Jean François Lyotard

First published Fri Sep 21, 2018

Jean-François Lyotard (1924–1998) was a French philosopher whose best known work—often to his chagrin—was his 1979 The Postmodern Condition. Written at the request of the Council of Universities of the Provincial Government of Quebec on the state of knowledge in the contemporary world, this work brought the term “postmodernism”, already in use in other fields, such as the arts and literature, to the forefront of debates in Western philosophy, especially when published in English in 1984. The book was more prescient than realized at the time, as described below, though soon critics of Continental philosophy used the term “postmodernism” to hold together a variety of thinkers often at odds with one another (Julia Kristeva, Michel Foucault, Jacques Derrida, Gilles Deleuze, and so on). These critics argued that postmodernists believed that were no such things as “facts”, only modes of discourse that forever block us from making truth claims about reality, and the term “postmodern” became a pejorative term to deride these thinkers as adhering to epistemological and moral nihilism. While Lyotard was surely interested in the postmodern loss of “metanarratives”—traditional means by which we order world—his works, especially after The Postmodern Condition, considered ways to think of justice after the loss of these metanarratives. In works such as Just Gaming (1979) and especially his masterwork, The Differend (1983), Lyotard offers not an “anything goes” relativism, but rather takes up the historical fact that after the Shoah, there is no longer a belief in the progress of history, à la G. W. F. Hegel (1770–1831) (and even more so today, when polls all over the West show that many believe the next generation will be worse off than the last) while there is also what Hannah Arendt (1906–1975) called a general “loss of authority” in traditional institutions. Hence both progressive and conservative political views are found flailing in diagnosing the problems of the political, especially when facing the devaluation of all values in consumer culture. The range of Lyotard’s works were not limited to diagnosing the politics of postmodernity, but also made important contributions to aesthetics, the philosophy of science, and the philosophy of language, among other areas.

1. Biographical Sketch

Born in Vincennes, France on August 10, 1924, Jean-François Lyotard was the son of Jean-Pierre Lyotard, a salesman. As he reports in an autobiographical essay that opens Peregrinations: Law, Form, Event (1988), while schooling in Paris lycées, he had dreams of becoming a Dominican monk, a novelist, a painter, or even a historian. During the second world war, he acted as a medic during the liberation of Paris and he became a father soon after studying literature and philosophy at the Sorbonne University in Paris (he failed entrance twice into the more prestigious École Normale Supériour), which certainly cut off any dreams of becoming a monk. As for being a novelist or artist, he says he had an “unfortunate lack of talent”, and an “obvious weakness of memory” meant he could never be a good historian (Peregrinations, 1–2). He met Gilles Deleuze (1925–1995) while studying at the Sorbonne and his work would later influence Lyotard’s Libidinal Economy (1974). Lyotard produced an M.A. dissertation, “Indifference as an Ethical Notion”, whose central belief in indifference he would spend his career repudiating. In 1954, he would publish a study on phenomenology (a textbook treatment that would go through some ten editions) and became a philosophy professor at a lycée in Constantine, the capital of the French department of East Algeria, having passed the agrégation that enabled him to do so (Peregrinations, 2). Lyotard came to Algeria at a propitious time: near start of the Algerian revolution that would ultimately liberate the country from France in 1962, the colony had a revolutionary air that he inhaled in full. After his arrival, Lyotard immersed himself in the works of Marx while updating himself on the Algerian situation. As the revolution began in 1954, Lyotard joined Socialisme ou Barbarie (Socialism or Barbarism), which also included Claude Lefort (1924–2010) and Cornelius Castoriadis (1922–1997), important political thinkers in their own right. Lyotard became an astute and strident political militant over the next fifteen years, writing works that would later be collected in Political Writings (1993). He edited and wrote for Socialisme ou Barbarie’s journal as well as leaflets given to protesters and union workers, and this work left him little time for academic philosophy (“Resisting a Discourse of Mastery”, 174). He returned to Paris in 1959, becoming until 1966 a maître-assistant at the Sorbonne, when he finally gained a position in the philosophy department at the University of Paris X, Nanterre. In 1964, he broke with Socialisme ou Barbarie, joining Pouvoir Ouvrier (Worker’s Power), quitting that splinter group two years later and, as often happens on the French left, losing many of his closest friends along the way as his distance from Marxism became clear. Around the same time, he began to attend the seminars of the French psychoanalyst Jacques Lacan (1901–1981). This was an important moment as Lyotard lost faith in the all-encompassing philosophy of Marxism, which offered, especially in the variant of the French Communist Party, a single key to history and its end. This loss of faith in Marxism’s “metanarrative” would expand to encompass all those available in modernity, a fact that would come to mark all his remaining writings. This didn’t keep him from participating in the events of May 1968, helping to organize the March 22 movement in Nanterre. Three years later he would publish Discourse, Figure (1971), earning him the degree of doctorat d’état. In light of the revolts of 1968, the French government set up a radical university in Vincennes, which Lyotard would join, becoming maître de conferences. Two years later, he published a work he later dubbed “my evil book”, Libidinal Economy (Peregrinations, 13). This work remains an important thinking of immanence and what a body politic would be like if reduced only to its libidinal pleasures and the blockages that make institutions possible. That Lyotard would later repudiate this difficult and complex work should say much to those who would reduce him to advocating a postmodern pastiche where any pleasure is good as long as it provides some intensity of feeling. In 1979, he would publish The Postmodern Condition, which was instantly taken as emblematic of what was underway in the West, right or wrong. Many would take up his call, as he put it in the book, to “wage a war on totality; let us be witnesses to the unpresentable; let us activate the differences and save the honor of the name” (Postmodern Condition, 82). The work was both descriptive of what we today would dub neoliberalism’s functionalization of knowledge—what can be known has value only insofar as it can increase the future economic productivity of the researcher or student—and prescriptive that the loss of metanarratives should be underway. With the fame gained from this book, Lyotard would go on to lecture all over the world, while acting as a major contributor to the Collège International de Philosophie in Paris. In 1979 and 1983, he published Au juste (translated as Just Gaming) and The Differend, respectively, two works that remain important to anyone thinking a postmodern politics. His later works, such as The Inhuman (1988) and Soundproof Room: Malraux’s Anti-aesthetics (1998), concentrated on aesthetics, an enduring theme as early as the 1970s, but always while extending conclusions he reached in The Differend. In April 1998, Lyotard died of leukemia in Paris.

2. Intellectual Background

Lyotard’s intellectual milieu is one that crossed major events in French philosophy and, of course, in global history. His writings would encounter the dominant Marxism of the French political and academic milieu, while also, over a long career, he would debate with writers in existential phenomenology, structuralism, and eventually post-structuralism, the latter being the moniker under which his works are commonly placed. Lyotard’s first book, Phenomenology (1954), demonstrated the import of that movement on his early thought. Husserlian phenomenology, by way of Jean-Paul Sartre (1905–1980) and Maurice Merleau-Ponty (1908–1961), was dominant in the era’s existentialist movements, and Lyotard’s work attempts to find a place for phenomenology in light of the Marxism dominant on the left, especially in the human sciences (e.g., sociology, history, and linguistics). Like Sartre, who attempted to wed his existentialist emphasis on the irreducibility of subjective experience and Marxian analyses, which led to his Critique of Dialectical Reason (1960), Lyotard wanted to understand if there was a way to take up the era’s dominant phenomenological bent in French philosophy in terms of the Left’s adherence to Marxian analyses. Ultimately, he argues for phenomenology’s place to speak to experiences beyond what is articulable in language, while also following its founder, Edmund Husserl (1859–1938), in arguing that it could provide the sciences with their grounding in the essence of their areas of study: what is the meaning of history for the historical sciences? What is the social for the sociologist? For Lyotard, these questions cannot be answered from within these sciences themselves.

Unlike Sartre, Lyotard does not seek a dialectical fusion of freedom, as found in existentialism, and necessity, as found in the objective laws found in the various sciences. Rather he seeks a “third way” of thinking of history that shows how ultimately phenomenology cannot speak to the movements of history found in Marxism, but he also rejects any incipient structuralism of the period that would denude the human of its place in history (Phenomenology, 131). For structuralism, as it would come to define itself over the next fifteen years in works by Lacan and Claude Levi-Strauss (1908–2009), among others, the human subject is largely the effect of discursive grammars in which it is produced. But most importantly for his later work, Lyotard argues that phenomenology offers a way not to think a single key to history, some one meaning to which it must answer, but rather stipulates that history, for phenomenology, has “some meaning” (Phenomenology, 131, his emphasis).

Nevertheless, Lyotard judged phenomenology to be ultimately reactionary, unable to respond to the ways in which the economic relations of production produce given conscious states, that is, how subjectivity is founded in objectivity. In this way, Lyotard’s work for the next decade would look to identify and illustrate these relations of production, especially in the Algerian situation, but time and again he chafed against Marxism’s cookie cutter approach, which denied cultural differences as epiphenomenal to the same economic forces it would find everywhere. The events of May 1968—and the vibrant intellectual period of France during the whole of the late 1960s—would have an indelible impact on Lyotard’s work. Marxism failed, he believed, to account for the alliance of bourgeois students and workers together demanding liberation, while the French Communist Party’s siding with Charles de Gaulle’s government in helping bring the May 1968 events to an end scandalized many on the left. Marxism, Lyotard believed, failed to account for the desire that pushed those very students into the streets in the first place. Structuralism, for its part, Lyotard averred, was ultimately too intellectualist to account for the sensuous and figural gestures that were very much a part of the anarchical May 1968 events. As marchers argued against their structuralist professors that structures don’t take to the streets, Lyotard came to emphasize the figural and aesthetic dimensions of human existence—going against what he believed was structuralism’s adherence to intellectual discourse over the libidinal, extra-linguistic and sensuous experience. This would result in Discourse, Figure (1971). This put him at odds with the dominant structuralist and post-structuralist emphasis on language, and as the 1970s began and disappointment set in that May 1968 gave rise to little in terms of substantive change, Lyotard, like others, looked to aesthetics and sensuous relations for their revolutionary potential. This led him to his strongest denunciation of Marxism yet in Libidinal Economy (1973). As the 1970s progressed and France moved from one technocratic government to the next, Lyotard began to elaborate a critique of technoscience and its reductionist account of existence in terms that also reflected post-structuralism’s attunement to difference. Ultimately, as he argued in such works as The Postmodern Condition (1979), Just Gaming (1979), and The Differend (1983), the task—in light of the loss of modernity’s metanarratives—was to account for the “differends” among different language games, that is, irreducible ways in which peoples operating within different milieu don’t have access to some all-encompassing order in which to have discussions over what is just, true, and so forth. This emphasis on language games, derived from Ludwig Wittgenstein’s (1889–1951) later work, but also influenced by such figures as Saul Kripke (1940– ), brought him within the linguistic turn that he had earlier found to be a linguistic idealism. Lyotard’s writings, then, were always on the move and it would be difficult to form a metanarrative or passkey that brings them all under a common point of view or set of concerns. Nevertheless, while he remained a man of his time—always responding and making advances in the dominant schools of French thought through which he lived—his work continues to speak to those influenced by those fields, as well as new movements in Continental realisms, aesthetics, and posthumanism.

3. Major Works

3.1 The Limits of Representation

Lyotard’s writings of the early 1970s were, it’s fair to say, far less influential at the time than, say, the writings of Michel Foucault (1926–1984) or Jacques Derrida (1930–2004). Yet, like Julia Kristeva (1941–), who developed in well-known articles leading to The Revolution in Poetic Language (1974) the distinction between the semiotic (the libidinal disruptiveness of bodily motility) and the symbolic (the structured grammar whose extreme form is mathematics) that together make language possible, Lyotard was interested in what escapes discourse but yet needs it to exist, just as there is no pure semiotic or symbolic language for Kristeva. In Discourse, Figure (1971), Lyotard differentiates discourse, that is, the written text investigated by semiotics and structuralism, and the figural, that is, the visual, which he discusses through the phenomenology of Merleau-Ponty. Lyotard’s work was avowedly a shot across the bow at structuralism, whether found in Lacan’s reading of Sigmund Freud (1856–1939) or Louis Althusser’s (1918–1990) structuralist Marxism. As he put it in a later interview, “I was against this way of thinking”, and for that reason the book was “ignored at the time because it was explicitly against structuralism” (“Resisting a Discourse of Mastery”, 191). For Lyotard, the emphasis on the written text in structuralism continues the Western tradition’s emphasis on the intellectual over the sensual. The figural is the disruptive force that is irreducible to any systemic or linguistic approach to language. For this reason, Lyotard valorizes the eye and its modes of seeing figures—shadings of meanings—that cannot be reduced to a single meaning or representation. The figural is what makes it impossible to collapse language into pure signification, what Kristeva would dub the symbolic, and this makes changes in language possible, as seen in poetry and literature. Discourse and figure, however, are not opposed but are co-implicated: texts always contain figures (metaphors and the poetic in general) while visual milieu would be chaotic without being ordered or structured discursively such that one can perceptually make one’s way about the world. In this way, what is libidinal and sensual is not, as Lacan argued, structured like a language, and Lyotard’s writings testify to an attunement of figural events that disrupt pre-given significations.

Libidinal Economy, published three years later, is one he later denounced, but remains an important examination of desire’s place as the driver of the political while also critiquing political and linguistic models of representation. The book is very much a reflection of its era: Deleuze and Felix Guattari’s (1930–1992) Anti-Oedipus had come out in 1972, arguing against Freudian accounts of repression while offering an immanentist ontology whereby all events had to be accounted for without reference to an outside or be confused with the representations made of them. Lyotard follows Friedrich Nietzsche (1844–1900) in arguing that there is no objective science or forms of knowledge that are not based in a desire or what Nietzsche called a will for power, a point that Lyotard will make by looking at the desire or libido behind the so-called scientific works of the later Marx. Libidinal Economy is not an easy read, not least since it does not wish to set itself up as merely another philosophical theory hiding its own desires, with a truth easily representable to others (Libidinal, 244). While Freud largely discussed the libido at the individual level as a form of energy circulating within the body and necessitating societal laws that led to the formation of an internal superego keeping these energies in check, Lyotard greatly extends the idea of the libido to think of political economy as really a libidinal economy. In sum, he looks to any stable formations within society as libidinal fields, whether we are discussing linguistics, economics, or architecture. For Lyotard, Freud’s notion of the pleasure principle (Eros) provides for this stabilizing effect of the other side of our drives, namely the death drive (Thanatos), which seeks out intensities, whether high or low, that destabilize institutions. These transformations occur through certain techniques (dispositifs, a term important in Foucault’s work of the time) that guide these energies and which are themselves almost precarious formations of energies themselves: the body, works of art, financial systems, texts, theoretical systems, and so forth. The mutations caused by the libidinal economy are events. The libido itself, its energetics, is never representable or containable within any given system; all desires are dissimulated in these institutions, and they are never presentable as they are in themselves. This is quite similar to what Deleuze and Guattari discuss in terms of organisms and and the body without organs in Anti-Oedipus two years earlier, and both texts are often read as encouraging these flows of energy, that is, the creation of the highest intensities, over forms of organization that tamp down these events. For this reason, both books will be critiqued as being irresponsibly anarchist. For Lyotard, structures and institutions tend to totalize and exploit intensities for their own good, and thus lay claim to all proper interpretations of these intensities. But where Deleuze and Guattari differentiate fascistic and liberating forms of desire, Lyotard argues it is impossible to do so. Hence, for example, he will say that capitalism is a liberating form of libidinal economy, since it overthrows all manner of institutions in the name of the accumulation of more and more money. Against Marx, he argues that our innate desires are not alienated in capitalism, but rather that capitalism is another means for the death drive to demolish those entities in its way, such as when capitalist expansion undoes traditional values and previous forms of economics. And just as in capitalism, where it matters not what goods are in circulation as long as there is an accumulation of capital, desires are neutral as to their locale. Indeed, later in interviews he will argue for at least passing through capitalism for those facing economic hardship. “Capitalism”, he will say in 1995, “is the only solution” for the unemployed and dispossessed, and there is “no competition” to capitalism for doing so (“Resisting a Discourse of Mastery”, 182). Only once one has a job, food, and housing, he goes on, can “real resistance appear”.

In any event, as Lyotard puts it, there is “not good or bad intensities, then, but intensity or its decompression” (Libidinal, 42). But this leaves, then, open a question that haunts other similar projects of the time: if each intensity is not to be thought outside of itself in terms of some representation or measure, then what ethics is available when all intensities are only to be thought in terms of their inherent efficacy? From what place, then, can one deem one set of intensities or libido economy “bad” over and against another? If all can and, it seems in Lyotard’s text, should come undone, then are we merely positing a nihilism?

3.2 Justice in light of the Postmodern Condition

As the 1970s progressed, Lyotard moved towards considerations of justice that could discern among different regimes of intensities, but only once we acknowledge the changes in the era in which we live. The Postmodern Condition begins by defining the postmodern as “incredulity towards metanarratives”, which is fitting given that it is a report on knowledge in the contemporary age. Lyotard means that modernist considerations of education as slowly developing and emancipating human beings in terms of a common project where all forms of knowledge ultimately cohere has fallen away and that we are left merely with “little” or regional narratives at odds with one another. He writes:

I will use the term modern to designate any science that legitimates itself with reference to a metadiscourse … making an explicit appeal to some grand narrative, such as the dialectics of Spirit, the hermeneutics of meaning, the emancipation of the rational or working subject, or the creation of wealth … I define postmodern as incredulity toward metanarratives. (Postmodern Condition, xxiii–xxiv)

This is the overarching theme of the book, which also takes up the crisis of legitimation in the sciences, which often must use extra-scientific narratives to attempt to place themselves above other kinds of narration (the arts, novels, philosophy, and so forth) as the final arbiter of truth, and hence is one of the last metanarratives of modernity. The problem, Lyotard argues, is that the sciences face two crises: one of representation, that is, that it cannot be held naively that its models present to human subjects an accurate view of the objective world, instead of paradigms in which only certain views of the world fit and which, within a few years, can be completely overturned. Like any other particular kind of knowledge, e.g., a religious or philosophical text, science is unable to move to transcend its particular modes of discourse in order to claim anything beyond its own sphere of competence and the rules by which its language game is played. The second crisis is that science and other forms of knowledge are being put to the “technological” or “operativity” criterion (Postmodern Condition, xxv). In this way, the gaining of scientific knowledge is not an end in itself, in but is in service ultimately to economic motives that will make certain processes more efficient and others redundant.

The narrative of The Postmodern Condition moves along two temporal periods, one being modernity and its adherence to certain metanarratives or means of organizing society’s chaotic mix of different language games, the other being the computerization of knowledge that occurred from the 1950s forward. This would become what is now called the “information” or “knowledge” economy, and Lyotard is one of those political thinkers who recognized a changeover from state-centered forms of liberalism to the neo-liberal, laissez-faire deregulation of economies just before the Reagan and Thatcher victories in the United States and United Kingdom. This computerization of knowledge has not just sped up how knowledge is transferred, but what we think knowledge is, especially as the sciences are put almost wholly in service of supplying patents and know-how for corporations. Lyotard avers that the old model of the learning of knowledge as a means for making citizens and free agents of individuals is falling away as knowledge is exteriorized from any particular individual knowers, and what is considered knowledge will only be that which can be translated into computerizable language. “We can predict that anything in the constituted body of knowledge that is not translatable in this way will be abandoned”, he writes, “and that the direction of new research will be dictated by the possibility” (Postmodern Condition, 4). Where before nation-states scrambled in competition for resources, what is now at stake are “informational commodit[ies]”, small packets of information to be gained and traded under conditions where maximal efficiency is given absolute privilege (Postmodern Condition, 5). Universities, then, will soon give up their roles in providing training (what the Germans call Bildung), instead preparing their students for becoming managers and creating these packets of information. No doubt, Lyotard was not the only one to see these changes coming, but his prescience is notable nonetheless. At the same time, since multinational corporations are best suited to commodify information at vast scales, the nation-state will lose its central political place and indeed purposely abdicate its role in managing national economies. This reduction of knowledge to that which is easily translatable and understandable, of course, is what drives globalization, and the leading economies, as Lyotard notes, will not be those engaged in manufacturing traditional commodities but instead those created and utilized through modern computing.

Knowledge in the form of an informational commodity indispensable to productive power is already, and will continue to be, a major—perhaps the major—stake in the worldwide competition for power. (Postmodern Condition, 5)

One need only see the decimation of the U.S.’s rust belt communities and the outsized economic and political role of Silicon Valley and the banking sectors in London and New York as proof of Lyotard’s claims. But these changes have another effect as well: these centers adjudicate what knowledge is, and one need only witness often fruitless attempts by humanities departments to prove themselves valuable to employers in the digital economy as evidence of this.

Lyotard offers that the postmodern, as he sees it, ought to look for what is irreducible to commodification, that which is unpresentable within the “realism” of today (Postmodern Condition, 73–9). That which is taken to be real and most natural is the formation of knowledge in terms understandable by capitalist economics and its modes of efficiency. Lyotard, then, argues for forms of avant-gardism that seek what is unpresentable in the present. Books by James Joyce (1882–1941), no doubt, can be treated like a commodity like any other, but open up onto a plurality of meanings. One could read Joyce’s Ulysses (1922) in the service of having dinner party patter, but such postmodern works ultimately evade any simple meaning to pass along in such idle chatter. Here is how Lyotard famously defines the postmodern more positively than being merely a disbelief in metanarratives:

The postmodern would be that which, in the modern, puts forward the unpresentable in presentation itself; that which denies itself the solace of good forms, the consensus of a taste which would make it possible to share collectively the nostalgia for the unattainable; that which searches for new presentations, not in order to enjoy them but in order to impart a stronger sense of the unpresentable. A postmodern artist or writer is in the position of a philosopher: the text he writes, the work he produces are not in principle governed by pre-established rules, and they cannot be judged according to a determining judgment, by applying familiar categories to the text. (Postmodern Condition, 81)

In sum, while there are a heterogeneity of language games through which we pass, artists, writers, and philosophers make moves within those language games—say those said to govern what a novel is—that disrupt and open those language games to what “will have been”, as he puts it. That is, they open up new ways of thinking that are unpresentable in current language games. “Terror”, as he understands it, is “a fantasy to seize reality”, that is to colonize or totalize all other language games and their future possibilities under the regime of one language game (e.g., the technocratic language game of efficiency [Postmodern Condition, 67]). On this flip side of this terror are those that are “witnesses to the unpresentable”, who wish to “activate the difference” beyond and between the plurality of language games that make up postmodern societies (Postmodern Condition, 82).

Published the same year as The Postmodern Condition, Lyotard’s Just Gaming (Au juste) is short, but nevertheless deserves its place among a canon of important 20th-century texts on justice, along with his The Differend. After Libidinal Economy, through a series of shorter works, Lyotard argued that we live again in pagan societies with many gods to be worshipped. By this he means that we live among and through a variety of language games (science, art, politics, and so on) (Just Gaming, 36). His main argument, though, is that “we judge without criteria” (Just Gaming, 14), that is, there are no ontological or theoretical foundations for our ethical and political claims for justice (Just Gaming, 44). In this way, he radicalizes David Hume’s (1711–1776) claim that one cannot derive an “ought” from an “is”. Just because there is a certain set of circumstances that we can denotate does not prescribe for us what to do in light of those conditions. Lyotard’s answers in this set of interviews to his interlocutor, Jean-Loup Thébaud, the editor of the French journal L’esprit, attempt to thread a tricky political needle: he recognizes that in postmodernity, there is no metanarrative, no onto-theology, as Martin Heidegger (1889–1976) would call it, that can ground prescriptive statements. Yet, leaving behind any foundation for prescriptive statements does not leave us unable to speak to what is just and unjust. For Lyotard, following Emmanuel Levinas (1906–1995), we are nothing but the receivers of obligations. For Levinas, that meant that ethics was first philosophy and we were always passive to the Other who came before us. But Lyotard argues, though, that ethics cannot be first philosophy, but is but one language game among others. And yet it is not nothing, since we are pulled into the pragmatics and practice of this particular language game that calls on us to make judgments. What is unjust, Lyotard avers,

occur[s] if the pragmatics of obligation, that is, the possibility of continuing to play the game of the just, were excluded. That is what is unjust. Not the opposite of the just, but that which prohibits that the question of the just and the unjust be, and remain, raised. Thus, obviously, all terror, annihilation, massacre, etc., or their threat, are, by definition, unjust. (Just Gaming, 66–7)

In this way, there can be prescriptives after the “death of God”, as Nietzsche called it, and the era of paganism that arose in its place (Just Gaming, 36). What is unjust is the violent silencing of those raising claims to justice and disallowing them from making prescriptive claims, such as those colonized and left unheard by hegemonic powers.

For Lyotard, there is “no knowledge in the matter of ethics”, nor is there a theoretical truth to adhere to in politics. Rather, politics is a matter of a diversity of opinions, as the non-Platonic Greeks believed, and is about nothing but this plurality of opinions. The ability to judge is a “power to invent criteria”, that is, create new rules not recognized by the dominant modes of thinking politics. This claim brings Lyotard’s thinking of the political close to Hannah Arendt’s thinking of action and her notion of “thinking without banisters” after modernity’s loss of authority. Politics, she believed, became ideological at best and totalitarian at worst if wedded to notions of truth, such as involved in the metanarratives of Marxist economic theory and its inexorable laws of history, or the racist theories of Nazism. The task, for Lyotard, is to see that questions of justice and prescriptive language games are not simply about obeying laws. Rather, the task is to develop an attunement to the plurality of opinions and language games. “We have to judge case by case”, he avers, pointing to Aristotelian phronēsis or practical wisdom as a model, but without an overarching community telos as in Aristotle’s (384–422 BCE) Nichomachean Ethics (Just Gaming, 47). Even such seemingly universal prescriptions, such as “thou shall not kill”, are anything but, since exceptions are invariably made concerning those lives that are to be taken in terms of the death penalty or in war. The point, then, is not that Lyotard’s “pagan” ethics and politics leads to irresponsibility, but the opposite. If it were just a matter of having a sure knowledge or absolute set of laws to follow, then politics would be pre-programmed and there would be no judgment worthy of the name.

3.3 The Differend

Shortly after completing Libidinal Economy, Lyotard began nine years of efforts crafting his masterwork, The Differend (1983). The book begins with a “Reading Dossier” that sets out clearly the question, theses, context, addressee, and so forth of the work in separate paragraphs. The context, he argues, is the linguistic turn in philosophy, and his avowed method is to engage political disputes on the model of linguistic affairs (Differend, xiii). The book itself contains 264 numbered paragraphs, building on arguments he had been making in the years leading up to the work. The major change is that Lyotard no longer uses the term “language games”, which led some readers to think that subjects could be outside these games as players. Lyotard is clear that subjects are only such in the way that they move and are produced by moves within different language games. The “object”, of The Differend will be “phrases”, which are indubitable since “to doubt that one phrases is still to phrase”, he argues, since even “one’s silence makes a phrase” (Differend, 11).

Despite this linguistic model, phrases may be extralinguistic, including the very gestures, shadings, and libidinal energetics he had discussed in his earlier writings. Anything, then, can be a phrase in Lyotard’s understanding. For every phrase, there is a regimen within which it exists, the possible significations of that phrase, the referent of the phrase, the one from whom the phrase arrives, and the addressee, the one to whom the phrase is addressed. Within each phrase regimen, there is a certain play, since there may be ambiguities along each aspect above. Any reader of Twitter knows the problem: is this meant as irony? In the form of a question? Who is being addressed and why? Only with continual phrases, linked to the initial phrase, does the initial ambiguity become clearer, but of course, with these newer phrases, further ambiguities may take place, since they face the same problems as the initial phrase. Nevertheless there are rules followed within phrase regimens such that certain phrases are allowable while others are not. Lyotard writes:

There are a number of phrase regimens: knowing, describing, recounting, questioning, showing, ordering. etc. Phrases from heterogeneous regimens cannot be translated from one into the other. They can be linked one onto the other in accordance with an end fixed by the a genre of discourse …Genres of discourse supply rules for linking together heterogeneous phrases, rules that are proper for attaining certain goals: to know, to teach, to be just, to seduce, to justify, to evaluate, to rouse emotion, to oversee. (Differend, xii).

This notion of linkages is important. Links follow the rules of the particular regimen or genre, while linking different phrases together is “the problem of politics” (Differend, xiii). Linking phrases, he says, is necessary but contingent in how it is done (Differend, 29). Linkages among phrases occur within genres, and these links are successful when the goals of the discourse are met: one seduces another, a question is met with an answer, or an economic exchange is performed. Yet these rules only apply within specific genres and there are no rules for how to make links between the different genres themselves. Lyotard argues that within genres, we cannot help but make linkages, and the hope is to escape the problem of what Lyotard calls a differend, where one move makes a link from within one discourse in other to colonize, that is, silence, another. Thus, though we cannot do anything other than make linkages among phrases and create new events, hegemonic discourses or grand narratives often want to pre-program how those links are to be made and thus control all future phrases or events (Differend, 80).

This is not to say that links within regimens are not without conflict: within the regimen of parliamentary democracy, within courts of law, within art criticism, there are always forms of “litigation” where one takes the rules within that genre and apply them to a particular case and arguments ensue. For example, to use the court example from which Lyotard borrows his term, in court one may use rules of evidence, case law, and so forth both in defending and prosecuting a certain defendant, all of which remains within the regimen of criminal law, and even if there are “damages”—one loses—one has at least been given one’s “rights” within that phrase regimen. This is not the case where there is a differend (différend):

As distinguished from a litigation, a differend would be a case of conflict, between (at least) two parties, that cannot be resolved for lack of a rule of judgement applicable to both of the arguments. One side’s legitimacy does not imply the other’s lack of legitimacy. However, applying a single rule of judgement to both in order to settle their differend as though it were merely a litigation would wrong (at least) one of them (and both of them if neither side admits this rule). (Differend, xi)

Lyotard offers a number of examples of differends: the relation of colonizer and the colonized or between the bourgeoisie and the proletariat, but he opens The Differend with the case of the French Holocaust denier Robert Faurisson, who claimed that the only testimony that he would accept would be that of someone who had actually been through the gas chambers. This, of course, sets off a differend since to have seen the gas chambers in operation would be to have been its victim, and thus silences all other genres, the various linkages of communication within the genre of history, for example, that would testify to the Shoah. One set of phrases is absolutely incommunicable with the other. But this does not mean that there is an “equivalence” between the discourse of the denier and the discourses of historians and survivors alike. Lyotard’s response to this problem is complicated. He argues, not always persuasively, that the Nazis were in many ways successful in destroying the means by which historians adduce historical events: they not only killed their victims and destroyed their bodies, but also the paperwork and buildings that would be evidence of their crimes. “The result”, he writes, “is that one cannot adduce numerical proof of the massacre and that a historian pleading for the trial’s revision will be able to object at great length that the crime has not been established in its quantity” (Differend, 56). But the task of justice, he claims, is not to let the Nazis or their modern apologists claim a relativism of different discourses. Lyotard argues that Auschwitz offers something that is unpresentable in the presentation of history itself: an inverted sublime, a horror so infinite that a “silence” is “imposed on knowledge”, though it does “not impose the silence of forgetting” (Differend, 56). Indeed, he says, it imposes a sentiment, if not an obligation:

The silence that surrounds the phrase, Auschwitz was the extermination camp is not a state of mind, is the sign that something remains to be phrased which is not. (Differend, 57)

In other words, the Shoah leaves us silent before its void, since it does not belong to any previous political phrase regimen or means for representing it. To represent it is to misrepresent it, and hence any regime is going to leave this powerful silence always on the edge of any discourse about it. From his early work on phenomenology through Discourse, Figure, Libidinal Economy, and The Postmodern Condition, Lyotard argued that events occur always in the face of what is not presentable to a phenomenology, discourse, language game, or phrase regimen. An event, if it occurs, is not simply unforseeable within any of these, but in fact explodes our ability to represent them within any language game or phrase regimen. The Shoah is one such event.

The political import of differends is easy to see: Israelis and Palestinians are not “litigating” a “political” impasse, but have completely different phrase regimens within which situations are interpreted and understood, and they are completely irreconcilable. There is no link to be found between the genre of discourse of the Apartheid South Africa and those who were silenced and violently suffered under white hegemony. There is, in these cases, no possibility for litigation, since one side has no right to claim justice within the dominant language of the political regime. This is what Lyotard had in earlier works called “terror” and in The Differend calls a wrong:

This is what a wrong would be: a damage accompanied by the lose of the means to prove the damage. This is the case if the victim is deprived of life, or all of his or her liberties, or of the freedom to make his or her ideas or opinions public, or simply the right to testify to the damage… In all of these cases, to the privation constituted by the damage there is added the impossibility of bringing it to the knowledge of others. (Differend, 5)

This should not be taken to mean that linkages cannot eventually be made, that justice cannot be done in spite of a differend. But new phrases regimens will need to be invented, new gestures or ways of existing together will have to be found, to get around this incommensurability. In fact, the cause of justice means that one phrase regimen (e.g., that of the Apartheid government) will need to be rooted out in order for its hegemony to end. For Lyotard, then, the politics of the differend does not call for valuing different discourses equally or one recognizing another, since, of course, conflict occurs precisely where neither side finds meaning in the phrase regimen of the other. Lyotard thus does not model the different phrase regimens as a marketplace of ideas, since the existence of one phrase regimen may mean the violent silencing of another.

This is what gives us the ability to name the unjust. The plurality of phrase regimens is a fact, and what is unjust or wrong would be precisely using one phrase regimen to silence that of others, to introduce a localized narrative as a metanarrative that would put all others in their place and render them mute and unseen. The postmodern obligation, then, as we saw at the end of The Postmodern Condition, is, yes, to deny “reality”, but only as that reality tends to be defined by hegemonic discourses, not the plenitude of plural ways of being in the world.

3.4 The Inhuman and the Event

Returning to themes in The Postmodern Condition, 1988’s The Inhuman returns to the problems of consumer capitalism. This set of essays, most first given as lectures, are remarkable in their literary and philosophical quality, with each indirectly, as the subtitle suggests, taking up the problem of temporality, that is, our openness to the unphraseable events given in a future worthy of the name. Like other French thinkers of his day, Lyotard was a thoroughgoing critic of humanism and its pretension to define and thus limit what the human was to be. The Inhuman begins by dissociating two forms that the “inhuman” has taken in postmodernity: on the one hand, there is the dehumanizing inhumanism of contemporary capitalism and its reduction of the human to modes of efficiency and the needs of the technocratic order, specifically through the ideology of “development”. Under this rubric, what is dubbed the human is constrained to become more like machines in their functioning, or indeed that the machines we have built will replace us in terms of the thinking we thought integral to the human being. The opening essay, “Can Thought Go on without a Body?” takes this up as the ultimate dream of technoscience, arguing, in a dialogue between a “he” and a “she”, that “the sole serious question to face humanity today” is the fact that in 4.5 billion years, the sun will burn out and take all of human thought, including the entire archive that human beings ever existed, with it (Inhuman, 9). Techno-science, the “he” claims, has its telos in escaping this fate, which “he” calls a “pure event”, one that, in the terms of The Differend, could never be put into a phrase since no one would be there to think it. “All the events and disasters we’re familiar with and try to think of”, “he” writes, “will end up as no more than pale simulacra” (Inhuman, 11). While hyperbolic, Lyotard’s surmise is that technoscience is driven by a need to conquer our being-towards-death and indeed, the possibility of the ultimate finitude of any living-on of any memory or history of humanity marked by the coming solar catastrophe. Digital technologies offer the hope of a becoming-inhuman of thought, of thought going on without a body, one that “she” offers would have to transcend “the differend of gender” and corporeal existence (Inhuman, 22–3). “She” argues that suffering and pain can only exist within a body, and thus any impetus to resistance to the literal programming of phrase regimens (computer programming being the most purified form of what Lyotard had called discourse in Discourse, Figure) would disappear. This surmise is no longer hyperbolic: there are myriad research programs in Silicon Valley and elsewhere for performing precisely what Lyotard suggests, namely making thought go on without a body, though whether one could call this thought in the full sense is precisely why Lyotard calls this the “sole question” facing humanity, given that it goes to what we mean by the word human.

Against this notion of the inhuman, akin to what Lyotard years earlier had called the figural, is the inventiveness of another form of the inhuman, what would get us beyond the human of humanism and its grand narratives. This event is one that Lyotard links to the youth of the child, since it has ever present possibilities that are nevertheless not presentable or speakable within the phrase regimens of the present, and thus provides a site of resistance to the dominant modes of “reality”. “Being prepared to receive what thought is not prepared to think”, he writes, “is what deserves the name of thinking” (Inhuman, 73). This form of the inhuman, against those who would think of Lyotard as a celebrant of the 1960s death of man and the end of humanism, stands as a testament to the inventiveness of the human and its irreducibility to the machinic—to the point where it can transcend what we thought the human was to be. As in Discourse, Figure, it is not that one form of the inhuman exists without the other: the technical and the artistic are not easily separable, and the arts survive using techniques and known grammars in order to coming into being. This is why Lyotard argues that the postmodern, despite suggestions otherwise in The Postmodern Condition, is not a “period” that comes after the modern. On his view, the postmodern is that which exists within the modern itself.

In any case, computerization seeks the repetition of what exists now in modes of efficiency, while the child in the human is open to possibilities of the future, the events to come that cannot be programmed or pre-figured. To attempt the latter, Lyotard claims throughout his later works, is an attempt to control and therefore escape time:

[I]t must never be forgotten that if thinking indeed consists in receiving the event, it follows that no-one can claim to think without being ipso facto in a position of resistance to the procedures for controlling time. To think is to question everything, including thought, and question, and the process. To question requires that something happen that reason has not yet known. In thinking, one accepts the occurrence for what it is: “not yet” determined. (Inhuman, 74)

In the Inhuman, Lyotard thinks the event not through the phrase “What is happening”, which presumes that all one has to do is await a form of information, as one does when watching television news. Rather the event arrives, as suggested above, through a questioning, specifically the question “is it happening” (“arrive-t-il?”), which opens up the possibility that “nothing might happen” (Inhuman, 92). This is the terror and pleasure found in Immanuel Kant’s (1724–1804) account of the sublime in The Critique of Judgment (1790), wherein one experiences a feeling that explodes one’s capacities for imagination and causes both pleasure and displeasure at once (Inhuman, 85). This, for Lyotard, is at the heart of all creation, which comes with the

misery that the painter faces with a plastic surface, of the musician with the acoustic surface, the misery the thinker faces with a desert of thought, and so on. (Inhuman, 91)

Barnett Newman’s (1905–1970) paintings, which often are merely monochromatic with single, straight “zips” or lines traversing them, is a paradigm of this. Newman’s paintings offer the “postmodern sublime”, for Lyotard. Everything in Newman’s paintings arrives in an instant, yet what arrives is what Lyotard calls the postmodern: the unpresentable in presentation itself. The paintings have no allusions, no modernist story to them. To their surfaces one can only ask “is it happening?” Any answer to the question fails since it would be attempting to represent what is not offered in the painting itself. In this way, the postmodern artist is modernist in the sense of seeking out what is new, not according to pre-established phrase regimens, but by exploring means for finding what cannot be articulated within any phrase regimens. Lyotard’s essays on Newman have had an indelible impact on aesthetics and understanding what has been underway in so-called postmodern art. When spectators complain that postmodern artists do not present anything to be understood or that their works withstand interpretation, Lyotard’s claim is that this is precisely the point: to stand against being recuperated within dominant modes of thinking. This is the ultimate argument that art is for art’s sake. Art need not provide a political message, represent reality properly, or morally guide us. Rather postmodern art would be that taking place of a self-enclosed event that withstands interpretation and is irreducible, as art, to any use value.

4. The Future of Lyotard

Lyotard’s writings have been seen as paradigmatic of the excesses of “high theory” in the 1970s and 1980s. His account of language games and refusal to allow any to have a grip on reality is supposed by his critics to have helped usher in a “post-fact” world. Yet Lyotard’s claims, as he well knew, were not far from the anti-realisms of those in Anglo-American philosophy influenced by Ludwig Wittgenstein, such as Michael Dummett (1925–2011), who at the time Lyotard was writing argued that claims to reality were merely moves within a given conceptual scheme and there was no test external to these schemes for corresponding that scheme to an external reality. Though this led Dummett to an anti-realist position on time, following J. M. E. McTaggart (1866–1925), Lyotard’s thinking of phrase regimens and their limits were meant to testify, as The Inhuman makes clear, to human finitude and the unassailable coming of the future and the simplicity of events. The future, as such, is not something that can be predicted from the present, since this would only be a present imagined into the future. Lyotard, especially in The Postmodern Condition, assailed realisms, but always from the point of view that these “realisms” want to pre-program and thus disallow the coming of events. In this way, from the beginning of his career to its end, Lyotard never argued that all was socially constructed, that all language games had equal validity, or that we are locked within the prison house of language. Rather, all of his works attempt to testify to that which escapes language, though we never stop attempting to articulate this excess. This leads to a dizzying array of differences among and between phrase regimens, and Lyotard’s work was to testify to the fact of these differences and the injustices of differends where these differences are silenced. The postmodern, then, bears witness not to the fact that there are no facts, but rather that those claiming a passkey to reality merely want to make a claim for the hegemony of one phrase regimen (e.g., the sciences or techno-capitalism) over all others.


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