Notes to The Normative Status of Logic

1. To be clear: an argument is valid just in case its conclusion is a logical consequence of its premises.

2. But even if an account of the normative status of logic does not aim to pin down the correct consequence relation, it may still play an important role in settling disputes between advocates of different logics. For instance, Steinberger (2016), following the lead of Fitelson (2008), Harman (1986) and MacFarlane (MF2004), argues that an influential argument for paraconsistent logic is unsuccessful because it relies on a philosophically untenable conception of the normative role of logic in reasoning.

3. Indeed Peter Geach states the truth conditions for “\(p\) entails \(q\)” as “There is an a priori way of getting to know that \(p \supset q\) which is not a way of getting to know either that \(\neg p\) or \(q\)” (Geach 1972 [1958]: 180).

4. Indeed one might take the opposition between monism and pluralism and its ramifications for the question of logic’s normative status as to some extent prefigured in Frege and Carnap’s philosophies of logic (see Steinberger 2017).

5. To say that logic is normative for reasoning, is to say that there is a sense in which the materials of reasoning—doxastic attitudes, inferences, etc.—are normatively evaluable. However, this assumption has been fiercely contested. It has been denied of doxastic attitudes, in particular, that they should qualify as proper subjects of normative appraisal on account of the fact that they are not under the agent’s direct voluntary control, and so are not responsive to reasons in the right kind of way. It would lead too far to pursue this important question here. (See entry on ethics of belief (section 3.3).)

6. See MacFarlane (2000, 2002), Steinberger (2017), Taschek (2008). For a dissenting view especially with respect to Kant having held this view, see Tolley (2006) as well as Conant (1991) and Putnam (1994).

7. See MacFarlane (2000: 52) who attributes this conception of thought to Kant. Note, though, that elsewhere, in the context of discussing Frege’s views, he defines “thinking” more narrowly as “forming beliefs on the basis of other beliefs” (MacFarlane 2002: 35, fn. 16).

8. Different manifestations of thought may of course be answerable to the strictures of logic in different ways. For instance, it may be entirely proper for me to entertain an inconsistent set of propositions in the context of a supposition or as part of an antecedent in a conditional, whereas in other contexts I would be in breach of logical norms. This is not to say that supposing and entertaining antecedents of conditionals are not acts of thinking, but simply that logical norms constrain them differently than other modes of thinking.

9. See Tolley 2006 for a similar example and further illuminating discussion.

10. See again Conant (1991), Putnam (1994) and especially Tolley (2006) for arguments that this view is misascribed to Kant.

11. Similar points are made by Taschek (2008: 384) in the case of thinking and by Williamson (1996: 491) in the case of speaking a language and making assertions. MacFarlane (2002: 37) also emphasizes, in the case of thought, that one need not be aware of the norms to which one is subject. What is required is merely that the agent be “assessable in light of these norms”. MacFarlane’s description of the thesis may thus be less demanding than Taschek’s proposal below.

12. Notice that this difference in methodological approach need not coincide with the internalism/externalism divide. Some externalists are happy to explore “first-personal” epistemology so long as the status of beliefs formed in compliance with the theory’s directives is distinguished from justification conceived as a necessary condition of knowledge. See, e.g., Goldman (1980). On the other hand, there are internalists who do not regard epistemic justification to be a matter of responsibly following precepts (see, e.g., Feldman & Conee 1985).

13. The following principles are roughly those discussed by Harman. Harman’s formulations of IMP differ in the deontic modals they feature (e.g., in his 2002: 172, Harman’s mentions “should” and “may”, in his 1986: 11, he uses “can be a reason for”.

14. Both assumptions can be challenged. On a more course-grained conception of propositions we face Fregean puzzles. For instance, the propositions expressed by “Superman can fly” and “Clark Kent can fly” might be taken to be one and the same. Yet, Lois Lane does not appear to be irrational if she believes that which is expressed by the former sentence, but disbelieves what is expressed by the latter sentence. The second assumption is rejected by advocates of paraconsistent logicians. See, e.g., Priest 2006: Ch. 6 for discussion.

15. Harman also enlists the Liar Paradox as an example of unavoidable inconsistencies of our beliefs (Harman 1986: 16). The case of the Liar introduces additional difficulties that would only obscure the issue at hand. I therefore will make no further mention of it in what follows.

16. We will soon also encounter what I call attitudinal bridge principles. They take the slightly different form:

  • (\(\star \gamma\)) If \(\gamma(A_1,\dots, A_n \models C)\), then \(N(\alpha(A_1), \dots, \alpha(A_n), \beta(C))\).

where \(\gamma\) designates a particular attitude of the agent towards the instance of \(\models\).

17. I will set suspension of belief aside for present purposes.

18. Notice that MacFarlane’s classification only recognizes B-principles in which the deontic operator occurring in the antecedent and the operator occurring in the consequent are identical. MacFarlane’s classificatory scheme might thus be extended by allowing for “mixed” Bs in which the deontic operators featuring in the antecedent and in the consequent of the embedded conditional could be distinct. For example, in addition to (Bo+), we could consider also

  • (Bop+) If \(A_1, \dots, A_n\models B\), then if \(S\) ought to believe all the \(A_i\), \(S\) may believe \(B\).
  • (Bor+) If \(A_1, \dots, A_n\models B\), then if \(S\) ought to believe all the \(A_i\), \(S\) has reason to believe \(B\).

and so on for all the possible combinations. Intuitively, only those mixed principles have any plausibility in which the deontic operator in the consequent is of equal strength or weaker than the operator in the antecedent: It would seem odd, for instance, if my having a reason to believe a proposition, should have the entailment that I ought to believe its logical consequences. Whatever epistemic goodness the premises enjoy may be thought to be inherited by their logical consequences. Epistemic goodness, presumably, can be diminished or, at best, preserved in this way. It would be strange, however, if we, as it were, got more epistemic goodness out of the conclusion than we put into the premises (assuming the logical consequence is a contingent proposition).

19. See MacFarlane (MF2004: 7) for an exhaustive list of all bridge principles that can be generated in this way.

20. See David Christensen (2004) for a lucid discussion of the importance and inevitability of the Preface Paradox. Milne 2009: 285 is a particularly relevant example of a dissenting view.

21. See Boghossian (2003), Gibbard (2003, 2005), Shah (2003), Wedgwood (2002) to name but a few proponents of versions of the truth norm. Others have opted for the closely related knowledge norm to the effect that one ought to have knowledgeable beliefs, e.g., Williamson 2000: 47, 255–56.

22. For example, Easwaran (2015) and Titelbaum (2015) are very clear that it is such evaluative norms of perfect rationality that they are after.

23. One might also consider comparative beliefs. That is, doxastic states which are partially ordered according to relative certainty. The idea goes back at least to Keynes (1921). More recently, it has received renewed attention in Hawthorne (2009) and Fitelson [BFMS]. For reasons of space I do not pursue comparative beliefs further here.

24. This claim is backed by an impressive array of arguments: so-called Dutch-book arguments, representation theorem-based arguments and accuracy-dominance arguments. See entry epistemic utility arguments for probabilism.

25. Though not necessarily. For there are generalizations of probability measures—what Joseph Halpern has called plausibility measures (Halpern 2003)—which satisfy the constraints imposed by Field’s principle, but which are not probabilistic.

Notes to the Supplement “Bridge Principles – Surveying the Options”

S1. The only attitudinal principles MacFarlane (MF2004) considers are factive ones.

S2. Arguably, this is a feature of what Harman (2002) has dubbed general foundations theories in epistemology. Such theories promote what we might call an innocent-until-proven-guilty policy concerning belief maintenance. The approach amounts to a type of conservatism about belief: An agent’s belief set enjoys a kind of default justification until she encounters sufficiently strong countervailing evidence. On such views, then, it seems proper to say, at first blush at least, that I do have reason to believe any proposition I in fact believe. I have reason to stick to my beliefs unless and until I am presented with sufficiently strong grounds for abandoning them. It may well be that the best case for the (Cr)s can be made in the context of such theories.

S3. Notice that it would not be enough merely to add the clause “and \(S\) takes an attitude towards \(C\)” because there may be cases in which an agent fails to take an attitude to a logical consequences she has good reason to consider. For example, I might, out of intellectual dishonesty, fail to take into account a damning consequence of my philosophical position of which I am otherwise aware.

Copyright © 2022 by
Florian Steinberger <>

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