The Normative Status of Logic

First published Thu Dec 22, 2016; substantive revision Tue Oct 4, 2022

We consider it to be a bad thing to be inconsistent. Similarly, we criticize others for failing to appreciate (at least the more obvious) logical consequences of their beliefs. In both cases there is a failure to conform one’s attitudes to logical strictures. We generally take agents who fall short of the demands of logic to be rationally defective. This suggests that logic has a normative role to play in our rational economy; it instructs us how we ought or ought not to think or reason. The notion that logic has such a normative role to play is deeply anchored in the way we traditionally think about and teach logic. To consider just two examples, Kant characterizes what he calls “pure general” logic as embodying the “absolutely necessary rules of thought without which there can be no employment whatsoever of the understanding” (A52/B76), which instruct us not “how the understanding is and thinks” but “how it ought to proceed” (Kant 1974 [1800]: 16). Similarly, Frege, in his vehement opposition to the psychologistic tendencies of his time, classifies logic, “like ethics” as a “normative science” (Frege 1897/1979: 228), one whose laws “prescribe universally how one should think if one is to think at all” (Frege 1893/1903/2009: xv). This entry is concerned with the question as to whether the tradition and the intuitions that appear to underwrite it are correct. In other words, it is concerned with the question as to whether logic has normative authority over us. And if it does, in what sense exactly it can be said to do so?

1. The normative status of what?

Before we can hope to make any headway with these questions a number of clarifications are in order. First and foremost, in asking after the normative status of logic, we had better get clearer on what we mean by “logic”. For present purposes, I will take a logic to be a specification of a relation of logical consequence on a set of truth-bearers. Moreover, I will assume consequence relations to necessarily preserve truth in virtue of logical form. For simplicity, I will use “\(\models\)” to denote such a consequence relation. My default assumption will be to take the double turnstile to denote the semantic consequence relation of the classical first-order predicate calculus. But not much hangs on this. Partisans of other types of non-classical consequence relations may read “\(\models\)” as referring to their preferred consequence relation.

Presumably, if logic is normative for thinking or reasoning, its normative force will stem, at least in part, from the fact that truth bearers which act as the relata of our consequence relation and the bearers of other logical properties are identical to (or at least are very closely related in some other way) to the objects of thinking or reasoning: the contents of one’s mental states or acts such as the content of one’s beliefs or inferences, for example. For present purposes I will assume the identity between truth-bearers and the contents of our attitudes, and I will assume them to be propositions.

1.1 Characterizing logical consequence in terms of its normative role

One may approach the question of the normativity of logic by taking the notions of logical consequence and of validity to be settled and to then investigate how these (and perhaps related) notions constrain our attitudes towards the propositions standing in various logical relations to one another.[1] An alternative approach has it that logic’s normative role in thinking or reasoning may be partly definitive of what logic is. Hartry Field, for one, advances an account of validity along the latter lines. In his 2015, he argues that neither the standard model- or proof-theoretic accounts of validity nor the notion of necessary truth-preservation in virtue of logical form succeed in capturing the notion of validity. More specifically, neither of these approaches is capable of capturing the notion of validity in a way that does justice to logical disputes, i.e., debates over which logical system is the correct one. On the standard approaches to validity, such disputes are reduced to merely verbal disputes inasmuch as “validity” is defined relative to the system of logic in question. No one, of course, ever disputed that a given classical argument form is valid relative to the notion of validity-in-classical logic, where as an intuitionistically valid argument is valid relative to the notion of validity-in-intuitionistic logic. The problem is that there is no neutral notion of validity one could appeal to that would enable one to make sense of logical disputes as genuine debates, which, arguably, they are. What is needed to capture the substantive nature of these disputes, therefore, is a workable non-partisan notion of validity, one that is not internal to any particular system of logic. The key to availing ourselves of such an ecumenical notion of validity, Field claims, resides in its conceptual role. The conceptual role of the notion of validity, in turn, is identified with the way in which a valid argument normatively constrains an agent’s doxastic attitudes. Roughly, in the case of full belief, in accepting an argument as valid, the agent is bound by the norm that she ought not believe the argument’s premises while at the same time not believing its conclusion. In other words, validity’s conceptual role resides (at least in part) in the normative role played by valid arguments in reasoning. Note that Field is not proposing to define validity in terms of its normative role. The notion of validity, Field contends, is best taken to be primitive. But even once we take it to be primitive, it still stands in need of clarification. It is this clarificatory work that is done by a characterization of validity’s conceptual role. And it is in this sense that the normative role of logic is supposed to characterize the very nature of validity (understood as a notion shared by various distinct logics).

In a similar vein, John MacFarlane (2004, Other Internet Resources; henceforth cited as MF2004) contends that a fuller understanding of how logical consequence normatively constrains reasoning may help us settle long-standing issues in the philosophy of logic, debates surrounding the very nature of validity. Attempts at resolving such questions have been thwarted because of their suspect methodology: they relied on the unreliable (because theory-laden) testimony of our intuitions about validity. Appealing to the normative role of logic, MacFarlane hopes, would give us a new angle of attack and hence a potentially better handle on these vexed questions. MacFarlane, too, may therefore be read as suggesting that a proper account of logic’s normative role in reasoning will ultimately enable us to hone in on the correct conception of logical consequence. As examples MacFarlane considers the dispute between advocates of relevantist restrictions of the notion validity and those who reject such restrictions (see entry relevance logic), and the question of the formality of logical validity (see entry logical consequence). The hope, in other words, is that an account of the normative role of logic, will help us pin down the correct concept of validity. In this respect, then, MacFarlane’s project may be thought to be more ambitious than Field’s whose aim is to provide a logic-neutral core concept of validity in terms of its normative role. For MacFarlane a correct account of the normativity of logic would constitute a potential avenue through which logical disputes may be decided; for Field such an account merely renders such disputes intelligible and so serves as a starting point for their resolution.[2]

A potential problem with approaches like Field’s and MacFarlane’s is that logical consequence does not appear to have a unique normative profile that sets it apart from other, non-logical consequence relations. For instance, that one ought not believe each member of a set of premises while at the same time not believing (or disbelieving) its conclusion, is a feature that logical consequence seems to share with strict implication. At least in one sense of “ought”, I ought to believe that this is colored, if I believe it to be red, just as much as I ought to believe \(A\), if I believe \(A \land B\). If the general principles characterizing logic’s normative role fail to discriminate logical consequence among other types of consequence, we cannot identify the conceptual role of validity with its normative role as Field proposes. We cannot do so, at least, unless we impose further conditions to demarcate properly logical consequence (see entry logical constants). The problem discussed here was raised (albeit in a different context) by Harman (1986: 17–20) when he argues that logic is not “specially relevant to reasoning”. One response, of course, is simply to concede the point and so to simply broaden the scope of the inquiry: Instead of asking how logic (narrowly construed) normatively constrains us, we might ask how strict implication (Streumer 2007) or perhaps a priori implication does.[3] A further response is that neither Field nor MacFarlane are committed to demarcating logic or carving out any “special” role for it. Their principles are left-to-right conditionals: the existence of a logical entailment gives rise to a normative constraint on doxastic attitudes. One can thus question the operative notion of entailment by questioning the normative constraint. This, it might reasonably be maintained, is all that Field and MacFarlane need for their purposes.

1.2 Logical pluralism

We said that not much of our discussion below hinges on the choice of one’s logic. However, while we countenanced the possibility of disagreement over which logic is correct, we have simply presupposed that there must be a unique correct logic. And this latter assumption does seem to bear on our question in potentially significant ways. The issue has yet to be explored more fully. Here I offer a number of preliminary distinctions and observations.

Logical pluralists maintain that there is more than one correct logic (see entry on logical pluralism). Now, there are perfectly uncontroversial senses in which several distinct logical systems might be thought to be equally legitimate: different logical formalisms might lend themselves more or less well to different applications, e.g., classical propositional logic may be used to model electric circuits, the Lambek calculus naturally models phrase structure grammars, and so forth. If “correct” or “legitimate” is merely understood as “having a useful application”, monists should have no complaints about such anodyne forms of “pluralism”. The monist may happily admit that there is a vast number of systems of logic that make for worthy objects of study, many of which will have useful applications. What monists must have in mind, then, is a more demanding sense of “correctness”. According to Priest, the monist takes there to be, over and above questions of local applicability, a core or “canonical” (Priest 2006: 196) application of logic. The canonical use of logic consists in determining “what follows from what—what premises support what conclusion—and why” (idem). It is only when the question is framed in these terms, that the full force of the opposition between monists and pluralists can be appreciated. The monist maintains that there is but one logic fit to play this core role; the pluralist insists that several logics have an equally good claim to playing it.

One consequence of pluralism, then, is that in a dispute between advocates of different logics both of which lay claim to being the correct logic in this sense—say, a dispute between a classical logician and an advocate of intuitionistic logic—neither party to the dispute needs to be at fault. Each logic may be equally legitimate. For this to be possible, it must be the case that even the canonical application of logic can be realized in multiple ways. Pluralists differ in the accounts they offer of this multiple realizability. One influential such account has been advanced by J.C. Beall and Greg Restall (2005). According to their account, several logics may be equally qualified to fulfill the core function of logic, because “logical consequence” admits of several distinct interpretations (within a specified range). Roughly, \(A\) is a logical consequence of a set of formulas \(\Gamma\) if and only if, in every case in which all of the members of \(\Gamma\) are true, so is \(A\). Depending on how we understand “case” in our definition—e.g., as Tarskian models (classical logic), stages (intuitionistic logic), situations (relevant logic), etc.—we arrive at different concepts of logical consequence.

What does this mean for the question of logic’s normative status? It follows that it is only once we choose to disambiguate “logical consequence” in a particular way—as classical or intuitionistic, say—that the normative import of that particular conception of consequence makes itself felt. After all, on the pluralist picture a given conception of consequence cannot be normatively binding in virtue of being (uniquely) correct, i.e., in virtue of being descriptively adequate with respect to the entailment facts, as it were. Hence, if I opt for an intuitionistic conception of consequence and you go in for a classical one, I have no grounds for criticizing your move from, say, \(\neg \neg A\) to \(A\), save perhaps pragmatic ones. To be sure, such a move would be impermissible according to my preferred notion of consequence, but it is perfectly acceptable according to yours. According to the pluralist, then, there exists no absolute sense, but only system-relative senses, in which a logic can normatively bind us. Pluralism about logic thus seems to give rise to pluralism about logical normativity: If there are several equally legitimate consequence relations, there are also several equally legitimate sets of logical norms. Consequently, it is hard to see prima facie how substantive normative conflicts can arise. If the consequence relations of classical and intuitionistic logic are equally legitimate, there is little to disagree about when it comes to the norms they induce. The classicist and the intuitionist simply have opted to play by different rules.

This line of thought leads to a potential worry, however. For logical norms do not merely bind us in the way that the rules of a game bind us. I hold myself to be answerable to the rules governing a game (of chess, say) so long as I wish to participate in it. However, the normativity of logic does not seem to be optional in the same way. The norms of logic are themselves responsible to our broader epistemic aims (and would thus need to be coordinated with other epistemic norms). Hence, if my epistemic aim is, say, acquiring true beliefs (and avoiding false ones), this may give me a reason to prefer one set of logical norms over another. For imagine I could choose either of two logics \(L_{1}\) and \(L_{2}\). Suppose, moreover, that \(A\) is true and that \(A \models_{L_{1}} B\) but \(A \not \models_{L_{2}} B\), for some relevant proposition \(B\). Even according to Beall and Restall, not all logics are equal. To pass muster, a logic must satisfy certain core conditions. In particular, it must be truth-preserving. Assuming that both \(L_{1}\) and \(L_{2}\) are truth-preserving, it follows that \(B\) is true. But then it would seem that there is a clear sense in which \(L_{1}\) outperforms \(L_{2}\) in terms of the guidance it affords us. According to the norms \(L_{2}\) gives rise to, there is presumably nothing amiss about an agent who believes \(A\) but not \(B\); according to \(L_{1}\) there presumably is. Hence, \(L_{1}\) is more conducive to our epistemic aims. It follows that whenever two putatively equally correct logics, \(L_{1}\) and \(L_{2}\) are such that \(L_{2}\) is a proper sub-system of \(L_{1}\), one would appear to have reason to opt for \(L_{1}\) since it is more conducive to one’s aim of having true beliefs. In cases where we are dealing with two logics \(L_{1}\) and \(L_{2}\) such that \(\models_{L_{1}}\) and \(\models_{L_{2}}\) are not sub-relations of one another, things may be more complicated. All the same, even in such cases, it may well be that our overarching epistemic aims and norms give us reason to prefer one logic over another, and hence that from the standpoint of these epistemic aims, the logics are not equally good after all. The aim of these considerations is not to undermine forms of logical pluralism like the one advanced by Beall and Restall, but merely to point out that once we take the normative dimension of logic into account, we must also reckon with the broader epistemic goals, which the norms of logic may be thought to be subservient to.

Field (2009b) argues for a different form of logical pluralism, one which leaves more room for normative conflict. Logical pluralism is not, for Field, the result of ambiguity in our notion of logical consequence. Rather, it has its source in non-factualism of epistemic norms. His non-factualism, in turn, is fueled partly by general concerns, partly by the nature of how we choose such norms. Among the general concerns Field (2009c) mentions are Hume-style worries about the impossibility of integrating irreducible normative facts into a naturalistic world view, Benacerraf-style worries about our ability to gain epistemic access to such facts, and Mackie-style worries about the “queerness” of such facts (i.e., that they not only appear to have no room within our scientific picture of the world, but that, furthermore, they are supposed to have a somewhat mysterious motivational pull to them). The latter issue of norm selection amounts to this. Given a set of epistemic goals, we evaluate candidate norms as better or worse depending how well they promote those goals. According to Field, we have no reason to assume that there should be a fact of the matter as to which choice of logic is the uniquely correct one; there will typically not be a unique system that best optimizes our (often competing) constraints.

That being said, it seems that we can sensibly engage in rational debates over which logic to adopt in the light of various issues (vagueness, the semantic paradoxes, etc.). Consequently, there is a clear sense in which normative conflicts do arise. Now, since Field takes it to be an essential component of the notion of logical consequence that it should induce norms (Field 2009a,b, 2015), we choose a logic by finding out which logical norms it makes most sense for us to adopt. But because Field does not take there to be a fact of the matter as to which set of norms is correct and since the question as to which of the norms best promotes our epistemic ends is often underdetermined, we may expect there to be several candidate sets of logical norms all of which are equally well-motivated. We are thus left with a (more modest) form of logical pluralism on our hands.

What both of these types of pluralism have in common from the point of view of the question of the normativity of logic, though, is their rejection of the view that logical norms might impose themselves upon us simply as a result of the correctness of the corresponding logical principles. As such, pluralist views stand diametrically opposed to realist forms of monism such as the one championed by Gila Sher (2011). According to Sher, logical principles are grounded, ultimately, in “formal laws” and so in reality. It is these formal laws that ultimately also ground the corresponding logical norms.[4]

2. Normative for what?

Next let us ask what it is that logic is normative for, if indeed it is normative. The paradigmatic objects of normative appraisal are actions, behaviors or practices. What, then, is the activity or practice that logical norms apply to?

2.1 Logic as normative for reasoning

One response—perhaps the most common one—is that logic sets forth norms for (theoretical) reasoning. Unlike thinking, which might consist merely of disconnected sequences of conceptual activity, reasoning is presumably a connected, usually goal-directed, process by which we form, reinstate or revise doxastic attitudes (and perhaps other types of states) through inference. Consider the following two examples of how logic might give rise to norms. First, suppose I am trying to find Ann and that I can be sure that Ann is either in the museum or at the concert. I am now reliably informed that she is not in the museum. Using logic, I conclude that Ann is at the concert. Thus, by inferring in conformity with the valid (by the standards of classical logic) logical principle of disjunctive syllogism, I have arrived at a true belief about Ann’s whereabouts. Second, if I believe that Ann is either at the concert or the museum, while at the same time disbelieving both of the disjuncts, it would seem that there is a tension in my belief set, which I have reason to rectify by revising my beliefs appropriately. Logic may thus be thought to normatively constrain the ways we form and revise doxastic attitudes. And it does so, presumably, in our everyday cognitive lives (as in our example), as well as in the context of more self-conscious forms of theoretical inquiry, as in mathematics, the sciences, law, philosophy and so on, where its normative grip on us would seem to be even tighter.[5]

2.2 Logic as constitutively normative for thought

Other philosophers have taken the normativity of logic to kick in at an even more fundamental level. According to them, the normative force of logic does not merely constrain reasoning, it applies to all thinking. The thesis deserves our attention both because of its historical interest—it has been attributed in various ways to Kant, Frege and Carnap[6]—and because of its connections to contemporary views in epistemology and the philosophy of mind (see Cherniak 1986: §2.5; Goldman 1986: Ch. 13; Milne 2009; as well as the references below).

To get a better handle on the thesis in question, let us agree to understand “thought” broadly as conceptual activity.[7] Judging, believing, inferring, for example, are all instances of thinking in this sense. It may seem puzzling at first how logic is to get a normative grip on thinking: Why merely by engaging in conceptual activity should one automatically be answerable to the strictures of logic?[8] After all, at least on the picture of thought we are currently considering, any disconnected stream-of-consciousness of imaginings qualifies as thinking. One answer is that logic is thought to put forth norms that are constitutive for thinking. That is, in order for a mental episode to count as an episode of thinking at all, it must, in a sense to be made precise, be “assessable in light of the laws of logic” (MacFarlane 2002: 37). Underlying this thesis is a distinction between two types of rules or norms: constitutive ones and regulative ones.

The distinction between regulative and constitutive norms is Kantian at root (KRV A179/B222). Here, however, I refer primarily to a related distinction due to John Searle. According to Searle, regulative norms “regulate antecedently or independently existing forms of behavior”, such as rules of etiquette or traffic laws. Constitutive norms, by contrast

create or define new forms of behavior. The rules of football or chess, for example, do not merely regulate playing football or chess but as it were they create the very possibility of playing such games. (Searle 1969: 33–34; see also Searle 2010: 97)

Take the case of traffic rules.[9] While I ought to abide by traffic rules in normal circumstances, I can choose to ignore them. Of course, rowdy driving in violation of the traffic code might well get me in trouble. Yet no matter how cavalier my attitude towards traffic laws is, my activity still counts as driving. Contrast this with the rules governing the game of chess. I cannot in the same way opt out of conforming to the rules of chess while continuing to count as playing chess; in systematically violating the rules of chess and persisting in doing so even in the face of criticism, I forfeit my right to count as partaking in the activity of playing chess. Unless one’s moves are appropriately assessable in light of the rules of chess, one’s activity does not qualify as playing chess.

According to the constitutive conception of logic’s normativity the principles of logic are to thought what the rules of chess are to the game of chess: I cannot persistently fail to acknowledge that the laws of logic set standards of correctness for my thinking without thereby jeopardizing my status as a thinker (i.e., someone presently engaged in the act of thinking).

Two important clarifications are in order. For one, on its most plausible reading, the thesis of the constitutive normativity of logic for thought must be understood so as to leave room for the possibility of logical error: an agent’s mental activity may continue to count as thinking, despite his committing logical blunders.[10]

That is, although one may at times (perhaps even frequently and systematically) stray from the path prescribed by logic in one’s thinking, one nevertheless counts as a thinker provided one appropriately acknowledges logic’s normative authority over one’s thinking. Consider again the game of chess. In violating the rules of chess, deliberately or out of ignorance, I can plausibly still be said to count as playing chess, so long, at least, as I acknowledge that my activity is answerable to the rules; for example, by being disposed to correct myself when an illegal move is brought to my attention.[11] Similarly, all that is necessary to count as a thinker is to be sensitive to the fact that my practice of judging, inferring, believing, etc., is normatively constrained by the laws of logic. It is not easy to specify, in any detail, what the requisite acknowledgment or sensitivity consists in. A reasonable starting point, however, is provided by William Taschek who, in his interpretation of Frege, proposes that acknowledging

the categorical authority of logic will involve one’s possessing a capacity to recognize—when being sincere and reflective, and possibly with appropriate prompting—logical mistakes both in one’s own judgmental and inferential practice and that of others. (Taschek 2008: 384)

A second point of clarification is that the agent need not be able to explicitly represent to herself the logical norms by which she is bound. For instance, it may be that my reasoning ought to conform to disjunctive syllogism in appropriate ways. I may be able to display the right kind of sensitivity to the principle by which I am bound (with the right prompting if need be), without my having to possess the conceptual resources to entertain the metalogical proposition that \(\neg A, A\lor B \models B\). Nor must I otherwise explicitly represent that proposition and the normative constraint to which it gives rise.

With these clarifications in place, let us turn to a central presupposition of the approach I have been sketching. What is being presupposed, of course, is a conception of thinking that does not reduce to brute psychological or neurophysiological processes or events. If this naturalistic level of description were the only one available, the constitutive account of the normativity of logic would be a non-starter. What is being presupposed, therefore, is the permissibility of irreducibly normative levels of descriptions of our mental lives. In particular, it is assumed that the boundary between the kinds of mental activity that constitute thinking and other kinds of mental activity (non-conceptual activity like being in pain, for instance) is a boundary best characterizable in normative terms. This is not to deny that much can be learned about mental phenomena through descriptions that operate at different, non-normative levels—the “symbolic” or the neurological level of description, say—the claim is merely that if we are interested in demarcating conceptual activity from other types of mental phenomena, we should look to the constitutive norms governing it. Davidson (1980, 1984), Dennett (1987), and Millar (2004) all hold views according to which having concepts and hence thinking requires that the agent be interpretable as at least minimally sensitive to logical norms. Also, certain contemporary “normativist approaches” according to which accounts of certain intentional states involve ineliminable appeals to normative concepts may advocate the constitutive conception of logic’s normativity (e.g., Wedgwood 2007, 2009; Zangwill 2005).

2.3 Logic as normative for public practices

So far the answers to the question “What is logic normative for?” we considered had in common that the “activities” in question—reasoning and thinking—are internal, mental processes of individual agents. But logic also seems to exert normative force on the external manifestations of these processes—for instance, it codifies the standards to which we hold ourselves in our practices of assertion, rational dialogue and the like. While much of the literature on the normativity of logic focuses on internal processes of individuals, some authors have instead emphasized logic’s role as a purveyor of public standards for normatively regulated practices.

Take the practice of asserting. Assertion is often said to “aim at truth” (or knowledge, Williamson 2000: Ch. 11) as well as being a “matter of putting forward propositions for others to use as evidence in the furtherance of their epistemic projects” (Milne 2009: 282). Since I take the asserted propositions to be true and since truths entail further truths, I am “committed to standing by” the logical consequences of my assertions or else to retract them if I am unable to meet challenges to my assertion or its consequences. Similarly, if the set of propositions I assert is inconsistent at least one of my assertions must fall short of being true and the set as a whole cannot be regarded as part of my evidence. Plausibly, therefore, logic does have a normative role to play in governing the practice of assertion.

Peter Milne takes an interest in assertion mainly in order to “work back” from there to how logic constrains belief. He concludes that logic exerts normative force at least on the stock of beliefs that constitute the agent’s evidence (Milne 2009: 286). Other authors explicitly prioritize the external dimension of reasoning, conceived of as a social, inter-personal phenomenon. According to them, it is reasoning in this external sense (as opposed to intra-personal processes of belief revision, etc.) that is the primary locus of logical normativity (MacKenzie 1989). The norms govern our rational interactions with our peers. For instance, they might be thought to codify the permissions and obligations governing certain kinds of dialogues. Viewed from this perspective, logic’s normative impact on the intra-personal activity of reasoning is merely derivative, arrived at through a process of interiorization. A view along these lines has been advanced by Catarina Dutilh Novaes (2015). In a similar vein Sinan Dogramaci (2012, 2015) has proposed a view he calls “epistemic communism”. According to epistemic communism our use of “rational” applied to certain deductive rules has a specific functional role. Its role is to coordinate our epistemic rules with a view to maximizing the efficiency of our communal epistemic practices. On the basis of this view, he then elaborates an argument for the pessimistic conclusion that no general theory of rationality is to be had.

We will here follow the bulk of the literature in asking after the normative role logic might play in reasoning understood as an intra-personal activity. Yet, much of the discussion to follow applies mutatis mutandis to the other approaches.

3. Harman’s challenge

Despite its venerable pedigree and its intuitive force, the thesis that logic should have a normative role to play in reasoning has not gone unchallenged. Gilbert Harman’s criticisms have been particularly influential. Harman’s skeptical challenge is rooted in a diagnosis: our deep-seated intuition that logic has a special normative connection with reasoning is rooted in a confusion. We have conflated two very different kinds of enterprises, viz. that of formulating a theory of deductive logic, on the one hand, and what Harman calls “a theory of reasoning” (Harman 2002) on the other. Begin with the latter. A theory of reasoning is a normative account about how ordinary agents should go about forming, revising and maintaining their beliefs. Its aim is to formulate general guidelines as to which mental actions (judgments and inferences) to perform in which circumstances and which beliefs to adopt or to abandon (Harman 2009: 333). As such, the subject matter of a theory of reasoning are the dynamic “psychological events or processes” that constitute reasoning. In contrast, “the sort of implication and argument studied in deductive logic have to do with [static, non-psychological] relations among propositions” (idem). Consequently,

logical principles are not directly rules of belief revision. They are not particularly about belief [or the other mental states and acts that constitute reasoning] at all. (Harman 1984: 107)

Once we disabuse ourselves of this confusion, Harman maintains, it is hard to see how the resulting gap between logic and reasoning can be bridged. This is Harman’s challenge.

At least two lines of response come to mind. One reaction to Harman’s skeptical challenge is to take issue with his way of setting up the problem. In particular, we might reject his explanation of the provenance of our intuitions to the effect that logic has a normative role to play in reasoning as stemming from a mistaken identification of deductive logic and theories of reasoning. It might be thought, for instance, that Harman is led to exaggerate the gulf between deductive logic and theories of reasoning as a result of a contestable—because overly narrow—conception of either logic or reasoning, or both. Advocates of broadly logical accounts of belief revision (belief revision theories, non-monotonic logics, dynamic doxastic logic, etc.) may feel that Harman is driven to his skepticism out of a failure to consider more sophisticated logical tools. Unlike standard first-order classical logic, some of these formalisms do make explicit mention of beliefs (and possibly other mental states). Some formalisms do seek to capture the dynamic character of reasoning in which beliefs are not merely accumulated but may also be revised. Harman’s response, it would seem (Harman 1986: 6), is that such formalisms either tacitly rely on mistaken assumptions about the normative role of logic or else fall short of their objectives in other ways. But even if one disagrees with Harman’s assessment, one can still agree that such formal models of belief revision do not obviate the need for a philosophical account of the normativity of logic. That is because such models do typically tacitly rely on assumptions concerning the normative role of logic. An account of the normativity of logic would thus afford us a fuller understanding of the presuppositions that undergird such theories.

On the other hand, some philosophers—externalists of various stripes, for instance—may find fault with the epistemological presuppositions underlying Harman’s conception of a theory of reasoning. Harman views the aim of epistemology as closely linked to his project of providing a theory of reasoning. According to Harman’s “general conservatism”, central epistemological notions, like that of justification are approached from the first-personal standpoint: “general conservatism is a methodological principle, offering methodological advice of a sort a person can take” (Harman 2010: 154). As such Harman's approach contrasts with much of contemporary epistemology which, unconcerned with direct epistemic advice, is mainly in the business of seeking to lay down explanatorily illuminating necessary and sufficient conditions for epistemic justification.[12] Summarizing the first line of response, then, Harman's skepticism is partly premised on particular conceptions of logic and of epistemological methodology both of which may be called into question.

The second line of response is to (largely) accept Harman’s assumptions regarding the natures of deductive logic and of epistemology but to try to meet his challenge by showing that there is a interesting normative link between the two after all. In what follows, I focus primarily on this second line of response.

Of course, saying that deductive logic and theories of reasoning are distinct is one thing, affirming that there could not be an interesting normative connection between them is quite another. As a first stab at articulating such a connection, we might try the following simple line of thought: theoretical reasoning aims to provide an accurate representation of the world. We accurately represent the world by having true (or perhaps knowledgeable) beliefs and by avoiding false ones. But our doxastic states have contents—propositions—and these contents stand in certain logical relations to one another. Having an awareness of these logical relations would appear to be conducive to the end of having true beliefs and so is relevant to theoretical reasoning. In particular, the logical notions of consequence and consistency seem to be relevant. If I believe truly, the truth of my belief will carry over to its logical consequences. Conversely, if my belief entails a falsehood it cannot be true. Similarly, if the set of propositions I believe (in general or in a particular domain) is inconsistent, they cannot possibly afford an accurate representation of the world; at least one of my beliefs must be false. Harman may be able to agree with all of this. His skepticism pertains also (and perhaps primarily) to the question whether logic has a privileged role to play in reasoning; that the principles of logic are relevant to reasoning in a way that principles of other sciences are not (Harman 1986: 20). However, I want to set this further issue to one side for now.

Notice that this simple reflection on the connection between logic and norms of reasoning leads us right back to the basic intuitions at the beginning of this entry: that there is something wrong with us when we hold inconsistent beliefs or when we fail to endorse the logical consequences of our beliefs (at least when we can be expected to be aware of them). Let us spell these intuitions out by way of the following two principles. Let \(S\) be an agent and \(P\) a proposition.[13]

  • Logical implication principle (IMP): If \(S\)’s beliefs logically imply \(A\), then \(S\) ought to believe that \(A\).

  • Logical consistency principle (CON): \(S\) ought to avoid having logically inconsistent beliefs.

Notice that on the face of it IMP and CON are distinct. IMP, in and of itself, does not prohibit inconsistent or even contradictory beliefs, all it requires is that my beliefs be closed under logical consequence. CON, on the other hand, does not require that I believe the consequences of the propositions I believe, it merely demands that the set of propositions I believe be consistent. However, given certain assumptions, IMP does entail CON. Against the background of classical logic, the entailment obtains provided we allow the following two assumptions: (i) one cannot (and, via the principle that “ought” implies “can”, ought not) both believe and disbelieve one and the same proposition simultaneously; and (ii) that disbelieving a proposition is tantamount to believing its negation.[14] For let \(\{ A_{1}, \dots, A_{n}\}\) be \(S\)’s inconsistent belief set. By classical logic, we have \(A_{1}, \dots, A_{n-1}\models \neg A_{n}\). Since \(S\)’s beliefs are closed under logical consequence, \(S\) believes \(\neg A_{n}\) and hence, by (ii), disbelieves \(A_{n}\). So, \(S\) both believes and disbelieves \(A_{n}\).

3.1 The objections

IMP and CON are thus a first—if rather flatfooted—attempt at pinning down the elusive normative connection between logic and norms of reasoning. Harman considers these responses and responds in turn. The following four objections against our provisional principles can, in large part, be found in the writings of Harman.

(1) Suppose I believe \(p\) and \(p \supset q\) (as well as Modus Ponens). The mere fact that I have these beliefs and that I recognize them to jointly entail \(q\) does not normatively compel any particular attitude towards \(q\) on my part. In particular, it is not the case in general that I ought to come to believe \(q\) as IMP would have it. After all, \(q\) may be at odds with my evidence in which case it may be unreasonable for me to slavishly follow Modus Ponens and to form a belief in \(q\). The rational course of “action”, rather, when \(q\) is untenable, is for me to relinquish my belief in at least one of my antecedent beliefs \(p\) and \(p \supset q\) on account of their unpalatable implications. Thus, logical principles do not invariably offer reliable guidance in deciding what to believe (at least, when the relation between logical principles and our practices of belief-formation are understood along the lines of IMP). Let us therefore call this the Objection from Belief Revision.

John Broome (2000: 85) offers a closely related objection, which nevertheless deserves separate mention. Broome observes that any proposition trivially entails itself. From IMP it thus follows that I ought to believe any proposition I in fact believe. But this seems patently false: I might hold any number of irresponsibly acquired beliefs. The fact that, by mere happenstance, I hold these beliefs, in no way implies that I ought to believe them. Call this variation of the Objection from Belief Revision, the Bootstrapping Objection.

(2) A further worry is that a reasoner with limited cognitive resources would be unreasonable to abide by IMP because she would be obligated to form countless utterly useless beliefs. Any of the propositions I believe entails an infinite number of propositions that are of no interest to me whatsoever. Not only do I not care about, say, the disjunction “I am wearing blue socks or pigs can fly” entailed by my true belief that I am wearing blue socks, it would be positively irrational of me to squander my scarce cognitive resources of time, computational power and storage capacity in memory and so on, on idly deriving implications of my beliefs when these are of no value to me. Harman fittingly dubs the principle of reasoning in question Principle of Clutter Avoidance. Let us call the corresponding objection the Objection from Clutter Avoidance.

(3) There is another sense in which both principles—IMP and CON—place excessive demands on agents whose resources are limited. Consider the following example. Suppose I believe the axioms of Peano arithmetic. Suppose further that a counterintuitive arithmetical proposition that is of great interest to me is entailed by the axioms, but that its shortest proof has more steps than there are protons in the visible universe. According to IMP, I ought to believe the proposition in question. However, if the logical “ought” implies “can” (relative to capacities even remotely like our own), IMP cannot be correct. An analogous objection can be leveled at CON. An agent may harbor an inconsistent belief set, yet detecting the inconsistency may be too difficult for any ordinary agent. We may summarize these objections under the label Objection from Excessive Demands.

(4) Finally, I may find myself in epistemic circumstances in which inconsistency is not merely excusable on account of my “finitary predicament” (Cherniak 1986), but where inconsistency appears to be rationally required. Arguably, the Preface Paradox constitutes such a scenario (Makinson 1965).[15] Here is one standard way of presenting it. Suppose I author a meticulously researched non-fiction book. My book is composed of a large set of non-trivial propositions \(p_{1},\dots, p_{n}\). Seeing that all of my claims are the product of scrupulous research, I have every reason firmly to believe each of the \(p_{i}\) individually. But I also have overwhelming inductive evidence for \(q\): that at least one of my beliefs is in error. The \(p_{i}\) and \(q\) cannot be jointly true since \(q\) is equivalent to the negation of the conjunction of the \(p_{i}\). Yet, it would seem irrational to abandon any of my beliefs for the sake of regaining consistency, at least in the absence of any new evidence. The Preface Paradox thus may be thought to tell against CON: arguably, I may be within my rational rights in holding inconsistent beliefs (at least in certain contexts). However, it also seems to constitute a direct counterexample to IMP. For in the Preface scenario I believe each of the \(p_{i}\) and yet it looks as if I ought to disbelieve an obvious logical consequence thereof: their conjunction (because \(q\) is transparently equivalent to \(\neg (p_{1} \land \dots \land p_{n})\)).

So much for the objections to IMP and CON. The question raised by these considerations is whether these principles can be improved upon.

4. Bridge principles

Let us focus on IMP for now. Harman’s objections establish that IMP—in its current form, at least—is untenable. The question is whether IMP can be improved upon in a way that is invulnerable to Harman’s objections. In other words, the question is whether a tenable version of what MacFarlane (MF2004) calls a bridge principle is to be had. A bridge principle, in this context, is a general principle that articulates a substantive relation between “facts” about logical consequence (or perhaps an agent’s attitudes towards such facts) on the one hand, and norms governing the agent’s doxastic attitudes vis-à-vis the propositions standing in these logical relations on the other. IMP is a bridge principle, albeit not a promising one.

Harman’s skepticism about the normativity of logic can thus be understood as skepticism as to whether a serviceable bridge principle is to be had. In order properly to adjudicate whether Harman’s skepticism is justified, we need to know what “the options are”. But how? John MacFarlane (MF2004) offers a helpful taxonomy of bridge principles which constitutes a very good first approximation of the range of options. This section briefly summarizes MacFarlane’s classification, as well as subsequent developments in the literature.

Let us begin with a general blue print for constructing bridge principles:[16]

  • (\(\star\)) If \(A_{1},\dots, A_{n} \models C, \textrm{ then } N(\alpha(A_{1}), \dots, \alpha(A_{n}), \beta(C))\).

A bridge principle thus takes the form of a material conditional. The conditional’s antecedent states “facts” about logical consequence (or attitudes toward such “facts”). Its consequent contains a (broadly) normative claim concerning the agent’s doxastic attitudes towards the relevant propositions. Doxastic attitudes, as I use the term, include belief, disbelief, and degree of belief.[17] Here \(\alpha\) may (but need not) represent the same attitude as \(\beta\). In fact, for principles with negative polarity, it may represent the negation of an attitude: “do not disbelieve the conclusion, if you believe the premises”.

In what ways, now, can we vary this schema so as to generate the space of possible bridge principles? MacFarlane introduces three parameters along which the schema may be varied. Each parameter allows for multiple “discrete settings”. We can think of the logical space of bridge principles as the range of possible combinations among these parameter settings.

  1. In order to express the normative claims, we will need deontic vocabulary. Bridge principles may differ in the deontic operator they deploy: does the normative constraint take the form of an ought (o), a permission (p) or merely of having (defeasible) reason (r)?

  2. What is the polarity of the normative claim? Is it a positive obligation/permission/reason to believe a certain proposition given one’s belief in a number of premises (+)? Or rather is it a negative obligation/prohibition/reason not to disbelieve (−)?

  3. What is the scope of the deontic operator? Different bridge principles result from varying the scope of the deontic operator. Let \(O\) stand generically for one of the above deontic operators. Given that the consequent of a bridge principle will typically itself take the form of a conditional, the operator can take

    • narrow scope with respect to the consequent (C): \(A \supset O(B)\)
    • wide scope (W): \(O(A \supset B)\)
    • or it can govern both the antecedent and the consequent of the conditional (B):[18] \(O(A) \supset O(B)\)

These three parameters admit of a total of eighteen combinations of their settings and hence eighteen bridge principles. The symbols in parentheses associated with each parameter setting combine to determine a unique label for each of the principles: The first letter indicates the scope of the deontic operator (C, W or B), the second letter indicates the type of deontic operator (o[bligation], p[ermissions], r[easons]) and the “+” or “−” indicate positive and negative polarity respectively.[19] For example, the label “Co+” corresponds to our original principle IMP:

  • If \(A_{1}, A_{2}, \dots, A_{n} \models C\), then if \(S\) believes \(A_{1}, A_{2}, \dots, A_{n}\), \(S\) ought to believe \(C\).

And “Wr−” designates:

  • If \(A_{1}, A_{2}, \dots, A_{n} \models C\), then \(S\) has reason to (believe \(A_{1}, A_{2}, \dots, A_{n}\), only if \(S\) does not disbelieve \(C\)).

Many will regard the bridge principles we have presented thus far to be problematic. They all relate “facts” about logical entailment—assuming there are such things—to certain normative constraints on the agent’s attitudes. The trouble, they will say, is that these principles are not sensitive to the cognitive limitations of ordinary agents. Agents, if they are even remotely like us, are not apprised of all entailment “facts”. Consequently, especially the “ought”-based principles (at least on some understanding of “ought”) are therefore vulnerable to Harman’s Objection from Excessive Demands.

A natural response is to consider attitudinal bridge principles. I call attitudinal bridge principles whose antecedents are restricted to logical implications to which the agent bears an attitude. For instance, to take the type of attitudinal principle considered by MacFarlane, Co+ may be transformed into:

  • (Co+k) If \(S\) knows that \(A_{1},\dots, A_{n} \models C\), then if \(S\) believes the \(A_{i}\), \(S\) ought to believe \(C\).

According to (Co+k), the agent’s belief set ought to be closed only under known logical consequence. Let us call this an attitudinally constrained or, more specifically, the epistemically constrained variant of Co+ (whence the “k” in the label). Different authors may go in for different types of attitudes. Knowledge, of course, is a factive attitude. Some will wish to leave room for the possibility of (systematic) logical error. For instance, an agent might mistakenly comply with the principle \(A\supset B, B \models A\). Perhaps even someone with erroneous logical convictions such as this should, for the sake of internal coherence, comply with the principles he deems correct. An agent who sincerely took an erroneous principle to be correct but failed to reason in accordance with it may be seen to manifest a greater degree of irrationality than someone who at least conformed to principles he endorses. But we can also imagine more interesting cases of systematic error. Suppose I am impressed with an argument for a particular non-classical logic as a means of parrying the semantic paradoxes. I thus come to espouse the logic in question and begin to manage my doxastic attitudes accordingly. But now suppose in addition that unbeknownst to me the arguments that persuaded me are not in fact sound. Again, it might be thought that though I am mistaken in my adherence to the logic, so long as I had good reasons to espouse it, it may nevertheless be proper for me to comply with its principles. If logical error in either of these two senses is to be accommodated, the appropriate attitude would have to be non-factive.

A further issue is that ordinary agents are presumably normatively bound by logical principles without being able to articulate or represent those principles to themselves explicitly. Assuming otherwise runs the risk of overly intellectualizing our ability to conform to logical norms. The attitudes borne by such logically untrained agents to the logical principles therefore presumably are not belief-like. Perhaps such agents are better thought of as exercising an ability or having a disposition to take certain forms of entailment to be correct. See Corine Besson 2012 for a criticism of dispositionalist accounts of logical competence, and Murzi & Steinberger 2013 for a partial defense.

Having thus outlined the classificatory scheme, a number of additional comments are in order. Notice that disbelieving \(A\) is to be distinguished from not believing \(A\). One cannot rationally believe and disbelieve the same proposition (although see note 12). Hence, I ought to ensure that when I disbelieve \(A\), I do not believe \(A\). The converse, however, obviously does not hold since I can fail to believe \(A\) without actively disbelieving it. I may, for instance, choose to suspend my judgment as to whether \(A\) pending further evidence, or I may simply never have considered whether \(A\). Furthermore, I will remain neutral on the question as to whether the attitude of disbelieving \(A\) should be identified with that of believing \(\neg A\).

Moreover, a note on deontic modals is in order. “You ought not \(\Phi\)” (\(O\neg \Phi\)) is not the same as saying “It is not the case that you ought to \(\Phi\)” (\(\neg O \Phi\)). But rather “You are forbidden from \(\Phi\)ing”. Consequently, “You ought not disbelieve \(A\)” should be read as “disbelieving \(A\) would be a mistake”, as opposed to “it is not the case that you ought to disbelieve \(A\)”, which is compatible with the permissibility of disbelieving \(A\).

Ought and may are understood to be strict notions. By contrast, reason is a pro tanto or contributory notion. Having reason to \(\Phi\) is compatible with simultaneously having reason not to \(\Phi\) and indeed with it being the case that I ought not to \(\Phi\). Reasons, unlike oughts, may be weighed against each other; the side that wins out determines what ought to be done. Finally, I am here treating all deontic modals as propositional operators. This too is not uncontroversial. Peter Geach (1982) and more recently Mark Schroeder (2011) have argued that so-called deliberative or practical oughts are best analyzed not as operators acting on propositions but rather as expressing relations between agents and actions. (Interestingly, MacFarlane (2014: Ch. 11) has recently followed suit.) Nevertheless, I will assume without argument that the operator-reading can be made to work even in the case of deliberative oughts. For defenses of this position see e.g., Broome 2000, 2013; Chrisman 2012; and Wedgwood 2006. We can capture the particular connection between an agent and the obligation she has towards a proposition at a particular time, by indexing the operator: \(O_{S, t}\). I will drop the indices in what follows.

A last comment: MacFarlane is not explicit as to whether bridge principles are to be understood as synchronic norms—norms that instruct us which patterns of doxastic attitudes are, in a specified sense, obligatory, permissible or reasonable at a given point in time; or whether they are to provide diachronic norms—norms that instruct us how an agent’s doxastic state should or may evolve over time. To illustrate the distinction, let us consider Co+ (aka IMP) once again. Understood synchronically, the principle should be spelled out as follows.

  • If \(A_{1}, A_{2}, \dots, A_{n} \models C\), then if, at time \(t\), \(S\) believes \(A_{1}, A_{2}, \dots, A_{n}\), then \(S\) ought to believe \(C\) at time \(t\).

In other words, the principle demands that one’s beliefs be, at all times, closed under logical consequence. Alternatively, on might interpret Co+ as a diachronic norm as follows:

  • If \(A_{1}, A_{2}, \dots, A_{n} \models C\), then if, at time \(t\), \(S\) believes \(A_{1}, A_{2}, \dots, A_{n}\), then \(S\) ought to believe \(C\) at time \(t'\) (where \(t\) precedes \(t'\) suitably closely).

Different principles lend themselves more or less well to these two readings. \(C\)- and \(B\)-type principles can be interpreted as either synchronic or diachronic principles on account of the fact that they make explicit claims as to what an agent ought, may or has reason to believe or disbelieve given her other beliefs. The \(W\)s, by contrast, are most plausibly read as synchronic principles. Such principles do not, in and of themselves, instruct the subject which inferences to make. Rather, they tend to proscribe certain patterns of belief (and, perhaps, disbelief) or distributions of degrees of belief.

4.1 Evaluating bridge principles

With the logical terrain of bridge principles charted, the question now arises as to which principles (if any) are philosophically viable. This is discussed in the following supplementary document:

Bridge Principles – Surveying the Options

In that supplement we discuss a variety of desiderata that have been put forward and consider candidate principles with respect to those desiderata.

4.2 The Preface Paradox

Given that the Preface Paradox constitutes a major stumbling block for many otherwise plausible principles, we do well to explore the ways in which the Preface Paradox might be dealt with. One way, of course, of dealing with the Preface Paradox is to deny it its force. That is, one might try to outright solve, or in some way dissolve, the paradox. Since it seems fair to say that no such approach has won the day (see entry epistemic paradoxes), I will assume that the Preface Paradox intuitions are to be take seriously.[20]

Alternatively, one might acknowledge the force of the Preface intuitions while at the same time trying to hold on to a strict, ought-based principle. But how? According to all such principles, I, the author of a non-trivial non-fiction book (let us assume), ought to believe (or at least not disbelieve) the conjunction of the propositions in my book, given that I firmly endorse each conjunct individually. MacFarlane’s response is that we must simply reconcile ourselves to the irreconcilable: the existence of an ineliminable normative conflict. Our strict logical obligations clash with other epistemic obligations, namely, the obligation to believe that some of my beliefs must be mistaken. Our agent becomes a tragic heroine. Through no fault of her own, she finds herself in a situation in which, no matter what she does, she will fall short of what, epistemically speaking, she ought to do.

It might be retorted that, as a matter of sound methodology, admitting an irresolvable normative clash should only be our last resort. A better approach (all other things being equal) would consist in finding a way of reconciling the conflicting epistemic norms.

Among the qualitative principles we have been considering, the only way out is via non-strict principles like (Wr+b*), which we considered at the end of the previous section. On this principle, I, the author, merely have reason (as opposed to having sufficient reason) for believing the conjunction of the claims that make up the body of my book, given that I believe each of the claims individually. The crucial difference resides in the fact that this leaves open the possibility that my reason for being logically coherent can be overridden. In particular, it can be outweighed by reasons stemming from other epistemic norms. In the case at hand, it might be thought that our logical obligations are superseded by a norm of epistemic modesty. This, of course, is not uncontroversial. Some maintain that what the Preface Paradox shows is not merely that the normative grip of logic does not take the form of a strict ought, but rather that we in fact have no reason at all to believe in multi-premise closure of belief under logical consequence: my reasons for believing in the conjunction of my claims are not being trumped by weightier reasons for disbelieving it; I have no logic-based reason whatsoever to believe the conjunction in the first place.

So far, then, we have considered the following reactions to the Preface Paradox: reject the Preface Paradox altogether; follow MacFarlane and cling to the strict ought-based principle at the cost of accepting an irresolvable normative clash; or opt for the weaker reason operator and give up the intuition motivating the Strictness Test. But none of these proposals incorporates what is perhaps the most natural response to the Preface Paradox outside of the debate surrounding the normativity of logic. A standard response to the Preface Paradox consists in appealing to graded credal states in lieu of “full” (“qualitative”, “binary” or “all-or-nothing”) beliefs. Such “credences” or “degrees of belief” (I will use the two labels interchangeably) are typically modeled by means of a (possibly partial) credence function (which we will denote by “\(cr\)”) that maps the set of propositions into the unit interval. Probabilists maintain that an ideally rational agent’s credence function ought to be (or at least ought to be extendable to) a probability function (i.e., it ought to satisfy the standard axioms of probability theory). In other words, an ideally rational agent should have probabilistically coherent credences.

Probabilists have no trouble accounting for the Preface phenomena: the subjective probability of a (large) conjunction may well be low—even zero, as in the case of the Lottery Paradox (see entry epistemic paradoxes)—even if the probability assigned to each of the individual conjuncts is very high (reflecting the high degree of confidence the author rightly has in each of her claims).

A tempting strategy for formulating a bridge principle capable of coping with the Preface Paradox is to incorporate these insights. This might be done by going beyond MacFarlane’s classification and devising instead a quantitative bridge principle: one in which logical principles directly constrain the agent’s degrees of belief (as opposed to constraining her full beliefs).

Hartry Field (2009a,b, 2015} proposes a bridge principles of just this form. Here is a formulation of such a principle:

  • (DB) If \(A_{1}, \dots, A_{n} \models C\), then \(S\)’s degrees of belief ought to be such that: \(cr(C) \geq \sum_{1 \leq i \leq n} cr(A_{i}) - (n - 1)\)

Note first that DB is a wide scope principle: it requires that our degrees of belief respect the specified inequality, which can be achieved in one of two ways: by suitably raising one’s degree of belief in the conclusion or else by readjusting one’s degrees of belief in the premises.

DB is based on a well-known result in probability logic, which is usually stated in terms of “uncertainties” (see Adams 1998 for more details; for a helpful overview, see Hájek 2001). Define the uncertainty of a proposition \(A\), \(u(A)\) as \(u(A) = 1-cr(A)\). Put in this way, DB says that the uncertainty of the conclusion must not exceed the sum of the uncertainties of the premises. DB can be seen to share a number of important features with standard probability theory. Plug in \(0\) for \(n\) and you get that one should assign \(1\) to any logical truth. Plug in \(1\) and you get that one’s degree of belief in the premise of a valid single-premise argument should not exceed your degree of belief in the conclusion. The idea underlying DB is that uncertainties can add up and therefore need to be accounted for when we are trying to determine how the logical relations between our belief contents should affect our degrees of belief in those contents. Even if my uncertainty about each of a large number of premises is next to negligible when taken individually, the uncertainty may accumulate so as to make the conclusion highly (perhaps even maximally) uncertain. It is for this reason that DB gets us around the Preface Paradox; in the Preface case the number of premises is sufficiently high for the conclusion to admit of a very low credence.

5. Further challenges

5.1 Kolodny’s challenge

Logical norms are naturally regarded as a species of rational requirements. If I believe a set of propositions and at the same time disbelieve an obvious logical consequence thereof my set of beliefs presumably exhibits a rational defect. Rational requirements are characterized by their demand for coherence: they demand either a particular kind of coherence among our attitudes or else coherence between our attitudes and the evidence. Niko Kolodny has dubbed the former “requirements of formal coherence as such” (Kolodny 2007: 229). They are formal in the sense that they concern logical relationships between attitude contents or the arithmetical relationships between the degrees of confidence we invest in those contents. The qualification “as such” indicates that an internal coherence among the attitudes is demanded to the exclusion of other epistemologically relevant factors (evidential considerations, for example). Requirements of this type, it has been argued (Broome 2000; Dancy 1977), take the form of wide scope principles. Hence, they do not generally prescribe a particular attitude, but are satisfiable in a number of ways. Or, to put it another way, they prohibit particular constellations of attitudes. For instance, Wo− proscribes states like the one just imagined, in which the agent believes all of the premises of a valid argument while disbelieving its conclusion. It may be satisfied, as we have seen, by either coming to believe the conclusion or by abandoning some of the premises.

The status of logical norms as a species of rational requirement raises weighty questions. For one, Kolodny (2005) has challenged the seemingly natural assumption that rationality is normative at all. That is, he has questioned whether we in fact have reason to do what rational requirements require of us. It might be that rationality makes certain demands on us, but that it is an open question as to whether we should want to be rational. Here is not the place to develop these ideas, let alone to try to resolve the “normative question” for rationality (see Way 2010 for an overview). In the absence of a convincing response to Kolodny’s challenge, some might take umbrage at our talk of logical norms. Strictly speaking, we should speak of them as necessary conditions for rationality, leaving open whether we have reason to be rational.

While it would take us too far afield to address the question of the normativity of rationality, there is a related strand of Kolodny’s argument that is more directly relevant to our discussion. The claim in question, put forth in Kolodny 2007 & 2008, is that there simply is no reason for postulating the existence of formal coherence requirements as such at all. This may seem surprising. After all, to take Kolodny’s simplest example, we certainly do have the intuition that an agent who, at a given time, believes both \(p\) and \(\neg p\) is violating a requirement—a requirement, presumably, of something like the following form:

  • (NC) \(S\) is required not to both believe \(A\) and \(\neg A\) at \(t\) (for any time \(t\)).

If Kolodny is right that there are no pure formal coherence requirements like (NC), how are we to explain our intuitions? Kolodny’s strategy is to devise an error theory, thereby seeking to show how coherence (or near enough coherence) in the relevant sense emerges as a by-product of our compliance with other norms, norms that are not themselves pure formal coherence requirements, thus obviating the need for postulating pure formal coherence requirements.

Consider how this plays out in the case of (NC). Kolodny proposes an evidentialist response. Any violation of (NC) is indeed a violation of a norm, but the relevant norm being violated is a (narrow scope) evidential norm: the norm, roughly, that one has reason to believe a proposition only in so far as “the evidence indicates, or makes likely, that” the proposition is true. A norm, in other words, much like (EN) (in the supplement on Bridge Principles). The thought is that any instance of my violating (NC) is eo ipso an instance in which my beliefs are out of whack with the evidence. For when I hold contradictory beliefs, at least one of the beliefs must be unsupported by the evidence. As Kolodny puts it,

The attitudes that reason requires, in any given situation, are formally coherent. Thus, if one has formally incoherent attitudes, it follows that one must be violating some requirement of reason. The problem is not, as the idea of requirements of formal coherence as such suggests, that incoherent attitudes are at odds with each other. It is instead that when attitudes are incoherent, it follows that one of these attitudes is at odds with the reason for it—as it would be even if it were not part of an incoherent set. (Kolodny 2007: 231)

Another way of making Kolodny’s point is to note the following. Suppose I find myself believing both \(p\) and \(\neg p\), but that the evidence supports \(p\) (over its negation). If (NC) were the operative norm, I could satisfy it “against reason”, i.e., by coming to believe \(\neg p\). But adherence to (NC) contra the evidence seems like an unjustified “fetish” for “psychic tidiness”. (Kolodny proposes similar maneuvers for other types of putative formal coherence norms, and for norms of logical coherence in particular.)

What Kolodny assumes here is that there are, in Broome’s words, “no optional pairs of beliefs” (Broome 2013: 85). That is, it is never the case that belief in \(A\) and belief in \(\neg A\) is equally permissible in light of the evidence. As Broome points out, Kolodny’s assumption is founded on a commitment to evidentialism, which may cause some to get off the bus. Notice, though, that even if we accept Kolodny’s argument along with its evidentialist presuppositions, there may still be room for logical norms. Such norms would not constrain beliefs directly, since only evidence constrains our beliefs on Kolodny’s view. Yet, the evidence itself would be structured by logic. For instance, if \(A\) entails \(B\), then since \(A\) cannot be true without \(B\) being true, any evidence that counts in favor of \(A\) should also count in favor of \(B\). Logic would then still exert normative force. However, its normative force would get only an indirect grip on the agent’s doxastic attitudes by constraining the evidence. It is not clear how robust the distinction is, especially against the background of conceptions that take evidence to be constituted largely (or entirely) by one's beliefs. Moreover, Alex Worsnip 2015 has argued that in cases of misleading higher-order evidence, failures of coherence cannot ultimately be explained in terms of failures to respond adequately to the evidence.

5.2 Consistency and coherence

At the outset we identified two logical properties as the two central protagonists in any story about the normative status of logic: consistency and logical consequence. So far our focus has been almost exclusively on consequence. Let us now briefly turn to norms of consistency.

The most natural and straightforward argument for consistency is that the corresponding norm—something along the lines of CON—is entailed by the truth norm for belief:

  • (TN) For any proposition \(A\), if an agent \(S\) considers or has reason to consider \(A\), \(S\) ought to believe \(A\) if and only if \(A\) is true.[21]

The truth norm entails the consistency norm (given certain assumptions):

  • (CN) For any agent \(S\), the set of propositions believed by \(S\) at any given time ought to be logically consistent.

For if the set of propositions I believe at a particular point in time is inconsistent, they cannot all be true, which is to say that I am violating the truth norm with respect to at least one of my beliefs.

Some objections to the consistency norm are closely related to the considerations of Excessive Demands. And even in cases where it would be within our powers to discover an inconsistency given our resources of computational power, time and so on, it may still be reasonable to prioritize other cognitive aims rather than expending significant resources to resolve a minor inconsistency (Harman 1986). However, many authors who invoke (CN) do so in a highly idealized context. They think of the norm not as reason-giving or as a basis for attributing blame, but merely as an evaluative norm: an agent with an inconsistent belief set is less than perfectly rational.[22]

Another reason for rejecting CON is dialetheism (see entry on dialetheism). Clearly, if there are true contradictions, there are special cases in which one ought to have inconsistent beliefs.

But there is a further worry about consistency borne out of less controversial assumptions. It stems from the aforementioned fact that we do not only evaluate our beliefs according to their truth status but also in terms of their reasonableness in light of the evidence. Accordingly, there would seem to be an epistemic norm, like (EN) in the supplement on Bridge Principles, that one ought to (or may) believe a proposition only if that proposition is likely to be true given the evidence. But if that is so, the following well-known scenario may arise: it may be that, for a set of propositions, I ought to (may) believe each of them in light of the evidence, yet—because evidential support is not factive—the resulting belief set turns out to be inconsistent. Therefore, if rationality demands that I align my beliefs with the evidence, rationality is no guarantee for logical consistency. Of course, it is precisely this clash between our (local) evidential norm and the (global) coherence norm of logical consistency that is dramatized in the Preface and in the Lottery paradoxes.

In light of such considerations, no small number of authors have come to reject the consistency norm (see inter alia Kyburg 1970 and Christensen 2004). A particularly interesting positive alternative proposal was recently made by Branden Fitelson and Kenny Easwaran (Fitelson and Easwaran 2015, Easwaran 2015). They advance a range of sub-consistency coherence norms for full belief inspired by Joyce-style accuracy-dominance arguments for probabilism as a norm for credences (see Joyce 1998, 2009 and also the entry on epistemic utility arguments for probabilism). One important such norm is based on the following conception of coherence. Roughly, a belief set is coherent just in case there is no alternative belief set that outperforms it in terms of its lower measure of inaccuracy across all possible worlds, i.e., just in case it is not weakly dominated with respect to accuracy.

5.3 Logic vs. probability theory

Even if there is a plausible sense in which logic can be said to be normative for thought or reasoning, there remains a worry about competition. Logic-based norms usually target full beliefs. If that is correct, a significant range of rationally assessable doxastic phenomena fall outside of the purview of logic—most significantly for present purposes, degrees of belief.[23] Degrees of belief, according to the popular probabilist picture, are subject not to logical, but to probabilistic norms, in particular the synchronic norm of probabilistic coherence.[24] Consequently, the normative reach of logic would seem (at best) to be limited; it does not exhaust the range of doxastic phenomena.

Worse still, some philosophers maintain that degrees of belief are the only doxastic attitudes that are, in some sense, “real”, or at least the only ones that genuinely matter. According to them, only degrees of belief are deserving of a place in our most promising accounts of both theoretical (broadly Bayesian) and practical (broadly decision-theoretic) accounts of rationality. Full belief talk is either to be eliminated altogether (Jeffrey 1970), or reduced to talk of degrees of belief (ontologically, explanatorily or otherwise). Others still acknowledge that the concept of full belief plays an indispensable role in our folk-psychological practices, but nevertheless deem it to be too blunt an instrument to earn its keep in respectable philosophical and scientific theorizing (Christensen 2004). Virtually all such “credence-first” approaches have in common that they threaten to eliminate the normative role of logic, which is superseded or “embedded” (Williams 2015) in probabilism.

A number of replies might be envisaged. Here we mention but a few. First, one may question the assumption that logical norms really have no say when it comes to credences. Field’s quantitative bridge principle is a case in point. As we have seen, it does directly connect logical principles (or our attitudes towards them) with constraints on the allowable ways of investing confidence in the propositions in question. To this it might be retorted, however, that Field’s proposal in effect presupposes some (possibly non-classical) form of subjective probability theory. After all, in order to align one’s credences with the demands of logic, one must be capable of determining the numerical values of one’s credences in logically complex propositions on the basis of one’s degrees of belief in simple propositions. This is most naturally done by appealing to probability theory.[25] But if so, it looks as if probability theory is really doing all of the normative work and hence that logic would seem to be little more than a redundant tag-along. Second, one might try to downplay the importance of degrees of belief in our cognitive economy. In its strongest form such a position amounts to a form of eliminativism or reduction in the opposite direction: against credences and in favor of full belief. Harman (1986), for instance, rejects the idea that ordinary agents operate with anything like credences. Harman does not deny that beliefs may come in varying degrees of strength. However, he maintains that this feature can be explained wholly in terms of full beliefs: either as belief in a proposition whose content is probabilistic or else

as a kind of epiphenomenon resulting from the operation of rules of revision [e.g., you believe \(P\) to a higher degree than \(Q\) iff it is harder to stop believing \(P\) than to stop believing \(Q\)]. (Harman 1986: 22)

More moderate positions accord both graded and categorical beliefs along with their respective attendant norms a firm place in our cognitive economies, either by seeking to give a unified account of both concepts (Foley 1993; Sturgeon 2008; Leitgeb 2013) or else by reconciling themselves to what Christensen (2004) calls a “bifurcation account”, i.e., the view that there is no unifying account to be had and hence that both types of belief and their attendant norms operate autonomously (Buchak 2014; Kaplan 1996; Maher 1993; Stalnaker 1984). Summarizing, then, so long, at least, as full belief continues to occupy an ineliminable theoretical role to in our best theories, there still is a case to be made that it is to logic that we should continue to look in seeking to articulate the norms governing these qualitative doxastic states.


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