Supplement to The Normative Status of Logic

Bridge Principle – Surveying the Options

Arguably, the viability of the claim that logical consequence imposes systematic normative constraints upon our belief system hinges on whether there is a defensible bridge principle. But how are we to decide whether a bridge principle is up to the job? One crucial test consists in how a bridge principle fares in the face of the objections presented in §3.1. In addition, MacFarlane (MF2004: 12) advances the following desiderata:

  • The Strictness Test: At least when it comes to ordinary, readily recognizable logical implications leading to conclusions that the agent has reason to consider, there is something amiss about an agent who endorses the premises but fails to believe the conclusion. Such an agent is “not entirely as she ought to be”. The Strictness Test delivers a prima facie strike against reason-based bridge principles. According to such bridge principles, my reasons for being logically coherent may be overridden by other reasons. In such situations I violate Strictness. (MacFarlane’s criterion is inspired by Broome 2000: 85.)
  • The Priority Question: The attitudinal variants have a distinctive advantage when it comes to dealing with Excessive Demands worries. But relativizing one’s logical obligations to, say, one’s logical beliefs or one’s logical knowledge invites problems of its own, according to MacFarlane.[S1] The problem according to MacFarlane is that

    we seek logical knowledge so that we will know how we ought to revise our beliefs: not just how we will be obligated to revise them when we acquire this logical knowledge, but how we are obligated to revise them even now, in our state of ignorance. (MF2004: 12)

    In other words, according to this intuition it is the facts about logical consequence that constrain our doxastic attitudes regardless of whether we are able to recognize them.

  • Logical Obtuseness: Suppose someone professes to believe \(A\) and \(B\), but refuses to take a stand on (neither believes nor disbelieves) the conjunction \(A \land B\). Intuitively, such a person is liable to criticism. Principles with negative polarity allow for breaches of Obtuseness. So long as the agent does not actively disbelieve \(A \land B\), our negative bridge principles find no fault with cases like these. If this intuition carries any weight, negative principles may ultimately prove to be too weak.

As is already becoming apparent, our desiderata are at times in tension with one another. For instance, the Strictness Test favors ought-based principles, whereas Excessive Demands and the Preface Paradox tell against them and hence pull in the opposite direction. As things stand, there can thus be no one bridge principle that satisfies all of them. Consequently, in evaluating our bridge principles against these criteria, we will need to decide on the relative importance of our various desiderata. Each principle will be assessed according to how well it performs when judged against the appropriately weighted desiderata. The principle (or group of principles) that performs best across the board takes the prize. At least this is the route taken by MacFarlane (MF2004) and, with respect to a slightly different set of desiderata, Field (2009a).

Let us take IMP (aka Co+) as our point of departure again. As we have already observed, IMP falls victim both to the No Guidance Objection and the Bootstrapping Objection. A natural reaction in light of these failings is to retreat to the weaker reason operator, thus giving rise to the following two principles (and their various attitudinally constrained counterparts):

  • (Cr+) If \(A_{1}, \dots, A_{n}\models C\), then if \(S\) believes all the \(A_{i}\), \(S\) has (defeasible) reason to believe \(C\).
  • (Cr−) If \(A_{1}, \dots, A_{n}\models C\), then if \(S\) believes all the \(A_{i}\), \(S\) has (defeasible) reason not to disbelieve \(C\).

Though this move does show some initial promise, this group of narrow scope principles does not ultimately succeed either. While, arguably, the (Cr)s are immune to the No Guidance Objection, things look less promising when it comes to Bootstrapping. According to the (Cr)s, believing \(A\) automatically gives rise to a reason to believe \(A\). Many will view this kind of (partial) auto-justification with some suspicion.[S2] What is more, almost by definition, the (Cr)s violate the Strictness Test.

Let us turn to the Bs. The Bs, recall, are characterized by the fact that deontic operators act both on the antecedent and on the consequent of the embedded conditional. But these two deontic operators are generally underwritten by norms stemming from different sources. For simplicity, let us focus on (Bo+) (the discussion to follow generalizes to the remaining Bs). In the embedded conditional “if \(S\) ought to believe all the \(A_{i}\), \(S\) ought to believe \(C\)”, the ought in the antecedent has its source in whatever epistemic norms make it the case that \(S\) ought to believe the \(A_{i}\) (we may assume that the \(A_{i}\) are not themselves acquired by logical inference and so the norms in question will not themselves be logical or logic-induced). It is in virtue of their compliance with this norm that the premises enjoy a positive epistemic status. \(C\)’s positive epistemic status, by contrast, may only be derivative; it may be inherited by dint of \(C\)’s logical relation to the \(A_{i}\). Thus, on this picture the normative force of logical consequence resides in its ability to propagate whatever epistemic goodness the premises might enjoy to their logical consequences. For example, the \(B\)-principle

  • (Bp+) If \(A_{1}, \dots, A_{n}\models C\), then if \(S\) may believe all the \(A_{i}\), then \(S\) may believe \(C\).

could be based on an evidential norm, which might constitute the source of the agent’s permission to believe the \(A_{i}\):

  • (EN)\(S\) may believe \(A\) if only if \(A\) is sufficiently likely in light of the evidence.

Thus, the reason why \(S\) may believe the \(A_{i}\) may be given by (EN): it is because all of the \(A_{i}\) enjoy the necessary evidential support. (Bp+) then states that one may believe the logical consequences of the propositions one is permitted to believe on account of their evidential support.

As a result of this, the Bs, unlike the Cs, are immune to the No Guidance worry as well as to the Bootstrapping Objection. That is not to say, however, that the Bs do not face potential difficulties of their own. The chief drawback, according to MacFarlane, is that the Bs are too weak: “according to the Bs, logical consequence is a channel through which existing norms of belief (obligation, permission, reason) can be extended” (MF2004: 10, the emphasis is the author’s). (Bo+), for instance, says that if you ought to believe the \(A_{i}\), you ought to believe their (joint) entailments. But if it is not the case that you ought to believe the premises, it provides little guidance as to what you should do. And therein lies the source of MacFarlane’s worry:

according to the Bs, then, logic is only normative for those whose beliefs are already in order—that is, for those who believe what they ought to believe (or may believe, or have reason to believe). To the unfortunate others, logical norms simply do not apply. (MF2004: 10)

Now, the Bs do offer some guidance. After all, according to (Bo+), for instance, upon discovering that an unacceptable proposition \(C\) follows from my belief that \(A\), I can immediately conclude that it is not the case that I ought to believe \(A\). Nevertheless, it may be felt that one should be bound by logic even when one has beliefs one ought not to have. That is, it might be thought that it would constitute an additional strike against an agent whose beliefs are not in good order, if he failed to be logically coherent. It is a legitimate question, however, whether logic really is normative in this way. We will return to this question in §5.1.

This brings us to the Ws. The Ws have considerable intuitive upside, which have earned them a number of followers. Broome (2013) appears to go in for a weak attitudinal restriction of (Wo+). Sainsbury (2002) seems to advocate an attitudinal restriction of (Wr−), while Streumer (2007) adopts a version of unrestricted (Wr−). MacFarlane (MF2004) himself settles on a combination of (Wo−) and (Wr+). However, not all of the \(W\)s are contenders. The (Wp)s, for one, are out of contention for being too weak. The (Wp)s imply that I have permission to see to it that if I believe \(A\) and \(B\), I also believe \(A \land B\), but this does not even so much as provide me with a reason to believe the latter when I believe the former. As MacFarlane puts it, “the difference between the (Wp)s and the position that there are no logical norms for belief seems slim indeed” (MF2004: 10). Let us therefore focus on the remaining Ws. For simplicity, let us begin by considering (Wo+):

  • (Wo+) If \(A_{1}, \dots, A_{n}\models C\), then \(S\) ought to (if \(S\) believes all the \(A_{i}\), \(S\) believes \(C\)).

(Wo+) elegantly dodges both the No Guidance and the Bootstrapping Objection. As for the former, the wide-scope reading provides just the wiggle room needed to neutralize Harman’s objection: suppose I believe \(A\) and \(A\supset B\). According to (Wo+), I may meet my logical obligations in one of two ways: by either retaining my beliefs and also coming to believe \(B\), or by ditching at least one of my antecedent beliefs in \(A\) and \(A \supset B\) so as to absolve me from the obligation to believe \(B\). When \(B\) turns out to be untenable, the latter course of action recommends itself: we revise our beliefs in light of their unpalatable consequences. This not only meets Harman’s challenge; it paints an attractive picture of the interplay between logic and other epistemic norms: logic, on the whole, does not require us to have any particular beliefs (except logical truths, perhaps). Rather it prohibits certain constellations of doxastic attitudes. When we reason we must negotiate these global constraints on our system of beliefs with other epistemic norms—local norms that guide us in determining whether a given proposition is to be believed. This element of negotiation is well captured by the wide-scope reading.

Moreover, provided one is willing to accept that deontic modals are best read as propositional operators, (Wo+) is untroubled by Broome’s reflexivity worries. It yields that, for any proposition \(A\) that I happen to believe, I ought to (believe \(A\) or not to believe \(A\)).

Things look less rosy when we consider (Wo+)’s performance with respect to some of the other desiderata. It requires us to have an attitude (namely the attitude of believing) towards any consequence of the beliefs I retain, thus placing Excessive Demands on us. Moving to (Wo−) avoids not only that problem, but also that of Clutter Avoidance. It does not, however, stave off the Preface problem. What is more, as a principle of negative polarity (Wo−) faces the Logical Obtuseness problem.

We could alternatively try our luck with an attitudinal principle. To fix ideas, let us opt for

  • (Wo+b) If \(S\) believes that \(A_{1}, \dots, A_{n}\models C\), then \(S\) ought to (if \(S\) believes all the \(A_{i}\), \(S\) believes \(C\)).

The upside is that (Wo+b) takes care of the problem of Excessive Demands. It does not, however, take care of Clutter Avoidance. At least not as it stands. To fix this, we could further try the following addendum:

  • (Wo+b*) If \(S\) believes that \(A_{1}, \dots, A_{n}\models C\) and \(S\) considers \(C\) or has independent reason to consider \(C\), then \(S\) ought to (if \(S\) believes all the \(A_{i}\), \(S\) believes \(C\)).[S3]

However, even if the amended principle successfully wards off Clutter Avoidance, it remains vulnerable to Preface Paradox-type considerations.

To deal with it, we could weaken our wide scope principle by replacing the strict ought operator by the defeasible reason operator. The thought is that one’s reasons for being logically coherent may be trumped in Preface-like situations. We will return to this point in the next section. Let us note already, however, that such a non-strict principle arguably solves the Excessive Demands problems. To deal with Clutter Avoidance, the principle can be modified along the lines of (Wo+b*), to yield the analogous (Wr+b*). However, as we noted, principles of this type fail to meet the Strictness Test. But perhaps the lesson to be learned just is that the normative force of logic is non-strict. This bitter pill would be considerably sweetened if reason-based principles really did offer a way around the Preface Paradox.

Copyright © 2022 by
Florian Steinberger <>

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