history of Platonic philosophy, which allowed him to see Nicholas and the twelfth-century Victorines, among others, as representatives of a distinctively Christian form of philosophy (Oosterhoff 2019a and 2019b). He defended a longstanding tradition, particularly strong in France (where Dionysius the Areopagite was regarded not only as St Paul’s Athenian convert, but also as the original bishop-martyr who had brought Christianity to France). He explained the similarities between Dionysius and late ancient Platonists such as Iamblichus and Proclus as thefts on the part of the pagan philosophers. To Lefèvre, Dionysius stood for a Pauline and fundamentally Christian form of insight, beyond both positive and negative theology. Later Platonists had drawn on this tradition for their most profound teachings, while suppressing their source. In his edition of Dionsyius’s Divine Names, Lefèvre adduced Nicholas of Cusa’s “scientie divine ignorantie” (“science of divine ignorance”) as a faithful reading of Dionysius, suggesting that Dionysius was the source of Nicholas’s recognition that both positive and negative statements about God fall short, since finite words cannot capture an infinite reality (1499: 58v–61r). Therefore, in Lefèvre’s eyes, Nicholas of Cusa was a modern representative of this authentic Christian philosophy (Meier-Oeser 1989: 36–61).

5. Legacy

Lefèvre’s editions of Neoplatonic works became important in their own right, long after his encyclopedic repristination of Aristotle had been supplanted by handbooks like those of the Lutheran Aristotelian Philip Melanchthon. His expanded edition of the Hermetic corpus (1505b)with the Crater Hermetis of Ludovico Lazzarelli and another book in addition to the fourteen treatises known to Ficino—became the most widely adopted text, reprinted all over Europe, along with his annotations. Similarly, his edition and commentary on Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite was read throughout the sixteenth century, and his edition of Cusanus remained the standard Opera omnia up to the twentieth century.

As discussed above, Lefèvre regularly mentioned “analogy” as a way to relate truths in different domains. While it seems that he never fleshed out the details of this method, his obsession with providing trustworthy steps to a unified, methodized, and above all pedagogically useful philosophy is perhaps his most lasting legacy—one which would be taken up in debates over method and textbooks throughout the sixteenth century (Schmitt 1988). The fascination of Lefèvre and his students with analogies and mathematics offers a glimpse of the early motivations to find a “universal method” that later bloomed in debates over universal arts (Rossi 2000: 29, 39; Ong 1958: 76). Timothy Reiss first identified Lefèvre and his circle with the early swell of philosophical interest in the quadrivium in the sixteenth century (Reiss 1997). Oronce Fine in particular extended Lefèvre’s mathematical legacy (Pantin 2009). By the early seventeenth century, some authors would put forward a method which was strongly mathematical and which purported to unify not only arithmetic and geometry but all disciplines under a mathesis universalis (Rabouin 2009). Lefèvre could be said to have inaugurated the genre of printed philosophical textbooks in which such positions emerged (Oosterhoff 2018).

Lefèvre’s students—with whom he had always worked closely—took up his project and developed it in several directions. They frequently published his works, especially in Strassburg and Cologne. In Paris, as Rice (1970) noted, several figures associated with Lefèvre set up on philosophical projects rooted in his teaching: most notably, Josse Clichtove and Charles de Bovelles. Clichtove, who wrote many commentaries on Lefèvre’s editions, became an important figure in the Paris faculty of theology. Bovelles deserves particular attention for his concerted effort to develop a fresh philosophical synthesis, which shared with Lefèvre core themes such as the dignity of mankind as the mirror of nature, human freedom, the distinctiveness of our intellectual faculties, and the importance of mathematics in modeling philosophical perspectives (Faye 1998). Lefèvre’s effort to provide students with handbooks in all fields of knowledge can be compared to Ramus’s philosophical reforms.

His students and successive generations of scholars carried forward Lefèvre’s conviction that a renewal of philosophy should begin with new translations and philological work. Around 1516, his student Gerard Roussel retranslated Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics from the Greek; he also wrote a long, philosophical commentary on Boethius (1521), picking up the Pythagorean and mathematical interests which had also motivated Lefèvre’s reform of university philosophy. Another student, François Vatables (later the first Royal Professor of Hebrew at the Collège Royal) similarly retranslated large parts of the Aristotelian corpus. Though he did not study directly with Lefèvre, Symphorien Champier fashioned his idiosyncratic introduction to philosophy, the Janua (1498), by liberally excerpting from his works. Later in the century, Lefèvre’s sustained and wide-ranging effort to make Aristotle eloquent was taken over by humanist translators of the philosopher such as Denys Lambin, Adrien Turnèbe, and Joachim Périon. Lefèvre influenced the history of philosophy as much through the deep relationships he cultivated with his students as through his ambitious use of the new technology of the printing press to reinvent the university philosophy curriculum.


Selected Works by Lefèvre

Lefèvre’s works were reprinted many times in the sixteenth century, but not afterward. Here only the first editions of key works are listed, as well those which first included the commentaries by Josse Clichtove. The most complete and reliable bibliography of Lefèvre’s works, including transcriptions of letters by him and his colleagues, remains Eugene F. Rice, ed., The Prefatory Epistles of Jacques Lefèvre d’Étaples and Related Texts (New York: Columbia University Press, 1972).

  • De magia naturali, Olomouc, M.I.119; Vatican City, Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana, MS lat. reg. 1115; Paris, Bibliothèque nationale de France, MS lat. 7454; Brussels, Bibliothèque royale de Belgique, MS lat. 10875. (See Lefèvre 2018, below.)
  • 1492, Totius philosophiae naturalis paraphrases, Paris: J. Higman.
  • 1494a, Introductio in metaphysicorum libros Aristotelis, Paris: J. Higman.
  • 1494b, Ars moralis … Aristotelis philosophi moralia illustria claraque reddit [= In Aristotelis Ethica Nicomachea introductio], Paris: [A. Caillaut].
  • 1494c (ed. and comm.), Mercurii Trismegisti Liber de potestate et sapientia dei, per Marsilium Ficinum traductus, Paris: J. Higman for W. Hopyl.
  • 1495, (ed. and comm.), Textus de Sphera Johannis de Sacobosco, Paris: J. Higman and W. Hopyl.
  • 1496a, (ed. and author), Elementa Arithmetica; Elementa musicalia; Epitome in Arithmetica Boetii; Richmimachie ludus, Paris: J. Higman and W. Hopyl.
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The author would like to thank Jill Kraye and Lodi Nauta, who offered especially detailed and helpful suggestions on an earlier draft of this article. Thanks also to Nynke Boef, Matthew Gaetano, Denis Robichaud, and Raphaële Garrod for sharing their expertise.

Copyright © 2019 by
Richard J. Oosterhoff <richard.oosterhoff@gmail.com>

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