Philosophy of Money and Finance

First published Fri Nov 2, 2018; substantive revision Fri Mar 10, 2023

Finance and philosophy may seem to be worlds apart. But they share at least one common ancestor: Thales of Miletus. Thales is typically regarded as the first philosopher, but he was also a financial innovator. He appears to have been what we would now call an option trader. He predicted that next year’s olive harvest would be good, and therefore paid a small amount of money to the owners of olive presses for the right to the next year’s use. When the harvest turned out to be as good as predicted, Thales earned a sizable amount of money by renting out the presses (Aristotle, Politics, 1259a).

Obviously, a lot has changed since Thales’ times, both in finance and in our ethical and political attitudes towards finance. Coins have largely been replaced by either paper or electronic money, and we have built a large infrastructure to facilitate transactions of money and other financial assets—with elements including commercial banks, central banks, insurance companies, stock exchanges, and investment funds. This institutional multiplicity is due to concerted efforts of both private and public agents, as well as innovations in financial economics and in the financial industry (Shiller 2012).

Our ethical and political sensitivities have also changed in several respects. It seems fair to say that most traditional ethicists held a very negative attitude towards financial activities. Think, for example, of Jesus’ cleansing of the temple from moneylenders, and the widespread condemnation of money as “the root of all evil”. Attitudes in this regard seem to have softened over time. However, the moral debate continues to recur, especially in connection with large scandals and crises within finance, the largest such crisis in recent memory of course being the global financial crisis of 2008.

This article describes what philosophical analysis can say about money and finance. It is divided into five parts that respectively concern (1) what money and finance really are (metaphysics), (2) how knowledge about financial matters is or should be formed (epistemology), (3) the merits and challenges of financial economics (philosophy of science), (4) the many ethical issues related to money and finance (ethics), and (5) the relationship between finance and politics (political philosophy).

1. Metaphysics

1.1 What is Money?

Money is so ever-present in modern life that we tend to take its existence and nature for granted. But do we know what money actually is? Two competing theories present fundamentally different ontologies of money.

The commodity theory of money: A classic theory, which goes back all the way to Aristotle (Politics, 1255b–1256b), holds that money is a kind of commodity that fulfills three functions: it serves as (i) a medium of exchange, (ii) a unit of account, and (iii) a store of value. Imagine a society that lacks money, and in which people have to barter goods with each other. Barter only works when there is a double coincidence of wants; that is, when A wants what B has and B wants what A has. But since such coincidences are likely to be uncommon, a barter economy seems both cumbersome and inefficient (Smith 1776, Menger 1892). At some point, people will realize that they can trade more easily if they use some intermediate good—money. This intermediate good should ideally be easy to handle, store and transport (function i). It should be easy to measure and divide to facilitate calculations (function ii). And it should be difficult to destroy so that it lasts over time (function iii).

Monetary history may be viewed as a process of improvement with regard to these functions of money (Ferguson 2008, Weatherford 1997). For example, some early societies used certain basic necessities as money, such as cattle or grain. Other societies settled on commodities that were easier to handle and to tally but with more indirect value, such as clamshells and precious metals. The archetypical form of money throughout history are gold or silver coins—therefore the commodity theory is sometimes called metallism (Knapp 1924, Schumpeter 1954). Coinage is an improvement on bullion in that both quantity and purity are guaranteed by some third party, typically the government. Finally, paper money can be viewed as a simplification of the trade in coins. For example, a bank note issued by the Bank of England in the 1700s was a promise to pay the bearer a certain pound weight of sterling silver (hence the origin of the name of the British currency as “pounds sterling”).

The commodity theory of money was defended by many classical economists and can still be found in most economics textbooks (Mankiw 2009, Parkin 2011). This latter fact is curious since it has provoked serious and sustained critique. An obvious flaw is that it has difficulties in explaining inflation, the decreasing value of money over time (Innes 1913, Keynes 1936). It has also been challenged on the grounds that it is historically inaccurate. For example, recent anthropological studies question the idea that early societies went from a barter economy to money; instead money seems to have arisen to keep track of pre-existing credit relationships (Graeber 2011, Martin 2013, Douglas 2016).

The credit theory of money: According to the main rival theory, coins and notes are merely tokens of something more abstract: money is a social construction rather than a physical commodity. The abstract entity in question is a credit relationship; that is, a promise from someone to grant (or repay) a favor (product or service) to the holder of the token (Macleod 1889, Innes 1914, Ingham 2004). In order to function as money, two further features are crucial: that (i) the promise is sufficiently credible, that is, the issuer is “creditworthy”; and (ii) the credit is transferable, that is, also others will accept it as payment for trade.

It is commonly thought that the most creditworthy issuer of money is the state. This thought provides an alternative explanation of the predominance of coins and notes whose value is guaranteed by states. But note that this theory also can explain so-called fiat money, which is money that is underwritten by the state but not redeemable in any commodity like gold or silver. Fiat money has been the dominant kind of money globally since 1971, when the United States terminated the convertibility of dollars to gold. The view that only states can issue money is called chartalism, or the state theory of money (Knapp 1924). However, in order to properly understand the current monetary system, it is important to distinguish between states’ issuing versus underwriting money. Most credit money in modern economies is actually issued by commercial banks through their lending operations, and the role of the state is only to guarantee the convertibility of bank deposits into cash (Pettifor 2014).

Criticisms of the credit theory tend to be normative and focus on the risk of overexpansion of money, that is, that states (and banks) can overuse their “printing presses” which may lead to unsustainable debt levels, excessive inflation, financial instability and economic crises. These are sometimes seen as arguments for a return to the gold standard (Rothbard 1983, Schlichter 2014). However, others argue that the realization that money is socially constructed is the best starting point for developing a more sustainable and equitable monetary regime (Graeber 2010, Pettifor 2014). We will return to this political debate below (section 5.2).

The social ontology of money: But exactly how does the “social construction” of money work? This question invokes the more general philosophical issue of social ontology, with regard to which money is often used as a prime example. In an early philosophical-sociological account, Georg Simmel (1900) describes money as an institution that is a crucial precondition for modernity because it allows putting a value on things and simplifies transactions; he also criticizes the way in which money thereby replaces other forms of valuation (see also section 4.1).

In the more recent debate, one can distinguish between two main philosophical camps. An influential account of social ontology holds that money is the sort of social institution whose existence depends on “collective intentionality”: beliefs and attitudes that are shared in a community (Searle 1995, 2010). The process starts with someone’s simple and unilateral declaration that something is money, which is a performative speech act. When other people recognize or accept the declaration it becomes a standing social rule. Thus, money is said to depend on our subjective attitudes but is not located (solely) in our minds (see also Lawson 2016, Brynjarsdóttir 2018, Passinsky 2020, Vooys & Dick 2021).

An alternative account holds that the creation of money need not be intentional or declarative in the above sense. Instead money comes about as a solution to a social problem (the double coincidence of wants) – and it is maintained simply because it is functional or beneficial to us (Guala 2016, Hindriks & Guala 2021). Thus what makes something money is not the official declarations of some authority, but rather that it works (functions) as money in a given society (see also Smit et al. 2011; 2016). (For more discussion see the special issue by Hindriks & Sandberg 2020, as well as the entries on social ontology and social institutions).

1.2 What is Finance?

One may view “finance” more generally (that is, the financial sector or system) as an extension of the monetary system. It is typically said that the financial sector has two main functions: (1) to maintain an effective payments system; and (2) to facilitate an efficient use of money. The latter function can be broken down further into two parts. First, to bring together those with excess money (savers, investors) and those without it (borrowers, enterprises), which is typically done through financial intermediation (the inner workings of banks) or financial markets (such as stock or bond markets). Second, to create opportunities for market participants to buy and sell money, which is typically done through the invention of financial products, or “assets”, with features distinguished by different levels of risk, return, and maturation.

The modern financial system can thus be seen as an infrastructure built to facilitate transactions of money and other financial assets, as noted at the outset. It is important to note that it contains both private elements (such as commercial banks, insurance companies, and investment funds) and public elements (such as central banks and regulatory authorities). “Finance” can also refer to the systematic study of this system; most often to the field of financial economics (see section 3).

Financial assets: Of interest from an ontological viewpoint is that modern finance consists of several other “asset types” besides money; central examples include credit arrangements (bank accounts, bonds), equity (shares or stocks), derivatives (futures, options, swaps, etc.) and funds (trusts). What are the defining characteristics of financial assets?

The typical distinction here is between financial and “real” assets, such as buildings and machines (Fabozzi 2002), because financial assets are less tangible or concrete. Just like money, they can be viewed as a social construction. Financial assets are often derived from or at least involve underlying “real” assets—as, for example, in the relation between owning a house and investing in a housing company. However, financial transactions are different from ordinary market trades in that the underlying assets seldom change hands, instead one exchanges abstract contracts or promises of future transactions. In this sense, one may view the financial market as the “meta-level” of the economy, since it involves indirect trade or speculation on the success of other parts of the economy.

More distinctly, financial assets are defined as promises of future money payments (Mishkin 2016, Pilbeam 2010). If the credit theory of money is correct, they can be regarded as meta-promises: promises on promises. The level of abstraction can sometimes become enormous: For example, a “synthetic collateralized debt obligation” (or “synthetic CDO”), a form of derivative common before the financial crisis, is a promise from person A (the seller) to person B (the buyer) that some persons C to I (speculators) will pay an amount of money depending on the losses incurred by person J (the holder of an underlying derivative), which typically depend on certain portions (so-called tranches) of the cash flow from persons K to Q (mortgage borrowers) originally promised to persons R to X (mortgage lenders) but then sold to person Y (the originator of the underlying derivative). The function of a synthetic CDO is mainly to spread financial risks more thinly between different speculators.

Intrinsic value: Perhaps the most important characteristic of financial assets is that their price can vary enormously with the attitudes of investors. Put simply, there are two main factors that determine the price of a financial asset: (i) the credibility or strength of the underlying promise (which will depend on the future cash flows generated by the asset); and (ii) its transferability or popularity within the market, that is, how many other investors are interested in buying the asset. In the process known as “price discovery”, investors assess these factors based on the information available to them, and then make bids to buy or sell the asset, which in turn sets its price on the market (Mishkin 2016, Pilbeam 2010).

A philosophically interesting question is whether there is such a thing as an “intrinsic” value of financial assets, as is often assumed in discussions about financial crises. For example, a common definition of an “asset bubble” is that this is a situation that occurs when certain assets trade at a price that strongly exceed their intrinsic value—which is dangerous since the bubble can burst and cause an economic shock (Kindleberger 1978, Minsky 1986, Reinhart & Rogoff 2009). But what is the intrinsic value of an asset? The rational answer seems to be that this depends only on the discounted value of the underlying future cash flow—in other words, on (i) and not (ii) above. However, someone still has to assess these factors to compute a price, and this assessment inevitably includes subjective elements. As just noted, it is assumed that different investors have different valuations of financial assets, which is why they can engage in trades on the market in the first place.

A further complication here is that (i) may actually be influenced by (ii). The fundamentals may be influenced by investors’ perceptions of them, which is a phenomenon known as “reflexivity” (Soros 1987, 2008). For example, a company whose shares are popular among investors will often find it easier to borrow more money and thereby to expand its cash flow, in turn making it even more popular among investors. Conversely, when the company’s profits start to fall it may lose popularity among investors, thereby making its loans more expensive and its profits even lower. This phenomenon amplifies the risks posed by financial bubbles (Keynes 1936).

2. Epistemology

Given the abstractness and complexity of financial assets and relations, as outlined above, it is easy to see the epistemic challenges they raise. For example, what is a proper basis for forming justified beliefs about matters of money and finance?

A central concept here is that of risk. Since financial assets are essentially promises of future money payments, a main challenge for financial agents is to develop rational expectations or hypotheses about relevant future outcomes. The two main factors in this regard are (1) expected return on the asset, which is typically calculated as the value of all possible outcomes weighted by their probability of occurrence, and (2) financial risk, which is typically calculated as the level of variation in these returns. The concept of financial risk is especially interesting from a philosophical viewpoint since it represents the financial industry’s response to epistemic uncertainty. It is often argued that the financial system is designed exactly to address or minimize financial risks—for example, financial intermediation and markets allow investors to spread their money over several assets with differing risk profiles (Pilbeam 2010, Shiller 2012). However, many authors have been critical of mainstream operationalizations of risk which tend to focus exclusively on historical price volatility and thereby downplay the risk of large-scale financial crises (Lanchester 2010, Thamotheram & Ward 2014).

This point leads us further to questions about the normativity of belief and knowledge. Research on such topics as the ethics of belief and virtue epistemology considers questions about the responsibilities that subjects have in epistemic matters. These include epistemic duties concerning the acquisition, storage, and transmission of information; the evaluation of evidence; and the revision or rejection of belief (see also ethics of belief). In line with a reappraisal of virtue theory in business ethics, it is in particular virtue epistemology that has attracted attention from scholars working on finance. For example, while most commentators have focused on the moral failings that led to the financial crisis of 2008, a growing literature examines epistemic failures.

Epistemic failings in finance can be detected both at the level of individuals and collectives (de Bruin 2015). Organizations may develop corporate epistemic virtue along three dimensions: through matching epistemic virtues to particular functions (e.g., diversity at the board level); through providing adequate organizational support for the exercise of epistemic virtue (e.g., knowledge management techniques); and by adopting organizational remedies against epistemic vice (e.g., rotation policies). Using this three-pronged approach helps to interpret such epistemic failings as the failure of financial due diligence to spot Bernard Madoff’s notorious Ponzi scheme (uncovered in the midst of the financial crisis) (de Bruin 2014a, 2015).

Epistemic virtue is not only relevant for financial agents themselves, but also for other institutions in the financial system. An important example concerns accounting (auditing) firms. Accounting firms investigate businesses in order to make sure that their accounts (annual reports) offer an accurate reflection of the financial situation. While the primary intended beneficiaries of these auditing services are shareholders (and the public at large), accountants are paid by the firms they audit. This remuneration system is often said to lead to conflicts of interest. While accounting ethics is primarily concerned with codes of ethics and other management tools to minimize these conflicts of interests, an epistemological perspective may help to show that the business-auditor relationship should be seen as involving a joint epistemic agent in which the business provides evidence, and the auditor epistemic justification (de Bruin 2013). We will return to issues concerning conflicts of interest below (in section 4.2).

Epistemic virtue is also important for an effective governance or regulation of financial activities. For example, a salient epistemic failing that contributed to the 2008 financial crisis seems to be the way that Credit Rating Agencies rated mortgage-backed securities and other structured finance instruments, and with related failures of financial due diligence, and faulty risk management (Warenski 2008). Credit Rating Agencies provide estimates of credit risk of bonds that institutional investors are legally bound to use in their investment decisions. This may, however, effectively amount to an institutional setup in which investors are forced by law partly to outsource their risk management, which fails to foster epistemic virtue (Booth & de Bruin 2021, de Bruin 2017). Beyond this, epistemic failures can also occur among regulators themselves, as well as among relevant policy makers (see further in section 5.1).

A related line of work attests to the relevance of epistemic injustice to finance. Taking Fricker’s (2009) work as a point of departure, de Bruin (2021) examines testimonial injustice in financial services, whereas Mussell (2021) focuses on the harms and wrongs of testimonial injustice as they occur in the relationship between trustees and fiduciaries.

3. Philosophy of Science

Compared to financial practitioners, one could think that financial economists should be at an epistemic advantage in matters of money and finance. Financial economics is a fairly young but well established discipline in the social sciences that seeks to understand, explain, and predict activities within financial markets. However, a few months after the crash in 2008, Queen Elizabeth II famously asked a room full of financial economists in London why they had not predicted the crisis (Egidi 2014). The Queen’s question should be an excellent starting point for an inquiry into the philosophy of science of financial economics. Yet only a few philosophers of science have considered finance specifically (Vergara Fernández & de Bruin 2021).[1]

Some important topics in financial economics have received partial attention, including the Modigliani-Miller capital structure irrelevance theorem (Hindriks 2008), the efficient market hypothesis (Collier 2011), the Black-Scholes option pricing model (Weatherall 2017), portfolio theory (Walsh 2015), financial equilibrium models (Farmer & Geanakoplos 2009), the concept of money (Mäki 1997), and behavioral finance (Brav, Heaton, & Rosenberg 2004), even though most of the debate still occurs among economists interested in methodology rather than among philosophers. A host of topics remain to be investigated, however: the concept of Value at Risk (VaR) (and more broadly the concept of financial risk), the capital asset pricing model (CAPM), the Gaussian copula, random walks, financial derivatives, event studies, forecasting (and big data), volatility, animal spirits, cost of capital, the various financial ratios, the concept of insolvency, and neurofinance, all stand in need of more sustained attention from philosophers.

Most existing work on finance in philosophy of science is concerned with models and modelling (see also models in science and philosophy of economics). It seems intuitive to view financial markets as extremely complex systems: with so many different factors at play, predicting the price of securities (shares, bonds, etc.) seems almost impossible. Yet mainstream financial economics is firmly committed to the idea that market behavior should be understood as ultimately resulting from interactions of agents maximizing their expected utility. This is a direct application of the so-called neoclassical school of economics that was developed during the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries. While this school continues to dominate textbooks in the field, there is a growing scholarly trend that seeks to criticize, complement or even replace some of its main assumptions. We can see how the problems play out in both corporate finance and asset pricing theory.

Corporate finance concerns the financing of firms. One question concerns a firm’s capital structure: should a firm obtain funding through equity (that is, from shareholders expecting dividends) or through debt (that is, from bondholders who lend money to the firm and have a contractual right to receive interest on the loans), or through a combination of the two. A key result in corporate finance is the Modigliani-Miller theorem, which says that a firm’s capital structure is irrelevant to its market value (Modigliani & Miller 1958). This theorem makes a number of highly unrealistic assumptions, among them the assumption that markets are efficient, and that there are no taxes. Alongside many other results in economics, it may therefore be considered as useless for predictive purposes; or even as dangerous, once used for such purposes nonetheless (Egidi 2014). In a detailed study of the Modigliani-Miller theorem, Hindriks (2008) has argued, however, that the value of highly idealized models in economics may lie in their providing counterfactual insights, just as in physics. Galileo’s law of free fall tells us what happens in a vacuum. Despite the fact that vacuum is rare in reality, the law is not uninformative, because it allows us to associate observed phenomena to the extent to which an unrealistic assumption must be relaxed. Similarly, if one of the assumptions that the Modigliani-Miller theorem makes is the absence of taxes, the observed relevance of capital structure may well have to be explained as resulting from particular tax regimes. The explanation obtained by relaxing unrealistic assumptions is called “explanation by concretization” (Hindriks 2008).

Explanation by concretization works if models and reality share at least a few concrete features. This is arguably the case for many extant models in finance, including models of bubbles and crises that are immediately relevant to explaining the 2008 crisis (Abreu & Brunnermeier 2003). A fairly recent development called “econophysics” may, however, be an exception. Econophysics uses physics methods to model financial markets (see Rickles 2007 for an overview). Where traditional models of crises include individual investors with beliefs and desires modelled by probability distributions and utility functions, econophysics models capture crises the way physicists model transitions of matter from fluid to solid state (Kuhlmann 2014).

Next, consider asset pricing theory. Ever since Bachelier’s groundbreaking mathematical treatment of asset pricing, financial economists have struggled to find the best way to determine the price developments of securities such as shares, bonds, and derivative instruments such as options. The mathematics of financial returns has received some attention in the literature (de Bruin & Walter 2017; Ippoliti & Chen 2017). Most models assume that returns follow Gaussian random walks, that is, stochastic processes in discrete time with independent and identically distributed increments. Empirical studies show, however, that returns are more peaked than Gaussian distributions, and that they have “fat tails”. This means that extreme events such as financial crises are far less improbable than the models assume. An exception with regards to these assumptions is Benoît Mandelbrot’s (1963) well-known contribution to financial mathematics, and work in this direction is gaining traction in mathematical finance.

A third aspect of financial models concerns the way they incorporate uncertainty (Bertolotti & Magnani 2017). Some of the problems of contemporary financial (and macroeconomic) models are due to the way they model uncertainty as risk, as outlined above (Frydman & Goldberg 2013). Both neo-classical models and behavioral economics capture uncertainty as probabilistic uncertainty, consequently ignoring Knightian uncertainty (Knight 1921 see also decision theory). The philosophy of science literature that pertains to financial economics is, however, still fairly small (Vergara Fernández & de Bruin 2021).

4. Ethics

Having considered the epistemic and scientific challenges of finance, we now turn to the broad range of compelling ethical challenges related to money and finance. The present part is divided into three sections, discussing 1) the claim that financial activities are always morally suspect, 2) various issues of fairness that can arise in financial markets, and 3) discussions about the social responsibilities of financial agents.

4.1 Money as the Root of All Evil?

Throughout cultural history, activities that involve money or finance have been subject to intense moral scrutiny and ethical debate. It seems fair to say that most traditional ethicists held a very negative attitude towards such activities. We will here discuss three very sweeping criticisms, respectively directed at the love of money (the profit motive), usury (lending at interest), and speculation (gambling in finance).

4.1.1 The love of money

At the heart of many sweeping criticisms of money and finance lies the question of motive. For instance, the full Biblical quotation says that “the love of money is the root of all [kinds of] evil” (1 Timothy 6:10). To have a “love of money”, or (in less moralistic words) a profit motive, means to seek money for its own sake. It has been the subject of much moral criticism throughout history and continues to be controversial in popular morality.

There are three main variations of the criticism. A first variation says that there is something unnatural about the profit motive itself. For example, Aristotle argued that we should treat objects in ways that are befitting to their fundamental nature, and since money is not meant to be a good in itself but only a medium of exchange (see section 1.1), he concluded that it is unnatural to desire money as an end in itself (Politics, 1252a–1260b). A similar thought is picked up by Marx, who argues that capitalism replaces the natural economic cycle of C–M–C (commodity exchanged for money exchanged for commodity) with M–C–M (money exchanged for commodity exchanged for money). Thus the endless accumulation of money becomes the sole goal of the capitalist, which Marx describes as a form of “fetishism” (Marx 1867, volume I).

A second variation of the criticism concerns the character, or more precisely the vice, that the profit motive is thought to exemplify (see also virtue ethics). To have a love for money is typically associated with selfishness and greed, i.e., a desire to have as much as possible for oneself and/or more than one really needs (McCarty 1988, Walsh & Lynch 2008). Another association is the loss of moral scruples so that one is ready to do anything for money. The financial industry is often held out as the worst in this regard, especially because of its high levels of compensation. Allegations of greed soared after the 2008 crisis, when financial executives continued to receive million-dollar bonuses while many ordinary workers lost their jobs (Piketty 2014, McCall 2010, Andersson & Sandberg 2019).

A third variation of the criticism says that the profit motive signals the absence of more appropriate motives. Kant argued that actions only have moral worth if they are performed for moral reasons, or, more specifically, for the sake of duty. Thus it is not enough that we do what is right, we must also do it because it is right (Kant 1785). Another relevant Kantian principle is that we never should treat others merely as means for our own ends, but always also as ends in themselves (see also Kant’s moral philosophy). Both of these principles seem to contrast with the profit motive which therefore is rendered morally problematic (Bowie 1999, Maitland 2002). It should come as no surprise that Kant was a strong critic of several examples of “commodification” and other market excesses (see also markets).

There are two main lines of defensive argumentation. The most influential is Adam Smith’s well-known argument about the positive side-effects of a self-interested pursuit of profits: although the baker and brewer only aim at their own respective good, Smith suggested, they are “led by an invisible hand” to at the same time promote the public good (Smith 1776, see also Mandeville 1732). This argument is typically viewed as a consequentialist vindication of the profit motive (see also consequentialism): positive societal effects can morally outweigh the possible shortcomings in individual virtue (Flew 1976).

A second argument is more direct and holds that the profit motive can exemplify a positive virtue. For example, there is the well-known Protestant work ethic that emphasizes the positive nature of hard work, discipline and frugality (Long 1972, Wesley 1771). The profit motive can, on this view, be associated with virtues such as ambition, industry, and discipline (see also Brennan 2021). According to Max Weber (1905), the Protestant work ethic played an important role in the development of capitalism. But it is not clear whether any of these arguments can justify an exclusive focus on profits, of course, or rather give permission to also focus on profits under certain circumstances.

4.1.2 Usury and interest

If having a love of money seems morally suspect, then the practice of making money on money—for instance, lending money at interest—could seem even worse. This is another sweeping criticism directed at finance that can be found among the traditional ethicists. Societies in both Ancient and Medieval times typically condemned or banned the practice of “usury”, which originally meant all charging of interest on loans. As the practice started to become socially acceptable, usury came to mean the charging of excessive rates of interest. However, modern Islam still contains a general prohibition against interest, and many countries still have at least partial usury laws, most often setting an upper limit on interest rates.

What could be wrong with lending at interest? Some of the more obscure arguments concern the nature of money (again): Aristotle argued that there is something unnatural with “money begetting money”. While he allowed that money is a useful means for facilitating commercial exchange, Aristotle thought that it has no productive use in itself and so receiving interest over and above the borrowed amount is unnatural and wrong (Politics, 1258b). A related argument can be found in Aquinas, who argued that money is a good that is consumed on use. Although a lender can legitimately demand repayment of an amount equivalent to the loan, it is illegitimate to demand payment for the use of the borrowed amount and so adding interest is unnatural and wrong (Summa Theologica, II–II, Q78).

Some more promising arguments concern justice and inequality. For example, as early as Plato we see the expression of the worry that allowing interest may lead to societal instability (The Republic, II). It may be noted that the biblical condemnations of usury most straightforwardly prohibit interest-taking from the poor. One idea here is that we have a duty of charity to the poor and charging interest is incompatible with this duty. Another idea is that the problem lies in the outcome of interest payments: Loans are typically extended by someone who is richer (someone with capital) to someone who is poorer (someone without it) and so asking for additional interest may increase the inequitable distribution of wealth (Sandberg 2012, Visser & MacIntosh 1998). A third idea, which is prominent in the protestant tradition, is that lending often involves opportunism or exploitation in the sense of offering bad deals to poor people who have no other options (Graafland 2010).

The Islamic condemnation of interest, or riba, adds an additional, third line of argument which holds that interest is essentially unearned or undeserved income: Since the lender neither partakes in the actual productive use of the money lent, nor exposes him- or herself to commercial risk, the lender cannot legitimately share in the gains produced by the loan (Ayub 2007, Birnie 1952, Thomas 2006). Based on this argument, contemporary Islamic banks insist that lenders and borrowers must form a business partnership in order for fees on loans to be morally legitimate (Ayub 2007, Warde 2010). Economists have over the years given several retorts to this argument. Some economists stress that lending also involves risk (e.g., that the borrower defaults and is unable to repay); others stress the so-called opportunity costs of lending (i.e., that the money could have been used more profitably elsewhere); and yet again others stress the simple time-preference of individuals (i.e., that we value present more than future consumption, and therefore the lender deserves compensation for postponing consumption).

The gradual abandonment of the medieval usury laws in the West is typically attributed to a growing acknowledgment of the great potential for economic growth unleashed by easy access to capital. One could perhaps say that history itself disproved Aristotle: money indeed proved to have a productive use. In a short text from 1787, Bentham famously poked fun at many of the classical anti-usury arguments and defended the practice of charging interest from a utilitarian standpoint (Bentham 1787). However, this does not mean that worries about the ethics of charging interest, and allegations of usury, have disappeared entirely in society. As noted above, usury today means charging interest rates that seem excessive or exorbitant. For instance, many people are outraged by the rates charged on modern payday loans, or the way in which rich countries exact interest on their loans from poor countries (Baradaran 2015, Graeber 2011, Herzog 2017a). These intuitions have clear affinities with the justice-based arguments outlined above.

4.1.3 Speculation and gambling

A sweeping criticism of a more contemporary nature concerns the supposed moral defects of speculation. This criticism tends to be directed towards financial activities that go beyond mere lending. Critics of the capitalist system often liken the stock market to a casino and investors to gamblers or punters (Sinn 2010, Strange 1986). More moderate critics insist on a strict distinction between investors or shareholders, on the one hand, and speculators or gamblers, on the other (Bogle 2012, Sorell & Hendry 1994). In any case, the underlying assumption is that the similarities between modern financial activities and gambling are morally troublesome.

On some interpretations, these concerns are similar to those raised above. For example, some argue that speculators are driven by the profit motive whereas investors have a genuine concern for the underlying business enterprise (Hendry 2013). Others see speculation as “parasitic”, that is, to be without productive use, and solely dependent on luck (Borna & Lowry 1987, Ryan 1902). This latter argument is similar to the complaint about undeserved income raised in particular by Islamic scholars (Ayub 2007, Warde 2010).

A more distinct interpretation holds that speculation typically includes very high levels of risk-taking (Borna & Lowry 1987). This is morally problematic when the risks not only affect the gambler him or herself but also society as a whole. A root cause of the financial crisis of 2008 was widespread speculation on very risky derivatives such as “synthetic collateralized debt obligations” (see section 1.2). When the value of such derivatives fell dramatically, the financial system as a whole came to the brink of collapse. We will return to this issue below (in section 4.3.1). In this regard, the question of risk imposition becomes important too (Moggia 2021).

A related interpretation concerns the supposed short-sightedness of speculation. It is often argued that financial agents and markets are “myopic” in the sense that they care only about profits in the very near term, e.g., the next quarter (Dallas 2012). Modern disclosure requirements force companies to publish quarterly earnings reports. The myopia of finance is typically blamed for negative effects such as market volatility, the continuous occurrence of manias and crashes, inadequate investment in social welfare, and the general shortsightedness of the economy (e.g., Lacke 1996).

Defenders of speculation argue that it can serve a number of positive ends. To the extent that all financial activities are speculative in some sense, of course, the ends coincide with the function of finance more generally: to channel funds to the individuals or companies who can use them in the most productive ways. But even speculation in the narrower sense—of high-risk, short-term bets—can have a positive role to play: It can be used to “hedge” or off-set the risks of more long-term investments, and it contributes to sustaining “market liquidity” (that is, as a means for providing counterparties to trade with at any given point of time) which is important for an efficient pricing mechanism (Angel & McCabe 2009, Koslowski 2009).

4.2 Fairness in Financial Markets

Let us now assume that the existence of financial markets is at least in general terms ethically acceptable, so that we can turn to discuss some of the issues involved in making them fair and just for all parties involve. We will focus on three such issues: deception and fraud (honesty), conflicts of interest (care for customers), and insider trading (fair play).

4.2.1 Deception and fraud

Some of the best-known ethical scandals in finance are cases of deception or fraud. Enron, a huge US corporation, went bankrupt after it was discovered that its top managers had “cooked the books”, i.e., engaged in fraudulent accounting practices, keeping huge debts off the company’s balance sheet in an effort to make it look more profitable (McLean & Elkind 2003). Other scandals in the industry have involved deceptive marketing practices, hidden fees or costs, undisclosed or misrepresented financial risks, and outright Ponzi schemes (see section 2).

While these examples seem obvious, on further examination it is not easy to give an exact definition of financial deception or fraud. The most straightforward case seems to be deliberately misrepresenting or lying about financial facts. However, this assumes that there is such a thing as a financial fact, i.e., a correct way of representing a financial value or transaction. In light of the socially constructed nature of money and finance (see section 1), this may not always be clear. Less straightforward cases include simply concealing or omitting financial information, or refraining from obtaining the information in the first place.

A philosophical conception of fraud, inspired by Kant, defines it as denying to the weaker party in a financial transaction (such as a consumer or investor) information that is necessary to make a rational (or autonomous) decision (Boatright 2014, Duska & Clarke 2002). Many countries require that the seller of a financial product (such a company issuing shares) must disclose all information that is “material” to the product. It is an interesting question whether this suggestion, especially the conception of rationality involved, should include or rule out a consideration of the ethical nature of the product (such as the ethical nature of the company’s operations) (Lydenberg 2014). Furthermore, there may be information that is legitimately excluded by other considerations, such as the privacy of individuals or companies commonly protected by “bank secrecy” laws.

But is access to adequate information enough? A complication here is that the weaker party, especially ordinary consumers, may have trouble processing the information sufficiently well to identify cases of fraud. This is a structural problem in finance that has no easy fix, because financial products are often abstract, complex, and difficult to price. Therefore, full autonomy of agents may not only require access to adequate information, but also access to sufficient know how, processing ability and resources to analyze the information (Boatright 2014). One solution is to require that the financial services industry promotes transparent communication in which they track the understanding of ordinary consumers (de Bruin 2014b, Endörfer & De Bruin 2019, Shiller 2012).

4.2.2 Avoiding conflicts of interest

Due to the problems just noted, the majority of ordinary consumers refrain from engaging in financial markets on their own and instead rely on the services of financial intermediaries, such as banks, investment funds, and insurance companies. But this opens up new ethical problems that are due to the conflicts of interest inherent in financial intermediation. Simply put, the managers or employees of intermediaries have ample opportunity, and often also incentives, to misuse their customers’ money and trust.

Although it is once again difficult to give an exact definition, the literature is full of examples of such misuse—including so-called churning (trading excessively to generate high fees), stuffing (selling the bank’s undesired assets to a client), front-running (buying an asset for the bank first and then reselling it to the client at a higher price) and tailgating (mimicking a client’s trade to piggyback on his/her information) (Dilworth 1994; Heacock, Hill, & Anderson 1987). Interestingly, some argue that the whole industry of actively managed investment funds may be seen as a form of fraud. According to economic theory, namely, it is impossible to beat the average returns of the market for any given level of financial risk, at least in the long term. Therefore, funds who claim that they can do this for a fee are basically cheating their clients (cf. Hendry 2013, Kay 2015).

A legal doctrine that aims to protect clients is so-called fiduciary duty, which imposes obligations on fiduciaries (those entrusted with others’ money) to act in the sole interest of beneficiaries (those who own the money). The interests referred to are typically taken to be financial interests, so the obligation of the fiduciary is basically to maximize investment returns. But some argue that there are cases in which beneficiaries’ broader interests should take precedence, such as when investing in fossil fuels may give high financial returns but pose serious risks to people’s future (Lydenberg 2014; Sandberg 2013, 2016). In any case, it is often thought that fiduciary duties go beyond the ideal of a free market to instead give stronger protection to the weaker party of a fragile relationship.

As an alternative or compliment to fiduciary duty, some argue for the adoption of a code of ethics or professional conduct by financial professionals. A code of ethics would be less arduous in legal terms and is therefore more attractive to free market proponents (Koslowski 2009). It can also cover other fragile relationships (including those of bank-depositor, advisor-client, etc.). Just as doctors and lawyers have a professional code, then, so finance professionals could have one that stresses values such as honesty, due care and accuracy (de Bruin 2016, Graafland & Ven 2011). But according to critics, the financial industry is simply too subdivided into different roles and competencies to have a uniform code of ethics (Ragatz & Duska 2010). It is also unclear whether finance can be regarded as a profession in the traditional sense, which typically requires a body of specialized knowledge, high degrees of organization and self-regulation, and a commitment to public service (Boatright 2014, Herzog 2019).

4.2.3 Insider trading

Probably the most well-known ethical problem concerning fairness in finance, and also perhaps the one on which philosophers most disagree, is so-called insider trading. Put simply, this occurs when an agent uses his or her position within, or privileged information about, a company to buy or sell its shares (or other related financial assets) at favorable times and prices. For example, a CEO may buy shares in his or her company just before it announces a major increase in earnings that will boost the share price. While there is no fraud or breach of fiduciary duty, the agent seems to be exploiting an asymmetry of information.

Just as in the cases above, it is difficult to give an exact definition of insider trading, and the scope of its operative definition tends to vary across jurisdictions. Most commentators agree that it is the information and its attendant informational asymmetry that counts and, thus, the “insider” need not be inside the company at all—those abusing access to information could be family, friends or other tippees (Irvine 1987a, Moore 1990). Indeed, some argue that even stock analysts or journalists can be regarded as insiders if they trade on information that they have gathered themselves but not yet made publicly available. It is also debatable whether an actual trade has to take place or whether insider trading can consist in an omission to trade based on inside information, or also in enabling others to trade or not trade (Koslowski 2009).

Several philosophical perspectives have been used to explain what (if anything) is wrong with insider trading. A first perspective invokes the concept of fair play. Even in a situation with fully autonomous traders, the argument goes, market transactions are not fair if one party has access to information that the other has not. Fair play requires a “level playing field”, i.e., that no participant starts from an unfairly advantaged position (Werhane 1989, 1991). However, critics argue that this perspective imposes excessive demands of informational equality. There are many asymmetries of information in the market that are seemingly unproblematic, e.g., that an antiquary knows more about antiques than his or her customers (Lawson 1988, Machan 1996). So might it be the inaccessibility of inside information that is problematic? But against this, one could argue that, in principle, outsiders have the possibility to become insiders and thus to obtain the exact same information (Lawson 1988, Moore 1990).

A second perspective views insider trading as a breach of duty, not towards the counterparty in the trade but towards the source of the information. US legislation treats inside information as the property of the underlying company and, thus, insider trading is essentially a form of theft of corporate property (often called the misappropriation theory) (Lawson 1988). A related suggestion is that it can be seen as a violation of the fiduciary duty that insiders have towards the company for which they work (Moore 1990). However, critics argue that the misappropriation theory misrepresents the relationship between companies and insiders. On the one hand, there are many normal business situations in which insiders are permitted or even expected to spread inside information to outside sources (Boatright 2014). On the other hand, if the information is the property of the company, why do we not allow it to be “sold” to insiders as a form of remuneration? (Engelen & van Liedekerke 2010, Manne 1966)

A third perspective deals with the effects, both direct and indirect, of allowing insider trading. Interestingly, many argue that the direct effects of such a policy might be positive. As noted above, one of the main purposes of financial markets is to form (or “discover”) prices that reflect all available information about a company. Since insider trading contributes important information, it is likely to improve the process of price discovery (Manne 1966). Indeed, the same reasoning suggests that insider trading actually helps the counterparty in the trade to get a better price (since the insider’s activity is likely to move the price in the “right” direction) so it is a victimless crime (Engelen & Liedekerke 2010). However, others express concern over the indirect effects, which are likely to be more negative. Allowing insider trading may erode the moral standards of market participants by favoring opportunism over fair play (Werhane 1989). Moreover, many people may be dissuaded from even participating in the market since they feel that it is “rigged” to their disadvantage (Strudler 2009).

4.3 The Social Responsibility of Finance

We will now move on to take a societal view on finance, and discuss ideas relating to the broader social responsibilities of financial agents, that go beyond their basic role as market participants. We will discuss three such ideas here, respectively focusing on systemic risk (a responsibility to avoid societal harm), microfinance (a responsibility towards the poor or unbanked), and socially responsible investment (a responsibility to help address societal challenges).

4.3.1 Systemic risk and financial crises

One root cause of the financial crisis of 2008 was the very high levels of risk-taking of many banks and other financial agents. When these risks materialized, the financial system came to the brink of collapse. Many banks lost so much money that their normal lending operations were hampered, which in turn had negative effects on the real economy, with the result that millions of “ordinary” people around the world lost their jobs. Many governments stepped in to bail out the banks and in consequence sacrificed other parts of public spending. This is a prime example of how certain financial activities, when run amok, can have devastating effects on third parties and society in general.

Much subsequent debate has focused on so-called systemic risk, that is, the risk of failures across several agents which impairs the functioning of the financial system as such (Brunnermeier & Oehmke 2013, Smaga 2014). The concept of systemic risk gives rise to several prominent ethical issues. To what extent do financial agents have a moral duty to limit their contributions to systemic risk? It could be argued that financial transactions always carry risk and that this is “part of the game”. But the important point about systemic risk is that financial crises have negative effects on third parties (so-called externalities). This constitutes a prima facie case for a duty of precaution on the part of financial agents, based on the social responsibility to avoid causing unnecessary harm (James 2017, Linarelli 2017). In cases where precaution is impossible, one could add a related duty of rectification or compensation to the victims of the harm (Endörfer 2022). It is, however, a matter of philosophical dispute whether finance professionals can be held morally responsible for these harms (de Bruin 2018, Moggia 2021).

Two factors determine how much an agent’s activity contributes to systemic risk (Brunnermeier & Oehmke 2013, Smaga 2014). The first is financial risk of the agent’s activity in the traditional sense, i.e., the probability and size of the potential losses for that particular agent. A duty of precaution may here be taken to imply, e.g., stricter requirements on capital and liquidity reserves (roughly, the money that the agents must keep in their coffers for emergency situations) (Admati & Hellwig 2013). The second factor is the agent’s place in the financial system, which typically is measured by its interconnectedness with—and thereby potential for cascading effects upon—other agents. This factor indicates that the duty of precaution is stronger for financial agents that are “systemically important” or, as the saying goes, “too-big-to-fail” institutions (Stiglitz 2009).

As an alternative to the reasoning above, one may argue that the duty of precaution is more properly located on the collective, i.e., political level (James 2012, 2017). We return to this suggestion below (in section 5.1).

4.3.2 Microfinance

Even in normal times, people with very low income or wealth have hardly any access to basic financial services. Commercial banks have little to gain from offering such services to them; there is an elevated risk of loan losses (since the poor lack collateral) and it is costly to administer a large amount of very small loans (Armendáriz & Morduch 2010). Moreover, there will likely be cases where some bank officers discriminate against underprivileged groups, even where extensive legal protection is in place. An initiative that seeks to remedy these problems is “microfinance”, that is, the extension of financial services, such as lending and saving, to poor people who are otherwise “unbanked”. The initiative started in some of the poorest countries of the world, such as Bangladesh and India.

The justifications offered for microfinance are similar to the justifications offered for development aid. A popular justification holds that affluent people have a duty of assistance towards the poor, and microfinance is thought to be a particularly efficient way to alleviate poverty (Yunus 1998, 2007). But is this correct? Judging from the growing number of empirical “impact studies”, it seems more correct to say that microfinance is sometimes helpful, but at other times can be either ineffective or have negative side-effects (Hudon & Sandberg 2013, Roodman 2012). Another justification holds that there is a basic human right to subsistence, and that this includes a right to savings and credit (Hudon 2009, Meyer 2018). But critics argue that the framework of human rights is not a good fit for financial services that come with both benefits and challenges (Gershman & Morduch 2015, Sorell 2015).

Microfinance is of course different from development aid in that it involves commercial banking relations. This invites the familiar political debate of state- versus market-based support. Proponents of microfinance argue that traditional state-led development projects have been too rigid and corrupt, whereas market-based initiatives are more flexible and help people to help themselves (Armendáriz & Morduch 2010, Yunus 2007). According to critics, however, it is the other way around: Markets will tend to breed greed and inequality, whereas real development is created by large-scale investments in education and infrastructure (Bateman 2010, H. Weber 2004).

In recent years, the microfinance industry has witnessed several “ethical scandals” that seemingly testify to the risk of market excesses. Reports have indicated that interest rates on microloans average at 20–30% per annum, and can sometimes be in excess of 100%, which is much higher than the rates for non-poor borrowers. This raises questions about usury (Hudon & Ashta 2013; Rosenberg, Gonzalez, & Narain 2009). However, some suggest a defense of “second best”, or last resort, when other sources of aid or cheaper credit are unavailable (Sandberg 2012). Microfinance institutions have also been accused of using coercive lending techniques and forceful loan recovery practices (Dichter & Harper (eds) 2007; Priyadarshee & Ghalib 2012). This raises questions about the ethical justifiability of commercial activity directed at the desperately poor, because very poor customers may have no viable alternative to accepting deals that are both unfair and exploitative (Arnold & Valentin 2013, Hudon & Sandberg 2013).

4.3.3 Socially responsible investment

Socially responsible investment refers to the emerging practice whereby financial agents give weight to putatively ethical, social or environmental considerations in investment decisions—e.g., decisions about what bonds or stocks to buy or sell, or how to engage with the companies in one’s portfolio. This is sometimes part of a strictly profit-driven investment philosophy, based on the assumption that companies with superior social performance also have superior financial performance (Richardson & Cragg 2010). But more commonly, it is perceived as an alternative to mainstream investment. The background argument here is that market pricing mechanisms, and financial markets in particular, seem to be unable to promote sufficient levels of social and environmental responsibility in firms. Even though there is widespread social agreement on the evils of sweatshop labor and environmental degradation, for instance, mainstream investors are still financing enterprises that sustain such unjustifiable practices. Therefore, there is a need for a new kind of investor with a stronger sense of social responsibility (Sandberg 2008, Cowton & Sandberg 2012).

The simplest and most common approach among these alternative investors is to avoid investments in companies that are perceived to be ethically problematic. This is typically justified from a deontological idea to the effect that it is wrong to invest in someone else’s wrongdoing (Irvine 1987b, Langtry 2002, Larmer 1997). There are at least three interpretations of such moral “taint”: (1) the view that it is wrong in itself to profit from others’ wrongdoings, or to benefit from other people’s suffering; (2) the view that it is wrong to harm others, or also to facilitate harm to other; or (3) the view that there is a form of expressive or symbolic wrongdoing involved in “morally supporting” or “accepting” wrongful activities.

The deontological perspective above has been criticized for being too black-and-white. On the one hand, it seems difficult to find any investment opportunity that is completely “pure” or devoid of possible moral taint (Kolers 2001). On the other hand, the relationship between the investor and the investee is not as direct as one may think. To the extent that investors buy and sell shares on the stock market, they are not engaging with the underlying companies but rather with other investors. The only way in which such transactions could benefit the companies would be through movements in the share price (which determines the companies’ so-called cost of capital), but it is extremely unlikely that a group of ethical investors can significantly affect that price. After all, the raison d’être of stock exchanges is exactly to create markets that are sufficiently liquid to maintain stable prices (Haigh & Hazelton 2004, Hudson 2005). In response to this, the deontologist could appeal to some notion of universalizability or collective responsibility: perhaps the right question to ask is not “what happens if I do this?” but instead “what happens if we all do this?”. However, such more complicated philosophical positions have problems of their own (see also rule consequentialism and collective responsibility)

A rival perspective on socially responsible investment is the (more straightforward) consequentialist idea that investors’ duty towards society consists in using their financial powers to promote positive societal goods, such as social justice and environmental sustainability. This perspective is typically taken to prefer more progressive investment practices, such as pushing management to adopt more ambitious social policies and/or seeking out environmentally friendly technology firms (Mackenzie 1997, Sandberg 2008). Of course, the flip side of such practices, which may explain why they are less common in the market, is that they invite greater financial risks (Sandberg 2011). It remains an open question whether socially responsible investment will grow enough in size to make financial markets a force for societal change.

Recent work has started exploring whether concrete sustainable finance policies (such as those suggested by the European Commission’s Sustainable Finance Action Plan) will generate sufficient funds to pay for climate change mitigation and adaptation, based as they are on policies of information provision only (De Bruin 2023).

5. Political Philosophy

Discussions about the social responsibility of finance are obviously premised on the observation that the financial system forms a central infrastructure of modern economies and societies. As we noted at the outset, it is important to see that the system contains both private elements (such as commercial banks, insurance companies, and investment funds) and public elements (such as central banks and regulatory bodies). However, issues concerning the proper balance between these elements, especially the proper role and reach of the state, are perennially recurrent in both popular and philosophical debates.

The financial system and the provision of money indeed raise a number of questions that connect it to the “big questions” of political philosophy: including questions of democracy, justice, and legitimacy, at both the national and global levels (on the history of political thinking about money see Eich 2019, 2020, 2022; Ingham 2004, 2019; Martin 2013). The discussions around finance in political philosophy can be grouped under three broad areas: financialization and democracy; finance, money and domestic justice; and finance and global justice. We consider these now in turn.

5.1 Financialization and Democracy

Many of the questions political philosophy raises about finance have to do with “financialization”. The phenomenon of “financialization”, whereby the economic system has become characterized by the increasing dominance of finance capital and by systems of financial intermediation (Ertürk et al. 2008; Davis 2011; Engelen et al. 2011; Palley 2013), is of potentially substantial normative significance in a number of regards. A related normative concern is the potential growth in political power of the financial sector, which may be seen as a threat to democratic politics.

These worries are, in effect, an amplification of familiar concerns about the “structural power” or “structural constraints” of capital, whereby capitalist investors are able to reduce the freedom of action of democratic governments by threatening “investment strikes” when their preferred political options are not pursued (see Lindblom 1977, 1982; Przeworski & Wallerstein 1988; Cohen 1989; B. Barry 2002; Christiano 2010, 2012; Furendal & O’Neill 2022). To take one recent version of these worries, Stuart White argues that a republican commitment to popular sovereignty is in significant tension with the acceptance of an economic system where important choices about investment, and hence the direction of development of the economy, are under the control of financial interests (White 2011).

In many such debates, the fault-line seems to be the traditional one between those who favor social coordination by free markets, and hence strict limitations on state activities, and those who favor democratic politics, and hence strict limitations on markets (without denying that there can be intermediate positions). But the current financial system is not a pure creature of the free market. In the financial system that we currently see, the principle that individuals are to be held financially accountable for their actions, and that they will therefore be “disciplined” by markets, is patchy at best. One major issue, discussed above, is the problem of banks that are so large and interconnected that their failure would risk taking down the whole financial system—hence, they can anticipate that they will be bailed out by tax-payers’ money, which creates a huge “moral hazard” problem (e.g., Pistor 2013, 2017). In addition, current legal systems find it difficult to impose accountability for complex processes of divided labor, which is why there were very few legal remedies after the financial crisis of 2008 (e.g., Reiff 2017).

The lack of accountability intensifies worries about the power relations between democratic politicians and individuals or corporations in the financial realm. One question is whether we can even apply our standard concept of democracy to societies that have the kinds of financial systems we see today. We may ask whether societies that are highly financialized can ever be true democracies, or whether they are more likely to be “post-democracies” (Crouch 2004). For example, states with high levels of sovereign debt will need to consider the reaction of financial markets in every significant policy decision (see, e.g., Streeck 2013 [2014], see also Klein 2020) Moreover “revolving doors” between private financial institutions and supervising authorities impact on the ability of public officials to hold financial agents accountable. This is similar to the problems of conflicts of interest raised above (see sections 2 and 4.2.2). If financial contracts become a central, or maybe even the most central, form of social relations (Lazzarato 2012), this may create an incompatibility with the equal standing of citizens, irrespective of financial position, that should be the basis of a democratic society and its public sphere of deliberation (see also Bennett 2020 from an epistemic perspective).

While finance has, over long stretches of history, been rather strictly regulated, there has been a reversed trend towards deregulation since roughly the 1970s. After the financial crisis of 2008, there have been many calls for reregulation. Proposals include higher capital ratios in banks (Admati & Hellwig 2013), a return to the separation of commercial banking from speculative finance, as had been the case, in the US, during the period when the Glass-Steagall Act was in place (Kay 2015), or a financial transaction tax (Wollner 2014). However, given that the financial system is a global system, one controversial question is whether regulatory steps by single countries would have any effect other than capital flight.

5.2 Finance, Money, and Domestic Justice

When it comes to domestic social justice, the central question relating to the finance system concerns the ways in which the realization of justice can be helped or hindered by how the financial system is organized.

A first question here, already touched upon in the discussion about microfinance above (section 4.3.2), concerns the status of citizens as participants in financial markets. Should they all have a right to certain financial services such as a bank account or certain forms of loans, because credit should be seen as a primary good in capitalist economies (see, e.g., Hudon 2009, Sorell 2015, Meyer 2018)? More broadly, how does the pattern of access to credit affect the distribution of freedom and unfreedom within society? (see Dietsch 2021; Preiss 2021). These are not only issues for very poor countries, but also for richer countries with high economic inequality, where it becomes a question of domestic justice. In some countries all residents have the right to open a basic bank account (see bank accounts in the EU in Other Internet Resources). For others this is not the case. It has been argued that not having access to basic financial services creates an unfairness, because it drives poorer individuals into a cash economy in which they are more vulnerable to exploitative lenders, and in which it is more difficult to build up savings (e.g., Baradaran 2015). Hence, it has been suggested either to regulate banking services for individuals more strictly (e.g., Herzog 2017a), to consider various forms of household debt relief (Persad 2018), or to offer a public banking service, e.g., run by the postal office, which offers basic services at affordable costs (Baradaran 2015).

Secondly, financialization may also have more direct effects on socio-economic inequality. Those with managerial positions within the financial sector are disproportionately represented among the very top end of the income distribution, and so the growth of inequality can in part be explained by the growth in the financial sector itself (Piketty 2014). There may also be an effect on social norms, whereby the “hypermeritocratic” norms of the financial sector have played a part in increasing social tolerance for inequality in society more broadly (Piketty 2014: 265, 2020; see also O’Neill 2017, 2021). As Dietsch et al. point out, the process of increasing financialization within the economies of the advanced industrial societies has been encouraged by the actions of central banks over recent decades, and so the issue of financialization also connects closely to questions regarding the justice and legitimacy of central banks and monetary policy (Dietsch, Claveau, & Fontan 2016, 2018; see also Jacobs & King 2016).

Thirdly, many debates about the relation between distributive justice and the financial system revolve around the market for mortgages, because for many individuals, a house is the single largest item for which they need to take out a loan, and their mortgage their main point of interaction with the financial system. This means that the question of who has access to mortgage loans and at what price can have a major impact on the overall distribution of income and wealth. In addition, it has an impact on how financial risks are distributed in society. Highly indebted individuals are more vulnerable when it comes to ups and downs either in their personal lives (e.g., illness, loss of job, divorce) or in the economy as a whole (e.g., economic slumps) (Mian & Sufi 2014). The danger here is that existing inequalities—which many theories of justice would describe as unjust—are reinforced even further (Herzog 2017a).

Here, however, a question about the institutional division of labor arises: which goals of distributive justice should be achieved within markets—and specifically, within financial markets—and which ones by other means, for example through taxation and redistribution? The latter has been the standard approach used by many welfare systems: the idea being to let markets run their course, and then to achieve the desired patterns of distribution by taxation and redistribution. If one remains within that paradigm, questions arise about whether the financial sector should be taxed more highly. In contrast, the approach of “pre-distribution” (Hacker 2011; O’Neill & Williamson 2012; O’Neill 202), or what Dietsch calls “process redistribution” (2010), is to design the rules of the economic game such that they contribute to bringing about the distributive pattern that is seen as just. This could, for example, mean regulating banking services and credit markets in ways that reduce inequality, for example by imposing regulations on payday lenders and banks, so that poor individuals are protected from falling into a spiral of ever higher debt. A more radical view could be to see the financial problems faced by such individuals as being caused by more general structural injustices the solution of which does not necessarily require interventions with the financial industry, but rather more general redistributive (or predistributive) policies.

Money creation: Another alternative theoretical approach is to integrate distributive concerns into monetary policy, i.e., when it comes to the creation of money. So far, central banks have focused on the stability of currencies and, in some cases, levels of employment. This technical focus, together with the risk that politicians might abuse monetary policy to try to boost the economy before elections, have been used in arguments for putting the control of the money supply into the hands of technical experts, removing monetary policy from democratic politics. But after the financial crisis of 2008, many central banks have used unconventional measures, such as “quantitative easing”, which had strongly regressive effects, favoring the owners of stocks or of landed property (Fontan et al. 2016, Dietsch 2017); they did not take into account other societal goals, e.g., the financing of green energy, either. This raises new questions of justice: are such measures justified if their declared aim is to move the economy out of a slump, which presumably also helps disadvantaged individuals (Haldane 2014)? Would other measures, for instance “helicopter money” that is distributed to all citizens, have been a better alternative? And if such measures are used, is it still appropriate to think of central banks as institutions in which nothing but technical expertise is required, or should there be some form of accountability to society? (Fontan, Claveau, & Dietsch 2016; Dietsch 2017; Riles 2018; see also Tucker 2018; van ’t Klooster 2020; James & Hockett 2020, Downey 2021).[2]

We have already discussed the general issue of the ontological status of money (section 1.1 above). But there are also significant questions in political philosophy regarding the question of where, and by what sorts of institutions, should the money supply be controlled. One complicating factor here is the extensive disagreement about the institutional basis of money creation, as described above. One strand of the credit theory of money emphasizes that in today’s world, money creation is a process in which commercial banks play a significant role. These banks in effect create new money when they make new loans to individual or business customers (see McLeay, Radia, & Thomas 2014; see also Palley 1996; Ryan-Collins et al. 2012; Werner 2014a,b). James Tobin refers to commercial bank-created money, in an evocative if now dated image as “fountain pen money”, that is, money created with the swish of the bank manager’s fountain pen (Tobin 1963).

However, the relationship between private commercial banks and the central bank is a complicated one, such that we might best think of money creation as a matter involving a kind of hybrid public-private partnership. Hockett and Omarova refer to this relationship as constituting a “finance franchise”, with private banks being granted on a “franchise” basis the money-creating powers of the sovereign monetary authority, while van ’t Klooster describes this relation between the public and private as constituting a “hybrid monetary constitution” (Hockett & Omarova 2017; van ’t Klooster 2017; see also Bell 2001). In this hybrid public-private monetary system, it is true that private commercial banks create money, but they nevertheless do so in a way that involves being regulated and subject to the authority of the central bank within each monetary jurisdiction, with that central bank also acting as “lender of last resort” (Bagehot 1873) when inter-bank lending dries up.[3]

When the curious public-private nature of money creation is brought into focus, it is not surprising that there should exist views advocating a shift away from this hybrid monetary constitution, either in the direction of a fully public option, or a fully private system of money creation.

Advocates of fully public banking envisage a system in which private banks are stripped of their authority to create new money, and where instead the money supply is directly controlled either by the government or by some other state agency; for example by the central bank lending directly to firms and households. Such a position can be defended on a number of normative grounds: that a public option would allow for greater financial stability, that a fully public system of money creation would allow a smoother transmission of democratic decisions regarding economic governance; or simply because of the consequences of such a system with regards to socioeconomic inequality and environmental sustainability (see Jackson & Dyson 2012; Wolf 2014a,b; Lainà 2015; Dyson, Hodgson, & van Lerven 2016a,b; Ingham, Coutts, & Konzelmann 2016; Dow 2016; Wodruff 2019; van’t Klooster 2019, Mellor 2019, Dietsch 2021; for commentary and criticism see Goodhart & Jensen 2015; Fontana & Sawyer 2016, Larue et al. 2020).

In stark contrast, a number of libertarian authors have defended the view that the central bank should have no role in money creation, with the money supply being entirely a matter for private suppliers (and with the consumers of money able to choose between different rival suppliers), under a system of “free banking” (e.g., Simons 1936; Friedman 1962; von Hayek 1978; Selgin 1988). Advocacy of private money creation has received a more recent stimulus with the rise of Bitcoin and other crypto-currencies, with some of Bitcoin’s advocates drawing on similar libertarian arguments to those offered by Hayek and Selgin (see Golumbia 2016, Robison 2022). One can also mention the “alternative currencies” movement here which defends private money creation on entirely different grounds, most often by appeal to the value of community (see Larue 2022, Larue et al. 2022).

5.3 Finance and Global Justice

Finally, a number of issues relate questions about finance to questions about global justice. The debate about global justice (see also global justice) has weighed the pros and cons of “statist” and “cosmopolitan” approaches, that is, approaches to justice that would focus on the nation state (maybe with some additional duties of beneficence to the globally poor) or on the global scale. The financial system is one of the most globalized systems of social interaction that currently exist, and global entanglements are hard to deny (e.g., Valentini 2011: 195–8). The question thus is whether this creates duties of justice on the financial system, and if so, whether it fulfills these duties, i.e., whether it contributes to making the world more globally just, or whether it tends in the opposite direction (or whether it is neutral).

There are a number of institutions, especially the World Bank and the International Monetary Fund (IMF), that constitute a rudimentary global order of finance. Arguably, many countries, especially poorer ones, cannot reasonably opt out of the rules established by these institutions (e.g., Hassoun 2012, Krishnamurthy 2014). It might therefore appear to be required by justice that these institutions be governed in a way that represents the interests of all countries. But because of historical path-dependencies, and because a large part of their budget comes from Western countries, the governance structures are strongly biased in their favor (for example, the US can veto all important decisions in the IMF). Miller (2010: 134–41) has described this situation as “indirect financial rule” by the US (see also Herzog 2021).

An issue worth noting in this context is the fact that the US dollar, and to a lesser degree the Euro, function as de facto global currencies, with a large part of global trade being conducted in these currencies (e.g., Mehrling 2011, Eichengreen 2011). This allows the issuing countries to run a current account deficit, which amounts to a redistribution from poorer to richer countries for which compensation might be owed (Reddy 2005: 224–5). This fact also raises questions about the distribution of power in the global sphere, which has often been criticized as favoring Western countries (e.g., Gulati 1980, United Nations 2009). However, global financial markets serve not only to finance trade in goods and services; there are also questions about fluctuations in these markets that result exclusively from speculations (see also sect.1.4.3 above). Such fluctuations can disproportionately harm poorer countries, which are more vulnerable to movements of capital or rapid changes in commodity prices. Hence, an old proposal that has recently been revived and defended from a perspective of global justice is that of a “Tobin tax” (Tobin 1978), which would tax financial transactions and thereby reduce volatility in international financial markets (Reddy 2005, Wollner 2014).

A second feature of the current global order that has been criticized from a perspective of justice is the “borrowing privilege”. As Pogge describes (e.g., 2008: chap. 4), the governments of countries can borrow on international financial markets, no matter whether they have democratic legitimacy or not. This means that rogue governments can finance themselves by incurring debts that future generations of citizens will have to repay.

Sovereign debt raises a number of questions that are related to global justice. Usually, the contracts on which they are based are considered as absolutely binding (e.g., Suttle 2016), which can threaten national sovereignty (Dietsch 2011), and raises questions of the moral and political responsibilities both of citizens of debtor nations, and of creditor countries themselves (Wiedenbrüg, 2018a, 2018b). These problems obtain in particular with regard to what has been called “odious” debt (Sack 1927, Howse 2007, Dimitriu 2015, King 2016): cases in which government officials sign debt contracts in order to enrich themselves, with lenders being aware of this fact. Such cases have been at the center of calls for a jubilee for indebted nations. At the moment, there are no binding international rules for how to deal with sovereign bankruptcy, and countries in financial distress have no systematic possibility of making their claims heard, which is problematic from a perspective of justice (e.g., Palley 2003; Reddy 2005: 26–33; Herman 2007; C. Barry & Tomitova 2007; Wollner 2018). The IMF, which often supports countries in restructuring sovereign debt, has often made this support conditional upon certain requirements about rearranging the economic structures of a country (for a discussion of the permissibility of such practices see C. Barry 2011).

Finally, and perhaps most importantly, the issue of financial regulation has a global dimension in the sense that capital is mobile across national boundaries, creating the threats to democracy described above. This fact makes it difficult for individual countries, especially smaller ones, to install the more rigid financial regulations that would be required from a perspective of justice. Just as with many other questions of global justice (see, e.g., Dietsch 2015 on taxation), we seem to see a failure of coordination between countries, which leads to a “race to the bottom”. Making global financial institutions more just is therefore likely to require significant levels of international cooperation.


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