Giordano Bruno

First published Wed May 30, 2018; substantive revision Tue May 28, 2019

Giordano Bruno (1548–1600) was one of the most adventurous thinkers of the Renaissance. Supremely confident in his intellectual abilities, he ridiculed Aristotelianism, especially its contemporary adherents. Copernicus’s heliocentric theory provided a starting point for his exposition of what he called a “new philosophy”. It disproved the axioms of Aristotelian natural philosophy, notably the idea that sublunary elements occupied or strove to return to their natural places, that is, the elemental spheres, at the centre of the cosmos. Concomitantly, it disproved the existence of a superlunary region composed entirely of incorruptible aether circling the earth and hence disproved Aristotle’s principal argument for supposing that the universe was finite. The universe was infinite, animate and populated by numberless solar systems. It was also eternal. As such, it exhibited all possibilities at any given moment, and all parts of it assumed all possibilities over time, thereby constituting a cognizable manifestation of a timeless and absolute principle, God, conceived as the sole being who truly existed. In keeping with these ideas, Bruno proposed versions of metempsychosis, polygenism, panpsychism and, renouncing Christian emphases on human imperfection, advocated a morality that exhorted individuals to perfect their intellectual powers.

1. Life

Filippo Bruno was born in January or February 1548, son of Giovanni Bruno, a soldier of modest circumstances, and Fraulissa Savolina, at Nola, about 17 miles north east of Naples. At the unusually late age of seventeen, beguiled perhaps by the prospect of a life dedicated to learning, he entered the Dominican convent of San Domenico Maggiore in Naples, assuming the name Giordano. In 1572 he became a priest and later that year began to study theology formally, obtaining his doctorate in July 1575. That year he was investigated by his Provincial for his views on the Trinity, a delicate topic in Reformation Europe. This was not the first occasion on which he had scandalized his fellow friars and, exasperated with the constraints of the religious life, he fled the convent in early 1576. He went first to Rome and then, taking off his habit, proceeded to northern Italy. He was now a fugitive from his order and excommunicate. Over the next fourteen or so years he moved from one town or city to another, first in Italy and then in France, Switzerland, England, Germany and Bohemia. In 1591 he returned, fatefully, to Venice. It was during these unsettled years that Bruno composed those Italian and Latin works of his that survive today.

Without family, connections or means of his own, Bruno relied on his wits. For example, at Noli, between Nice and Genoa, he taught Latin to schoolboys and elementary astronomy to “certain gentlemen” (Firpo 2000: 45). In Geneva, he worked in a printer’s shop, correcting proofs. He aspired to greater things. His goal was to teach philosophy without the trammels of revealed truths, preferably at a university. On several occasions, a position of this kind seemed within his grasp. Two factors, however, conspired to thwart his ambitions. The first was the unsettled circumstances of Reformation Europe. At Toulouse, for example, he taught philosophy at the university for nearly two years (1579–81), but renewed conflict between Catholics and Huguenots in the summer of 1581 forced him to leave the city. His notoriety further complicated matters. In a dispatch dated 28 March 1583, the English ambassador in Paris, Henry Cobham, alerted Queen Elizabeth’s principal secretary, Francis Walsingham, to Bruno’s impending arrival: “Il Sr Doctor Jordano Bruno Nolano, a professor in philosophy, intendeth to pass into England; whose religion I cannot commend” (Aquilecchia 1995: 22, 24). Not by chance does Bruno have the distinction of being the only known sixteenth-century philosopher to have been excommunicated from all three major confessions: Roman Catholic (Naples, 1576), Calvinist (Geneva, 1579) and Lutheran (Helmstedt, 1589). The second factor was his temperament. Intolerant of those whom he deemed fools, Bruno repeatedly caused offence. In The Ash Wednesday Supper, the first and best known of the six philosophical dialogues in Italian that he published while living in London, he decried the ignorance and pomposity of English men of learning and cast aspersions on the London commoner. He compared himself, “a Neapolitan born and bred under a more benign sky”, with a hapless antagonist at Oxford University, whom he described as a discourteous “pig” (BOI I, 535). Such was the offence that the work caused that he began his next dialogue, On the Cause, the Principle and the One with an elaborate apology in which he retracted his comments while simultaneously justifying them. It was a ploy that he would use again, ill-advisedly, during his trial.

Bruno’s wanderings came to an abrupt end shortly after he returned to Italy in late August 1591. After a brief stay in Venice, he moved to Padua for three months or so and then returned to Venice to take up lodgings with the Venetian patrician Giovanni Mocenigo, to whom he divulged the “secrets” of his mnemotechnics and philosophy. Alarmed at some of Bruno’s views, Mocenigo denounced him to the Venetian Inquisition on 22 May 1592. Events took a decided turn for the worse when, on 12 September 1592, the Papal Nuncio in Venice, on behalf of the Holy Office in Rome, requested Bruno’s extradition. The Venetian authorities dilly-dallied, before eventually acceding to the request in January 1593. At Rome, the trial proceeded slowly. Eventually, on 14 January 1599, the Congregation of the Holy Office approved a list (now lost) of eight heretical propositions assembled by Robert Bellarmine, S.J., and Alberto Tragagliolo, O.P., from the trial records and copies of Bruno’s works. Bruno was invited to consider “whether he wished to abjure the propositions as heretical” (Firpo 2000: 411, 413, doc. 55). Four days later, he was brought before the Congregation and ordered to abjure the propositions within six days. Bruno conceded, with qualifications, and then submitted a written defence of his views.

The trial proceeded, with Bruno abjuring the heresies of which he was accused, while at the same time taking issue, in written depositions, with aspects of the accusations. It was not, as mentioned above, the first time that Bruno had used this ploy, turning concession into a springboard for reasserting his position. On this occasion, however, the stakes were higher, as he surely knew. On 21 December 1599, the die was cast when he retorted to the Inquisitors that

he neither needed nor wished to recant, that he had nothing to recant, that he did not have views to recant, and did not know about what he should recant. (Firpo 2000: clxxvi, 463, doc. 65)

The Congregation made a final attempt the same day, sending the Dominican General and the Procurator, two of the most distinguished members of the order that he had deserted almost twenty four years previously, to plead with him, in vain. On 20 January 1600, the Congregation, with Pope Clement VIII presiding, ordered that all of Bruno’s works be placed on the Index of Prohibited Books and that he should be consigned to the secular authorities of Rome for punishment as an impenitent, pertinacious and obstinate heretic. Bruno’s final written deposition, addressed to the pope, “was opened but not read” (Firpo 2000: 471, 475, doc. 65a-b). At dawn on 17 February 1600, he was led out onto the Campo de’ Fiori. With a metal plate clamped over his tongue, Bruno was stripped, tied to a stake and, accompanied by the chants of the Confraternity of the Beheading of St John, burned alive.

2. The Wisdom of the Ancients

Bruno’s philosophy—despite its inconsistent terminology, intricacies, eclecticism and willful contrariness—has an inner coherence. Indeed, he can claim to be the first thinker since antiquity to integrate a metaphysics, physics, psychology and ethics into an original, if unsystematically presented, philosophy, one that aspired to go beyond the reelaborations of Platonism, Aristotelianism or scepticism within a Christian context that had hitherto prevailed. The outcome was a radical alternative to medieval and Renaissance interpretations of human nature, the cosmos and God. His philosophy remained, however, in one decisive respect a creation of the Renaissance: neither celestial nor terrestrial mechanics were reducible to mathematical abstractions. His treatment of Copernicus’s heliocentric hypothesis, discussed in the following section, exemplifies his approach in this respect.

The coherence stems from his interpretation of ancient learning. From, principally, the fifteenth-century Christian Platonist Marsilio Ficino, he learned of the gentile tradition of wisdom, the “ancient philosophy”, that had allegedly originated with sages such as Zoroaster in Persia and Hermes Trismegistus in Egypt. Orpheus, Pythagoras and other early Greek thinkers had imbibed this wisdom and transmitted it to Plato, among many others. Through innate powers of mind, divine inspiration or direct or indirect knowledge of Jewish lore, these sages and philosophers had acquired intimations of many, indeed most, of the essential tenets of Christianity. Hence, concluded Ficino, the study of ancient Greek philosophy, especially Platonism, could rightfully serve as a handmaiden to the Christian faith. Bruno denied any such notions of progress. Human knowledge, like all natural things, observed the rule of vicissitude (see Section 3), gradually oscillating from one extreme to the other. Greek philosophy from Plato onwards was a debased version of the true wisdom known to ancient sages such as Hermes Trismegistus among the Egyptians and Pythagoras, Parmenides and Empedocles among the early Greeks. The task, then, was to restore an authentic ancient philosophy by elaborating upon what could be discerned in the few surviving Egyptian and Pythagorean records of it with the help of vestigial truths preserved in Greek philosophy. Even Aristotle, “the stupidest of all philosophers”, who had done his best to “pervert the opinions of the ancients and oppose the truth” (BOI I, 182, 730), sometimes included, despite himself, valuable ideas gleaned from his predecessors. The many other philosophical sources that Bruno eclectically pressed into service—Presocratic, Platonic, Aristotelian, Stoic, Epicurean, medieval, Arabic, scholastic and Renaissance—had the same purpose: the articulation of a philosophy true to the principles of an ancient wisdom all but obliterated by Aristotle and his followers.

His approach towards Scripture followed suit. Patristic, medieval and Renaissance authors, including again Ficino, held that Hermes Trismegistus had lived at the same time as or shortly after Moses. This explained the many similarities between the Old Testament and Hermes’s writings. Bruno reversed the chronology. He was not the first Renaissance author to do so, but he was the first to draw out the implications. The daughter of the Pharaoh had taken Moses into her household as “her son” (Exodus 2:10, KJV), and he had become “learned in all the wisdom of the Egyptians” (Acts 7:22, KJV; BOI II, 369). This “wisdom of the Egyptians” was the wisdom recorded in Hermes’s works. In other words, the Pentateuch, which conventionally was believed to have been composed by Moses, and hence Scripture as a whole were tributaries of Egyptian lore, rather than vice versa. Bruno made this point circumspectly, as well he might. Sometimes he disguised his interpretation by referring to Scripture as the “Kabbalah”. Such wisdom, he declared, as there was in the Kabbalah of the Jews “derived from the Egyptians, by whom Moses was educated” (BOI II, 362; 369). Read literally, this statement was uncontroversial. Though purportedly Mosaic in origin, the Kabbalah was not an authoritative repository of Christian doctrine. By “Kabbalah”, however, Bruno surreptitiously meant Jewish lore as recorded not only in the originally oral tradition of the Kabbalah, but also in the parallel written tradition, that is, the Pentateuch, and hence in the Old and New Testaments generally. The crucifixion was a “Kabbalistic tragedy” (BOI II, 263).

Travesty though it therefore was for the most part, Holy Scripture, like Plato’s and Aristotle’s philosophies, had inherited some truths from pre-Mosaic wisdom. Bruno duly quoted from Scripture on many occasions—examples feature in the following sections—to support his metaphysical, cosmological and ethical ideas. The Book of Job was especially valuable in this respect. Job had lived in the Land of Uz and so recorded, not Jewish lore, but “profound mysteries of the Chaldeans” (BOL I.2, 390, 418), ones that, like the wisdom of the Egyptians, the Magi, Orphics and Pythagoreans, constituted a strand of “the ancient philosophy” (BOI I, 460). Chaldean wisdom, like that of the Egyptians, owed nothing of importance to the “Jewish Kabbala”, which had been composed by a people, the “excrement” of Egypt, who had never governed a land of their own (BOI II, 377). Whether these and other aspersions (see also BOI II, 438, and Section 7), stereotypical by his day, represent prejudices discredited by objections voiced by other interlocutors or ones that he shared is a moot point. One way or the other they served to convey his conviction that what truths there were in scripture derived from a philosophical tradition that had originated in ancient Egypt.

Medieval and Renaissance philosophers and theologians had, disastrously, held the opposite view. Philosophically, they looked to Plato, Aristotle and Averroes as authorities, rather than to Hermes, the Chaldeans, Pythagoras and other early Greek sages. Exegetes had consequently misinterpreted those parts of Scripture that touched on philosophical matters, incorrectly reading literally passages that described nature and the universe figuratively and vice versa. This did not dissuade Bruno from adopting scholastic ideas when it suited his purposes. He acknowledged the Dominican Thomas Aquinas as an important influence, praised the metaphysical speculations of thirteenth-century Oxford Franciscans (e.g., Duns Scotus) and extolled Averroes as a better commentator on Aristotle than any late Greek commentator, despite the Arab philosopher’s ignorance of the Greek language. It was contemporary scholasticism that bore the brunt of Bruno’s animosity, above all for its emphasis on Latin style at the expense of intellectual substance—a vice contracted from Renaissance humanism, for which he had no patience.

3. Cosmology: The Universe and the Atom

How and when Bruno began to develop what he called his “new philosophy” is uncertain (Granada 1990). His earliest surviving philosophical work, On the Shadows of the Ideas, dated 1582, hints at a few of its propositions, including heliocentricism (BOL II.1, 7–8). The first detailed statement, however, came in The Ash Wednesday Supper, published at London in 1584, in which he set out his interpretation of Copernicus’s heliocentric hypothesis, as explained in On the Revolutions (1543). Dismissing contemporary claims that Copernicus’s hypothesis was merely a convenient computational device, Bruno announced that it disproved the traditional Aristotelian-Ptolemaic picture of the cosmos. In the first place, it disproved Aristotle’s doctrine that each sublunary element had a fixed “natural place” at the centre of the cosmos—the earth’s globe at the very centre, water in the sphere immediately surrounding it, followed by the air and fire spheres—and that particles of the elements, if displaced from these natural spheres, had an intrinsic impulse to regain them. On the contrary, since the earth, Bruno explained, was a planet circling the sun, the elemental spheres of which it was constituted were continuously in motion. The elements did not have absolute “natural places”; and an elemental part, whether displaced from a whole or chancing to be near a whole, sought to attach itself to it because a whole was the place where it would be best preserved. Once united with a whole, elemental parts were no longer heavy or light and revolved with it naturally, that is, without resistance. This doctrine of gravity drew on Ficino’s Neoplatonic ideas of elemental motion, Copernicus’s doctrine of gravity, Lucretius’s comments on the weightlessness of parts in their wholes and scholastic notions of self-conservation (Knox 2002).

Woodcut showing cosmos as concentric spheres

Peter Apian, Cosmographicus liber (1524, p. 6). The woodcut typifies the medieval and Renaissance picture of the cosmos that Bruno sought to discredit. At the centre lies the terraqueous globe, understood as a combination of the earth and water spheres. Surrounding them are the concentric spheres of the other two sublunary elements, air and fire. Beyond the fire sphere is the superlunary region, which comprises: a) seven spheres, each of which carries a planet—the moon, Mercury, Venus, the sun, Mars, Jupiter and Saturn—around the centre of the cosmos; and b) four outer spheres, namely, the firmament (i.e. the sphere of fixed stars), the crystalline sphere, the primum mobile and the empyrean. Reproduced by permission of UCL Library, Special Collections.

Commendable though his achievement had been, Copernicus had remained unaware of the full implications of his heliocentric hypothesis. It was left to Bruno, the philosopher, to accomplish the full revolution of thought, pass beyond the quantitative sensible realm that, important stepping stone though it was, had unduly preoccupied mathematicians like Copernicus and proceed to knowledge of what could be discerned by reason alone (BOI I, 448–454). Copernicus’s most egregious shortcoming in this respect was his failure to recognize that his heliocentric hypothesis disproved Aristotelian and scholastic arguments that the cosmos, or rather universe, was finite and unique. If the heavens were infinite, these arguments ran, then their outermost regions would —impossibly— revolve infinitely fast around the earth at centre of the cosmos. Nor could there be more than one cosmos, because, if there were, then a displaced particle of an element would —no less impossibly—have two or more natural places to which it should return. These objections carried no weight in a heliocentric world. The apparent daily rotation of a firmament or “sphere of fixed stars” around the earth was an illusion created by the earth’s rotation around its axis as it circled the sun. The universe was not, Bruno insisted, a finite globe composed of concentric spheres, “like an onion” (BOL I.2, 261), to use a common simile. Instead it was an infinite, homogeneous expanse populated by an infinite number of solar systems like our own. How far his achievement surpassed that of Columbus, who had discovered just one continent on one earth (BOI I, 451–452)! Lucretius, Nicholas of Cusa (1401–64) and counterfactual scholastic discussions concerning the plurality of worlds are evident influences. The authority that Bruno particularly liked to invoke, however, was Scripture. The infinite number of celestial bodies corresponded to “those so many hundreds of thousands [of angels]”—an allusion to Daniel 7:10—“that assist in the ministry and contemplation of the first, universal, infinite and eternal efficient cause” (BOI I, 455).

The celestial or, as Bruno called them, “principal” bodies glided weightlessly within an infinite “receptacle” or “expanse” of aether (BOI II, 110) like specks of dust in the sunlit air (BOL I.1, 262; I.2, 91). What made them move? Their souls. They were animate and, as their orderly patterns of motion attested, intelligent too. Aristotle had suggested this among other possible explanations for celestial motion. Most patristic and scholastic authors, anxious to discourage polytheism, had rejected the idea. Ficino’s revival of Platonism, however, had given a new lease of life to the idea that the celestial bodies were animate. True to form, Bruno, though indebted to Ficino on this as on many other scores, quoted the Book of Job (28:20–21) as his authority. In each solar system or, in Bruno’s terminology, “synod” the suns and earth regulated their motions autonomously to their mutual advantage. From the earths, the suns absorbed vaporous exhalations. In exchange the sun produced the light and heat that the earths, as “animals”, needed in order to host living things. No part of them remained forever barren thanks to the several approximately circular revolutions that they performed. Nature, for Bruno no less than for Aristotle, did nothing in vain (BOL III, 108).

In keeping with these ideas, Bruno populated the principal bodies with life-forms of every kind. Each region of each principal body comprised matter which, circumstances permitting, became a plant or animal, even a rational animal. This last category included human beings and also demons, in other words, rational beings with rarefied bodies made of pure aether or combinations of aether with air, water or earth. The latter, to judge by the demons frequenting the elemental regions of our globe, were generally, but by no means invariably, more intelligent than human beings. Within the mountains were dim-witted troglodytes jealously guarding the earth’s mineral veins (BOL I.2, 61, 282; III, 431). Long-living but of feeble intelligence, they had little commerce with human beings. Stone-throwing demons, another species of earthy demon, of the kind described by the Byzantine author Michael Psellos, had lairs in the vicinity of Nola and habitually pelted those who passed nearby at night, as Bruno knew from personal experience (BOL III, 431). Nymphs with predominantly aqueous bodies lived secluded in grottos (BOL I.2, 282; III, 181). The variety of demonic life was such that it “far surpassed that of sensible things” (BOL III, 427, 429). A comparable diversity was evident among human beings, who differed in skin colour and stature from region to region (BOL I.2, 282, 284). The variations reflected their diverse habitats. When extinguished by a cataclysm of some kind, they regenerated spontaneously (BOL I.2, 282), in the manner that Avicenna and, if only as a philosophical possibility, some Christian authors had described. The novelty in Bruno’s interpretation was the idea that spontaneous generation explained the variety of life in an infinite and infinitely varied universe rather than the survival of a privileged species on this earth.

The principal bodies, human beings and demons were the three genera of rational animal inhabiting the universe. In one important respect, however, principal bodies were unique. Like accomplished musicians—here Bruno adapted an analogy used by Plotinus and many others to illustrate how nature operated non-discursively according to a final cause—they did not think rationally, proceeding from one thought to the next as they executed their roles. Their intellects dominated their animal bodies, enabling them to move intuitively in accordance with the ends proper to them. Unlike human beings, too, the celestial “animals” were eternal and hence did not reproduce, grow or decay. Though corruptible intrinsically, they were, as the Chaldeans and Plato had taught, sustained by divine providence (for providence, see Section 5). This is, at least, what Bruno tended to think even if he conceded, uncharacteristically, that he was uncertain on this point (Granada, 2000). In all other respects, the principal bodies were animals like any other. Stones and other parts of our earth, for example, might seem inanimate but, as parts of a principle body, they were, like the bones, nails and hair of an animal, alive, if only vestigially. Like animals, too, the principal bodies fed and excreted. They expelled stray particles from the surrounding aether and in compensation emitted others, an idea inspired by Lucretius’s concept of simulacra (On the Nature of Things, IV.54–268).

This picture was incompatible with traditional doctrines of the elements. Aristotelian, Neoplatonic and scholastic cosmology distinguished neatly between the super- and sublunary regions. The superlunary region and the celestial bodies within it were composed entirely of aether. This “fifth element” or quintessence was devoid of all change other than that of perfect, unending, circular motion. The sublunary region comprised the remaining four elements, fire, air, water and earth, which by nature observed finite linear motion upwards or downwards. In addition to finite local motion, bodies composed of the sublunary elements continuously underwent generation and corruption. In these respects the superlunary region was superior to the sublunary one. Indeed, even within the sublunary region, according to many authors, the four elements were organized hierarchically, with earth as the dullest and grossest element at the centre of the cosmos and fire as the nimblest and subtlest sublunary element, akin to the neighbouring celestial region.

No such hierarchy could obtain in a homogeneous universe populated by animate suns and earths of the kind that Bruno imagined. Fire, air, water and earth, as they were commonly conceived, were present in each and every celestial body, indeed all four were present in each part of every celestial body. Just as in a syllable, each letter was equally important—an Aristotelian analogy that Bruno turned to his own purposes (BOL I.2, 118; Aristotle Metaphysics, VII.17, 1041b11–33)—so too were the elements in the composition of a body. Timely support came from contemporary accounts of the 1572 supernova and theories about comets proposed by Tycho Brahe and others (Tessicini 2007, 112–150). The birth of a new star proved that generation did, after all, occur in the superlunary region. As for comets, they were indeed, as Aristotle and others held, composed of the same elements as other sublunary things but they were not, as they had concluded, sublunary phenomena peculiar to the air and fire spheres. Their trajectories proved that were superlunary objects or, more exactly, planets which, owing to the incline at which they revolved around the sun, only intermittently reflected the sun’s light towards the earth. The supposedly sublunary elements occurred in the superlunary region! In short, not only reason but also observation disproved the notion of a cosmos divided into two finite regions of contrasting properties (BOL I.1, 219–221). This was a vivid example of Bruno’s constant refrain that the senses, regulated by reason, could be used to advantage (BOI II, 10, 136–137; BOL I.2, 196, 218; II.2, 78; Firpo 2000, 57, doc. 11).

Bruno’s alternative theory of the elements drew on Pythagoreanism, ancient atomism, medieval discussions, pro and contra, of indivisible minims and Nicholas of Cusa’s elemental doctrines (BOL III, 510–536). Corporeal things comprised two material principles, earth and water, and two immaterial ones, spirit and soul. By “earth” Bruno meant the discrete, identical, irreducible spheres of which physical things were made. He often called them “atoms” to emphasize their indivisibility. The circumferences and centres of these spherical atoms coincided. Hence, as some medieval authors had proposed, atoms were dimensionless bodies, unlike the atoms imagined by Democritus and other ancient atomists. They were, as Bruno said, the principles of spatial contraction, of solidity. Water, by contrast, was a continuum and the principle of corporeal extension. Two or more atoms, though dimensionless, bonded by water constituted a determinate body in space, just as two or more dimensionless points, in Bruno’s Pythagorean geometry, constituted a line. “The minimal body or atom was the substance of all things” (BOL I.3, 140). Observation confirmed this theory: dry, dusty, earth congealed with the addition of water.

The two non-material principles, spirit and soul, related to each other analogously. Soul, the principle of motion, aggregated atoms and thereby determined the identity of a body. Spirit—the spiritus popularized by Ficino—was the incorporeal medium through which soul connected with body. Soul accounted for the existence of fire. In its purest form, fire was the combination of water and light, which, as others, including Ficino, had explained, was the physical analogue of the intellectual soul governing all things (for soul and light, see further Section 4). This explained why flame resembled water flashing in sunlight: in the former, soul predominated, in the latter, water. The Egyptians Hermes Trismegistus and Moses corroborated this idea. Both had understood fire to be essentially water (BOL I.1, 376; Genesis 1:6–7; Hermes Trismegistus, Pimander, I.5). Again, in Genesis 1:1–3 Moses had spoken of earth, the water (the “abyss”), spirit and light but ignored fire and air, precisely because they were not true elements. Similarly air was a derivative rather than, as conventionally believed, an element in its own right. Heat generated by fire vaporized water to produce the air of the kind that we breath, and this vaporous air merged seamlessly into the empty, dimensionless, space beyond the atmosphere surrounding a celestial body. This space was the aether, though not the aether of conventional cosmology. It was the continuum spread throughout the universe and through the corporeal things contained in it, binding them together—not unlike the Stoic pneuma interpreted as hexis—without, however, moving them. It was, in other words, spiritus, the motionless immaterial medium through which soul, the principle of motion, operated. As such, spiritus or aether was the container—non-terminated space—in which all things were located.

Bruno’s elemental theory disproved outright the dominant Aristotelian view that the universe was finite but infinitely divisible. It also disproved ancient atomism. Democritus, Epicurus, Lucretius and others had, it is true, correctly surmised that the universe was infinite and comprised an infinite number of finite, indivisible, atoms. But their atoms were solids, although imperceptible ones, of various shapes, weights and sizes floating in a vacuum, a conclusion that led to a mechanistic view of the universe, which Bruno did not countenance. Correctly understood, atoms were incorporeal spheres with spatial locations. Soul, working through the intermediary of aether or spirit, joined these incorporeal, identical, spheres to make a body. Indeed, they were not so much components as instances of the universe. Intrinsically dimensionless, their centres coincided with their circumferences. Conversely, since the universe was an infinite, indivisible (atomus) sphere, its centre was omnipresent. Both were absolute physical monads, indivisible unities, the centres and circumferences of which coincided. They differed inasmuch as the maximum was the “unfolding” of the minimum and a minimum was the “enfolding” of the maximum.

4. The Universal Soul, Universal Intellect and Universal Matter

The soul that Bruno identified as one of the four principles of corporeality was the World or Universal Soul. The universe was an organism in which each principal body and the life sustained on it participated in a common animating principle, in the same way as the many parts of the human body were vivified by one and the same soul. Even supposedly inanimate things had a vestigial presence of life. Rocks, for example, were alive to the same degree as the bones or teeth of animals were. The Universal Soul was “all-in-all”, that is, present wholly and indivisibly in each and every thing to the degree that it was capable of receiving it, just as, to borrow Plotinus’s analogy (Enneads,VI.4.12), a single voice was audible to everyone in a room, however great the audience. Bruno, like others before him, attributed the doctrine of “all-in-all”, in a dematerialized version, to Anaxagoras. He also adduced several scriptural witnesses, notably the Book of Wisdom (1:7), thereby identifying the Universal Soul implicitly with the Holy Spirit: “For the Spirit of the Lord filleth the world: and that which containeth all things hath knowledge of the voice”. No matter that the Council of Sens (1140) had anathematized this association.

The Universal Soul combined with Universal Matter to produce the universe; the former was the active power, form, and the latter its passive subject. Bruno conceived Universal Matter as indeterminate space, that is, the receptacle of Plato’s Timaeus (52A–B) or more exactly Aristotle’s interpretation of it (Physics, IV.2, 209b6–17; IV.6, 214a12–19). In this respect, it was the motionless aether or spirit, devoid of any “specific quality” of its own (BOI II, 159–160; BOL I.2 78–79), that served as the medium through which soul acted on the two corporeal principles, earth atoms and water (see Section 3). Some philosophers, noted Bruno, called this space or container “vacuum” (BOI II, 160–161). All Universal Matter was “accompanied” by form, that is, the Universal Soul (BOI I, 665–666). This simple picture was complicated by Bruno’s interpretation of the Universal or, synonymously, First Intellect. Like the Neoplatonic Intellect, Bruno’s Universal Intellect comprised the Ideas; but, unlike its Neoplatonic counterpart, it was not a hypostasis distinct from, and ontologically prior to, the Universal Soul. Instead, it was “the inner and most essential and characteristic faculty” of the Universal Soul, operating immanently from within Universal Matter like “an internal craftsman” (BOI I, 652–654; BOL I.2, 312–313, 426; I.4, 107). It did so by articulating its effects through division: a seed of a tree became a stem, from which grew branches, from which grew twigs, from which grew buds and so on—to the point of generating a new specimen through separation or discharge of some kind.

Bruno's Ontology: This is an svg file so the full text should be readable. Graphically the major parts are 'God' at the top with a brace enclosing what is below. On the left side of all is 'active principle/cause' and on the right side of all is 'passive principle' and on the bottom 'the living matter or Nature in a second sense'. In the interior on the left is 'Universal Soul/Intellect' with arrows point to 'Separate Intelligences', 'forms that ... by using sense data' ('Separate Intelligence' has a dotted arrow to this also), and 'forms...without using sense data'. In the interior on the right is 'Universal Matter' with arrows pointing to 'intelligible matter' (that also braces 'Universal Soul/Intellect' and 'Separate Intelligences') and to 'Sensible Matter' (this braces the two types of forms).

The Universal Intellect was, however, simultaneously separate from the corruptible things that it engendered in that it was immutable. Spatial language—“above”, “within”, “separate” and so forth—was, as Bruno recognized, inappropriate when describing intelligible realities. By definition, something intelligible had no location or dimensions. To clarify what he meant by the immanent and transcendent roles of the Universal Soul and its faculty, the Universal Intellect, Bruno appropriated a distinction formulated in Thomas Aquinas’s On the Principles of Nature. Principles were constituents of something. The marble of the statue and its form were constituents; hence, they were principles, the marble being the material, the form the formal principle. Causes, by contrast, were extrinsic. A sculptor was the efficient cause of a statue, and he made it with an end, a final cause, in mind. Neither the sculptor nor his purpose were constituents of the finished piece. Analogously the Universal Soul and Universal Matter were the two principles immanent in all things, whereas the Universal Intellect was the efficient cause of all things and so extrinsic to them. It also operated in accordance with a final and therefore extrinsic cause: the perfection of the universe.

The Stoics, as Bruno knew, had similarly proposed that the cosmos comprised two mutually dependent principles, the World Soul or pneuma and matter, active and passive respectively, with the former accommodating Mind. Indeed, when introducing his account of the Universal Soul and Universal Matter in On the Cause, the Principle and the One (1584), he included the Stoics among the several schools and authors who had identified the World Soul and matter as the active and passive principles of the physical world. Stoic philosophy also contributed to Bruno’s doctrine in surreptitious ways. In the Pimander (chaps 10–12) Hermes Trismegistus had declared that the cosmos was composed of matter and soul and that the latter included Mind. Again, Virgil (Aeneid, VI.724–727) had described the super- and sublunary regions as animated from within by spiritus, which Bruno identified in this context with the Universal Soul, and added that they were moved by a Mind diffused throughout their vast mass. Hermes Trismegistus and Virgil were, according to conventional wisdom, reporting the wisdom of the ancient Egyptians and the Pythagoreans respectively. As such, Bruno considered them authorities for his interpretation. Neither, however, was authentic. The comments in the Pimander are just one of many Stoic borrowings that reflect the eclectic intellectual ambient of Alexandrian Egypt in which Hermetic works of this kind were composed. And unbeknown to Bruno, Virgil’s lines drew on Stoic rather than Pythagorean thought (Knox 2013).

Bruno’s two universal principles resembled Stoic doctrine in another respect. For the Stoics, “first matter” was an unqualified substance (ousia). For Bruno, too, Universal Matter was a substance and in act, not a prope nihil (“almost nothing”) of the kind imagined by Aristotle. The similarities, however, cease at this point. For the Stoics, whatever existed, even soul and matter, was corporeal, capable of acting on or being acted upon by another corporeal entity. By contrast, neither of Bruno’s principles was corporeal. The Universal Soul was an intelligible reality; and Universal Matter was not corporeal in the Stoic sense. Inherently qualityless, dimensionless, impassive and inactive, Universal Matter was a medium that had the potentiality to become all things. To explain why Universal Matter conceived in this manner was a substance, Bruno drew on Thomas Aquinas’s commentary on Aristotle’s reportage of ideas proposed by “ancient philosophers” (Commentary on Aristotle’s Physics, II, lectio 2, §1). Wood was a substance in act because it was that from which a bed, stool or image could be made, not because it was any one of those things; and the same was true of Universal Matter. It was not so much the effects elicited from Universal Matter by the Universal Soul’s faculty, the Universal Intellect, which were in act, but rather Universal Matter itself. It was in act by virtue of the unexplicated forms that the Universal Intellect could incite from within it, not by virtue of the explicated material forms that it produced. Nicholas of Cusa supplied the language of explication and implication.

Universal Matter was present in incorporeal as well as corporeal things. It was the genus of two types of matter, corporeal and intelligible. The former was the substrate of corporeal objects, as described above. The latter, Plotinus’s version of Plato’s Indefinite Dyad as reported by Aristotle, was instead the substrate—the principle of indeterminacy or potentiality—of intelligible realities. Bruno quoted two of Plotinus’s arguments for the existence of intelligible matter. First, the plurality of Ideas in the Intellect presupposed something common to each of them, this commonality being intelligible matter. Second, since the sensible world imitated the intelligible world and the sensible world comprised matter, so too must the intelligible. Plotinus, like other ancient Neoplatonists, considered the two matters ontologically distinct, as Bruno noted. Intelligible matter, as the matter of unchanging intelligible realities, did not change, Plotinus had explained. It “possessed” all things simultaneously. By contrast, the matter of sensible things possessed all things only inasmuch as parts of it assumed all possible forms sequentially. Bruno added a differentiation of his own, applying again Nicholas of Cusa’s distinction between explication and implication: intelligible matter was informed but unexplicated, sensible matter was informed but explicated. Nevertheless, Bruno insisted that corporeal and intelligible matter were, ultimately, two species of the genus Universal Matter. He was not the first to do so. The eleventh-century Jewish philosopher, Ibn Gabirol or, in Latinized form, Avicebron, as Bruno mentioned, had made the same move. Just as importantly, even if Bruno did not say so, so too had Ficino in accordance with Augustine’s Plotinian exegesis of Genesis 1:1–3. All distinctions, Bruno concluded, presupposed something indefinite: potentiality, matter. Hence the distinction between the two matters presupposed an absolute Universal Matter. No doubt he knew of Thomas Aquinas’s objections. Avicebron was wrong, Thomas had written, to say that species were the actualization of a genus’s potentialities and so attribute existence to what was a purely theoretical relationship between genus and species.

Like Avicebron, Bruno sometimes went as far as to elevate Universal Matter above Universal Form. Nothing was “constant, fixed, eternal and worthy of being esteemed a principle apart from [Universal] Matter” (BOI I, 686). Form, that is, the Universal Soul, was “under the constant control of [Universal] Matter” (BOI I, 722). Its stability, which contrasted so favorably with the flux of form, had led the heterodox scholastic philosopher David of Dinant (d. 1215) “who had been poorly understood by some” to call matter “divine” (BOI I, 601, 723; BOL III, 695–696). Divine though it might be, Bruno did not identify Universal Matter with God. Indeed, he criticized Avicebron, misrepresenting him on the by, for having held that matter alone was “stable”, “eternal” and hence “divine” and for vilifying all substantial form, including the Universal Soul, as “corruptible” and ephemeral (BOI I, 687, 696). For Bruno, the Universal Soul was “mutable”, rather than “corruptible”, in relation to Universal Matter and only in this sense inferior to it (ibid.).

5. God and Nature

The two substances, Universal Soul and Universal Matter, were not antagonistic, Manichean. Though opposites, they were aspects of one and “the same principle” (BOI I, 698; BOL I.2, 344) or “supersubstantial substance” (BOI I, 557). Since this supersubstantial substance reconciled these and indeed all other opposites, it was a “plenitude” without a counterpart “non-being” (BOL III, 40). To explain its unity, Bruno turned to Nicholas of Cusa’s doctrine of the “coincidence of opposites”. Universal Matter and Universal Soul/Intellect coincided in an undifferentiated unity just as the circumference of an infinite circle and an infinite straight line, though distinct entities, coincided. Not for nothing did Bruno acknowledge that Nicholas’s doctrine had provided him with the means for reviving the ancient philosophy that had long been “defunct” (BOL I.3, 272). This supersubstantial principle was the God of whom the Egyptians Hermes and Moses had spoken. During his trial Bruno asserted that God had created all things from the two principles, “the World Soul and prime matter”, from which all things derive. “They depend with respect to their whole being on God, and they are eternal” (Firpo 2000, 381 [doc. 51, §252]). In his written works, too, he identified them with, respectively, the primordial darkness and light described in the first three verses of Genesis (BOL II.3, 117). This was not as provocative as it might seem. Origen, St Augustine and many other theologians had identified God’s first two creations on the First Day, “heaven” and “earth”, with, respectively, intellective beings—the angels—and matter.

This first principle and cause of all things, given its supersubstantiality, was unknowable. We cannot understand God as we can, say, abstract mathematical or metaphysical truths, let alone experience him directly through our senses. Nevertheless, the universe, mere vestige of him though it is, teaches us a few incontrovertible truths. We know, first, that he exists. We can deduce that a sculptor exists when we see a statue, even though we know nothing else about him. Similarly, we know from the existence of the universe that there must be a first principle and cause of all things, whom we call God (BOI I, 646–650). “He is who is”—a pun on God’s response to Moses’s plea that he describe himself (Exodus 3:14)—“for besides him nothing is” (BOL III, 41; similarly BOL I.3, 26). Furthermore, since the universe is one, we can tell that God, too, is absolutely simple and the “monad of monads” (BOL I.3, 144 , 146). He was the One Being, the unchanging ens unum, of which Xenophanes and his pupil Parmenides had spoken. All other things were his accidents or contingent “modes” (BOI I, 733), just as in arithmetic numbers were composed of, and therefore accidents of, the number one, and physical objects were composed of, and therefore accidents of, the atom. Even the substances Universal Soul and Universal Matter, given they engaged in the flux of things, were accidents of God’s supersubstantial unity.

True philosophers, those, that is, who understood that the universe was infinite, could discover more than this. The numberless, magnificent, blazing, celestial bodies revealed, to paraphrase Psalm 19:1 (KJV), many things about “the infinite excellence and majesty of their first principle and cause” (BOI I, 649–650). Together they formed a “picture, book and mirror in which we could gaze upon, read and contemplate the vestige, law and simulacrum” of God (BOL I.1, 203; BOI II, 27). The first of these analogies, that of painting, Bruno developed as follows. A masterpiece relied on using appropriately a range of colours, not just “gold and finest purple” (BOL I.1, 310, 312). Plotinus inspired the analogy (Enneads, III.2.11), but Bruno, as ever, gave it a distinctive twist. For Plotinus, it illustrated how the hierarchical arrangement of all things necessarily entailed a descent from perfect being to the absence of being, from the absolutely good to the not-good. In Bruno’s philosophy, no such hierarchy existed. Something abject was like a splodge of paint which, drab though it appeared on the palette, once applied, lent a painting the desired effect (BOL I.1, 312). In other words, accidents that they all were, things acquired ontological significance only insofar as they were part of God’s “perfect” image, the universe. As such, the latter was an epiphany incomparably more splendid and revelatory than that proferred by any individual, whether “Egyptian, Syrian, Greek or Roman” (BOL I.1, 205). The Syrian that Bruno had in mind was Jesus Christ, who was born in Bethlehem and bought up in Nazareth, both towns, as St Luke (2:2) mentioned in his account of the nativity, being located in what the Roman Empire at the time knew as Syria. It was the universe, not the first Adam or, as St Paul had called Jesus (1 Corinthians 15:45), the second Adam (Genesis 1:26; 2 Corinthians 4:4; Colossians 1:5; Hebrews 1:3), that was made in God’s “image”.

Countless theologians and philosophers had proclaimed over the centuries that the perceptible world announced the glory of God. Bruno turned the topos to advantage. Only a universe infinite in time and extent could fittingly embody what the Apostles’ Creed designated as his primary attribute, omnipotence. In God and the universe all possibilities were actualized. Both were infinite and “all that can be” (BOI I, 602). They differed in that, whereas in the universe all possibilities were at any given moment actualized somewhere, in the supersubstantial being, in which form and matter, being and existence, act and potentiality were undifferentiated, all possibilities were actualized absolutely without distinctions of time and place. This argument contradicted two scholastic convictions: 1) that what was in act physically could not be infinite since infinity was indeterminacy and that consequently an infinite body in act, that is, an infinite universe and specifically an infinite animate universe, was an impossibility; and 2) that God’s absolute and ordained power were distinct, that there was, in other words, a distinction between: a) the unlimited possibilities, apart from self-contradiction, available to God by virtue of his absolute power; and b) the limited range of possibilities, that is, those of a finite cosmos, that he freely chose to entertain in his dealings with creation (Granada 1994). These arguments, Bruno replied, besides being philosophically incoherent, belittled God’s powers and so undermined “laws, religions, faith and morality” (BOI II, 46)

These two modes of defining God, as the One Being and through his accidents, mirrored an important distinction in Bruno’s metaphysics. God had two aspects, one wholly aloof from the universe, the other in communion with it. Precedents were the Neoplatonic distinction between the One “unparticipated” and “participated” and the Christian distinction between “God hidden” and “God manifest” (BOI II, 43; BOL I.4, 79; III, 41; Isaiah 45:15; Romans 1:19–20). The Christian God, or more exactly the Word, remained unaltered even as he became miraculously incarnated as Jesus Christ. Similarly, Bruno’s supersubstantial God produced the universe, through his supernatural reconciliation of necessity and free will (BOL I.1, 242–247), as Christ-like and as his “only begotten” nature (BOI I, 693; BOL III, 58–59; I John 4:9). Bruno used several analogies to clarify the relationship, one of which derived from a passage in Plotinus (BOI I, 731–732; Plotinus, Enneads, II.6.1) clarifying the relationship of the intelligible and sensible worlds. A single sperm—here he followed a common belief—was a complete homunculus, a “substance”, comprising virtually the arms, legs and every other bodily attribute of a fully grown human being in an undifferentiated unity. This substance, this DNA so to speak, remained intact with the advent of the body, determining its “qualities, differences, accidents and organization” as it developed, matured and decayed. Similarly, converting temporal into ontological priority, the One Being, God, contained intrinsically the attributes of the universe in a virtual, unexplicated, mode and, while remaining undifferentiated in this mode, also determined in a second extrinsic, yet still undifferentiated, mode the differentiations of the explicated universe.

To explain how God, in his external aspect, articulated these differentiations, Bruno used Platonic concepts and themes. Ficino’s Christian Platonism was especially influential. God was a unity or undifferentiated plenitude of Ideas existing in him virtually. In this sense he was Mind. Dependent on him as Mind were: (a) the discrete Ideas unified in the Universal Intellect (see Section 4); and (b) the vestiges of the Ideas, that is, forms, which, in combination with sensible matter, produced corporeal things. Further, as Mind, he was also the supersubstantial principle of intelligence, contemplating the undifferentiated plenitude of Ideas within him in one timeless act. Dependent on him in this respect were intelligences of various kinds: (a) the Universal Intellect, which contemplated the discrete Ideas simultaneously as a unity; (b) disembodied intelligences, known conventionally as “separate intelligences”, which contemplated just one Idea absolutely; (c) embodied intelligences, a category that included the “principal bodies”, which, though embodied, contemplated God intellectively without the use of sense data and ratiocination, demons and human beings, both of whom used sense data and reason to attain intellection, and all other animals, even the simplest. Proof of this were animal instincts, as Ficino, too, had noted. Instincts were the presence of God as Mind working within them rather than, as scholastics typically held, powers that the stars instilled in them extraneously.

Bruno’s next step was Presocratic rather than Platonic. All cognitive acts, in whatever animal or indeed separate intelligence, were instantiations of a single cognitive power deriving from the Universal Intellect and ultimately, therefore, from God as Mind. Bruno cited Presocratic philosophers to support this idea and related it to Parmenides’s concept of the One Being and the accidental nature of all things dependent on it. Two unconventional conclusions followed. First, the form that this single cognitive power took depended on the bodily shape that it inhabited. For example, contradicting Aristotle (On the Parts of Animals, IV.10, 687a7–23), Bruno observed that the hands determined the kind of intelligence that human beings enjoyed. Second, no particular bodily shape, human, demonic or otherwise, was a privileged outlet for the expression of the single cognitive power. Just as some animals had a better sense of smell or sight than others, so, too, some were more intelligent than others in certain respects. Ants were more intelligent than human beings in the way in which they organized their communal lives (BOL I.4, 119). By means of their individual cognitive powers all things identified how best to preserve themselves and acted accordingly. Even supposedly inanimate things observed this principle and so showed traces of intelligence. “Whatever exists in some way knows in some way” (BOL I.4, 112, 118). A stone held aloft sought to return downwards to the earth because that was where it was in its optimal condition. It observed the law of gravity (see Section 3). Collectively the individual cognitive acts of the infinite number of things were the means whereby the Universal Soul/Intellect bound the universe to its source, God. This impulse to adhere to him—Love on a cosmic scale—ensured that the universe, having gone forth from God (his exitus), preserved themselves by their impulse to return to him (his reditus).

Bruno’s Platonic interpretation of God’s exitus accounts for his celebrated dictum “Nature is God in things” (BOI II, 354; BOL I.2, 151; I.4, 101). Nicholas of Cusa probably inspired the formula. In a work that Bruno knew, Nicholas identified Plato’s World Soul with Aristotle’s concept of Nature, before concluding that “the World Soul or Nature was no less than God operating in all things” (The Layman: On the Mind, XIII.145). Bruno’s comments on God and Nature independently of the dictum agree with this sense. “God determined and ordered; Nature executed and produced” (BOL I.3, 136; similarly BOI II, 660). Nature was the Universal Soul/Intellect acting as the efficient cause (see Section 4) “within natural things” (BOI I, 598; BOL II.2, 176). It was the act of generation that “divided” matter (BOI II, 147), operating within it non-discursively, unlike art, as Ficino (Platonic Theology, IV.1) had observed, which operated discursively on material from without (BOI I, 680–682: BOL I.2, 312). The idea that plants and animals were the “living effects of Nature”, that “Nature was God in things”, had led the ancient Egyptians to worship images of the gods in the form of animals. Each living thing, in addition to its intrinsic being, incorporated something divine from the gods “according to its capacity and measure” (BOI II, 354–355). The “Egyptian” inspiration for Bruno’s comments in this instance was a passage in Ficino’s paraphrase of On the Mysteries of the Egyptians (VII.1-3) in which Iamblichus distinguished God as the cause of generation, Nature, from God in himself.

These and other Platonic borrowings sometimes obscure Bruno’s overarching idea of God as the One Being in which two substances of equal ontological status, the Universal Intellect and Universal Matter, were reconciled. It was, however, only on sufferance that he engaged with Platonism. Repeatedly he suppressed Neoplatonic distinctions between one ontological entity and another (BOI I, 651–653; BOL II.2, 178) or used them instrumentally rather than in the conviction that they were philosophically valid (BOL I.4, 103). Philosophy must aim at “simplicity” (BOL I.3, 236); hence his contempt for Francesco Patrizi (1529–97), the most eminent Platonist of the day (BOI I, 676–677). All things were accidents of the One Being, intelligibilia included, and hence all things engaged with matter in some respect. Accordingly he denied, with a good dose of sarcasm, Platonism’s central tenet: that the Ideas and the intelligences apprehending them were transcendent realities (BOI I, 720-721; BOL I.2, 118, 304, 309–313, 483). In what sense could they be outside an infinite universe? Not even the separate intelligences were, in fact, separate absolutely. They constantly illuminated us whether or not we were conscious that they were doing so (BOL II.2, 173)—hence the existence, for example, of instincts (BOI II, 455–456). On these grounds, too, Bruno discounted the notion, in both its original medieval formulation (see the illustration in Section 3) and the revised version proposed by the mysterious Renaissance thinker known as Marcello Palingenio Stellato (c. 1500–c. 1543), that an empyrean—an “infinite” extent of intelligible light, devoid of all material connotations— surrounded a finite, geocentric cosmos. Matter and form were inseparable (BOL I.2, 303–304). Abstract things, wholly separate from matter, were “chimera”, no more than logical fictions (BOL I.2, 257, 309–310). This led Bruno to speak, not of the Universal Soul/Intellect shaping Universal Matter, that is, of two distinct principles or causes, one active, the other passive, but of Universal Matter as having the forms inherent within it. To denote them as an integrated unity, he sometimes used the term “Nature” (BOL I.4,155; BOL III, 266–267, 319). “Nature works within Matter, or rather it is Matter itself” (BOL I.2, 312). It contained “the origins of forms of all things within its womb, from which it brings forth and discharges all things” (BOL III, 694; also BOI I, 716–717). The universe was like a “gastropod”, a living mass endlessly changing in configuration (BOL I.2, 313).

We arrive, then, at the intriguing conclusion that Nature, in this second sense, was God in his extrinsic aspect. “Nature is either God or the divine virtue manifested in things themselves” (BOL I.4, 101). Given, moreover, that God, despite having an inner and outer aspect, was one being, in some sense he must as a whole be within things. God was separate from us in one respect but, “as the nature of Nature”, was “more intimate” to His effects than Nature itself (BOI II, 363; similarly BOL I.4, 73; III, 41). Or conversely, God was “separate from all things” in the sense that “he was present in them in a more exalted mode”, not in the sense that he was “absent” from them (BOL III, 51). Bruno was, as we have seen (see Section 4), wary of applying spatial metaphors to intelligibilia, which were by definition dimensionless. Yet, like many a philosopher or theologian before him, he was happy to use them when it suited. God or Mind or Nature was both “outside” and “within” all things, “above” them and “beneath” them, “extrinsic” and “intrinsic”, and so forth (BOL I.2, 342; I.3, 147; III, 40–41, 509).

The question of whether Bruno’s philosophy was pantheistic preoccupied nineteenth- and twentieth-century scholars. Most concluded, often ruefully, that his God remained theistic and retained, even if only minimally, an element of the transcendental. Regrettably, therefore, he could not be declared unequivocally the founder of modern philosophy, the precursor of Spinoza and Hegel. During his trial Bruno himself, hoping to reassure his inquisitors, emphasized the theistic features of his philosophy. Divine Providence was twofold. It was present in all things, animating them “in the manner that the soul was present in the body … and this I call Nature, the shadow and vestige of the Divinity”. It was also in essence, existence and power “in everything and above everything, not as a part, not as a soul, but in an inexplicable way” (Firpo 2000, 67, 303). In his works, too, he emphasized that God governed over all things providentially. Whether his philosophy is pantheistic depends, needless to say, on how we define the term. It shares with Stoicism, which is conventionally considered pantheist, the view that there was a providential principle, God, operating within the universe, that was more than just the sum of its parts. Nor does Bruno’s view differ radically from Spinoza’s distinction between God as natura naturans and the universe as natura naturata, a distinction, incidentally, that Bruno knew in its original medieval formulation but did not avail himself of (BOI I, 702). Indeed, it might be argued that Bruno’s philosophy is more authentically “pantheist” than Spinoza’s, given that the term implies that the cosmos or universe is divine. Bruno’s philosophy, unlike Spinoza’s (Nadler 2016, §2.1), makes this claim in no uncertain terms. The universe as the embodiment of God was an object of awe, veneration and aesthetic delight (BOI I, 453–456; BOL I.1, 203).

6. The Individual Soul and its Perfection

The universe was perfect. It could not be otherwise. It was, essentially, a bodily manifestation of God. Nothing in the universe, however “mean”, was “unconducive to the integrity and perfection of what is excellent”. There was “nothing that is bad for some things in some place that is not good and optimal for something elsewhere” (BOL I.3, 272). Philosophers through the ages had said much the same, as had scholastic authors. “The death of a fly”, wrote Thomas Aquinas (Super Sententiis, lib. 1, d. 39, q. 2 a. 2 co.) “is sustenance for a spider”. Then Thomas added a qualification. Creatures nobler than the irrational animals, for example, human beings, have a will, which, the more closely it cleaved to God, was “the more free from the necessity of natural causes” (ibid.). The cosmos provided the setting for human beings to demonstrate that they merited everlasting salvation. For Bruno, however, they were, no less than anything else, transient modes or “corruptible substances”, in essence, “accidents” of the One Being (BOI I, 664, 729; II, 125, 181–182). They were, as for Spinoza (Ethics, pt IV, prop. 4), part of nature, not a privileged species for which, as Christian doctrine maintained, nature had been created.

Human beings, understood as combinations of body and soul, perished. But what of their souls? Bruno stated unequivocally that they were individual, that is to say, that they were indestructible, “atomic”. Death was an illusion, no more than the dissolution of an ephemeral conjunction of soul and matter. We should await mutation serenely, not fear death, as Pythagoras, or more exactly Ovid’s ‘Pythagoras’, had rightly observed (Ovid, Metamorphoses, 15.153–175; BOI I, 665). Bruno’s doctrine of metempsychosis required him to uphold the soul’s immortality, even though, as he noted, he interpreted the doctrine differently from Pythagoras, Pythagoreans, Plato, Platonists, the Sadducees, Scripture (Psalm 36:6 [KJV]), Origen and the Druids. Souls of the dead did not endure a shadowy existence in some other world before reincarnation in the manner that the “Pythagorean” Virgil (Aeneid, VI.743–751) and others had described (BOI II, 511–515). That is to say, on the death of one body, a soul did not retain the personality that it had accrued and commandeer another body, like a helmsman changing ships. Rather, we should understand that the soul turned its operative powers to forming a new body, the limitations of which were determined by Providence (BOL III, 257, 429–430). What made ancient accounts worthy of close consideration was the underlying idea that souls were punished or rewarded for their conduct. The One Being, as Providence or Fate, ensured that, by means of the perpetual change or vicissitude which it imposed on natural things, retributive justice prevailed (BOI II, 180–185, 197, 457–459). A soul that behaved like a pig had been a pig in a previous incarnation or, on account of its conduct, was doomed to become a pig in the next. Bruno’s patron in Venice, Giovanni Mocenigo, reported to the Inquisition that Bruno had once admonished him for killing a spider. It may have been, he had remarked, the incarnation of a former friend of his (Firpo 2000, 341, doc. 51, §22.179). In keeping with these convictions, Bruno, inspired by Erasmus or perhaps Agrippa von Nettesheim, condemned the aristocratic obsession with hunting and the customs that it nurtured (BOI II, 388–389).

His doctrine of minims (see Section 3) explained the individual soul’s survival of bodily death. A soul was an incorporeal centre of animation governing the atoms conglomerating around it as the body grew and flourished. As the body grew older and decayed, the soul contracted its powers inwardly, eventually dissociating itself altogether from the body. It remained, nevertheless, an individual centre of animation capable of forming another body. Insofar, however, as it was disengaged from dimension, it “expanded” seamlessly into the infinite space of the universe. Or rather, given that infinite space was replete with souls, it expanded into the aether or spiritus diffused throughout space. Hence, in the Kabbala of the Pegasean Horse (1585), one of his most irreligious works, Bruno described an ass who, on his death, passed into the underworld and noticed there “that all spirits are from the sea of one spirit and that all return to that spirit” (BOI II, 450–451). This interpretation of spiritus as the unity of discrete individual souls, distinct from the undifferentiated unity of the Universal Soul, conformed with Bruno’s elemental theory and definition of space in relation to Universal Matter (see Section 3). Scripture, as always, supported his view.

Well it is said, too, in Holy Scripture [Ecclesiastes 12:7] that the body dissolves into dust, that is to say, atoms [see again Section 3], and that the spirit returns to its source [God]. (BOL III, 256)

How could an individual soul endowed with human body, one that encouraged the development of its rational and intellectual potential, ensure a prosperous reincarnation? By turning, as many before Bruno had urged, from the world of sense data to the intelligible principles underlying it. From sensibilia the soul composed intelligibilia by virtue of the intelligible light of the Universal Intellect, in which all souls, as indeed all other things to some degree (see Section 5), participated. These intelligibilia were “shadows of the Ideas” rather than the Ideas of the Universal Intellect themselves. The philosopher’s soul yearned to pass beyond these shadows to the Ideas of which the Universal Intellect was the unity and so “attune its thoughts and deeds to the symmetry of the law inscribed in all things” (BOI II, 557). The final step that he could take was to understand the Ideas, not discretely, but as a unity. He came, in other words, to understand the Universal Intellect. Given that, following an almost universally accepted principle going back to Aristotle, intellection entailed the identification of the intellectual subject with the object of intellection, the philosopher at this juncture lost his individual intellectual identity. He was taken out of himself and, identified with Nature (in the first of the senses mentioned in Section 5), knew himself as part of the divine presence in the universe. Beyond this, he could not pass. He could discover God’s “shadow”, an allusion to Corinthians (I 13:12; II 3:18), that is, “the world, the universe and Nature that is in things”, the “monad” that “proceeds from the monad that is divinity”. He could gaze upon this “image of him”, but not his “absolute light” (BOI II, 694–697). God as the One Being, both in his inner and external aspect (see Section 5), remained unknowable. The few who aspired to perfection in this way were “divine”, “heroic”, “rare” men, inspired by “a superior light” (BOI I, 453, 475, 525; II, 595). These aspirations inspired Bruno’s doctrine of “love” in his prose-poem masterpiece, The Heroic Frenzies (Nelson, 1958), and his interpretation of creative genius (BOI II, 528). His art of memory and Llullism, in their theoretical applications, were additional resources in this pursuit of self-fulfillment. By constructing a memory palace that mirrored the hierarchical structure of the intelligible universe, the soul could move from the accidental multiplicity of the universe to the unity of the Universal Intellect and vice versa (Sturlese 1994). With the same purpose in mind, Bruno designed and cut the wood engravings of ontological realities that feature, like proto-Jungian mandala, in several of his works.

a diagram of concentric circles and hexagons

Giordano Bruno, “Figura intellectus”, discussed in Corpus iconographicum. Le incisioni nelle opere a stampa, ed. M. Gabriele, Milan, 2001, pp. 374–379; and reconstructed by Raymond Kotty at

7. Religion

Marsilio Ficino, Giovanni Pico della Mirandola (in one phase of his career) and other Renaissance authors had held similarly “Pelagian” views that philosophy led to self-perfection and “deification”. Yet they had stopped well short of denying the integrity of Christianity. Philosophy and religion were, so to speak, two parallel paths, suited to different audiences. Bruno had no such scruples. Philosophy—Bruno’s philosophy of God as immanent in an infinite universe as announced in The Ash Wednesday Supper—was the true bread of life. It “illuminated the blind”, “loosed the tongue of the dumb”, “cured the lame”, so that the human spirit could once again “progress” (BOI I, 454). Its powers, that is, were miraculous, Christ-like, salvific. By contrast, Christianity was fraudulent. Under a thin veil of irony, all the while denying the irony, Bruno praised the various guises under which Christianity taught that ignorance of the natural world led the soul to God. Among its many deceits were: scriptural injunctions to acknowledge our ignorance, notably, the Pauline theme of folly; the ascetic mysticism of Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite and mystics generally; claims that the light of faith and revelation were superior to human knowledge; Augustine’s emphasis on the fallen nature of mankind, particularly the corruption of knowledge innate to it; injunctions to be childlike and meek; and the humility and obedience that the Christian clergy sought to instill among its flock (BOI II, 381–384, 415, 418, 422–430, 443–448; BOL I.2, 316). The philosopher should ignore these “foolish dreams” (BOL I.3, 200)—in practical as well as in intellectual endeavor. To be virtuous was to strive against adversity, to embody a coincidence of opposites. “Where opposites meet, there is order, there resides virtue” (BOI II, 549). Who deserved praise the more: someone who healed a worthless cripple, or a man who liberated his homeland or who reformed, not a mere body, but a mind (BOI II, 264–267)? In other words, who was the true savior: Christ or Bruno?

Simultaneously, with the same indignation that Spinoza and Nietzsche would later voice, Bruno impugned the clerical caste. Living parasitically off the labors of others and affecting “a foul-smelling melancholy”, i.e., accidia (BOL II.2,189–190; BOI II, 238–239), they advocated the solitary life and renunciation of this world for the next. Such men had extinguished the divine light that had made the souls of the ancients “heroic and divine”, those very men whom they condemned for their pride (BOI I, 453). If we followed the counsel of these clerics, we would have no temples, no chapels, no hospices, no hospitals, no colleges, no universities (BOI II, 238, 267). Of all peoples, the ancient Romans had best understood the value of “glory” for establishing and maintaining civilization. A true religion, like that of the ancients, extolled men of action, strength of body and mind and worldly glory (BOI II, 267–268). Similar comments on clerical duplicity, glory and religion occur in Machiavelli, whose works Bruno probably read.

Nevertheless, religion had a role to play. The “uneducated populace” (BOI I, 525; II, 514–515) could not aspire to philosophical perfection. They needed laws and sanctions to keep their conduct in check. Religion, with its promises of reward and punishment in an afterlife, served this purpose. When Moses had led the Israelites from captivity, they were no more than an uneducated rabble. To govern them, he established laws and enforced them with terrifying accounts of an almighty, wrathful God who administered retribution in an afterlife. Scripture, whether Jewish, Islamic or Christian, had been composed with this practical goal in mind (BOI I, 522–528). Admittedly, Bruno conceded, Scripture did sometimes record philosophical truths. Genesis and the Book of Job were conspicuous repositories. This was only to be expected, given that Scripture was a tributary of “the ancient philosophy” (see Section 2). For the most part, however, it simplified. Several passages of Scripture (e.g., Ecclesiastes, 1:5–6; Joshua 10:12–13) implied that the sun circled the motionless earth. This was a simplification made for the benefit of the uneducated. Disquisitions based on a true, heliocentric, interpretation of celestial motion would have, at best, confused them and, at worst, led them, counterproductively, to dismiss Scripture’s tales of divine retribution (BOI I, 522–525).

To claim that Scripture made allowances for the weak understanding of most men and women was conventional. Patristic, Catholic and Protestant theologians acknowledged that Moses had addressed an ignorant, slavish people and that Scripture spoke in a way that the uneducated could understand. All agreed, too, that it focused on moral and spiritual issues and refrained from intricate philosophical arguments. Bruno’s appeal to these positions disguised his heterodoxy. The crucial deviation was his denial of miracles, the most important of all testimonies to the Christian faith. Given that the laws of nature were, essentially, “God in things”, they were inviolable (BOL I.2, 316). Repeatedly Bruno mocked, allusively, the miracles reported in the Old and New Testament, including those performed by Moses and Christ. Christ’s were bagatelle, “sleights of hand” (BOI II, 383). They were no more than natural magic, effects produced by manipulating “occult”, that is, natural, though imperceptible, forces (BOL III, 427). Or, indeed, they may have been the fruits of demonic magic, a comment which implied that Christ had commerce with demons. Christ began to perform miracles, Bruno noted, only “after his struggle with the devil in the desert” (BOL II.2, 181). The allusive style in which Bruno disguised his views only served to accentuate his blasphemies, mixing as they did ridicule and contempt with heresy. Handwritten annotations in copies of his works show that contemporaries or near contemporaries recognized his intentions easily enough.

Philosophers, “heroes”, did not need Scripture’s bogus threats of retribution and promises of future rewards to cajole them into behaving morally. They understood the “pattern” (istoria) of Nature inscribed within [them]’ (BOI II, 24–25), that God, in other words, was with and within them (BOI I, 455–456; II, 658), and governed their actions accordingly. Those who considered the matter carefully, “truly religious men”, “men who were good by nature”, would see that Bruno’s philosophy, more than any other, “not only contained the truth but also favoured religion” (BOI I, 528). They did not need rituals involving some “food and drink” to revere the divine (BOL I.1, 205). On diverse occasions, he covertly mocked the eucharist, despising as he did the “subtleties” of scholastic accounts of transubstantiation (Spampanato 1933, 40). Instead, it was the majesty of Nature, the infinite animate universe, that inspired the wonder and reverence of truly divine men and led them to search for its cause (see Section 5). In so doing they became themselves “greater than those gods whom blind commoners worship” (BOI II, 24). Stripped, in short, of its false claims, Christianity could be seen for what it was, a “foolish faith and blind credulity” (BOI II, 386, 398), “a wretched story” (BOL I.2, 172), “a worthless, pernicious fable” (BOI II, 400), a continuation of Judaism, a religion invented by that “pestilent, leprous and wholly pernicious” race, the Jews (BOI II, 314–315; for similar stereotypical anti-Jewish comments, see Section 2 and the caveat there regarding the extent to which they reflect Bruno’s views). With its threats that the world would end and its stories of a God who wrought miracles at whim, it had cowed a “stupefied” world into despising Nature—“God in things”—and, “having smashed the tables of Nature” (cf. Exodus, 32:19), looked forward joyfully to the ruin of all things (BOL I.2 123).

Bruno’s several clashes with ecclesiastical authorities testify to his impatience with Christianity of whatever shade. The sectarian violence that plagued the sixteenth century plainly showed that it had done the very opposite of what religion should do, “bind” men and women together, an allusion to an etymological derivation of the Latin word religio from religo, “I bind”, commonly invoked by Latin authors of all periods (BOL II.2, 181). There are, however, many indications that Bruno found Protestantism the more irksome variant. Above all Protestants’ denial of the efficacy of “good works” and free will and, conversely, their emphasis on the inner spirit, predestination and justification through “faith alone”, were unconducive to civil order, political stability and material prosperity. At several points Bruno’s turn of phrase suggests that his attack on Protestant theology was directed in the first instance against Luther’s On the Bondage of the Will (1525) and that, in formulating his riposte, he drew on Erasmus’s On Free Will (1524), the work that had prompted Luther to write his treatise in the first place.

8. Bruno’s Afterlife

Bruno’s philosophy, his views on religion and his execution earned him notoriety. “It is reasonable to denounce Bruno”, wrote the French mathematician, philosopher and theologian Marin Mersenne (1588–1648), “as one of the most evil men that the earth has ever borne” (Mersenne 1624 [2005, 173]). What perturbed Mersenne and many others, including Descartes, was not so much Bruno’s doctrines concerning the earth’s mobility, the elemental homogeneity of the universe, the plurality of worlds and other cosmological innovations, but rather the underlying doctrine of the World Soul and its perceived corollaries: pantheism, demonology, magic, metempsychosis, the claim that God’s absolute power necessitated an infinite product, the essential identity of human, plant and animal souls, the elimination of individual responsibility, denial of miracles—in short, “atheism”.

Demonizing Bruno lent him, however, a certain fascination. To his dismay, Mersenne observed that some of his compatriots amused themselves by reading his On the Cause, the Principle and the One. During the course of the seventeenth century, his ideas continued to appeal to libertines, Rosicrucians and other unorthodox thinkers, despite, or perhaps because of, the censures of conventional theologians and philosophers. In his Oculus sidereus (Starry Gaze), published at Danzig in 1644, the Rosicrucian Abraham von Franckenberg (1593–1652), a pupil of Jacob Böhme, included a synopsis, the first to be printed, of De immenso (originally published in 1591) relating its ideas to those of ancient and Renaissance authors. Bruno’s space, wrote Franckenberg, was the Kabbalists’ “God as space”, their Ensoph, the first of the ten Sephiroth (Ricci 1990, 137–152). In England and on the Continent, John Toland championed Bruno’s philosophy, incurring the disapproval of Leibniz and others. Leibniz’s early enthusiasm for Bruno had worn off; and the striking similarities between aspects of Leibniz’s monadology and Bruno’s doctrine of minims are probably attributable to the sources and philosophical interests that they shared in common, rather than direct influence (Brown 2002). Among the seventeenth-century champions of heliocentricism, Johannes Kepler, averse though he was to Bruno’s suggestion that the universe was infinite and his apparent conflation of God and matter, engaged circumspectly with his cosmological ideas on several occasions, particularly through the intermediary of the Imperial Counsellor to Rudolph II, Wacker von Wackenfels, an enthusiast of Bruno’s cosmology (Ricci 1990, 68–79; Granada 2008). In private conversation, Kepler, the newly appointed Imperial Mathematician, chided Galileo for not having acknowledged the contribution that others, including Bruno and himself, had made to the novelties recorded in his Starry Messenger, published in 1610 (Hasdale 1610).

Interest in Bruno’s philosophy remained, nevertheless, sporadic. Copies of his works were hard to come by and, for the most part, the ideas in them remained curiosities, outlined in encyclopedias and histories of philosophy, such as those of Pierre Bayle and J. J. Brucker, with cautionary remarks about his extravagant, wayward, genius. More than any other philosopher, Bruno proved “that often the greater the power of intellect, the less judgement there is” (Brucker 1776–77: IV.2, 30). “Gold” there was to be discovered, but it lay concealed within the “dung” of his confused thinking (ibid., 31). What changed Bruno’s fortunes decisively was the advent of “Spinozism”. The similarities between Bruno’s and Spinoza’s substance monism had long been noticed. Bayle, no admirer of Spinoza, pointed them out, as did Mathurin Veyssière de Lacroze by way of denigrating Bruno as an “atheist” (Veyssière de Lacroz 1711, 284–325). Brucker conceded that there were some resemblances but concluded that Bruno did not merit the charge of “Spinozism” (ibid., 52), arguing that, for Bruno, the universe emanated from, rather than was identical with, God (see Section 5). Then, spectacularly, in the second half the eighteenth century Bruno passed from being a heinous atheist to, in Herder’s estimation, someone comparable to, indeed “undoubtedly still more divine” than St John (McFarland 1969, 77). The key moment was the publication in 1785 of F. H. Jacobi’s On the Doctrine of Spinoza in Letters to Herr Moses Mendelssohn, in which Jacobi, without Mendelssohn’s consent, published an exchange of letters between them concerning Lessing’s alleged “Spinozism” and Spinoza’s philosophy more generally. Jacobi, an opponent of Enlightenment rationalism, praised Spinoza’s philosophy, in the “purified” form proposed by some exponents, as an exemplary manifestation of what pure reason, left to its own devices, could achieve. Equally, however, it manifested the limitations of reason, more specifically rational theism. It led essentially to materialism, fatalism and atheism. In 1789, Jacobi issued an expanded edition of his work, which included, in a new preface, a brief discussion of Bruno and his monism and, in an appendix, a German paraphrase of On the Cause, the Principle and the One together with an extended quotation from the second dialogue in the original Italian. His purpose in combining Spinoza and Bruno was to provide “a summa of the philosophy of the ἓν καὶ πάν”, a reference to Lessing’s “pantheist” theology as well as an allusion to Heraclitus’s monism. “It was difficult to give a purer or better explained summary of pantheism” than that provided by this “dark man”, Giordano Bruno (Jacobi 1789, IX, XI).

In the ensuing intellectual uproar, the Pantheismusstreit (“Pantheism controversy”) that dominated late eighteenth- and early nineteenth-century German philosophy, Bruno emerged as the great precursor of Spinoza and a major philosopher in his own right. Spinoza and Spinozists had followed in Bruno’s footsteps, concluded F. W. J. Schelling, who thereupon wrote a dialogue, Bruno or On the Divine and Natural Principle of Things (1802), setting out a Platonized form of Spinozism. Goethe, writing to Schiller, while expressing reservations, confided that what he understood or thought he understood of the dialogue was in tune with his “innermost convictions” (McFarland 1969, 247). Many others concurred, among them Hegel, who, in his Lectures on the History of Philosophy (1827–28), praised Bruno’s writings, fantastic and confused though they might be, for displaying “a sense of indwelling spirit”. Coleridge was a steadfast admirer, even in later life, when his philosophical and religious views were less consonant with Bruno’s. “This man”, he wrote in 1819, “though a pantheist, was religious” (Gatti 2011, 203). This new found enthusiasm led to the publication of editions of Bruno’s Italian and Latin works in Germany by Adolph Wagner (1830) and August Friedrich Gfrörer (1836) respectively, the first editions of his works in their original languages since the mid-seventeenth century.

This European revival was the setting for Bruno’s rehabilitation in Italy. Hegel, Michelet and others had portrayed the period that we now know, thanks to Michelet, as the Renaissance and Reformation as the birthplace of modernity. This was manifest above all, though not exclusively, through the artistic, literary and philosophical achievements of the period, which had broken the Roman Catholic Church’s dominance in spiritual and cultural concerns. For many, the most conspicuous being Jacob Burckhardt in The Civilization of the Renaissance in Italy (1860), the honor for this rupture belonged principally to the Italians, “the first born among the sons of modern Europe” (pt 2, ch. 1). Sentiments of these kinds were welcome in Italy. Pride in its cultural achievements fed into the crescendo of nationalist fervour—the “Risorgimento”, leading eventually to the proclamation of Italy as an independent kingdom in 1861—and mounting hostility in some circles towards the Roman Catholic Church. The Church had been blamed for the peninsula’s political fragmentation and intellectual atrophy ever since the Counter-Reformation.

Circumstances could scarcely have been more propitious for heterodox Renaissance thinkers such as Telesio, Campanella, Galileo Galilei and, above all, Bruno. For many Italians, his philosophy, heroic defiance of ecclesiastical authority and execution exemplified the long struggle to free philosophy from the trammels of revealed religion. Popular versions of Bruno’s life and death likened him to Socrates, Christ or, nearer home, martyrs of the Risorgimento. This adulation found its most visible expression in the monumental bronze statue, designed by the sculptor Ettore Ferrari, a mason and later Grand Master of the masonic lodge, the Grande Oriente d’Italia, located in Rome. In 1889, in the face of tooth-and-nail opposition from the Vatican, the statue was erected, glaring directly towards the Holy See, on the very spot in the Campo dei Fiori where Bruno was believed to have been burned at the stake. For nineteenth-century Italian intellectuals such as Vincenzo Gioberti, Bertrando Spaventa and Francesco Fiorentino, he was, as he had been for Enlightenment thinkers, a “Spinozist” in many respects or more broadly, a secular humanist, someone who had liberated the human spirit from the suffocating confines of religious orthodoxy and paved the way for modern philosophy and natural science. Catholic apologists rose to the Church’s defence, belittling this “Brunomania”, as they dubbed it, and on occasion denying that Bruno had been executed. Amid the turmoil, Bertrando Spaventa, Felice Tocco, Francesco Fiorentino and other Italian scholars produced critical editions of Bruno’s Latin and Italian works or wrote studies on them, thereby laying the foundations of modern Bruno scholarship and appreciation of him as a philosopher. During the twentieth century Bruno enjoyed a reputation among orthodox historians of the Soviet Union as the first modern genius of a materialist philosophy; those who, like Lev Karsavin, presented a philosophically and historically contextualized interpretation of his thought, were persecuted for their “bourgeiois” views. Comparatively recent attempts to establish magic or mnemotechnics as the key to his philosophy such as those of Frances Yates, valuable though they remain for incidental details and insights, obscure Bruno’s stated intention to articulate a “new philosophy”, tout court.


Primary sources

Works by Bruno

The two abbreviations used in this entry, BOL and BOI, are defined below. The page numbers in BOL are indicated in the margins of many later editions and translations. Roman numbers following the abbreviations indicate volume numbers; an Arabic numeral immediately after a Roman numeral and full stop indicates a separately paginated part of a volume. Hence “BOL II.3, 213” designates Bruno, Opera latine scripta, volume II, part 3, page 213.

Collections of works by Bruno
  • [BOL] Opera latine conscripta, 3 volumes in 8 pts, F. Fiorentino, F. Tocco, G. Vitelli, and others (eds.), Naples and Florence, 1879–91. (Reprinted, Stuttgart, 1961–62.)
  • Oeuvres complètes, 7 volumes, G. Aquilecchia (ed.), Italian texts; with French translations and commentaries by various authors, Paris, 1993–99. (Corrected editions, 2003–.)
  • [BOI] Opere italiane, 2 volumes, G. Aquilecchia (ed.) Italian texts; introduction by N. Ordine, with commentaries by various authors, Turin, 2002.
  • Opere magiche, S. Bassi, E. Scapparone, and N. Tirinnanzi (eds.), Latin texts with Italian translations, introduction by M. Ciliberto, Milan, 2000.
  • Opere mnemotecniche, 2 volumes, M. Matteoli, R. Sturlese, and N. Tirinnanzi (eds.), Latin texts with Italian translations, introduction by N. Tirinnanzi, Milan, 2004–09.
  • Werke, 7 volumes, T. Leinkauf (general editor), Hamburg, 2007–18; G. Aquilecchia (ed.), Italian texts; with German translations and detailed commentaries by various authors.
Individual Works by Bruno

The website La biblioteca ideale di Giordano Bruno. Le opere e le fonti (in the Other Internet Resources section below),includes lists of Bruno’s Italian and Latin works, with links to the texts.

English translations of Bruno’s works
  • 1950, On the Infinite Universe and Worlds, in Dorothea Waley Singer, Giordano Bruno. His Life and Thought, with an Annotated Translation of his Work On the Infinite Universe and Worlds, New York: H. Schuman. (Translation of De l’infinito, universo e mondi, first published at London in 1584.)
  • 1964, The Expulsion of The Triumphant Beast, translated by Arthur D. Imerti, New Brunswick, NJ: Rutgers University Press. Reprint, Lincoln, NE: University of Nebraska Press, 1992. (Translation of Spaccio de la bestia trionfante, first published at London in 1584.)
  • 1998, Cause, Principle and Unity: and Essays on Magic, translated by Robert de Lucca, with Essays on Magic, translated by Richard J. Blackwell, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. (Translations of De la causa, principio et uno, originally published at London in 1584, and of De magia and De vinculis in genere, both of which were published for the first time in BOL III.)
  • 2002, The Cabala of Pegasus, translated by Sidney L. Sondergard and Madison U. Sowell, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press. (Translation of Cabala del cavallo pegaseo, first published at London in 1585.)
  • 2013, On the Heroic Frenzies. A Translation of De gli eroici furori, Italian text edited by Eugenio Canone, English translation by Ingrid D. Rowland, Toronto: University of Toronto Press. (First published at London in 1585.)
  • 2018, The Ash Wednesday Supper, translated by Hilary Gatti, Toronto: University of Toronto Press. (Translation of La cena de la ceneri, first published at London in 1584.)

New English translations of Bruno’s Italian works are appearing in the Lorenzo Da Ponte Italian Library, a series published by the University of Toronto Press. At the time of writing (August, 2018), the series includes Rowland’s translation of On the Heroic Frenzies and Gatti’s translation of The Ash Wednesday Supper, both as listed above.

Documents relating to Bruno’s life and trial

  • Firpo, Liugi (ed.), 2000, Le procès [de Giordano Bruno], Italian and Latin texts, together with a French translation by A.–P. Segonds, Paris. (Original Italian edition, without Segond’s supplementary notes, Rome, 1993.)
  • Spampanato, Vincenzo, 1933, Documenti della vita di Giordano Bruno, Florence.

Other primary sources

  • Apian, Peter, 1524, Cosmographicus liber, Landshut: Johann Weyssenburger.
  • Aristotle, 1933–35, Metaphysics, Greek text with a translation by Hugh Tredennick, 2 vols, London: Heinemann. (Bruno read the Metaphysics in one or more of the available medieval or Renaissance Latin versions.)
  • –––, 1929–34, The Physics, tr. Philip H. Wicksteed and Francis M. Cornford, 2 vols, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press (Loeb Classical Library).
  • –––, 1937, Parts of Animals, tr. Arthur L. Peck, with Movement of Animals and Progression of Animals, tr. Edward S. Forster, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press (Loeb Classical Library).
  • Brucker, Jakob Johann, 1766–67, Historia critica philosophiae a mundi incunabulis ad nostram usque aetatem deducta, 6 volumes, 2nd edition, Leipzig: Wiedmann and Reichel. (First edition, 1742–44.)
  • Burckhardt, Jakob, 1990, The Civilization of the Renaissance in Italy, translated by S. G. C. Middlemore, introduction by Peter Burke, notes by Peter Murray, London, Penguin Books. (Original German ed.: Die Kultur der Renaissance in Italien, Basel, Schweighauser, 1860.)
  • Copernicus, Nicolaus, 1978, On the Revolutions, translated, with a commentary, by Edward Rosen, London, Macmillan. (Original Latin edition: De revolutionibus orbium coelestium libri VI, Nuremberg, Johann Petreius, 1543; Bruno read either this or the 1566 edition, also published at Nuremberg.)
  • Erasmus, Desiderius, 2013, Free Will, in Discourse on Free Will. Desiderius Erasmus and Martin Luther, translated by Ernst F. Winter, London: Bloomsbury Academic. (Original Latin editions respectively: De Libero Arbitrio διατριβή sive Collatio, first published at Cologne in 1524; and De servo arbitrio, first published at Wittenberg in 1525.)
  • Ficino, Marsilio, 2001–06, Platonic theology, eds J. Hankins and W. Bowen, trans. M. J. B. Allen and J. Warden, 6 vols, Cambridge, Mass, Harvard University Press.
  • Franckenberg, Abraham von, 1644, Oculus sidereus, Gdansk: Georg Rheten.
  • Galilei, Galileo, 1957, Starry Messenger, translated by Stillman Drake, in Discoveries and Opinions of Galileo, together with translations of other works by Galileo Galilei, New York, Doubleday & co. (First edition: Sidereus Nuncius, Venice, T. Baglioni, 1610.)
  • Hasdale, Martin, 1610, [Letter to Galileo Galilei, dated 15 April, 1601], in Galileo Galilei, Le opere, 20 vols in 21 pts, Florence, 1929–39, vol. 10:314–315.
  • Hermes Trismegistus (spurious author), 1992, Pimander, in Hermetica. The Corpus Hermeticum and the Latin Asclepius, with translation, introduction and notes by Brian Copenhaver, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. (The Original Greek texts were composed sometime in Egypt between the late first- and late third-century A.D.. Bruno used: Marsilio Ficino’s Latin translation of the Pimander, published for the first time at Treviso in 1471 and many times thereafter; and a Latin translation of the Asclepius made “before the early fifth but after the early fourth century [A.D.]” [Copenhaver, p. xliii].)
  • Iamblichus, 2004, De mysteriis, Greek text, with an English translation and notes, by Emma C. Clarke, John M. Dillon, and Jackson P. Hershbell, Leiden: Brill. (Composed sometime between 280 and 305 A.D. Bruno used Marsilio Ficino’s paraphrase, published for the first time at Venice in 1497, together with other Neoplatonic treatises, and many times thereafter).
  • Jacobi, Friedrich Heinrich, 1994, On the Doctrine of Spinoza in Letters to Herr Moses Mendelssohn, in Jacobi, Philosophical Writings and the Novel Allwill, translated by George di Giovanni, Montreal and Kingston: McGill-Queen’s University Press. (Original German edition: Ueber die Lehre des Spinoza in Briefen an den Herrn Moses Mendelsohn, Breslau: G. Löwe, 1789.)
  • [KJV] King James Version of the Bible. (Bruno used the Vulgate and perhaps other Latin versions of the Bible.)
  • Lucretius, 1924, De rerum natura [“On the Nature of Things”], with an English translation by W. H. D. Rouse, London: Heinemann (Loeb Classical Library). (Composed in the mid-first century B.C.)
  • Luther, Martin, 2013, The Bondage of the Will; see Erasmus, 2013.
  • Mersenne, Marin, 2005, L’Impiété des déistes, ed. Dominique Descotes, Paris: H. Champion. (Original edition published at Paris in 1624.)
  • Nicholas of Cusa, 1996, The Layman on Mind, in Nicholas of Cusa on Wisdom and Knowledge, translated by Jasper Hopkins, Minneapolis: A. J. Banning Press, (Cusanus completed the original Latin version, Idiota de mente, in 1450. It was first published at Basel in 1565.)
  • Plato, 1929, Timaeus, together with other works by Plato, Greek texts with English translations by Robert G. Bury, London: Heinemann (Loeb Classical Library). (Bruno used Marsilio Ficino’s Latin translation, which was first published in Ficino’s translation of works by Plato, together with his, Ficino’s, commentaries, summaries and other matter related to Plato and the Platonic corpus, at Florence in 1484–85. )
  • Plotinus, 1966–88, [Works], Greek text with an English translation by A. H. Armstrong, 7 vols, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press (Loeb Classical Library). (Bruno used Marsilio Ficino’s Latin translation and commentary, first published at Florence in 1492 and several times thereafter in the sixteenth century.)
  • Schelling, F. W. J., 1984, Bruno, or, On the Natural and the Divine Principle of Things, translated by Michael G. Vater, Albany: State University of New York Press. (Original German edition: Bruno oder über das göttliche und natürliche Prinzip der Dinge, Berlin: J. F. Unger, 1802.)
  • Thomas Aquinas, 1882–, Opera omnia, vol. 1–, Rome: Ex typographia polyglotta S. C. Propaganda Fide, 1882–. (Available online on the Corpus thomisticum website.)
  • –––, 1998, On the Principles of Nature, in J. Bobik, Aquinas on Matter and Form and the Elements. A Translation and Interpretation of the De principiis naturae and the De mixtione elementorum of St. Thomas Aquinas, Notre Dame, Ind., University of Notre Dame Press, 1998. (The original Latin text of On the Principles of Nature was composed c. 1255.)
  • –––, 1963, Commentary on Aristotle’s Physics, translated by Richard J. Blackwell, Richard J. Spath and W. Edmund Thirlkel, New Haven: Yale University Press; reprinted: Notre Dame, Ind.: Dumb Ox Books, 1999. (Latin original, Expositio Libri Physicorum, composed 1268–1270, in Thomas Aquinas, 1884, vol. 2.)
  • –––, 1929–47, Scriptum super libros Sententiarum magistri Petri Lombardi (incomplete), 4 vols, eds Pierre Mandonnet and M. Fabien Moos, Paris: P. Lethielleux. (Composed 1252–1256. No complete English translation is curently available.)
  • Veyssière de Lacroze, Mathurin, 1711, Entretiens sur divers sujets d’histoire, de littérature, de religion et de critique, Cologne.
  • Virgil, 1918–26, [Works, including the Aeneid], Latin texts, with English translations, by H. Ruston Fairclough, 2 vols, London: Heinemann (Loeb Classical Library). (Virgil died in 19 B.C.E., before completing his revision of the Aeneid.)

Secondary Sources

Studies cited in this entry and selected studies

  • Aquilecchia, Giovanni, 1995, “Giordano Bruno in Inghilterra (1583–1585). Documenti e testimonianze”, Bruniana & Campanelliana, 1: 21–42.
  • –––, 2001, Giordano Bruno, Turin. (A revised version of the 1971 edition, also published as an entry to the Dizionario biografico degli italiani, vol. 14, (1972). [Aquilecchia 2001 available on line]. Based on a careful reading of the available documentation and free of the supposition that colours many biographies.)
  • Blum, Paul Richard, 2012, Giordano Bruno. An Introduction, Amsterdam: Rodopi. (Recommended for those unfamiliar with Bruno’s life and works.)
  • Brown, Stuart, 2002, “Monadology and the Reception of Bruno in the Young Leibniz”, in Gatti 2002, 381–404.
  • Canone, Eugenio, and others, 2000, Giordano Bruno 1548–1600. Mostra storico documentaria, Roma, Biblioteca Casanatense, 7 giugno–30 settembre 2000, Florence: L.S. Olschki. (A visual tour of Bruno’s life and works.)
  • Gatti, Hilary (ed.), 2002, Giordano Bruno. Philosopher of the Renaissance, Ashgate: Aldershot, 381–404.
  • Gatti, Hilary, 2011, Essays on Giordano Bruno, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Granada, Miguel Angel, 1990, “L’interpretazione bruniana di Copernico e la Narratio prima di Rheticus, Rinascimento, 30: 343–365.
  • ––– 1994, “Il rifiuto della distinzione fra potentia absoluta e potentia ordinata di Dio e l’affermazione dell’universo infinito in Giordano Bruno”, Rivista di storia della filosofia, 49: 495–532.
  • –––, 2000, “‘Voi siete dissolubili, ma non vi dissolverete’. Il problema della dissoluzione dei mondi in Giordano Bruno”, Paradigmi, 18: 261–289.
  • –––, 2005, La reivindicación de la filosofía en Giordano Bruno. Barcelona: Herder.
  • –––, 2008, “Kepler and Bruno on the Infinity of the Universe and of Solar Systems”, Journal of the History of Astronomy, 39: 469–495.
  • Knox, Dilwyn, 2002, “Bruno's Doctrine of Gravity, Levity and Natural Circular Motion”, Physis, 38: 171–209.
  • –––, 2013. “Bruno: Immanence and Transcendence in De la causa, principio et uno, Dialogue II”, Bruniana & Campanelliana, 19: 463–482.
  • McFarland, Thomas, 1969, Coleridge and the Pantheist Tradition, Oxford: Clarendon.
  • Michel, Paul-Henri, 1962, La Cosmologie de Giordano Bruno, Paris: Hermann. Translated as The Cosmology of Giordano Bruno, R.E.W. Maddison (trans.), Paris: Hermann, 1973.
  • Nadler, Steven, 2016, “Baruch Spinoza”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2016 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.). URL = <>
  • Namer, Emile, 1926, Les Aspects de Dieu dans la philosophie de Giordano Bruno, Paris: F. Alcan.
  • –––, 1968, Giordano Bruno ou l’univers infini comme fondement de la philosophie moderne, Paris: Seghers.
  • Nelson, John Charles, 1958, Renaissance Theory of Love. The Context of Giordano Bruno's Eroici furori. New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Papi, Fulvio, 1968, Antropologia e civiltà nel pensiero di Giordano Bruno, Florence: La Nuova Italia.
  • Ricci, Saverio, 1990, La fortuna del pensiero di Giordano Bruno, 1600–1750, Florence: Le Lettere.
  • –––, 2000, Giordano Bruno nell’Europa del Cinquecento. Rome: Salerno.
  • –––, 2009, Dal Brunus redivivus al Bruno degli italiani. Metamorfosi della nolana filosofia tra sette e ottocento, Rome: Edizioni di storia e letteratura.
  • –––, 2104, “Le procès de Giordano Bruno par l’Inquisition”, Lexicon Philosophicum, 2: 97–125. [Ricci 2014 available online]
  • Rowland, Ingrid D., 2008, Giordano Bruno, Philosopher, Heretic, New York: Farrar, Straus and Giroux. (Recommended for those unfamiliar with Bruno’s life and works.)
  • Spruit, Leen, 1988, Il problema della conoscenza in Giordano Bruno, Naples: Bibliopolis.
  • –––, 1989, “Motivi peripatetici nella gnoseologia bruniana dei dialoghi italiani”, Verifiche, 18: 367–400.
  • Sturlese, Rita, 1994, “Le fonti del Sigillus sigillorum del Bruno, ossia: il confronto con Ficino a Oxford sull’anima humana”, Nouvelles de la République des Lettres, 13: 89–167.
  • Tessicini, Dario, 2007, I dintorni dell’infinito. Giordano Bruno e l’astronomia del Cinquecento, Pisa, Rome: F. Serra. (Valuable for an understanding of what Bruno did and did not know about astronomy.)
  • Védrine, Hélène, 1967, La Conception de la nature chez Giordano Bruno, second edition, Paris: J. Vrin.
  • Yates, Frances A., 1964, Giordano Bruno and the Hermetic Tradition, London: Routledge. (Readable, informative, even if the overall interpretation is flawed.)

Bibliographies (ordered chronologically)

  • Salvestrini, Virgilio, 1958, Bibliografia di Giordano Bruno (1582–1950), second revised edition by Luigi Firpo, Florence: Sansoni.
  • Severini, Maria Elena, 2002, Bibliografia di Giordano Bruno, 1951–2000, Sussidi eruditi, 58, Rome: Edizioni di storia e letteratura.
  • Figorilli, Maria Cristina, 2003, Per una bibliografia di Giordano Bruno, 1800–1999, Paris: Belles lettres.
  • Gatti, Hilary, ‘Giordano Bruno’, first instantiation 2104, regularly updated thereafter, in the Oxford Bibliographies online resource; accessible by subscription only.

Additional Resources

  • Canone, Eugenio, and Ernst, Germana (eds), 1995–, Bruniana & Campanelliana, Pisa, 1–. (A journal dedicated to Bruno and Campanella.)
  • ––– (eds), 2006–, Enciclopedia bruniana & campanelliana, 1–, Pisa, Rome: F. Serra. (Scholarly entries on concepts and persons mentioned by Bruno and Tommaso Campanella.)
  • Ciliberto, Michele (ed.), 2014, Giordano Bruno. Parole, concetti, immagini, 3 volumes, Pisa: Edizioni della Normale. (Contains entries, with bibliographies, on most aspects of Bruno’s thought; especially helpful for authors relating to its reception.)

Other Internet Resources


My thanks to Leen Spruit for his comments on, and corrections to, the pre-publication version of this entry; Dario Tessicini for his advice about Bruno’s cometary theory; Hilary Gatti for her comments on Bruno’s insistence on the importance of the senses and observation; Ovanes Okopyan for the section on Soviet interpretations of Bruno; Valentina Zaffino for her various suggestions; and Ada Bronowski for her suggestion that Lucretius’s simulacra inspired, at least in part, Bruno’s theory that cosmic bodies emitted and absorbed stray particles.

Copyright © 2019 by
Dilwyn Knox <>

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