Social Ontology

First published Wed Mar 21, 2018

Social ontology is the study of the nature and properties of the social world. It is concerned with analyzing the various entities in the world that arise from social interaction.

A prominent topic in social ontology is the analysis of social groups. Do social groups exist at all? If so, what sorts of entities are they, and how are they created? Is a social group distinct from the collection of people who are its members, and if so, how is it different? What sorts of properties do social groups have? Can they have beliefs or intentions? Can they perform actions? And if so, what does it take for a group to believe, intend, or act?

Other entities investigated in social ontology include money, corporations, institutions, property, social classes, races, genders, artifacts, artworks, language, and law. It is difficult to delineate a precise scope for the field (see section 2.1). In general, though, the entities explored in social ontology largely overlap with those that social scientists work on. A good deal of the work in social ontology takes place within the social sciences (see sections 5.1–5.8).

Social ontology also addresses more basic questions about the nature of the social world. One set of questions pertains to the constituents, or building blocks, of social things in general. For instance, some theories argue that social entities are built out of the psychological states of individual people, while others argue that they are built out of actions, and yet others that they are built out of practices. Still other theories deny that a distinction can even be made between the social and the non-social.

A different set of questions pertains to how social categories are constructed or set up. Are social categories and kinds produced by our attitudes? By our language? Are they produced by causal patterns? And is there just one way social categories are set up, or are there many varieties of social construction?

The term ‘social ontology’ has only come into wide currency in recent years, but the nature of the social has been a topic of inquiry since ancient Greece. As a whole, the field can be understood as a branch of metaphysics, the general inquiry into the nature of entities.

1. History

The following short discussion mentions some key themes and innovations in the history of social ontology. For a more detailed discussion of historical developments in social ontology as well as references, see the supplementary document: Social ontology: History.

1.1 Ancient and Early Modern Debates on the Sources of Social Entities

Ancient inquiries into the nature of social phenomena introduced questions that remain active today: Which features of the world are products of humans or society, and which are products of nature? What does it mean to say that something is a social creation? A central concern of Sophism, a school of Greek philosophy in the fifth century BCE, was the contrast between nature (phusis) and custom, law, habit, or convention (nomos). In particular, they debated the sources of justice, law, and language: are these rooted in phusis or in nomos?

Ancient philosophers explored the mix between natural and human contributions in the construction of familiar features of the world. They did not, however, theorize much about exactly what people do in order to create the social world. Instead, they wrote of agreements, compacts, conventions, habits, laws, customs, and so on, without paying particular notice to separating these from one another. In the early modern period, theories of these sources broadened considerably, as did the variety of social phenomena being investigated. Approaches developed in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries include:

  • Social entities as products of covenants: Hobbes, in Leviathan (1651), argues that a stable commonwealth is generated by covenants among all the people in a society. Hobbes’s analysis is reflexive: the people who institute the commonwealth are those who are members of the commonwealth. Hobbes analyzes covenants in terms of agreements, and also provides an analysis of agreement, a crucial part of which is to explain what makes agreements binding.

  • Social entities as products of convention: As an alternative to ‘compact’ or ‘agreement,’ the legal theorist Samuel Pufendorf, in De Officio Hominis et Civis (1673), uses the term ‘convention’ as the basis for law and language. He argues that conventions do not need to be explicitly formed or agreed to. Instead, we can have tacit conventions—i.e., conventions that we may not even be aware we have. Hume greatly advances the analysis of convention and of social phenomena in terms of it (Hume 1740). He expands the scope of convention to include a wide variety of social entities—not only law, property, and language, but also money, government, justice, and promises.

  • Social entities as products of God and Nature: Other early modern philosophers root the social world in the natural—both in divine commandment and in human nature. Robert Filmer, a seventeenth century monarchist, argues in Patriarcha (1680) that the state is a family. This implies, according to Filmer, that state authority is no different from the authority of a father over his family. Locke’s Two Treatises on Government (1689) sharply criticize Filmer and provide a competing analysis, though Locke, too, sees God and nature as the sources of the state and of property. Locke rejects Filmer’s comparison of the state with a family, arguing instead that political authority has its source in the natural rights of each individual created equally.

  • Social entities as products of the individual mind: Locke’s theory of “nominal essence” is important for a number of contemporary approaches to social ontology, even though Locke does not himself associate nominal essences with the social world in particular. A nominal essence is a definition of a species or sort of thing, which people assemble in their minds out of ideas. Individuals generate these definitions when they observe things in the world and classify them according to their apparent similarities. Nominal essences, in Locke’s approach, are generated mentalistically: they are formed from the association of ideas in the mind. Moreover, they are generated individualistically: a nominal essence defined by any given person is fully defined by that person’s own mental states.

In Locke’s work, we also see the foundations for a new inquiry that blossomed in the eighteenth century—not into the sources of social phenomena, but into their constituents or building blocks. (See also sections 2.3, 3, and 4 for contemporary theories of constituents vs. sources of social entities.)

1.2 Individuals, Aggregates, and Wholes

Advances in science and interest in political governance led theorists to draw analogies between the traditional domains of science—such as heavenly bodies, chemicals, and organisms—and the newly salient domains of economies and societies. The push to develop a science of society motivates a different emphasis in social ontology, as compared to earlier theories. Whereas ancient and early modern theorists largely investigated the sources or generators of social entities, these theorists devoted more attention to analyzing social entities into their constituent parts.

Philosophers in the Scottish Enlightenment argue that social order arises from aggregates of individuals interacting with one another, even if the individuals did not plan the order. “Nations stumble on establishments”, Ferguson 1767 writes, “which are indeed the result of human action, but not the execution of any human design”. Later attempts to develop a rigorous science of the social world also employ a similar picture of the components of society. J.S. Mill builds on Comte 1830–1842 to argue that social science is a branch of psychology. Society, according to Mill, is the aggregate of human minds, and the topic of the social sciences is to derive laws governing such aggregates. (Mill 1843) Altogether, his approach to social phenomena is “psychologistic”: he takes social phenomena to be built exclusively out of psychological states of individual people. (The interpretation and expansion of psychologism becomes an important topic in twentieth century individualism; see sections 3.1 and 3.2.)

The historicist tradition in eighteenth and nineteenth century German philosophy inverts the relation between individuals and societies. Rather than seeing individuals as primary, these philosophers stress the primacy of societies, with individuals a product of the societies in which they are brought up. Hegel argues that even self-consciousness is not something that an individual can possess independently of others. Instead, it depends on our having a sense of ourselves as individuals as distinct from others, which in turn depends on mutual interactions (Hegel 1807). Hegel also develops the idea, following Hölderlin, of a “World-Soul” or universal human spirit, of which individual actions are a manifestation. Hegel’s universal spirit is sometimes used as an example of “ontological holism”—i.e., the claim that social entities are fundamental, independent, or autonomous entities, as opposed to being derived from individuals or non-social entities.

Nineteenth century criminologists, including Taine 1887, Ferri 1884, Sighele 1891, and Le Bon 1895 investigated mental properties of crowds, such as impetuousness and irrationality. Tarde 1890 postulated mechanisms by which crowds acquire these characteristics, by way of the psychology of individuals and interactions among people. Durkheim 1894 challenged these explanations, arguing that such individualistic laws cannot be adequate to explain crowd psychology or other social phenomena. Durkheim argues that “social facts” are autonomous of individuals and have the power to constrain and affect their actions. In social ontology, Tarde is often seen as a representative of “individualism” and Durkheim of “holism” regarding the social world, and their positions remain a touchstone for contemporary debates (see section 3).

1.3 The Construction of Social Categories

Nineteenth-century social criticism reopened the question of the sources of social categories. Philosophers scrutinized commonplace categories—often ones that we employ in our daily practices—revealing that they have darker (or at least richer) underpinnings than we realize. Their approaches raise questions about the motivations for using these categories, as well as their nature and metaphysical sources.

In a section of Capital titled “The Fetishism of Commodities and the Secret Thereof”, Karl Marx argues that certain social categories that might appear natural are in fact the products of social and economic relations among people (Marx 1867). Subsequent philosophers put claims of the constructedness of social entities at the center of social critique. Lukács 1923 argues that capitalism extensively “reifies” social entities—that is, it turns phenomena that arise from an oppressive economic system into features of the world that we regard as natural.

Friedrich Nietzsche employs a historical or “genealogical” method in On the Genealogy of Morals (1887) to critique the basic categories of Christian morality. Challenging the idea that this morality is basic to human nature, he argues that prevailing moral categories were tools intentionally wielded in a struggle for power. Ideals of humility and self-denial, for instance, were introduced by leaders of a resentful population to undermine the aristocratic values of Greco-Roman society. In Nietzsche’s account, the sources of such categories are largely cognitive and intentional, as opposed to arising from material relations, as they do in Marx’s account.

Members of the Frankfurt School, especially Theodor Adorno and Max Horkheimer, draw on Marx and Nietzsche to argue not just that the social world becomes “second nature” to us, but that our current social order is maintained, at least in part, by the causal effects of our treating social entities and categories as if they were natural (Adorno & Horkheimer 1947, Adorno 1966). Uncovering social categories becomes a centerpiece of subsequent social criticism. If oppressive structures are to be dismantled, the social nature of the everyday world first needs to be revealed. The work of the Frankfurt School in particular is influential in contemporary feminist and race theory (see section 5.4).

2. The Problem of Demarcating Social Ontology

2.1 Social Versus Non-Social

Social ontology is the study of social entities and properties. But which things are social? How are they distinguished from those that are not social? Not every theory in social ontology needs to make this distinction—but many rely on it. Michael Bratman, for instance, analyzes “shared intentions” of a group in terms of the knowledge and intentions of individual members of the group (Bratman 1993, 2014). His project is designed to remove the mystery behind shared intention by analyzing it in terms of non-social mental states of individual people. More generally, “psychologistic” theories of the social world sharply distinguish the social from the non-social. These theories—descendants of Mill 1843—hold that all social facts are determined by the psychological states of individual people.

The “level of the social” is often divided from other “lower levels” in arrangements of the sciences into hierarchies (Comte 1830–1842, Oppenheim and Putnam 1958). This arrangement of the sciences into levels is sometimes challenged altogether (e.g., Wimsatt 1976, Thalos 2013). But even if certain domains of science can be arranged into levels, the level of the social has difficulties unique to it. One is the problem of identifying just which entities are the social ones. Even cases that would seem straightforward can be contentious. A crowd, for instance, was regarded by many in the late nineteenth century as the paradigmatic social object. But in recent years it has become less obvious that this is so. Margaret Gilbert, for instance, hesitates to attribute “sociality” to crowds: sociality, she argues, arises from norms and commitments, which many crowds lack. According to Gilbert, it is with joint commitment that a group is genuinely social (Gilbert 1989). Other philosophers and sociologists make alternative claims about the “mark of the social”, while still others deny that there is any criterion for distinguishing the social from the non-social (see Greenwood 1997).

A second problem is to identify which categories of social entities are the best focus for analysis of the social world. Social theorists have treated a variety of different categories of social entities as basic, including social laws (Mill 1843, Spencer 1895); social facts (Durkheim 1894, Mandelbaum 1955); social groups (Oppenheim & Putnam 1958, Gilbert 1989, Tuomela 2013); human kinds (Boyd 1991, 1999b; Millikan 1999, Mallon 2016); institutional facts (Searle 1995); social objects and social properties (Macdonald & Pettit 1981, Ruben 1985); social predicates (Kincaid 1986); social practices (Bourdieu 1977, Giddens 1984, Schatzki 1996); and social processes (Whitehead 1929, Rescher 2000, Livet & Nef 2009). Some theories focus on a category because it is significant, but do not claim that it comprehensively covers the social world. Others choose a category of social entities in order to be comprehensive. In doing this, a theory may aim to set up an exhaustive determination claim: for instance, it may claim that all social objects are composed of individual people interacting with one another, or that all social properties supervene on individualistic properties, or that all social facts are grounded by physical facts. As these examples illustrate, the category of social entities a theory focuses on is tied to how the theory interprets “determination” (for more on this, see section 2.3).

Even more contentious is which objects are not social. To many theorists, individual people are paradigmatically non-social. Many philosophers, however, argue that individuals are socially constituted (see sections 1.2, 3.1.2, and the sections A.3.2, and A.4.2 of the supplement on the history of social ontology). Thus some projects in social ontology look for a middle ground. They intend to accommodate the social nature of individuals, and yet to account fully for the social in terms of individuals (see section 3.2.2).

One option for interpreting the “non-social entities” is that they include only the objects of physics, chemistry, biology, and other “hard sciences”. According to some theorists, even these are socially constructed and therefore fall on the social side of the division (Pickering 1984, Woolgar 1988). But even presuming that objects of the “hard sciences” are non-social, they may be inadequate for practical purposes as a characterization of the set of non-social things. After all, social theory aims to say more than merely that the social world is somehow built out of physical entities (see section 3.1.4). A variety of approaches to the building blocks of the social are discussed in section 3.

2.2 Ontology Versus Causation

A second difficulty in analyzing social entities is in distinguishing ontological from merely causal relations. In many cases, the distinction is straightforward. The Battle of the Somme, for instance, is part of World War I. That battle is not a cause of the war. It is a constituent of it: the Battle of the Somme is ontologically rather than causally related to World War I. The 1881 formation of the Triple Alliance, on the other hand, is causally related to the war, not ontologically.

Many cases, however, are less straightforward, and it is not always easy to distinguish when entities stand in ontological rather than causal relations. We could argue that the formation of the Triple Alliance is only causally related to the war because it took place long before the war began. But temporal remoteness is not always good evidence. Even if causes must always precede their effects, identifying causally related events is complicated by the fact that events extend over long periods of time. (The weather in January 1916 is causally and not ontologically related to World War I, although the war stretched on before and after that month.) Furthermore, there might be instantaneous or even backward causation (see entry on backward causation).

The more significant complication, however, is that ontological relations need not be synchronic. For a mental state to be a memory, for instance, it must be caused by the event of which it is a memory. Likewise, a mark’s being a footprint partly depends on historical events: it requires that the mark was made by the strike of a foot (Dretske 1988, Stalnaker 1989). And for a person to be President of the United States, an election must have taken place beforehand. Some theories of the social world insist that a social entity can only ontologically depend on synchronic facts about the world. Classical structuralism, influenced by Saussure 1916, regards social structures as synchronic, with the social structure at time t being a product of the mental states of individuals at time t (see section 4.1). John Searle’s theory of institutional facts (Searle 1995, 2010) also regards social entities as being synchronically dependent: the institutional facts at time t are a product of attitudes in the community at time t together with a synchronic residue of historical events that Searle calls the “background”. Work in a variety of domains, however, argues for an ontological role of historical factors. Among these are theories of semantic content (Kripke 1972, Putnam 1975, Davidson 1987), biological and social kinds (Millikan 1984), artworks (Levinson 1980), and artifacts (Bloom 1996, Thomasson 2003).

Distinguishing causation from ontology does not imply that causal relations are ontologically irrelevant. Having causal effects may be a criterion for an entity to be real (Gellner 1956, Bhaskar 1975, Elder-Vass 2010). Causal structure is also often regarded as central to the nature of various entities. Several theorists argue that kinds are individuated by their causal roles (Fodor 1974, Khalidi forthcoming). Some theorists of biological and artifactual kinds regard patterns of reproduction to be part of what individuates these kinds. And some theorists of human kinds regard certain causal feedback loops to be characteristic of human kinds (see section 4.3.3). The burden of such accounts is to distinguish the causal factors that are part of an account of ontology from those that are “merely” causally connected.

For more discussion of the distinction between “causal” and “constitutive” social construction, see Kukla 2000, Haslanger 2003. Discussion of non-causal determination relations can be found in the recent literature on “grounding” and “ontological dependence”, including Rosen 2010, Audi 2012, Correia & Schnieder 2012, Fine 2012, Raven 2015, the entry on metaphysical grounding, and the entry on ontological dependence.

2.3 What is Meant by the “Building” of the Social World

As seen in section 1 (and the supplement on history), it is useful to break social ontology down into two broadly different inquiries. One inquiry is to analyze the constituents or essential properties of social entities. A second is to analyze the metaphysical sources or generators of social kinds or categories.

To illustrate the distinction, consider a category such as animal sacrifice. This is a kind of ritual act performed in both historical and contemporary cultures. The boundaries of this category are not simple. Animal sacrifice is not the same as ritual slaughter, though the two acts have many properties in common: the animals killed in both may be eaten, both acts may be performed by specially qualified individuals, and both may be subject to specific rules and performed in specific contexts. The first inquiry into the nature of animal sacrifice, then, is to clarify the conditions for something to be in the category: what are the essential properties of an animal sacrifice, or the constituents of an animal sacrifice?

Once this is settled, however, there is a second set of ontological questions regarding the sources of the category animal sacrifice. What features of the world—social, intellectual, practical or otherwise—puts this category in place? What sets up the category animal sacrifice to have the boundaries or essential properties it does (as analyzed in the first inquiry)?

A task for each inquiry is to clarify the respective notion of building.

2.3.1 “Building” in the inquiry into constituents

What is being claimed by a theorist who argues, as Bratman does, that group intentions are “built out of” the attitudes of group members? Or, as Dretske does, that footprints are “partly built out of” a foot-strike? A social entity (a group intention or a footprint) is held to stand in some relation R1 to other entities (member attitudes or a past foot-strike). What is this relation R1—and is there just one such relation, or are there many ways that social entities are “built out of” their constituents?

One of the more precise ways of clarifying claims about the building of social entities is to use various forms of the supervenience relation (see the entry on supervenience). A virtue of the supervenience relation is that it makes it easy to articulate important distinctions in precise ways. For instance, maybe the social properties of the U.S. Senate are exhaustively determined by the properties of U.S. Senators. Or maybe the social properties of the U.S. Senate are exhaustively determined by properties of the population of the entire U.S., or even of the entire world, not just by properties of Senators. This distinction can be clarified using the notion of “global supervenience” (see Macdonald & Pettit 1981, Currie 1984, Kincaid 1986, Epstein 2009). There are, however, well-known shortcomings to the supervenience relation as well (see Fine 2001, Shagrir 2002, K. Bennett 2004a, Correia 2005). People interested in the building blocks of the social world often discuss different relations apart from supervenience, including identity, parthood, fusion, aggregation, set membership, constitution, and grounding (see entry on ontological dependence, Copp 1984, Ruben 1985, Baker 2004, Sheehy 2006, Effingham 2010, List & Pettit 2011).

2.3.2 “Building” in the inquiry into setting up social categories

The relation in the second inquiry is less discussed. Specific theories of the setup of the social world include theories of convention, law, collective acceptance, structure, practices, and more (see section 4). A theory of law, for instance, may propose that certain lawmaking systems are set up by specific beliefs and practices of members of the society. Here, a set of social entities—legislative systems—stand in some relation R2 to a set of other entities—member beliefs and practices. Perhaps the R2 relation (or relations) is the same as the R1 relation. Or perhaps it is different; this topic remains little explored.

Epstein 2015 argues that R1 and R2 are the distinct “grounding” and “anchoring” relations. On this understanding, the topics discussed in section 3 pertain to the grounding of social facts, and those discussed in section 4 pertain to the anchoring of social categories and kinds.

Clarifying the “building relations” is part of understanding the different roles that even a single kind of building block can play in making the social world. Certain theories, for instance, propose that social entities are built out of individual people’s psychological states. But psychological states play a different role in the first inquiry—see section 3.1—than they do in the second—see section 4.1.

3. Constituents of the Social World

What are the parts of a crowd or of a corporation? What are the necessary and sufficient conditions for an event to be an animal sacrifice? What facts determine that Massachusetts is a state in the United States?

Some theories strive to give very general answers to questions like these. They aim to fill in for X in the formula: All social entities are exhaustively determined by (or are constituted by, or supervene on, or are grounded by, etc.) entities of type X. That is, they argue for a particular “determination base” for the social entities. A large class of theories fill in ‘X’ with strictly non-social entities. Others argue that this asks too much: they agree that we can analyze constituents of social entities, but deny that social entities decompose into non-social parts. Still others reject the question altogether. And within all these views a variety of positions are taken on what the “determination” or building relation is (see section 2.3).

Other theories make less ambitious claims. Instead of searching for an exhaustive determination base for all social entities, they focus on a particular subset of social entities. Or even more modestly, they aim to analyze certain social entities in terms of other social parts—such as a battalion in terms of platoons, or an industry in terms of corporations.

Many positions on these matters descend from the debates between individualism versus holism that took place in the early part of the twentieth century (cf. O’Neill 1973, Udehn 2001, Zahle & Collin 2014a). Individualism is the somewhat vague thesis that the social is built exclusively out of individual people. Holism is the even vaguer thesis that social entities are “sui generis”, or ontologically fundamental in some sense. Some recent work aims to clarify these (cf. List & Spiekermann 2013, Epstein 2014a, entry on methodological holism in the social sciences), while some rejects the terms of that debate.

3.1 Non-Social Building Blocks

Many theories aim to remove the mystery from the social world by characterizing a non-social “determination base”: i.e., a domain of non-social entities that exhaustively determines the social. Some put forward a strong claim about the relation between the social and the non-social: for instance, they claim that social entities are reducible to some particular set of non-social entities (see entry on scientific reduction). Others make weaker claims, such as that the set of social properties globally supervenes (see section 2.3) on some set of non-social properties.

3.1.1 Psychologism

Psychologism is the view that social facts are composed exclusively out of the psychological states of individual people. This is the view advanced by Mill 1843 (see section 1.2 and also section A.3.1 of the supplement on the history of social ontology) and endorsed by subsequent theorists of the “social mind” such as Tarde 1898, 1901. Economists in the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries also advocated psychologism (Jevons 1871, Wicksteed 1910, Pareto 1916), as did mid-century social theorists (Popper 1945, Watkins 1952). The term ‘psychologism’ is a little confusing. Karl Popper, for instance, uses this word as a pejorative regarding a particular kind of methodology in social science. But when it comes to ontology, he endorses Mill’s view (Popper 1945).

Most historical versions of psychologism are “internalist” in that they regard the contents of mental states as depending only on what is inside a person’s head. (“Externalist” psychologism is discussed in section 3.2.1. For discussion of internalism versus externalism, see entry on externalism about mental content.)

Psychologism is a claim about ontology; it is compatible with taking psychological states to be caused by non-psychological factors. Jane’s belief that the wind is blowing is caused in part by the blowing of the wind. But her psychological state, according to internalists, is a matter of her brain or other internal states, and does not include the wind. According to psychologism, the social world is determined exclusively by these internal psychological states.

Versions of psychologism differ when it comes to whose psychological states a given social entity or fact is determined by or depends on. Some theories are “globally dependent”: they take a fact like Gallius and Tiberius are slaves to depend on the psychological states of a larger population, not just those of Gallius and Tiberius (Currie 1984). Other theories are “locally dependent”. Many theories of group attitudes argue that the beliefs, intentions, and other attitudes of a given group depend only on the attitudes of the members of that group (Tuomela & Miller 1988, Bratman 1993, List & Pettit 2002).

Theories also differ when it comes to which psychological states determine social entities or facts. The theories of group attitudes just mentioned hold that group attitudes are determined not just by psychological states in general, but by particular attitudes on the part of members. Broader versions of psychologism (e.g., Mill’s) are less specific about which psychological states are involved.

Finally, theories differ when it comes to which social entities are determined by psychological states. Theories of group attitudes, for instance, limit their claims to the group attitudes alone. Other views, such as those of Mill and Popper, propose that psychological states exhaustively determine social facts in general.

3.1.2 Atomism

Social atomism (or atomistic individualism) holds that the social world is built out of individual people understood as isolated “atoms”. As Taylor 1985 points out, the term ‘atomism’ is mostly used by its enemies, so its characterization often depends on what it is used to be a foil for. But, typically, atomism is a combination of two claims: the view that society is exclusively built out of individual people, and that individual people are somehow isolated from one another, as opposed to being mutually interdependent.

‘Atomism’ is taken fairly literally by theories that apply the methods of statistical physics to society. The idea is to model societies as large aggregates of people, much as liquids and gases are aggregates of molecules, or ant colonies aggregates of ants. Historical examples include Quetelet’s On the Social System of 1848 and Spencer 1895. Contemporary representatives include models in sociophysics and econophysics (see Chakrabarti et al. 2007). The simplest of these models take individual interactions to be governed by deterministic rules, and take a society or market to be an aggregate of these interacting individuals.

Some theories are accused of being atomistic in the sense that they treat individuals as isolated and non-interacting. Neoclassical economic theory is sometimes challenged on this basis; others point out that even in basic neoclassical models relations among individuals are incorporated in markets, prices, and other features (see Samuelson 1966, Arrow 1994).

The term ‘atomism’ is also used to indicate theories that neglect the causal or historical influences of society on individuals. A model may neglect social conditioning altogether, for instance by treating individual preferences as exogenous or given parts of a social model. Or, instead, people at a historical starting point may be regarded as isolated or non-social. ‘Atomism’ in this sense is applied to Hobbesian or “state or nature” views that give an account of the development of society starting with non-social individuals encountering one another (see Pettit 1993).

3.1.3 Bodies, actions, and resources

Theorists in several fields have turned away from mentalistic treatments of the building blocks of the social. Psychologism presupposed that the social sciences are sciences of the “mind” or “psyche” of society. However, the social sciences study not just social thoughts, but actions. This suggests a different and larger determination-base for the social—that is, a larger set of blocks out of which the social world is built. After all, actions are not the same as thoughts or behaviors, but involve the world.

Even behaviorism (Skinner 1953) rejects the idea that the social is built out of internal psychological states. Instead, it argues that only externally observable human behaviors can be the basis of a scientific inquiry into the psychological and social sciences. Still, behaviorism resembles psychologism more than it departs from it: it replaces the internal states of minds with the “outputs” of the mind in behavior, and takes the social to be exhaustively determined by those outputs or behaviors (see entry on behaviorism).

More recent theories depart from psychologism by introducing additional entities into the determination base of social entities. Kincaid 1986, for instance, claims that the social supervenes on individualistic properties and relations and actions. Other theories argue that among the constituents of the social are also resources and other features of the world. For instance, many microeconomic models include variables not only for attributes of individual people, but also for bundles of resources possessed by those people, or for such things as capital goods or geographic locations. Another example is Edith Penrose’s “resource theory” of the firm (Penrose 1959). Penrose proposes that firms (corporations, partnerships, etc.) be understood as collections of distinctive resources, including real estate, capital goods, and material processes.

Despite such examples, it is often unclear whether such theories genuinely take goods and resources to be ontologically related to social entities. Or instead, whether they regard resources to interact causally with social entities, but not to constitute them. Moreover, even in models that include resources, often only individual choices are modeled as having causal powers: resources have no causal import except as mediated by the attitudes and actions of individuals. Even Penrose’s theory of the firm focuses most of its attention on “capabilities”, understood as knowledge and skills of human actors, and subsequent literature derived from Penrose focuses even more on capabilities as the exemplar of resources (e.g., Teece et al. 1997).

A more unequivocal turn away from mentalism and toward the external world in constituting social entities occurred in the 1980s in sociology and anthropology. Theorists in these fields began to pay a great deal of attention to how bodies cope in the practical world, as discussed in section 3.2 below.

3.1.4 Physicalism

The most prominent theories arguing for non-social building blocks of the social are individualistic in either a narrow or broad sense. Either the social is exhaustively determined by the psychological states of individual people, or by these plus behaviors, bodies, and actions, or by these plus resource bundles allocated to individuals. An alternative is to reject individualism altogether, and instead regard the determination base of the social to include (at least potentially) any physical entities whatever (see Epstein 2009, Hindriks 2013, Ylikoski 2014). Physicalism is often understood to be the view that all facts—the social ones included—are physical facts (see entry on physicalism).

Physicalism—on this and related understandings—has difficulties as well. First, even if it is true, it would be surprising if this is all we can say about the facts that determine the social ones. Physicalism seems at best a starting point in an account of the ontology of the social. Some theorists have put forward alternative approaches to stratification and hierarchy (Wimsatt 1976, 1994; Potochnik 2010; Potochnik & McGill 2012; Thalos 2013), and Ylikoski 2014 does so for the social world. But these are largely designed to make sense of levels of a sort in scientific methodology, rather than to put forward claims about ontological determination.

Second, it is difficult to define physicalism, and in particular to ensure that it is not trivial (see entry on physicalism). Clarifying the thesis of physicalism involves circumscribing what counts as “physical”, just as individualism involves clarifying what counts as “individualistic”. If the physical entities are to be a non-social “base” that exhaustively determines the social, then it is required that the social not be included in that base. (See sections 3.2 and 3.3 on the separation of the social from the nonsocial.) Clarifying physicalism likewise requires clarifying what dependence relation various facts are taken to stand in, with regard to the physical. Are social facts, for instance, taken to be physical facts? To supervene on physical facts? To be exhaustively grounded by physical facts? (See section 2.3.1 for analogous considerations in interpreting individualism.)

Third, it is unclear if physicalism is true. In fact, certain social entities seem to be good candidates for counterexamples to at least some versions of physicalism. One widely discussed problem with a supervenience interpretation of physicalism, for instance, is the “grounding” problem regarding the modal properties of coinciding objects (K. Bennett 2004b). The classic example used to discuss coinciding objects is an artwork—a statue—and the clay that constitutes it (Gibbard 1975). Other social entities work equally well for the same point, such as Gilbert’s cases of two distinct social groups with the same members (Gilbert 1987) and Epstein’s extension of such cases (Epstein 2015).

3.2 Socially Constituted Building Blocks

Many theorists in social ontology reject the approaches discussed in section 3.1. It is fruitless, they hold, to search for non-social building blocks of the social world. That does not mean, however, that they renounce analysis of the social altogether. Instead, they try to shed light on the determination of the social in terms of other social components.

Some of these projects make similar claims to the ones in the last section. That is, they propose sets of entities that exhaustively determine the social world—but they propose sets consisting of social entities. Other projects are more modest. They aim at partial accounts, rather than exhaustive ones. Just as one might break a car down into chassis, engine, transmission, etc., one might break social entities into mid-sized parts even if that breakdown is not fully exhaustive, and even if those parts are not themselves analyzed.

For those projects that do attempt to give an exhaustive analysis of the social in terms of other social building blocks, a recurring worry is whether they can avoid being circular. If we were trying to explain the nature of water, it would hardly do to say that it is built out of watery parts. Likewise, it is unclear what we have accomplished if we argue that social entity x is ontologically determined by social entity y, and then that y in turn is partly ontologically determined by x.

3.2.1 Externalist psychologism

A variant of psychologism takes an externalist approach to mental states. Externalism is the view that mental states ontologically depend on facts about the external world. It holds that, for instance, the content of a person’s concept of water partly depends on the actual structure of samples of water in the person’s environment; and likewise that the content of a person’s concept of the U.S. Government partly depends on the external entity that is the U.S. Government (see the entry on externalism about mental content).

This version of psychologism regards the social to be exhaustively determined by externalist mental states. Mid-century opponents of standard psychologism (Mandelbaum 1955, Gellner 1956, Goldstein 1958) had raised the problem of attitudes toward social entities, but it is not clear in those views whether the external world was causally or constitutively related to the mental states. Following Kripke 1972 and Putnam 1975, the explicitly externalist view was developed by Bhargava 1992 and Pettit 1993. Pettit argues for externalist psychologism as a qualified version of individualism. Like more standard psychologism, he takes social phenomena to be exhaustively determined by mental states. The mental states in question, however, are partly constituted by external stuff.

Externalist psychologism, if correct, would pare down the determination base of the social world to one kind of (partly social) entity. It faces hurdles, however. First, it must explain how it avoids circularity—that is, social entities depend on attitudes toward those entities that depend on the social entities themselves. Second and more seriously, it needs to explain why this is a plausible determination base for the social. According to this view, the external world figures profoundly into the determination of the social—but only when it is a constituent of attitudes. Strangely, when the external world is not a constituent of attitudes, it plays no role in the determination of the social.

3.2.2 Socially constituted individuals

Other theorists argue that people or selves are socially constituted. Husserl argues that even the content of an individual’s sensory perception is conditioned by the community of other conscious individuals. A person’s subjectivity thus depends on intersubjectivity (Husserl 1936: Sec. 71, 1950: Secs. 55–60).

A view like this—much like the externalist psychologism discussed above—can be seen as individualistic in some sense. Though it does not argue that the social world is determined by non-social or pre-social individuals, it still holds that the social is determined by individuals. Husserl, for one, argues that the social world is the community of intersubjectively constituted individuals.

Many views of the self as socially constituted implicitly equate the self with the individual mind, consciousness, or mental states. Among many others, Hegel argues that self-consciousness—and hence the existence of the self—depends on recognition from others (see section 1.2, and also section A.3.2 of the supplement); Scheler 1913 that the fundamental kind of experience is experience-with-one-another; Mead 1913, 1934 that individual experience and self-consciousness emerge from a social matrix of communication processes; and Berger and Luckmann 1966 that individuals are constituted by the social roles with which they identify. MacIntyre 1984 argues that selves are constituted by social narratives; Taylor 1989 that the self is constituted through the participation in moral frameworks; and Davis 2003 develops a social narrative theory of the individual in economics.

Other views focus on the social constitution of the body. Foucault 1976, 1977a and Butler 1988, 1990, 1993, among others, hold that an adequate theory of the self involves the construction of bodies as much as it does the construction of mental states. And they argue that human bodies are largely products of discourse and the exercise of social power. However, in interpreting these views it is important to distinguish claims about the constituents of selves and bodies from claims about how kinds and categories are set up. At least to some extent, these are theories of how narratives and practices set up categories for classifying bodies (see sections 4.4 and 5.4).

3.2.3 Partial and mixed analyses

To be useful, it is not necessary to provide a complete account of the social world, nor to analyze social entities “all the way down” to some fundamental level. It can also be illuminating even to give a partial account of one particular social entity in terms of others.

A certain type of hate-crime, for instance, might be usefully analyzed as constituted in part by a speech act. That may be useful for social science or law, whether or not we can say much about the nature of speech acts. In economics, general equilibrium models are often designed to represent sets of households (as opposed to individuals), endowments of resources, sets of firms, goods, and other entities such as bonds and governments (Mas-Colell et al. 1995: Ch. 19). In models like these, some ontological work is implicitly done, in their partial analysis of economic systems into components. It is also common in sociological theory to analyze social entities into other social parts (see section 5.3).

Popper and his students put forward a hybrid methodology for social science, which favors individualistic explanations in a local context or “situation”, but takes institutions as background conditions that are treated as exogenous. This methodology is often known as “institutional individualism” (Agassi 1975, J.S. Coleman 1990, Jarvie 1998, Udehn 2001). This, however, is an approach to methodology, not a claim about the nature of the social. These models do not generally commit themselves to ontological claims either about the nature of these entities or about which social entities the various components constitute. Popper, for one, argues for the indispensability of institutions in social explanation, but has a psychologistic ontology of institutions (and all social entities).

3.2.4 Practices and embodied agency

Theories of practice, developed in anthropology in the 1970s and 1980s, turn their attention to actions, routines, and the engagement of people with the world. A range of theories are now classified under the broad rubric of “theories of practice”: Bourdieu 1977 and Giddens 1984 are the most prominent, but theorists as diverse as Foucault, Garfinkel, Butler, Latour, Taylor, Ortner, and Schatzki are also counted among the practice theorists.

A practice is a “way of doing” some activity, involving how people in a culture not only think, but also behave, speak, feel, and interact with objects in the environment. Consider, for instance, a way of cooking in a given culture. Cooking involves bodily movements that individuals reproduce, objects in the environment that individuals handle in routine ways, explicit and background knowledge, and people’s intentions and choices. Individuals, according to practice theory, are always involved in the performance of practices, but those performances are not limited to the bodies and minds of the performing individuals. Bourdieu 1990 takes practices to be exhaustively determined by sets of objectively observable behaviors. But other theories argue for the primacy of the “type” over the “token”: it does not make sense to say that a practice supervenes on its performances, since the performances are individuated by reference to the practice.

Some theories of practice are, to a certain extent, individualistic. Practice theory is largely concerned with bodily activity—the ways people move, carry themselves, and act skillfully—as it is reproduced in a culture. Individual agents are the “carriers” of practices (Reckwitz 2002, Rouse 2007). Still, practices involve not only attitudes and mental representations, but also objects in the world: pans, stoves, vegetables, and sauces are among the constituents of cooking practices. Moreover, individual activities themselves depend on the social: they are partly constituted by the cultural practices of which they are instances.

3.3 Top-Down and Flat Approaches

Although it is common to distinguish individualism and holism as the two poles in debates over social ontology, the range of views discussed in sections 3.1 and 3.2 show that individualism is not the only alternative to holism. Even among those in 3.1—ones that take the social to be built out of non-social components—there are both individualistic and non-individualistic alternatives to holism.

“Holism” too is diverse. Some theories are dualist: they propose separate spheres of the individualistic and the social, akin to the Cartesian distinction between bodies and mind. Others are monist: they take the social to be fundamental or to have ontological priority. Still other theories put forward a “flat” ontology, according to which entities of all kinds exist and yet stand in no ontological priority with respect to one another.

3.3.1 Dualism

Dualism about the social is the view that social and non-social entities—such as societies and individuals, or structures and agents—are distinct, and neither is grounded in the other. In the mid-twentieth-century individualism/holism debates (see Jarvie 1972, O’Neill 1973), holists were widely understood as endorsing versions of dualism. In those debates, defenders of holism did not deny the existence of the non-social. Instead, they argued that the social cannot be reduced to individualistic entities.

Work on the relation between minds and bodies strongly influences arguments about social dualism. In particular, many philosophers of social science have adopted anti-dualist strategies pioneered by philosophers of mind, especially the “non-reductive physicalism” developed by Davidson, Putnam, Fodor, Kim, and others. As applied to minds, this is the view that there may be in-principle obstacles to reducing mental properties or facts to physical properties or facts, even though the mental is exhaustively determined by the physical. Philosophers of the social sciences applied this to social entities in the form of “non-reductive individualism”. There may be obstacles, this view holds, to the reduction of social phenomena to individualistic ones, even though the social is exhaustively determined by the individualistic (Macdonald & Pettit 1981; Mellor 1982; Currie 1984; Kincaid 1986, 1997, 1998; Tuomela 1989; Little 1991; Bhargava 1992; Pettit 1993, 2003; Hoover 1995, 2001a, 2009; Stalnaker 1996; Sawyer 2002, 2005; Schmitt 2003a; List & Spiekermann 2013). More recently, some philosophers have challenged these arguments as inadequately characterizing the “supervenience base” (see sections 3.1.3 and 3.1.4). These philosophers agree with the basic strategy for denying dualism. But they deny that the “individualistic” is the proper way to understand the building blocks of the social, arguing instead for a broader set of building blocks.

Dualism has seen a resurgence among some philosophers of mind, e.g., Chalmers 1996. It is not clear, however, that the sorts of argument marshalled in favor of mental dualism could apply to social dualism. For instance, even if Chalmers’ “zombie” argument succeeds for minds, there may not be a social analogue to the “hard problem of consciousness” (see entry on zombies).

3.3.2 Ontological priority of the social

A different version of social holism is monist rather than dualist. Instead of postulating two or more spheres of substances—social and non-social—this version regards social entities to be ontologically prior or fundamental, and individual people (and other entities) to be ontologically derivative on the social. This sort of monism is often associated with Hegel (see section A.3.2 of the supplement) and the British idealists, such as Green 1866 and Bradley 1893.

Some mid-century social theories also seem to take this position. Classical structuralism emphasizes the priority of structure over the individual, following Saussure’s arguments for the ontological priority of the linguistic system over the individual sign (1916). In its initial applications to anthropology, roles in a cultural system were analyzed in terms of the system as a whole. By the 1960s, however, the point was applied not just to roles but to individuals themselves. Althusser 1965 and Balibar 1965, for instance, argue for a “theoretical anti-humanism” in which causal explanation is predominantly structural:

Men only appear in the theory as supports for the relationships implied in the structure, and the forms of their individuality only appear as the determined effects of the structure. (Balibar 1965)

The functionalist sociology of Talcott Parsons (1951) also prioritizes social structure over individual agency. Parsons is often understood as arguing that individual action is little more than a manifestation of social functions, and is severely criticized (e.g., by Garfinkel 1967) on the grounds that he inappropriately discounts individual agency. It is not always clear, however, whether the explanatory priority of the social over the individual entails a claim about ontological priority. Functional systems, even ones that strip individuals of their freedom to act independently, may nonetheless be exhaustively grounded in “low-level” entities.

3.3.3 Flat ontologies

Other approaches reject any ordering or hierarchy of entities altogether. Some views deny that the sciences can be divided into hierarchies, but allow that certain entities are composed of others. A more radical view is that there is no building at all among entities. A prominent example is Actor-Network Theory (Latour 2005, Callon 1999, Law 2009). All entities, in this approach, are potentially on a par with one another. Even identifying an entity or a class of things as “social” is a mistake, according to Latour. Latour distinguishes certain roles that objects can play: they can act as “mediators”, transforming meaning, and they can act as “intermediaries”, transmitting meaning without transforming it. An atom, a person, a machine, a mountain, or a bank, have equal potential to play these roles. All the scientist—social or natural—can do is to write narratives that trace associations. Other approaches to flat ontology include “assemblage theory” (DeLanda 2006), “object-oriented ontology” (Harman 2005), and “scale-free metaphysics” (Thalos 2013).

4. How Social Categories and Kinds Are Set Up

Inquiry into the constituents or “stuff” of the social world, discussed in the last section, is a huge field. But there is another field of inquiry with an array of approaches in social ontology: the inquiry into how social categories or kinds are set up. Consider, for instance, the fact Kanye and Kim are dancing the cha-cha. The “stuff” of the dance is the two people moving around in some pattern. But, we might ask, what sets up the category cha-cha? Why do the moves determine what dance it is, rather than the material of floor they are dancing on or the brand of shoes they are wearing? What makes it the case that dances are categorized into cha-chas versus sambas versus salsas; or, for that matter, certain sequences of movement into dances versus strolls versus marches?

Here are a few options one might start with:

  1. A crude mentalistic theory: the fact that the dance is a cha-cha is a product of the fact that I believe it is a cha-cha.
  2. A crude naturalistic theory: social categories are natural features of reality, with the physical structure of the world breaking reality down into categories, one of which is the cha-cha.
  3. A crude linguistic theory: we define the word ‘cha-cha’, and that definition specifies the conditions for an entity to be a cha-cha.

The following sections discuss more developed views taking off from these ideas. Section 4.1 discusses theories that are both mentalistic and individualistic: i.e., those holding that the metaphysical source of a person’s social categories is that person’s own mental states. Section 4.2 discusses mentalistic theories that involve many or all the mental states of people in a community, rather than each person for herself. Section 4.3 discusses theories that regard social categories to be set up by patterns of properties and causes. Section 4.4 discusses theories that include practices in setting up social categories, and section 4.5 discusses pluralistic and heterogeneous theories. Section 4.6 discusses the potential roles for language in setting up social categories.

Importantly, any given theory of the source of social categories can take different positions on the topics discussed in section 3—i.e., on what the constituents or building blocks of social entities are. A set of theorists might disagree about how cha-chas (or other social entities, or entities in general) are constituted—e.g., by people, or patterns, or physical configurations of atoms, or sensible particulars, or impressions, etc. And yet all might agree that a person’s categories are set up by that person’s own mental states (compare, for instance, Berkeley 1710, Russell 1929, and Dennett 1991). Conversely, a set of theorists might all agree on how cha-chas are constituted, yet disagree on what metaphysically sets up that category.

4.1 Social Categories as a Product of Each Person’s Own Mental States

Many philosophical traditions investigate how individuals mentally construct, organize, categorize, or represent social objects—and objects more generally. Some views regard social categories to be concepts that individual minds assemble in order to organize subjective impressions. An example is a Lockean “nominal essence” theory of social categories (see section A.2.4 of the supplement). In this theory, a given person’s social category cha-cha is an idea in that person’s mind, formed out of combinations of impressions or other ideas internal to that person’s mind.

At least until the middle of the twentieth century, the individualistic-and-mentalistic theories were the prevailing approaches to the setup of the social world. These theories come in staggering variety. Even classical structuralism in anthropology (e.g., Lévi-Strauss 1945, 1963) falls into this class, holding that structures are unconscious sets of mental states. This brand of structuralism has an individualistic rather than a distributed theory of how structure determines a person’s social categories: each person, according to Lévi-Strauss, has a mental structure that determines his or her own social categories. Later versions of structuralism reject this individualistic treatment of structure.

To organize the class of individualistic-and-mentalistic theories, we might distinguish the positions they take with respect to dimensions such as the following:

  • The extent to which social categories differ from person to person: We seem to live in a single world, to have attitudes about the same objects and propositions as one another, and to communicate about them. Are categories shared among people in a culture, between cultures, or universally? Intersubjectivity and objectivity are acute problems for mentalistic theories of social categories. In certain views, each person’s private “conceptual scheme” may differ in subtle or stark ways from the schemes of others. Some hold that conceptual schemes may be similar among members of a community, as a result of collaboration and causal feedback, but never identical. Alternatively, conceptual schemes and social categories may be less fine-grained, so that differences in people’s mental states may not yield differences in their categories (cf. Mach 1886, Natorp 1888, Cassirer 1910, Quine 1960, Foucault 1966 [1970]).

  • How integrated a person’s category-determining mental states are: Quine 1951 argues that our beliefs about the world are interconnected with one another, and that no belief can be assessed against our experience of the world on its own, in isolation from our other beliefs. Each person, according to Quine, forms a “web of belief” by systematizing the stimuli the person receives from the world. A person’s ontological categories are a product of that network, and any change to the network affects the network as a whole. Other approaches to the mentalistic construction of social categories are more piecemeal, with the determination of each category ontologically independent of one another.

  • How a person’s social categories are related to that person’s concepts: Many theories of categorization in psychology (see Cohen & Lefebvre 2005) treat a person’s concepts interchangeably with the categories that person imposes on the world. The so-called internalist versions of these theories take a person’s concepts to ontologically depend on states of the person’s brain alone. These theories take a person’s social categories to be the same as her concepts, which are internal mental states. Other mentalistic theories of social categories do not fit this mold. It may be that a person’s social categories are generated by that person’s mental states, without the categories having to be conceptualized.

  • Whether the mind “organizes” the world: Mentalistic theories of how social categories are set up often implicitly draw on a picture of the mind as “organizing” the content that is “given” to it by the senses. Sellars 1956 and Davidson 1973 criticize this picture, denying that there is any such “given”. Davidson rejects the distinction between “scheme” and “content”, arguing that it is incoherent to hold that different people, or people in different cultures, have different “conceptual schemes”. In response, one might defend the scheme/content distinction, or else turn to a less mentalistic picture of the determination of categories (see section 4.4). Still other views—such as various forms of idealism—take a mentalistic view of the setup of social categories without endorsing a scheme/content distinction.

  • Whether and how category-determining mental states are constrained: Theories inspired by structural linguistics (Saussure 1916, Jakobson 1931, Chomsky 1965) hold that the mind limits the possible variations among categories, and that a person’s categories are linked with one another. According to Lévi-Strauss, kinship structures are governed by universal rules, so only a limited number of forms of kinship are human possibilities (Lévi-Strauss 1945). Some recent psychological theories of categorization see humans as having specialized neural circuits for processing different categories of objects (see Carey & Spelke 1994, Capitani et al. 2003, Mahon & Caramazza 2009). Other theories propose constraints on the mechanisms by which categories are constructed by the mind (Kant 1781/1787, Cohen 1871). Still other theorists regard the mental construction of social categories to involve generic mental processes (Piaget 1926, Mandler 2004).

4.2 Social Categories as a Product of Community-Wide Mental States

Instead of taking social categories to be products of individual minds, another class of theories holds that they are the products of the minds in a community taken together. Hume 1740 argues that promises are a product of a social convention. We have a convention, according to Hume, of the following form: words uttered according to a certain formula incur an obligation. When someone utters a phrase of the form ‘I promise to S’, the speaker is obligated to perform S. According to this theory, the conditions for an utterance to be a promise are set up by beliefs and expectations of the members of the community at large.

Theories in this broad class take different approaches to how community mental states set up social categories.

4.2.1 Social categories set up by agreement

Agreement, according to some historical theories, is the source of law, language, and the state (see section 1.1, and also sections A.1 and A.2.1 of the supplement). Agreement still plays a role in contemporary theories of some social phenomena, but that role is typically to ground the obligations associated with phenomena. For instance, according to the “will theory of contract”, contractual obligations are grounded by the intentional choices of each party to be bound to a commitment (see Fried 1981, Barnett 1985). When it comes to setting up social categories, it seems less likely that actual agreements are available to be their metaphysical sources. Instead, even theories that are putatively agreement-based tend to place agreement in a different role. Gauthier 1986, for instance, advances an agreement-based theory of morality. By his account, however, the justification for moral claims is based on what people rationally would agree to: idealized agreements, rather than actual ones, serve as the basis for moral categories.

Another difficulty—even if a given social category is the product of agreement—is identifying which feature of an agreement does the “metaphysical labor” in setting up the category. Suppose we employ a social category at time t′ which was a product of an agreement at time t. It may be that the features of that category are a product of the mental states of participants at t, or of the utterances or acts of participants at t. Or perhaps what matters is the mental states of community members at t′: that is, it is the synchronic trace of the agreement that sets up the social categories in a community at t, not the agreement itself.

4.2.2 Social convention

Convention-based theories are widely proposed for many social phenomena, including traffic rules, etiquette, laws, language, norms, institutions, morality, gender, codes of dress, and religion—as well as geometry, logic, truth, and necessity (see, among many others, Quine 1936, Lewis 1969, Schiffer 1972, Carter & Patterson 1982, Gilbert 1983, Kekes 1985, Sugden 1986, Sidelle 1989, Friedman 1995, Lagerspetz 1995, Young 1996, Bicchieri 2005, Bickhard 2008, Schotter 2008, Marmor 2009, Azzouni 2014, Guala 2016).

To say that a social phenomenon is “conventional” sometimes means little more than that it is social, or that something about the phenomenon is arbitrary, or a matter of choice. In social ontology, however, conventionalist theories are understood more precisely, following variants of David Lewis’s 1969 analysis of convention, or else following analyses of convention that challenge Lewis’s approach.

Lewis argues that conventions are solutions to coordination problems. In interactive situations that have more than one equilibrium—for instance, where it is rational for us all to drive on the left or for us all to drive on the right—conventions resolve the question of which actions to choose. In his analysis, convention does not require explicit or tacit agreement, but instead involves the possession of various attitudes by members of the community, including beliefs, knowledge, expectations, and preferences (see the entry on convention).

Among the critiques of Lewis-style conventionalist theories are: that many social phenomena do not appear to be solutions to coordination problems; that they are excessively mentalistic, involving a complex structure of beliefs, knowledge, expectations, and preferences of the population; and that they regard conventions as regularities in behavior having certain characteristics, so the analysis rules out as conventions anything that is not exemplified in behavioral regularity (see Burge 1975, Millikan 2005). The critiques, however, are complicated by the malleability of the notion of convention: it is not clear whether these should be regarded as difficulties for conventionalism or for Lewis’ analysis.

4.2.3 Collective attitudes and dispositions

Another prominent set of approaches is closely related to conventionalism, but instead of appealing to structures of individual attitudes, these approaches take the social world to be set up by collective attitudes and dispositions. (Some, though not all, of these accounts go on to analyze collective attitudes in terms of individual attitudes. See section 5.2.)

Hart (1961) proposes a sociological basis for certain kinds of rules—in particular, the rule regarding how valid laws are made in a society. A rule R, for Hart, is a rule in a society if two requirements hold: that members of the society behave in conformance to R, and that members of the society accept R as a standard of behavior in the society.

Searle (1995, 2010) proposes a theory of those social facts he calls “institutional facts”. He modifies a Hart-style approach in three ways. First, he augments Hart’s account of what it takes for members of a society to accept a rule: he argues that the community must collectively accept the rule (see 5.2 on collective attitudes). Second, he does not require that rules be implemented in behavior: institutional facts depend only on mental states in a society, not on practices. Third, he argues that the “constitutive rules” for institutional facts all share a common form: they involve a certain kind of status assigned to objects in the world. The general form of constitutive rules, according to Searle, is “X counts as Y in context C”. An object X counts as having the status or symbolic function of Y in the context of a community. For example: a line of stones (X) counts as having the status of functioning as a border wall (Y) in a village (C). Another example: a piece of paper issued by the Bureau of Engraving and Printing (X) counts as having the status of functioning as money (Y) in the United States (C). Among the institutional facts, according to Searle, are social categories such as money, borders, cocktail parties, and public offices. Tuomela (2002) advances a related collective acceptance theory of social entities.

Ásta Sveinsdóttir (2008, 2010, 2013) also regards many social properties to be a product of collective attitudes, but in a weaker sense than Searle. A social property is “conferred” on an object, according to Ásta, if the object has the property because of some attitudes of people. A baseball umpire, for instance, confers the property of being a strike on certain pitches. Many properties, Ásta argues, should not be understood as being conferred by actual beliefs or acceptances of community members. Instead, conferrals should be understood in terms of ideal versions of community members. At bottom, she understands conferrals to be a product of community dispositions: i.e., how members are disposed to use concepts in counterfactual situations.

4.2.4 Other mental states

Other approaches also see social categories as being set up by the distributed mental states of members of a society. Many of these theories are less specific about the particular states that individuals must be in. Husserl (1936, 1950) argues that how an individual represents an object depends, in part, on the presupposition that others are representing it as well. Individual empathy for the representations of others plays a part in how the individual herself constructs representations. The representations of objects in a society, therefore, are a product of harmonized mental states among its members. But these mental states are not required to be attitudes or dispositions. Other theorists associate different mental characteristics with structuring social categories. Berger and Luckmann (1966), for instance, regard the identification of people in a society with social roles as central to the characteristics of those roles.

4.3 Pattern Theories

Mentalistic theories of social categories, whether individualistic or social, are sometimes criticized for overly fictionalizing the social world. Some philosophers emphasize that social categories are routinely used in the social sciences: the categories support inductive inferences, can be assessed statistically, and have causal effects. Such theorists argue that social categories are “real kinds” in the world, much like water and gold are “natural kinds”. Some deny the distinction between social kinds and natural kinds altogether, even while seeking to retain a role for people in setting up social categories. Instead of regarding social kinds to be generated principally by mental states that we overlay on the world, they treat social kinds as products of patterns—often patterns of causes and effects—in the world.

4.3.1 Functional roles and realizers

Functionalism in social theory is predominantly an approach to social explanation, providing causal accounts for the existence and maintenance of social entities in terms of the functions they serve for society. Some functionalist theories also make ontological claims, arguing that the nature of social entities involves their functions.

A common theme in functionalism is that people are often unaware of the functions that their own activities perform. Merton (1957) distinguishes the “latent” functions of an activity from its “manifest” functions. In many contemporary societies, for instance, people choose whom to marry on the basis of strong romantic attachments. One function of this practice is the manifest function of promoting happy long-term relationships. This motivates individuals to marry for love. But, Merton argues, the practice also has an underlying goal (the latent function): to minimize the role of family in the selection of a mate, thus leading to a kinship structure with many marriages that join individuals from different communities. Functionalists, then, often disagree with theories that treat social phenomena as cognitively transparent to members of a society.

A function may figure into the ontology of a social kind K in any of several ways. The simplest is for K to be defined by a causal role R that its instances perform. In that case, K is a “causal role kind”. Take, for instance, the role serving to minimize the role of family in selecting a mate. Alternatively, certain social categories may better be understood as realizers of functional roles. A realizer-kind is often defined in terms of process or physical characteristics, where things that have those characteristics normally perform a role (see Block 1980, McLaughlin 2006).

As analyses of social functional kinds, both role-kinds and realizer-kinds have shortcomings. In particular, they miss out on the normative character of functions. Cummins (1975) analyzes functions in terms of the capacities of the components of a system to contribute to a capacity of a larger system. On his account, the function that an entity plays is sensitive to the context of the larger system in which it is embedded. Social kinds, then, may arise from components of social systems having particular Cummins-functions.

4.3.2 Teleofunctions and tokens

Millikan (1984) proposes a different approach to functional kinds, arguing that they arise from the successive copying or reproduction of new objects from older ones. A population of objects copied in the right way, and copied because they perform a function, form a “reproductively established family”. Millikan (1999, 2005) applies this account to linguistic and social kinds as well as biological ones. Millikan also analyzes social convention in terms of reproductively established families, and other theorists have recently applied her theory to artifacts (see section 5.5).

A significant contribution of Millikan’s approach is the constitutive role of particular tokens in the world in setting up the kinds of which they are members. In her approach, the kind marriage is partly set up by millions of particular marriages copied one from another in a reproductively established family. Particular marriages—the actual members of the kind—figure into setting up the kind marriage to have the membership conditions it does. Contrast this with a mentalistic account of the kind marriage. According to that sort of theory, particular marriages are members of the kind, and may play a causal role in triggering people to have certain attitudes. But it is the attitudes that define the kind; the tokens do not play an ontological role. Thus Millikan proposes a more “world-involving” and less mentalistic theory of how kinds are set up. Also see Burge 1986 for a similar insight.

4.3.3 Causal loops

Systems theorists in the 1940s and 1950s began to investigate feedback mechanisms of regulation and control, such as electronic circuits that loop their outputs back into their inputs in order to arrive at a stable equilibrium. Wiener (1948, 1950) applies this “cybernetics” to social systems, as do Mead et al. 1950–1956, Parsons 1951, Ashby 1956. Bateson (1972) elaborates these applications, describing social systems as involving homeostasis, i.e., mechanisms that self-correct to stabilize their properties.

Boyd (1999a) applies homeostasis to the analysis of kinds, both natural and social. According to Boyd, kinds are clusters of entities that stably have similar properties, with these similarities sustained by a causal homeostatic mechanism. Marriage, for instance, is a kind because there are many particular entities with similar properties (such as being formed by ceremonies, involving couples paired up, and so on), and because there are mechanisms causing entities to have and keep these properties. Like Millikan, Boyd argues that kinds are a product of actual tokens in the world and the causal processes in which those tokens are involved. Since his account involves actual causal patterns over time, kinds are historical, but they do not need to involve functional roles or evolution.

Hacking (1995) employs feedback mechanisms in a different way: rather than emphasizing stability, he regards causal change to be characteristic of “human kinds”. Hacking argues that human kinds are generated through histories of causal loops, in which objects having a cluster of properties are named as being members of a kind. That label then affects the property cluster that they have, which changes the classification, and so on repeatedly, with human interests changing the properties that get classified into the category. Hacking discusses the example of the kind refugee, in which categorizing people as refugees changes how they are treated, which then loops back to affect how we categorize refugees. In Hacking’s account, each loop includes a mentalistic aspect—the classification—and an instantiated aspect—the causal effects on the properties. Butler 1993 and Hayles 1999 develop accounts of the looping effects of classification systems on human bodies (see also Schilling 2001). Mallon (2003, 2016) combines the looping theories with homeostatic property clusters, and applies them to social kinds, races in particular.

4.4 Theories of Practice

A different large class of theories hold that practical engagement with the environment is the basis for the setup of social categories. Many of these theories are influenced by Heidegger 1927, Merleau-Ponty 1945, and Wittgenstein 1953. And still other theories are pluralistic and heterogeneous: they hold that social categories are not just set up in one uniform way, but in a variety of distinct ways.

Theories of practice were discussed in section 3.2.4, as theories of the constituents or parts of social phenomena. Dances, for instance, involve physical and mental routines: among the constituents of a cha-cha are people’s thoughts and actions on the dance floor. However, theories of practice are not so easily categorized. Particular tokens of dance routines might be understood as playing a dual role: not only are they the constituents of cha-chas, but they also are among the sources of the category cha-cha. In this respect, theories of practice share an insight with certain “pattern” theories (see sections 4.3.2 and 4.3.3): the tokens of the practices themselves do some of the work in structuring the social categories into which the practices fall. Giddens (1984) gives an account of what he calls “structuration”, the process by which social structures are dynamically generated by practices and also condition them. Sahlins (1981, 1985) describes the formation of cultural categories through collisions between cultures and the actions of individuals. Other theories as well, such as Foucault (1976, 1977a) and Geertz (1973) can also be understood as giving accounts of how practices set up social categories.

Because practices are so general and play so many roles in these theories, it is a challenge to interpret them from the perspective of social ontology. It is hard to tease apart different kinds of ontological claims they make, and also hard even to know when these theories are making an ontological claim, as opposed merely to telling a narrative of causal influence. Some theories of practice insist on the importance of material routines in the world, and yet return to mentalistic-sounding accounts of the conceptual creation of the social world. The centerpiece of Bourdieu 1972 [1977], for instance, is the claim that social practice is generated by a “habitus”—a mentally internalized system of discrimination and perception, embodied as dispositions. (See also Ortner 1984).

4.5 Pluralistic and Heterogeneous Theories

As seen in the “pattern theories” discussed in section 4.3, approaches to biological and other scientific kinds are sometimes extended to social categories. Some participants in these debates, including Dupré (1995) and Hacking (2007), argue for a sweeping pluralism about scientific kinds: they contend that there are myriad kinds of kinds, and that it is an error to regard some kinds as more “natural” than others. Others argue for a more modest form of pluralism. Ereshefsky and Reydon (2015) argue that there are several distinct kinds of scientific kinds, including non-causal kinds, functional kinds, and heterostatic kinds. Along similar lines, many theorists of race argue for pluralism with respect to racial kinds: though contemporary race theorists deny “biological essentialism”, they argue that there are many ways racial kinds are constructed and used in contemporary societies (see section 5.4).

Epstein (2008, 2014a) argues for modest pluralism about the ways social categories are set up. He introduces the term ‘anchoring’ to denote the setting up or putting in place of social categories or kinds. He proposes that all the theories discussed in section 4 are theories of anchoring, but denies that social categories are all anchored in the same way. Instead, there are various “anchoring schemas”. He cautions that we sometimes classify kinds according to how they are anchored, but not in all cases.

In addition to pluralism about anchoring schemas, he also argues that anchors are heterogeneous (Epstein 2015): even for a single anchoring schema, the anchors that feed into that schema—i.e., the facts that metaphysically set up a social category—are often diverse. Legal categories in the U.S., for instance, are anchored by facts such as jury instructions, trial results, legislative enactments, judicial interpretation, and environmental regularities. Even theories of practice, he argues, do not have the resources to accommodate this heterogeneity.

4.6 The Roles of Language

Many theories in social ontology assign a central role to language. In considering the relation between language and sociality, we should separate the following questions:

  1. Regarding the social nature of language: Is language private or public, mental or social or environmental? This is discussed in section 5.7.
  2. Regarding linguistic entities as constituents of social facts: Do certain social facts have linguistic components or building blocks? For instance, a speech act may be a component of an instance of a hate-crime. This is discussed in section 3.2.3.
  3. Regarding roles for language in setting up social categories: Is our language part of the metaphysical explanation for why we have the social categories we do, such as dollar, woman, or professor? This is the topic of the present section.

Answers to this third question can, in turn, be divided into two broad kinds of role for language: (a) social categories correspond to semantic values, or meanings, of words; (b) social categories are set up by speech acts, discourse, or other features of a community’s language.

4.6.1 Social categories as semantic values

‘Cha-cha’ is a word in the English language (yes, imported from Spanish). In some semantic theories, the meaning of that word just is the social kind cha-cha: the semantic value of the word is identical with the social category. This may or may not imply that language plays a key role in social ontology. On a direct-reference theory of meaning (see Soames 1987, Kaplan 1989, Recanati 1993), it does not. That theory argues that we encounter the kind cha-cha in the world—a kind that is presumably socially constructed—and then connect the word ‘cha-cha’ to that kind. The inclusion of that word in our language does not have any metaphysical bearing on the category.

The same may apply even if the name has causal influence on the category cha-cha. Hacking 1995 argues that the term we apply to a category has an influence on our practices, which in turn changes the category. Even in this account, it is not clear that language has a metaphysical bearing on the category: the practices ontologically determine the contours of the category, and the uses of the word are merely one among many causal influences on those practices.

But in other theories of meaning, the order of metaphysical determination is reversed. Consider, for instance, a theory in which word meaning is derived from patterns of usage—a theory, for instance, in which the word ‘cha-cha’ derives its meaning at a time from uses of that word up to that time. Or consider a descriptive theory of meaning—a theory in which the word ‘cha-cha’ derives its meaning from the cluster of descriptions that the English-speaking community associates with it. If we add to these theories of linguistic meaning the further claim that social categories are identified with semantic values, then it is linguistic building blocks that set up the social kind cha-cha.

There are grounds for skepticism about equating social categories with semantic ones. Sociologists often discover social categories that have not been previously named, spoken of, or even conceptualized. This suggests that semantic categories may not play quite so central a role in the metaphysics of the social world.

4.6.2 Social categories set up by speech acts, discourse, features of language

Austin (1961, 1962) points out that language is not only reserved for describing states of affairs in the world. Certain utterances are “performative”: merely in uttering them, we establish facts in the world. A minister, for instance, marries a couple with an invocation. Searle (1995, 2010) argues that all “institutional facts” are generated in this way. Every constitutive rule, he argues, is a product of a declarative speech act, although he qualifies this by holding that some declarations may be replaced with attitudes that have the same function (Searle 2010). He expresses skepticism that, in such acts, we genuinely create new entities in the world, rather than merely taking attitudes towards “brute reality” (cf. Sider 2001, Effingham 2010). Thomasson (2003) argues on the contrary for the reality of entities generated with speech acts (cf. Wiggins 1980, Schiffer 2003).

Several theorists argue not just that particular social entities are produced by speech acts, but that the social world is the product of discourse more generally. This view has many historical antecedents in the enlightenment and post-enlightenment (Aarsleff 1982, Ricken 1994, and Forster 2010), as well as in the early twentieth century, such as Cassirer 1925 and Whorf 1944. But Wittgenstein (1953) is generally credited with crystallizing this “linguistic turn”. Winch (1958) draws on Wittgenstein to argue that “our language and our social relations are just two different sides of the same coin”. Social phenomena and their meanings, according to Winch, are manifestations of the “form of life” in which a society’s language-games are a part. This perspective has been influential in post-structuralism in particular, with a wide range of theories advocating the linguistic construction of social reality. Included among these are Foucault’s discourse analysis (Foucault 1984, 2001) and Butler (1988)’s treatment of the performativity of gender, with the speech acts that would appear to express gender actually being constitutive of gender identities. See Tannen, Hamilton et al. 2015.

Recent theories in post-structuralism have begun to de-emphasize language, partly as a result of critiques that such theories focus too little on human bodies and physical experience. The notion of “discourse” is also often expanded to include practical activities in the world (such as the “architectural discourse” of constructed spaces). Theories of discourse, construed in this way, are difficult to distinguish from more general theories of practice and heterogeneous theories.

5. Key Domains Addressed by Social Ontology

The preceding sections discuss general theories of social ontology. Informing these—and informed by them—is work on specific applications. The following sections briefly discuss prominent domains in social ontology to give a sense of the variety of these applications, to introduce some key topics, and to point to resources for further reading. Corresponding to each these sections is an entire subfield of philosophy and/or social science.

5.1 Social Groups

What are social groups? One debate in the literature concerns the kind of entities that social groups are: collections, classes, sets, fusions, structures, or some other kind of entity. It may seem natural to think of a group as a set of people in the mathematical sense. However, groups can persist through changes in membership, while sets are generally understood as having their members essentially (see Sharvy 1968, Ruben 1985, Uzquiano 2004, Sheehy 2006). Effingham (2010) proposes an account that identifies groups with complex sets, so that they can have different members at different times and at different worlds. Others (including Macdonald & Pettit 1981, Copp 1984, Sheehy 2006) argue that groups are fusions of people. A problem with this is the transitivity of parthood: since Alice’s finger is a part of Alice, it follows from the fusion view that if Alice is a part of a group, then so is Alice’s finger. That is a problem, because while Alice is a member of the group her finger is not. Another view is that groups are realizations of structures: Schmitt (2003a) considers and objects to this, and Ritchie (2013) defends it. Others argue that groups are distinct from their members but are constituted by them (Uzquiano 2004, Jansen 2009, Epstein 2015).

Different approaches to groups make different commitments with regard to the entities that should be included among the social groups—e.g., committees, teams, corporations, universities, nations, races, genders, red-haired people. Some theorists also propose that social groups must have certain distinctive characteristics, such as the members being in certain cognitive states or being subject to certain norms. Related to this is the question of whether there are distinct types of groups. Ritchie (2015) argues that there are two prominent types—organized groups, which are realizations of structured sets of nodes that stand in a functional relation to one another, and feature groups, which are collections of people who have a property or feature in common with one another. Thomasson (forthcoming) argues that an important way of characterizing groups is in terms of the norms they bear. Epstein (forthcoming) challenges simple typologies of groups and proposes a framework for the metaphysics of groups involving multiple dimensions.

5.2 Group Minds, Collective Intentionality, and Group Agency

Can groups take actions? Can they have intentions or beliefs? Can they bear responsibility? If so, how are these to be understood? Through much of the twentieth century ascriptions of intentions and actions to groups were widely regarded as either erroneous or else merely “summative”: that is, for a group to have an intention or take an action is merely for all the members of the group to have that intention or take that action (see Tollefsen 2015).

Schweikard and Schmid (see entry on collective intentionality) find more nuanced approaches in Scheler 1913 and Walther 1923. Scheler identifies various kinds of social entities, some of which involve people acting in solidarity, and Walther proposes an account of structured attitudes in terms of empathy. In the recent literature, Gilbert (1989, 1990) introduces new reasons for denying summative approaches: members of social groups are subject to norms that do not apply merely to individuals who have matching attitudes. If a couple is walking together to the store, one person violates a norm if she suddenly takes off in a different direction without excusing herself. But this would not violate any norms if collective intentions were merely summative. Gilbert argues that social groups, as opposed to mere collections of individuals, are formed by the members making joint commitments. She describes the formation of such commitments, and analyzes group attitudes in terms of them.

Bratman (1993, 2014) is more concerned with demystifying shared intentions by explaining how they can arise from individual attitudes. Instead of searching for a general analysis, he proposes sufficient conditions for the formation of shared intention, as applied to the case of “modestly social” groups. These are small, unstructured groups of people, in which all members participate knowledgably in coordination with one another. Bratman analyzes shared intention in terms of the common knowledge of group members, together with “meshing” intentions by group members to perform an action by way of the actions and plans of the other members. Bratman argues that the norms Gilbert observes can be derived from these interpersonal intentions together with standard moral obligations.

Tuomela and Miller (1988) and Searle (1990) account for group intention differently. Following Sellars (1968, 1980), they propose that there is an overlooked class of attitudes that individual people possess: in addition to “I-attitudes”, individuals also have “we-attitudes”. According to Searle, these are distinct primitive mental states. For a group to collectively intend J, according to Searle, is for all the members of the group to we-intend J. His view is somewhat similar to a “summative” view of group attitudes, except that collective attitudes are sums of we-attitudes rather than I-attitudes. Tuomela and Miller also distinguish attitudes in the “we-mode” from attitudes in the “I-mode”. The most unified form of group attitude, in their view, is made up of the members having we-mode attitudes. But for Tuomela and Miller, we-mode attitudes are not primitive, but are built out of more standard attitudes. They also admit different species of group attitudes, some of which are built of I-mode attitudes of group members, much like Bratman does. In recent years, psychologists and cognitive scientists have begun to investigate whether there are distinctively social attitudes (see Knoblich, Butterfill et al. 2011, Gallotti & Frith 2013, Tomasello 2014).

In addition to collective intentions, other philosophers have worked on the analysis of other attitudes, such collective belief and judgment (Gilbert 1987, Wray 2001, Hakli 2006, List 2014).

The analysis of collective attitudes raises questions about the nature of group minds more generally, and whether or not they are to be understood as extensions of individual properties applied to groups. A number of theorists take a functionalist approach to group minds and agency. On this approach, group agents or group cognitive systems are understood to function in a similar way as individuals do, at a certain level of description. A widely accepted theory of individual agency is that people have a modular system that we use to navigate the world. We have beliefs, knowledge, form intentions, plan, reason, and take action. All of these components can be described in terms of their functional contributions to the system, and they integrate with one another to perform unified functions. They compose, in other words, a “system of practical activity”. Group agency is understood on this model: for group agents, the same functional system is realized, but by groups or distributed systems rather than by individuals. (See Bratman 1987, 1993, 2014; List & Pettit 2011; Theiner & O’Connor 2010; Theiner 2014; Epstein forthcoming). List and Pettit argue that such realizers constitute new “loci of agency”, or “groups with minds of their own”.

Others challenge group minds by arguing against functional treatments of mind altogether. Rupert (2014), for instance, argues that having phenomenal states is a requirement for intentionality, but that groups cannot have such states (see also Schwitzgebel 2015, List forthcoming). Other theorists object to the typical focus of this literature on small unstructured collectives of adults interacting with one another. They instead work on the attitudes of complex groups, corporations, and large-scale systems (Hutchins 1995, Huebner 2013). Questions of moral agency and corporate responsibility may also bear on how to analyze group agency and group minds (see French 1979, Tollefsen 2002, Pettit 2007, Hess 2010, List & Pettit 2011).

5.3 Institutions, Organizations, and Firms

The nature of institutions, organizations, and firms is treated more extensively in sociology and economics than in philosophy. Coase (1937, 1960) pioneered the literature on firms in economics. In “The Nature of the Firm”, Coase examines the question of why firms exist at all: he argues that the function of firms is to lower transaction costs that would otherwise have to be incurred in forming contracts among individuals. Coase does not distinguish the question of the function of firms from the question of what firms are. But subsequent work engages more directly with ontological questions, including eliminativism about firms (Alchian & Demsetz 1972), the “nexus of contracts” view (Jensen & Meckling 1976), the “property rights” view (Grossman & Hart 1986, Hart & Moore 1990), and the “resource view” (Penrose 1959, Barney 1991, Conner & Prahalad 1996).

Work on firms is also tied to theories of in institutions in economics, spearheaded by Oliver Williamson, Douglas North, and Elinor Ostrom. Williamson (1979, 1981, 1996) popularized a Coase-style approach with theories of how institutional structures such as markets, hierarchies, multidivisional corporations, and alliances solve problems of transaction costs. Ostrom’s influential work on common pool resources treats institutions as sets of rules that communities put in place in order to change incentives and to induce socially beneficial choices. The “new institutional economics” program develops this largely game-theoretic understanding of institutions, tying them to analyses of the nature of conventions and norms (see Shepsle 1986; Sugden 1986; North 1990; Ostrom 1990, 1995; Binmore 1998; Schotter 2008; Guala 2016).

Recent work in organizational sociology also focuses on systems of rules, with organizations analyzed in terms of their “institutionalized” features. Rather than the explicitly chosen rules discussed by economists, however, here systems of rules are regarded as tacit and non-intentionally followed (Powell & DiMaggio 2012). Sociological approaches have been developed for interpreting organizations, largely focused on causal explanations for their structure, power, and influence. Work on the nature of organizations in sociology often involves analyzing them in terms of social components or properties (see Clegg, Hardy et al. 1996, Scott 2014).

5.4 Race, Gender, and Disability

Much recent interest in social ontology has been sparked by new approaches to race, gender, disability, and related social categories. Historically, erroneous ontological claims have contributed to and been used to justify social oppression. Claims about the genetic nature of race, for instance, are historically tied to claims about intellectual, character, and cultural differences between racial groups. Likewise, claims about the nature of gender differences are historically tied to claims about how women ought to behave.

Controversy over race categories, gender categories, and other categories, pertains both to their construction and their essential properties. The term ‘essentialism’, as applied to categories such as race and gender, has a different meaning than it does in mainstream metaphysics. As applied to race, for instance, ‘essentialism’ is often understood as synonymous with ‘biological essentialism’—the view that races have simple, natural, and heritable biological properties, such that every member of a racial group has that biological property. This should not be confused with a metaphysical claim that might be made by a social constructivist proposing a “social essence” of race: for instance, a claim that membership in a racial group essentially involves identifying with other people for reasons of solidarity, or that it involves being descended from a historically and geographically situated population. Such a theorist would flatly deny “essentialism” in the old sense, which still analyzing the (socially set up) essential properties of race (for a critique of essentialism, see Phillips 2010; see also entry on race).

Eliminativists argue that biological essentialism in the old sense is inseparable from our racial categories, so debunking racist views implies that racial categories are an illusion: there are no races (Appiah 1985, 1994; Zack 1994, 1995). A different set of approaches maintains that races are social kinds without having simple biological essences. Among these are historico-geographic theories, genetic-bundle theories, identity theories, etc. (see Bernasconi & Lott 2000, Zack 2002, Glasgow 2009). Other theories hold that although simple biological theories are false, racial differences can be identified using the methods of population biology (Andreasen 1998, Kitcher 2007, Hardimon 2012; see also Kaplan & Winther 2014). In the face of competing conceptions of race, some theorists propose pluralism about race-like kinds (Hochman 2013, McPherson 2015). In many theories of race, bi-racialism and multi-racialism have been treated as boundary or marginal cases. Others argue, on the contrary, that multiracialism is central to the construction of racial categories (see Alcoff, Sundstrom et al. 2016).

In some ways, questions pertaining to the metaphysics of sex and gender resemble those pertaining to race: historically, descriptive and normative categories were conflated in simplistic biological theories. An important difference between sex/gender and race, however, concerns the distinction between sex and gender (Beauvoir 1949, West & Zimmerman 1987). Many theorists propose that sexes are biological categories and that genders are categories of social norms and behaviors that are traditionally attached to sexes. However, other theorists argue that it is incorrect to regard sex as biological (Fausto-Sterling 2000, Butler 2004). Thus in the case of sex/gender, there are arguably multiple socially constructed categories that interact with one another; and some theorists reject the distinction between sex and gender (see entry on feminist perspectives on sex and gender).

A question pertaining to racial and gender categories alike is whether these are descriptively adequate categories in the first place. Many of the political phenomena associated with differential treatment of groups and oppression cut across lines of race, gender, and class. Some theorists of intersectionality argue that it is misleading to regard standard gender and racial groups as if they were unified (see Crenshaw 1991, McCall 2005, Jones 2014).

A central problem in the ontology of race, gender, and other categories is that how we categorize not only has ethical implications, but is affected by ethically-laden facts. Some theorists challenge the idea of a purely descriptive analysis of such groups. Others propose that there can be descriptive analyses, but that such analyses are a stepping stone to ethically preferable categories. Haslanger (2000, 2012) in particular has argued for the “ameliorative” analysis of racial and gender categories. Part of the role of social ontology is to analyze the concepts and categories that are “operative” in a social system, but an equally important aim is to explore how we might otherwise construct social categories with the aim of social improvement. Barnes (2016) argues for an ameliorative account of disability (see entry on disability: definitions, models, experience).

5.5 Artifacts and Artworks

The term ‘artifact’ denotes a broad class of objects that are products of human activity. The paradigmatic examples are tools, such as hammers, knives, and cups, but the category of artifacts includes more complex objects as well, such as cars, houses, and computers. Some theorists conceive of artifacts broadly enough that the category includes nearly all social entities, from hammers to Hamlet.

The standard rough characterization of an artifact is that it is an object created by people to perform some function (see Hilpinen 1992a, Dipert 1993; entry on artifact). This characterization excludes objects that are used to perform functions but are not made by a person. A rock might be used as a hammer, or a piece of driftwood as decoration. Other objects are made by people but without any functional intention, such as scraps of metal produced in making a blade. The functionality of an object can also be de-coupled from its making: someone might, for instance, decide that an unmodified pile of scrap metal is sculpture.

This definition requires an understanding of the role—and perhaps the necessity—of intention. Many objects that we presume to be artifacts are not accompanied by human intentions directly. A machine, for example, might automatically hammer out thousands of blades, which the machine stacks into boxes. A particular blade in one of those boxes would typically be considered an artifact even though no human was ever aware of that blade’s existence, to say nothing of having created it for a reason. Millikan (1984) argues that certain entities can be understood as having “derived functions”, when their intended role is part of the explanation for their being reproduced. Thomasson (2003, 2007) develops this idea further, arguing that the function of an artifact is always in principle knowable to the creator. Elder (2004, 2007) develops Millikan’s approach in an opposing direction, arguing that artifacts are copied kinds but need not be accompanied by creator intention.

These and other accounts hold that artifacts ontologically depend on historical facts, often historical intentions of the creator. Others argue that the emphasis on historical processes is misguided, and that what matters is how an object is used in the present (Keil, Greif et al. 2007; Preston 2009, 2013). Not everyone agrees that artifacts must have a function (or an intended function). Objects such as doodles and rock stacks are created without either functions or functional intentions. Even if artifacts necessarily involve functions, the role of functions in distinguishing artifactual kinds from one another might be debated. It may be that artifactual kinds are individuated by function, but many artifactual kinds (such as houses) seem to have multiple functions, and some sets of distinct artifactual kinds (such as bicycles and tricycles) may all have the same function.

Theories of artifacts draw from the literature on the ontology of art (see, for instance, Bloom 1996, Levinson 2007), and many theories of artworks regard them to be kinds of artifacts (see Eaton 1969, Iseminger 1973, Hilpinen 1992b, Thomasson 1999).

Problems in the ontology of art include the ontological categories into which artworks fall, the unity or diversity of kinds of entities within artistic domains and across domains (e.g., in painting, sculpture, music, dance), the individuation of particular artworks, the definition of art in general, and the dynamic changes in artistic categories. See entries on the definition of art, history of the ontology of art, the philosophy of music, the philosophy of dance, conceptual art, and the philosophy of digital art.

5.6 Money

Menger (1892) tells a story of the emergence of money from trading practices. For a society to come to have money, Menger argues, it is not required that anyone in the society made a choice to adopt a medium as money. Instead, in the course of transactions in the marketplace, the marketability of certain goods will tend to increase, and as a result, these goods acquire a degree of “money-character”. Money, in Menger’s view, is simply a good that is highly marketable in transactions, and therefore highly liquid.

The centerpiece of Menger’s account is the non-intentional emergence of money (see Aydinonat 2008, Tieffenbach 2010). But his account also gives an implicit theory of the nature of money. Money is a simple causal-role kind, with any good that is highly liquid and marketable being money. Introductory economics textbooks tend to define money as a slightly more complicated role-kind: money is a store of value, a medium of exchange, and a unit of account (Arnold 2008, Mankiw 2016). Recent work in economics suggests a different set of functions for money. A striking feature of standard economic models is that money seems superfluous. In idealized neo-classical economies, there is no need for a medium of exchange, nor is it clear why price levels should affect the “real economy” of production and consumption. Thus economists have recently investigated the economic “frictions” that make money useful, and find that money contributes to efficiency in a market that has imperfect enforceability of contracts and limited record-keeping. In such an economy, money helps perform operations such as the search for trading partners. The overcoming of such economic “frictions” seems to be an alternative and perhaps underlying function of money. (See Diamond 1984, Kiyotaki & Wright 1989, Kocherlakota 1998, Wright 2010, Smit, Buekens et al. 2016.)

These discussions imply that money is a causal-role kind of some sort. This is questionable, however: such a definition fails to accommodate tokens of money that fail to perform those roles (such as a coin buried in the ground). Instead, money may be better understood as a different sort of functional kind, or perhaps as an artifactual kind (see section 5.5). Alternatively, the nature of money may not involve its functions at all. Aristotle (Politics 1.8–10) notes that there are several distinct functions performed by money, each of which would naturally have its own essence; but he points out that we use the same medium for all of these. The money in any given society, he argues, is a product of agreement in that society.

A story is sometimes told of a historical progression from barter to the use of “commodity money” (such as gold, cowrie shells, or beads) to the use of “fiat money” (such as government-issued paper currency) (see Searle 1995, McEachern 2011). Searle argues that all kinds of money are “institutional kinds”, which he analyzes in terms of the collective assignment of a function to a substrate. Commodity money, in his view, involves assignment to a good with some intrinsic value, while fiat money involves assignment to a piece of paper printed by the government.

Historians of money and monetary theorists divide kinds of money along more nuanced dimensions. A few historical cases may qualify as fiat money, such as in Ming dynasty China, revolutionary France, and the American Confederacy, but these were fragile and subject to collapse (Yang 1952, Ferguson 2008, Spang 2015). But many contemporary approaches emphasize the role of private interactions in the creation of money, and importantly, reserve banking as well as credit and debt markets. Other theories emphasize the role of the state, and in particular the central roles of interest-rate-setting institutions, government debt, and the collection of taxes (see Friedman & Schwartz 1963, Kaldor 1985, Moore 1988, Deleplace & Nell 1996). In these approaches, questions about the “substance” of money become rather peripheral.

Some controversies persist on the substance of money. It was part of historical debates over the gold standard and “bimetallism”, and more recently there has been philosophical discussion of electronic money (Smith & Searle 2003) and “cryptocurrencies” such as bitcoin. An ongoing problem for work in the nature of money is the blurring of distinctions between questions about ontology, about the evolution of money, about what drives the money supply, and about what makes a monetary system stable.

5.7 The Law

Many important questions in social ontology are connected to jurisprudence, or the study of the nature of law itself. Consider a given legal obligation or prohibition in a locality, such as a U.S. federal law on reporting requirements for public corporations, or a state law governing medical reimbursements. Lawyers and judges mainly work on specific applications of such laws, such as whether a particular corporation satisfying a particular reporting requirement. In certain circumstances lawyers and judges investigate and interpret the content of the law, such as whether some provision is incompatible with the Constitution.

The study of the nature of law is distinct from these. It can be divided into two principal inquiries, corresponding to the division between the “constituents” and “sources” discussed in sections 3 and 4. The first inquiry examines what determines or grounds the content of laws in general, within a legal system. For instance, is the content of a law exhaustively determined by the statutes recorded in the legal code? Or is that only a part of what determines the content of a law? Other candidate contributors to the content of a law are historical judicial interpretations, jury decisions, patterns of practices, legislative actions and intentions, executive statements, general legal principles, and moral principles. Hart (1961) casts this question as the inquiry into the “rule of recognition” in a legal system: that is, what conditions a proposition needs to satisfy in order for it to be a law (see also Dworkin 1967, 1978, 1986; Greenawalt 1986; Shapiro 2007, 2009).

A second question is: What are the sources of these contributors to the content of the law? In virtue of what do texts or enactments or interpretations or moral considerations figure into grounding the content of a nation’s laws? Positivist theories hold that social practices and other sociological facts are the sources of legality; natural law theories argue instead that legality is rooted in human nature and that legal standards are independent of human decision and practice. A central problem for any theory of the sources of law is the authority, or bindingness, which law carries (if it does carry these). See the articles in J.L. Coleman, Shapiro, & Himma 2002, as well as entries on the nature of law, natural law theories, legal positivism, and the economic analysis of law.

Other issues in the ontology of law pertain to the nature of entities that pervade the law, such as contracts (Fried 1981, Barnett 1985, Hart & Holmstrom 1986), promises (Scanlon 1990, Kolodny & Wallace 2003, Owens 2006, Shiffrin 2008), and torts (J.L. Coleman 1982, 1983, Postema 2001). The law also plays a central role in setting up certain social categories, such as marriage and corporations. Marriage is tightly regulated by the law in many cultures. Does the law define what marriage is, or is marriage set up wholly or in part by social practices? Likewise for corporations: does the law have a privileged role in determining what types of corporations exist in a modern society, or are corporations products of social and economic systems? (See section 5.3.)

Social ontology also has implications for the practice of lawmaking and adjudication. Theorists of corporate liability, for instance, investigate the nature of corporate agency and responsibility, and the relation between these and the agency and responsibility of individual people connected to the corporation (French 1984, Fisse & Braithwaite 1993, Erskine 2003, Gobert & Punch 2003, Pettit 2007). The law is also often called on to adjudicate ontological questions, such as whether goods of a certain kind fall under a clause of a trade agreement, or whether a particular act is an instance of a criminalized activity.

5.8 Language and Linguistic Objects

Much work in linguistics and the philosophy of language involves claims and assumptions about the nature of linguistic entities, such as linguistic rules, components of the language faculty, and semantic content. Theories of the nature of language and meaning are also influential models for the metaphysics of other social entities (such as artifacts, institutions, and laws).

The most conspicuous debate about the “nature of language”—namely, the debate over innateness—does not have much to do with the metaphysics of language. Like most phenomena involving the human mind, language is causally affected by social factors. A person’s vocabulary and grammar, for instance, are affected by interactions with parents, peers, and other community members. Just how significant these causal effects are is widely debated in linguistics, with many in the Chomskian tradition favoring innate constraints on the mental structures of language and others rejecting innatism (see Chomsky 1986, 2000; Tomasello 1992, 1995; Elman, Bates et al. 1996; Kirby 1999). The question of the nature of language, however, is to a large extent independent of innatism versus anti-innatism. Interactions with other people may contribute only a bit to an individual’s mental structures, or they may fundamentally shape them—but in either case a person’s language may or may not ontologically depend only on that person’s brain states.

Chomsky (1986) does take an explicit position on the nature of language and its ontological building blocks. He argues that linguistics is the science of “I-languages”—i.e., internalized languages, the mental rules of grammar, phonology, and so on, that individuals use in expressing themselves or understanding the utterances of others. He rejects “E-languages”—externalized or public languages like English, Chinese, and Khosa—as unscientific fictions. Others disagree on various grounds. Katz and Postal (1991) share Chomsky’s view that each person has his or her own language, but argue that languages are abstract or mathematical entities rather than psychological ones (see also Higginbotham 1991). Wittgenstein (1953) and his successors have a more substantive disagreement: Wittgenstein denies the possibility of a “private language” altogether, arguing that language is a matter of engagement of people with one another and with the world. Other philosophers have argued for the publicity and externality of language on a variety of grounds, including the communicative basis of language, the nature of rules, and theories of semantic content (see Kripke 1972, 1982; Schiffer 1972; Lewis 1975; Putnam 1975; Burge 1979; Brandom 1994; Dummett 1989; and entries on theories of meaning, externalism about mental content, names, and the normativity of meaning and content).

Theories of words, phonemes, and other linguistic entities are tied to the metaphysics of language more generally, but also are subjects of separate inquiries. The extent to which these are questions for social ontology, rather than, say, the metaphysics of psychological states, depends in part on whether and how language is public. Kaplan (1990), for instance, argues that words are entities extended over time and across a population: “utterances and inscriptions are stages of words, which are the continuants made up of these interpersonal stages”. This approach is in contrast to type-token theories, some of which regard word-types to be socially individuated, and others individualistically individuated (see Hugly & Sayward 1981, Bromberger 1989, McCulloch 1991, Cappelen 1999, Wetzel 2009, Hawthorne & Lepore 2011). The nature of words is also tied to the question of whether a word’s meaning is essential to it (Kaplan 1990, Alward 2005, Simchen 2012), and to the distinctions between various types of words in linguistics, such as phonological words, syntactic atoms, morphological words, and lexical words (see Selkirk 1984, Di Sciullo & Williams 1987, Hall 1999, Raffelsiefen 1999, Julien 2007). Similar issues arise in connection with sentences, utterances, and quotation (Davidson 1979, J. Bennett 1988, Washington 1992, Cappelen & Lepore 1997, Recanati 2001, García-Carpintero 2004b, Predelli 2008, Saka 2013).

Speech acts make up another domain in which social factors are plausibly constitutive. Austin (1962) and Searle (1969) argue that the force of any speech act is a product of a social convention pertaining to speech acts of that type. Others use an “intentionalist” approach, in which the force of a speech act is a product only of the intentions of the speaker. Yet others argue that this force is a product of the uptake by hearers in addition to speaker intentions (see Strawson 1964, Bach & Harnish 1979, Clark & Carlson 1982, García-Carpintero 2004a, and entries on speech acts, assertion).


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