Iris Murdoch

First published Wed Mar 23, 2022; substantive revision Tue Apr 19, 2022

Iris Murdoch (1919–1999) was a prominent British philosopher of the second half of the 20th century, best known for her moral philosophy. Unusual for her times, she combined her grounding in Wittgensteinian and linguistic/analytic philosophy with a strong influence of 19th and 20th century Continental philosophy, Christian religion and thought, and Hindu and Buddhist philosophy. Though linked with virtue ethics, care ethics, and particularism, she developed a unique form of Platonic moral realism not readily assimilated or even comparable to any of the dominant approaches to ethics in 20th century Anglo-American philosophy.

1. Overview

Murdoch’s family was middle class (her father was a civil servant) and Irish Protestant (an identity that remained important to Murdoch throughout her life). They moved to London from Ireland when Murdoch was very young. Murdoch attended Oxford University, overlapping with three other women—Elizabeth Anscombe, Philippa Foot, and Mary Midgley—at a time (1938–1942) when many male students were away at war. Foot, Murdoch, and Midgley all became prominent and influential moral philosophers, and Anscombe a prominent philosopher of action and a student, friend, translator and interpreter of Wittgenstein.

The four (now being referred to as the “Wartime Quartet” [MacCumhaill & Wiseman 2022; Lipscomb 2021]) stayed in touch after the war, and Murdoch did so with each of them individually. All four pushed back against various aspects of the male-dominated Oxford orthodoxy of linguistic and analytic philosophy (e.g., the fact/value dichotomy, the severing of ethics from an understanding of human nature, the neglect of virtue and vice), though their own philosophies differed significantly from one another.

Over her lifetime Murdoch developed an entirely distinctive position in moral philosophy, as well as philosophy of art and religion (both of which she saw as important for morality). She was engaged with the Anglo-American moral philosophy of that period and its historical antecedents (such as Hobbes and Hume) but was equally engaged throughout her life with traditional and some then-current “Continental” philosophy—especially Schopenhauer, Hegel, Heidegger (on whom she wrote a book, to be published in the near future), Sartre, Adorno, Buber, and Derrida; with Christian thinkers St. Paul, St. Augustine, Anselm, Eckhart, Julian of Norwich; and with Hindu and especially Buddhist thought. Her views were also strongly influenced by Plato, Kant, Simone Weil, and Wittgenstein, and she declared herself in 1968 to be “a kind of Platonist” (Rose 1968).

2. Murdoch’s Trajectory and Reception

Murdoch taught at Oxford from 1948–1963 (as both tutor and lecturer), and was highly regarded by colleagues, often appearing in collections and BBC programs with leading British philosophers generally though not always in the analytic or linguistic tradition. She was comfortable with the analytic approach, though her thinking was clearly headed in different directions, in part because of the influence of Simone Weil (Broackes 2012a: 19–20).

However, unusual for Oxford philosophers of that period, she was also drawn to Jean-Paul Sartre’s existentialism, to which she had been exposed while working after the war in Belgium (and Austria) for the United Nations Relief and Rehabilitation Administration (UNRRA). Her first book, in 1953, was Sartre: Romantic Rationalist. She was instrumental in bringing French thinkers of that period, including also Simone de Beauvoir, the feminist/existentialist, and Albert Camus, to an English-speaking audience.

Murdoch left her position at Oxford in 1963 (though she continued to live in Oxford for some of each week) and increasingly lost touch with British academic philosophy. As of this writing, Murdoch is best known for a collection of three essays written in the 1960s, none originally published in easily accessible philosophy venues, published in 1970 as The Sovereignty of Good. This collection is by far the main source for professional philosophers writing on Murdoch, and of Murdoch’s broader impact on moral philosophy, and this entry will draw largely but not exclusively on that work.

Toward the end of the 1970s and into the 1980s, some Anglo-American philosophers began to make use of Murdoch in criticizing moral philosophy of the day, or in developing a distinctive position of their own. This included Charles Taylor, Hilary Putnam, Cora Diamond, Genevieve Lloyd, John McDowell, Raimond Gaita, Martha Nussbaum, Lawrence Blum and Sabina Lovibond. This early secondary literature did not involve deep scholarly engagement with Murdoch’s own work, but was inspired by it and helped bring Murdoch to the attention of the wider professional philosophical world.

A collection of almost all Murdoch’s previous articles (including those in Sovereignty) plus a short book on Plato was published in 1997, as Existentialists and Mystics: Writings on Philosophy and Literature, edited by her friend and biographer, the literary scholar Peter Conradi. That and the first scholarly collection on her work, Iris Murdoch and the Search for Human Goodness (Antonaccio & Schweiker 1996), with essays by theologians and philosophers (including Diamond, Nussbaum, and Taylor) prompted an increase in scholarship directly on Murdoch in the 2000s. Justin Broackes’s Iris Murdoch, Philosopher, in 2012, was the first all-philosopher collection on Murdoch. While the recent scholarship sometimes aims at demonstrating Murdoch’s relevance to current live issues in Anglo-American ethics (Setiya 2013; Hopwood 2018), increasingly, scholarship (including the two articles just cited) engages with Murdoch’s own philosophical preoccupations on her terms.

In 1992, Murdoch published her sole book working out her own philosophical views (Sovereignty being a collection of separately published essays), Metaphysics as a Guide to Morals. Murdoch’s views, especially in the latter work, have been difficult for contemporary philosophers to place comfortably within the intellectual terrain of moral philosophy as it has developed in our time, in part because of her unusual range of intellectual touchstones; in part because, especially in Metaphysics, she seldom writes in a standard “argument/conclusion” format; and in part because of her intellectual distance from contemporary Anglo-American philosophy. There is currently very little secondary literature on Metaphysics, but Dooley and Hämäläinen’s 2019 collection, Reading Iris Murdoch’s Metaphysics as a Guide to Morals will hopefully spur further scholarship on that work. A Routledge Handbook, Hopwood and Panizza’s The Murdochian Mind (forthcoming), will contribute substantially to Murdoch scholarship.

Murdoch is distinctive as a philosopher in another way as well. Beginning in 1954, she became a published novelist, with twenty-six novels in her lifetime, several of which won or were short-listed for important British literary prizes. Although her philosophy and her novels can be read entirely separately from one another, they are plausibly regarded as connected and mutually illuminating, although in interviews Murdoch sometimes denied this. A good deal of scholarly literature (mostly from literary scholars [but from the philosophy side, see Nussbaum 1990; Browning 2018b]) is devoted to exploring their connection and non-connection. Murdoch is the subject of an award-winning biography, Iris: The Life of Iris Murdoch, by Peter Conradi (2001), and an award-winning film of that same year, Iris (dir: Richard Eyre), based on a memoir by Murdoch’s husband, John Bayley, which focuses largely on her decline into Alzheimer’s in her last years (Bayley 1999). The Iris Murdoch Society publishes (since 2008) a twice-yearly journal, the Iris Murdoch Review (see Other Internet Resources), that had been almost entirely a venue for scholarship and commentary on Murdoch’s literary oeuvre, but recently has started to carry much more philosophy.

3. Murdoch in Her Times

As is generally recognized, the English philosophical tradition has a strong empiricist and anti-metaphysical bent. An important exception was the late 19th and early 20th century movement of a Hegelian-influenced “absolute idealism”, whose most prominent exponent was F.H. Bradley (1846–1924). This movement was seen as discredited by two prominent early 20th century British philosophers, G.E. Moore and Bertrand Russell. The final blow was dealt by A.J. Ayer “logical positivist” work, Language, Truth, and Logic, channeling for an English audience views developed by the Vienna Circle in the 1920s and 30s. Logical positivism essentially declared that what made a statement meaningful was the possibility of verifying it through empirical observation. Science was seen as the paradigm, though not the only, form of meaningful discourse. Metaphysical statements typical of British Idealism, such as that “all reality is one” or that “time is unreal”, were viewed as meaningless because unverifiable. Ethical and evaluative statements, such as that killing is wrong, were taken to have no cognitive significance. Murdoch thus came of age when the metaphysical tradition was still within memory (she read Bradley seriously and taught him), even if regarded as discredited. For her entire career, she retained a strong sense of the value of metaphysics both in itself and as providing broader visions and structures for moral philosophical reflection, while also appreciating the force of especially a Wittgensteinian critique of traditional metaphysics. Her main tutor at Oxford, Donald MacKinnon, with whom she remained close through much of her younger life, was a philosophical theologian, and helped influence her in a less positivistic direction, also less distant from and hostile to religion (MacKinnon 1957).

Soon verificationism and its related ethical view, “emotivism” (ethical statements express emotions, especially of approval and disapproval) was abandoned and a more sophisticated, and (in Oxford) a much more influential view of ethical language was developed by R.M. Hare, in his 1952 The Language of Morals. Hare said that moral statements did not aim to make truthful assertions, but had a distinct character as prescriptions, telling their addressees to do what is stated in the prescription. Hare’s view, “universal prescriptivism”, said that a prescription no matter what its content was moral if the subject prescribed it for all (or everyone relevantly similarly situated), and in that sense universally.

Hare’s account of ethics involved several assumptions, not always articulated, but widely shared in the practice of moral philosophy in the 1950s (and many of them beyond). Murdoch’s rejection of all of them provides an essential backdrop to her distinctive approach to ethics.

  1. Fact/value dichotomy: A fact can never entail a value. If a term appears to be simultaneously factual and evaluative (e.g., “rude”, to take an example made famous by Murdoch’s dear friend Philippa Foot), it is really a conjunction of a descriptive/factual meaning and an evaluation conferred on the factual referent by the speaker. This view is inherited from the empiricist tradition “created in the scientific image” (SG 1970: 28/321[1]). Murdoch says it is “the most important argument in modern moral philosophy” (M&E 1957/EM: 64).
  2. Moral agents all inhabit the same shared world of facts (M&E 1957/EM: 71).
  3. Values are not part of the world, capable of being discovered by individual agents, but are brought to or projected onto the world by moral agents. Quite often, situations present no moral issues for the agent at all.
  4. The fundamental subject matter of ethics is what acts persons should perform, and principles and procedures for determining those acts, not what kind of person it is good to be (e.g., what sort of qualities of character, or virtues, it is good to have), or how to describe the human world, an enterprise Murdoch takes to be inherently ethical.
  5. “The individual’s ‘stream of consciousness’ is of comparatively little importance, partly because it is often not there at all, and more pertinently because it is and can only be through overt acts that we can characterize another person mentally or morally” (VCM 1956/EM 77). Inner reflection is of moral interest only as it issues in choice, decision and action.
  6. Metaphysics has no legitimate role to play in ethics, and is not an intellectually coherent project.
  7. The role of the moral philosopher is distinct from that of the moralist, who aims to “elaborate a moral code or encourage its observance”, as Ayer says (Warnock 1960: 131). The task of the moral philosopher is to analyze the character of moral statements, a linguistic/analytic rather than moral enterprise. The moral philosopher qua philosopher should remain neutral on specific moral issues or more generally on questions about how to act and live.

Murdoch’s rejection of all these views in her writings of the 1950s and 60s is partly connected with her take on existentialism. Existentialism attracted Murdoch partly because it was a philosophy one could “inhabit” or “live by” [OGG: 47/337]. For existentialism it mattered tremendously what one did, in particular situations as well as with one’s life overall, and how philosophy was to guide and illuminate that journey. That sense of urgency is lacking in British philosophical ethics in its turn toward characterizing “the language of morals”, partly because this enterprise was seen as morally neutral, not having implications for conduct. (Murdoch’s friend Foot, who herself famously challenged the idea that the language of morals was morally neutral, poignantly captured Murdoch’s relation to the linguistic turn in ethics: “We were interested in moral language, she was interested in the moral life…She left us, in the end” [Conradi 2001: 302].)

4. Murdoch’s View of the Self Against the Existentialist/Behaviorist Account

Murdoch developed her own view of morality in reaction against both Hare and (notwithstanding her admiration for it) Sartrean existentialism as she understood it. (For a critique of her take on existentialism, see Moran 2012.) Both viewed freedom as fundamental to the moral enterprise. For Hare the moral agent is free to choose their moral values, constrained only by the requirement that the agent prescribe those values universally. Sartre shares the former view but eschews the universalist “logic of morality” constraint.[2] For Sartre, anguish (Angst) attends our recognition that our choices are totally up to us; Hare’s view lacks that existential anguish. But what interests Murdoch is their shared privileging of the choosing will in the moral enterprise, the central image of the moral agent as responsible and free (and, in Hare’s case, rational), and their rejection of a structure of objective value outside the individual that gives authoritative direction for deciding and choosing. Murdoch sees the appeal of this view, in both its existentialist and analytic forms, but finds it false to our moral experience and to the nature of moral agency.

In the 1962 “The Idea of Perfection” (in Sovereignty), Murdoch begins to develop a contrasting picture of the self, moral agency, and moral reality, building on her 1956 “Vision and Choice in Morality”. Her stated target is not Hare, who is only briefly mentioned, but Stuart Hampshire, whom she admired as a subtler and deeper thinker (and to whom she dedicated Sovereignty) and whom she regarded, in his 1959 Thought and Action, as having articulated and defended much more explicitly than Hare the view of human agency and the self underlying Hare’s moral theory (largely but not entirely incorporating the seven characteristics of Hare’s philosophy mentioned above). Murdoch says that the will does not engage in choice out of nowhere, but out of a rich and complex individual psyche formed by ongoing attitudes, perceptions, drives, attachments, beliefs, and modes of attention. This substantial self is in the process of formation, change, and development all the time; and it provides the context for choice in determinate situations (against point 4 above). Murdoch notes that sometimes our way of apprehending a particular situation will seem to make so evident to us what we should do that processes of deliberation standardly underlying choice will not be necessary and we will simply perform the action. We should not, she thinks, value a kind of “freedom” that would exert will contrary to an accurate perception of moral features of the situation that bear on conduct.

Murdoch says that philosophy should develop a moral or philosophical psychology that provides the terms in which to understand and characterize the substantial self to which she gives center stage, displacing the existentialist/analytic (which she sometimes calls “existentialist-behavioristic”) freely choosing will. This call for a new turn in philosophical ethics toward what came to be called “moral psychology” helped to usher in that subject. It somewhat echoed Murdoch’s friend Elizabeth Anscombe’s similar but more radical and striking charge in her 1958 “Modern Moral Philosophy” to put the subject of ethics on hold until a philosophical psychology that clarified the notions of intention, will, desire, and belief could be developed. But Anscombe thought of philosophical psychology as an enterprise independent of and prior to doing ethics (Anscombe 1958 [1997: 38]). By contrast Murdoch did not think such a philosophical psychology (a term she also sometimes used but more frequently used “moral psychology”) could be separated from ethics (OGG: 46/337; Diamond 2010; Brewer 2009: 8–9).

Murdoch takes some steps toward developing such a moral psychology by embracing Freud as the great theorist of the human mind, who

sees the psyche as an egocentric system of quasi-mechanical energy, largely determined by its own individual history, whose natural attachments are sexual, ambiguous, and hard for the subject to understand or control. (OGG: 51/341)

This substantial self constrains the will much more extensively than the existentialist/analytic picture recognizes. “The area of [the moral agent’s] vaunted freedom of choice is not usually very great” (SGC: 78/364). We cannot easily rid ourselves of pernicious emotions, attachments and motives that work against moral motivation and behavior. Murdoch adds,

Introspection reveals only the deep tissue of ambivalent motive, and fantasy is a stronger force than reason. Objectivity and unselfishness are not natural to human beings. (OGG: 51/241)

She sees the Freudian view as “a realistic and detailed picture of the fallen man” (OGG: 51/241), one of many places where her philosophy is influenced by a Christian worldview, as she fully recognizes. This pessimistic view of the human psyche plays a central role in Murdoch’s thought for her entire life, bolstered by her encounter with Schopenhauer and her particular take on Kant, both of whom articulate a philosophic dualism with a strong egoistic anti-moral force countered by a moral force (differing among those two philosophers) in the psyche.

5. Moral Reality and Moral Realism

Murdoch’s critique of the existentialist/analytic conception of the self and the will mirrors her critique of both the Sartrean and Harean rejection of a moral reality outside the individual self. She believes in that reality, that it can be known by human persons, and that that reality, or the apprehension of it, motivates us to act morally. She is thus a “moral realist”, “moral objectivist” and “moral cognitivist” (thus rejecting point 3 [values are not part of the world]).

There are three distinct strands within Murdoch’s conception of moral reality—“other persons”, “the Good”, and “metaphysics”. Murdoch does not pull the three together into an overall systematic view of moral reality.

5.1 Moral reality as other persons

A central strand in Murdoch’s view is that moral reality is other persons. Murdoch is not thinking of “other persons” as an aggregate, nor primarily as instances of a category. Rather a given moral agent’s moral reality consists in the individual reality of each other person, one at a time.

In this strand, Murdoch emphasizes the complexity and difficulty of apprehending the moral reality in question. She says that we are prone to fantasy and egoism (the “fat, relentless ego” [OGG: 52/342]) that block us from being able to see other persons clearly; from appreciating that they are as real as oneself (SBL 1959/EM: 215); from a lived recognition of their separateness and differentness (OGG: 66/353); and from grasping their true individual character (OGG: 59/348). Our ego must in a way be silenced—a process she refers to as “unselfing” (a concept she draws from Simone Weil’s “décreation”)—in order for us to fully grasp reality in this sense.[3] (“We cease to be in order to attend to the existence of something else”. OGG: 59/349) Murdoch’s novels frequently portray characters lost in their own world who see others primarily through their own fantasies of them. But Murdoch also emphasizes a more general contingency and idiosyncrasy of persons, resulting in a general opaqueness of persons to each other, a point apparently independent of the one about fantasy and egoism, though complementing it.

Murdoch thinks grasping the reality of the other comes in degrees, that extend to a “perfect” understanding of another, a state that can be aimed at but not actually attained. She often speaks of levels of understanding—of persons, concepts, ideas—an idea she increasingly comes to associate with Plato, and that she connects with a “perfectionism” that holds out the perfect understanding as a (moral) standard (IP: 29/322; OGG: 61/350). The moral challenge of knowing the other differs for each individual agent because each agent encounters different people, but also because the task and challenge of knowing differs for each agent in relation to each other person.

Sometimes Murdoch expresses the “other persons” strand in more general terms—not only individual persons but “individual realities” outside the (agent’s) self. This can include natural objects such as a tree or an individual animal, but also non-animate and conceptual objects such as a language or a subject matter, and also situations. She sometimes, and increasingly so in Metaphysics, sees an appreciation of all of reality in its manifold detail as a crucial form of moral aspiration, and there is evidence in her novels of a special appreciation of natural objects, not only living beings, and not only as beautiful (White 2020). But more frequently Murdoch regards other persons specifically as the content of moral reality.

5.2 Moral reality as Platonic good

A second, and increasingly prominent, strand in Murdoch’s view of moral reality is that it is “The Good”, understood in a Platonic sense. One element in Murdoch’s Platonism is that something like the form of the Good constitutes what is known when we have moral knowledge, and is also what is sought and loved. We achieve that understanding through knowing and loving the good in good particular things (including persons but also art, nature and ideas), then ascending to an understanding of Good itself. (Murdoch frequently employs Plato’s “ascending” metaphor [e.g., SGC: 94/377].) Murdoch also says, attributing it to Plato, that the Good is like a light that enables us to see goodness in particular things (SGC: 93/376).

Murdoch explicitly rejects two philosophically familiar ways to understand “good”—a functional use (“good knife”; SGC: 93/376) and good as “the most general adjective of commendation” (SGC: 98/381). These do not give us a clue to the concept. “A genuine mysteriousness attaches to the idea of goodness and the Good” (SGC: 99/381).

While the Good is an object of both knowledge and love for Murdoch (and she links those two notions (“to love, that is, to see” [OGG: 66/354]; “attention to reality inspired by, consisting of, love” [OGG: 67/354]), she does not subscribe to the aspect of Plato’s view that regards the forms as more real than individual objects and persons who partake of them in the world of experience, nor as inhabiting a transcendent world beyond our world of experience (Hämäläinen 2019: 267). And she rejects this as a proper interpretation of Plato (SGC: 96/378f; Robjant provides a detailed defense of her interpretation of Plato [Robjant 2012].)).

The Good and other persons are distinct strands in Murdoch’s view of moral reality. But they reinforce each other. Hopwood interprets Murdoch as saying that “we love particular individuals in light of the Good, and we love the Good through particular individuals” (Hopwood 2018: 486). Murdoch’s view is not analogous to Kant’s idea that respecting the other person involves directing that respect to the moral law or rational will within them, or to their best self. (Velleman defends a form of Kant’s view as Murdochian, understanding rational will to be the capacity for valuing [Velleman 1999 (2006: 100)]. Hopwood criticizes this view [Hopwood 2018: 482].) For Murdoch loving and knowing other persons is also not the same as knowing what is distinctly good in them or about them. Susan Wolf rejects the idea that loving attention as Murdoch (and she) understand it affirms the moral goodness, or overall goodness, of its object. One can love, and direct loving attention to, another whose deficiencies and faults she fully recognizes (Wolf 2014). Both Cordner and Wolf emphasize that it is the person as a whole that is the proper object of loving attention (Cordner 2016; Wolf 2014). Murdoch agrees, in giving a criticism of Kant: “Kant does not tell us to respect whole particular tangled-up historical individuals” (M&E 1957/EM: 215).

Other connections between the Platonic and the other persons strands, not necessarily incompatible with the ones mentioned, have been proposed. Clarke suggests that the Good is a perfectionist principle in Murdoch, so that seeing other persons in light of the Good is just an expression of her perfectionism, pushing the agent to achieve a more and more just, loving, and complete perception of that person (Clarke 2012). Dorothy Emmet, an older contemporary and friend of Murdoch presses a similar view, that the Good should be thought of as a “regulative ideal” in the Kantian sense, “an indefinable standard towards which we can turn in appreciation of” what is Good (or Beautiful). But Emmet differs from Clarke in denying that this is a moral principle (Emmet 1994 [this book was dedicated to Murdoch]: 65–66; see also 1979 for one of the first scholarly engagements with Murdoch). Emmet likely also influenced Murdoch’s resistance to British philosophy’s jettisoning of metaphysics in its analytic and linguistic modalities in the 1950s, through Emmet’s defense of metaphysics in her 1945 The Nature of Metaphysical Thinking; which Murdoch read, and in her and Murdoch’s attempts starting in the 1950s (and in all of Murdoch’s subsequent writings) to bring religion and philosophy closer together. Murdoch acknowledges that the Christian conception of God influences her understanding of the Good. “I shall suggest that God was (or is) a single perfect transcendent non-representable and necessarily real object of attention” and that we should retain a non-theistic concept [i.e., Good] with those characteristics (OGG: 55/344). This semi-religious dimension relates to the idea Murdoch occasionally expresses, and more so in Metaphysics, that the Good is a source of energy that is not found within our “natural psychology” (OGG: 71/358).

5.3 Murdoch, Sidgwick, Plato and the self/other moral framework

Though “the Good” is a distinctly Platonic strand in Murdoch’s view of moral reality, the “other persons” strand is un-Platonic in two important ways. One is that it involves a sharp separation between self and other, and identifies morality with attention to, love of, or concern for the other and not the self. Henry Sidgwick articulated a standard view in Anglo-American moral philosophy on this matter when he said that the field of ethics made an important step beyond the ancients when it articulated self-interest as a distinct rational principle of action that is separate from a principle of the good of others, understood impersonally. (He attributed this discovery to Bishop Butler.) (Sidgwick 1874 [1907: 404]; Sidgwick 1886 [1902: 197–8]; Brewer 2009: 193). Neither Plato nor Aristotle have this exclusively other-focused conception of virtue, common to both Murdoch and the tradition Sidgwick identifies and praises. Murdoch agrees with Sidgwick’s self/other distinction as one of great moral significance, though she does not regard cognizing or caring for the other in terms either of rationality or principle.

A second difference from Plato (and Aristotle) is Murdoch’s rejection of the Greeks’ sense that virtue and virtuous action are good for their agent as well as for their own sake (but the former “good for” is not understood by Plato or Aristotle prudentially and is not separable from virtue being good for its own sake [Brewer 2009: 202]). For Murdoch it is indeed good to act virtuously, and doing so helps to constitute the agent as morally good. But she does not understand this virtuousness as intrinsically good for the agent. Virtue is pointless, as Murdoch often says (OGG: 71/358; SGC: 78/364), and this is tied up with the view, which she sees as historically produced from Kant to Existentialism, that there is no inherent purpose in human life. “We are simply here” with no larger purpose or telos (SGC: 79/364). But in the face of this purposelessness, being and becoming a morally good person through a suppression or transcendence of self is the best aspiration we can have.

Despite aligning with Sidgwick regarding the identification of morality solely with an appropriate focus on the other and the other’s welfare, not that of the self, Murdoch’s view differs from Sidgwick’s, as well as from much of the English empiricist tradition in ethics (Hutcheson, Hume, Mill), in three crucial respects. First, she pays very little attention to self-interest as an egoistic obstacle to morality through our unduly privileging our own interests over those of others. For Murdoch the prime self-oriented obstacle to morality is fantasy, which gets in the way of our seeing the other person as a distinct, separate, other being with their own reality. Sometimes the personal fantasy idea is bound up with self-absorption, which keeps us from being more than barely aware of others at all. More frequently it is our investment in false ideas of the (particular) other expressed in the fantasy idea. Neither of these, however, is self-interest as an overall motive or principle as Sidgwick envisages. All three (fantasy, self-absorption, self-interest) are egoistic but in distinct ways.

A second difference from Sidgwick (and from Butler, Hume, and Hutcheson, and the empiricist temper of British philosophy more generally) is Murdoch’s understanding of moral realism. She is viewing morality not only as calling for a greater focus on the well-being of others rather than the self, but saying that doing so involves being in touch with, being responsive to, reality itself, while egoism involves living in falsehood, being out of touch with reality. “The self, the place where we live, is a place of illusion” (SGC: 93/376). “The authority of morality is the authority of truth, that is, of reality” (SGC: 90f/374).

Diamond and Brewer both note that Murdoch shares with both Plato and Aristotle the view that reality is irreducibly evaluative (Diamond 2010, 59f; Brewer 2009: 152). The identification of the Real with the Good is a deep part of Murdoch’s view (Brewer 2009: 152). Murdoch recognizes that the view of reality as evaluatively inert (in addition to human life having no telos) is an historical product, tied up with the rise of natural science, with Kant playing a particularly important role in solidifying it within the Western philosophic tradition (MGM 1992: 40). She views Kant as trying to rescue value and morality in the face of this scientistic view of reality (MGM 1992: 50), but she entirely rejects that (unPlatonic) view of reality. Diamond argues that in doing so she also rejects the related Kantian distinction between the theoretical domain and the practical domain (Diamond 2010: 73).

A third difference between Murdoch and the British tradition in ethics is that the latter largely fails to recognize the difficulty and psychic complexity, so central to Murdoch’s view, of knowing the (individual) other, and thus also often of knowing how to act toward them so as to bring about their well-being. The notion of “benevolence” as employed in that tradition is taken to imply that being motivated to help others is sufficient to bring about what is good for the other. Murdoch strongly rejects this view, since the benevolent sentiment and motive does not guarantee an understanding of the other’s reality and well-being.

5.4 Moral realism, fact and value, practical reason

Murdoch’s form of moral realism has spurred important and influential secondary literature that is more engaged than Murdoch herself with meta-ethical questions in the Anglo American tradition. Hilary Putnam credits Murdoch with the critique he develops of the fact/value dichotomy, focusing on what Murdoch calls “secondary moral words” (IP: 22/317) and “normative-descriptive words” (IP: 31/325; Putnam 2002: 34–35). (Bernard Williams later influentially referred to these as “thick” moral or evaluative concepts, such as cruel, rude, brave, courageous, generous, elegant [Williams 1985]). These terms possess descriptive content but are also evaluative, and often motivational, contrasting with the more abstract moral terms “good”, “right”, and “ought” that had dominated British moral philosophy through the 1950s, and that almost entirely lack the descriptive element. For Putnam there are evaluative facts (“Jane’s act was courageous”) that have no less standing as describing reality than a presumptively non-evaluative fact. Nor, he argues, can the reality reflected in the characterization be factored into two unrelated components joined together—an allegedly “purely descriptive” component, and an evaluation of the content in that component (point 1 on the Hare list). The two dimensions are inextricably “entangled”, Putnam argues (2002).

This view thus rejects a common moral non-cognitivist (but shared by some cognitivists) claim that moral properties always “supervene” on (that is, apply in virtue of) already-existing non-moral properties. Panizza and Setiya defend this implication of the existence of secondary moral terms (Panizza 2020; Setiya 2013). Panizza connects the rejection of supervenience with Murdoch’s view that our direct perception of moral properties is bound up with the ways that perception is deeply conceptual (Panizza 2020: 284–5; see also Setiya 2013).

Others have focused more distinctly on Murdoch’s view’s implications for practical reason. John McDowell developed a Murdochian-influenced moral realist view, in an influential 1979 paper “Virtue and Reason”, often also regarded as a founding essay in the contemporary virtue ethics tradition (and indeed McDowell sees his view [developed in other papers as well] as both Aristotelian and Murdochian) (McDowell 1979, 1998). (More on Murdoch and virtue below.)

McDowell says that to possess a virtue, such as kindness, is to possess “a reliable sensitivity to a certain sort of requirement which situations impose on behavior”. Its

deliverances…are cases of knowledge… [A] kind person knows what it is like to be confronted with a requirement of kindness. The sensitivity is, we might say, a sort of perceptual capacity. (McDowell 1979 [1997: 142])

McDowell adds that the reasons for action in particular situations that moral perception cognizes cannot be derived from general principles but retain a particularistic dimension, also emphasized by Murdoch. (See “particularity” below.)

Setiya agrees with McDowell that for Murdoch reality as accurately cognized supplies agents with motivating reasons, including moral reasons, for action; this view thus constitutes a form of “moral internalism”. “Rationality belongs to full cognition of the facts” (Setiya 2013: 13). Setiya responds to the objection that a moral agent could apply a moral concept competently to a situation but be unmoved by the moral force of the thus-characterized situation. He notes that Murdoch speaks of

two senses of “knowing what a word means”, one connected with ordinary language and the other very much less so. (IP: 29/322)

The second sense is the deeper understanding on which her moral realism relies. And the deeper understanding can be both of a concept and of an individual person in the situation to which the concept is being applied (Setiya 2013: 9). Murdoch connects these points to an aspect of her perfectionism, implying the ideal of perfect understanding of both individuals and concepts.

But Setiya disagrees with McDowell’s view that the moral reality cognized by the moral agent must take the form of moral requirements and indeed, more broadly, with action-guiding features of situations (Setiya 2013: 11). Mylonaki criticizes McDowell on similar grounds and both she and Setiya take the “other persons” view of the moral reality Murdoch is concerned with (Mylonaki 2019; Setiya 2013: 11a). Mylonaki emphasizes, however, that cognizing that reality can give rise to reasons for action.

5.5 Moral reality as metaphysics

A final thread in Murdoch’s view of reality is that it is what metaphysics describes. She understands metaphysics as an all-encompassing view of a transcendent reality, of the universe, that the individual must then attempt to come to understand in order to work out her place in it (M&E 1957/EM: 70). In “Metaphysics and Ethics” she mentions Thomism, Hegelianism, and Marxism as examples. These metaphysical systems and pictures are deeply ethical and evaluative, but, she implies, also provide a broader conception of reality. In her 1950s essays, she defends metaphysical thinking not so much as true, as capturing reality, but as a coherent way of thinking about the moral endeavor of life that is excluded by the linguistic turn in philosophical ethics, and which thereby refutes (Hare’s) universal prescriptivism’s claim to be the sole moral theory consistent with “the language of morals”. She is sympathetic to some moral, political, and philosophical/analytic criticisms of metaphysical systems (especially that they can lose a sense of the value of the individual [M&E 1957/EM: 70; Antonaccio 1996: 115f], and an acknowledgment of ultimate contingency [MGM 1992: 490]). Nevertheless, her evolving moral views always leave room for some kind of transcendent structure beyond the individual that retains ethical authority over the moral agent. The title of her final summative work, Metaphysics as a Guide to Morals, expresses this continuing role for metaphysics in her thinking about morality and reality. As Diamond argues, she is not thinking of “metaphysics” as a non-morally-informed enterprise, as it is sometimes understood. In that form, Diamond says, Murdoch would not think it positioned to dictate what possibilities are open to moral philosophy (Diamond 2010). A metaphysics of actual reality cannot avoid being morally informed.

The Platonic strand of moral reality can of course be seen as exemplifying the metaphysics strand, but the latter remains a more general idea within Murdoch’s complex overall view of moral reality. The “other persons” strand seems less metaphysical and thus contrary to the final strand. But Murdoch often speaks of the reality of other people in “transcendental” terms—transcending the individual ego—and this framing thereby retains an element important to her complex and shifting understanding of metaphysics. All three strands play a role in Murdoch’s thinking about (moral) reality, but the other persons and the Good are distinctly more prominent.

5.6 Metaphor

In addition to but interwoven with the differences mentioned, other persons, the Good, and metaphysics (or a particular metaphysical system or concept) also embody distinct metaphors for understanding moral reality. Murdoch often emphasizes the importance of metaphor in thinking, especially in philosophy where, in the analytic tradition, there is an often tacit assumption that any metaphorical use of language can be given a purely literal rendering. Murdoch entirely rejects this way of thinking about language and understanding and often talks of exploring metaphors.

Metaphors are not merely peripheral decorations or even useful models, they are fundamental forms of our awareness of our condition. (SGC: 77/363, and elsewhere 93f/377)

The “other persons” strand involves an image of a struggle of each moral agent to grasp the other person(s) in their particular world as distinct persons, as equally real as themselves. The metaphor of Good involves a reaching to an abstract and implied-to-be “higher” entity. The metaphor of “metaphysics” generally evokes an elaborated system within which the individual agent is placed. The metaphorical dimension (with the differences among the three) is integral to our understanding of each strand.

6. Moral Agency as Inner Activity

Murdoch’s form of moral realism has influenced a critique of the fact/value dichotomy; the development of a virtue-ethical form of moral realism focused on right-making characteristics prompting acts in the public world; and, more generally, debates about practical reason and reasons for action. But the significance of Murdoch’s philosophy, and in particular of her version of moral realism, for an understanding of morality significantly transcends those contributions. (Setiya recognizes that Murdoch herself is barely interested in reason or rationality [Setiya 2013], though she does very occasionally talk about reasons. She would not regard “practical rationality” as a welcome framework for her thought, even if her insights have bearing on what is currently understood by that notion. She says, in promotion of both her perfectionism and love as a central ethical concept, “‘Act lovingly’ will translate ‘Act perfectly’ whereas ‘Act rationally’ will not” [IP: 102/384].) Bakhurst argues that Murdoch’s moral realism is a substantive moral view, not a meta-ethical view as McDowell’s is (a rejection of point 7, that philosophers can and should propound morally neutral views of morality) (Bakhurst 2020: 218).[4]

We may focus on two such contributions to moral philosophy connected to Murdoch’s moral realism: (A) an expanded conception of moral agency; (B) the notion of a “fabric of ethical being”.

On (A), Murdoch delineates a broader notion of moral agency than that involved in reasons internalism and the perception of or sensitivity to action-guiding reasons within situations. She seeks to demonstrate a form of moral agency that takes place solely in the mind of the agent with no expression in her behavior in the public world. She does so through an extended example in IP, which serves other purposes as well (especially the importance of the inner life for morality, against point 5 [the inner life is not very important for morality]), and is extensively cited in the secondary literature. The example is of M, the mother-in-law of D. Throughout D’s marriage to M’s son, M has viewed D as “pert and familiar, insufficiently ceremonious, brusque, sometimes positively rude, always tiresomely juvenile”. She feels her son has “married beneath him” (IP: 17/312). M behaves toward D without revealing her real opinions and feelings. Murdoch highlights this feature by imagining that D moves away or dies, and that M therefore comes to have no opportunity to engage in behavior directed at D.

M settles into her fixed picture of D. But something prompts her to reflect on her view, recognizing both her jealousy of D and her own snobbishness. She tries to look at the D she knew in a new way, and over time, as the result of her attempts to see D anew, her view of D changes.

D is discovered to be not vulgar but refreshingly simple, not undignified but spontaneous…not tiresomely juvenile but delightfully youthful. (IP: 17–18/313)

Murdoch imagines that M’s new view of D is accurate and truthful, recognizing that it need not be. Murdoch sees M’s attempts to see D as exemplifying activity on M’s part, though issuing in no outward behavior, activity that is moral in character. Murdoch concludes that our moral agency is not exhausted by our outward behavior, nor by outward behavior plus mental acts conceptually tied to outward behavior, like deciding, choosing, and deliberating. And the moral philosophy of her time did not leave any clear place for this purely inner moral activity of attention.

7. The Fabric of Moral Being

(B) Beyond her expansion of moral agency to include inner mental life, Murdoch proposes the notion of a person’s total moral being, which transcends agency itself. In discussing M she says that her inner mental acts of attention contribute to “a continuous fabric of being” (IP: 22/316) that she says

is shown in their mode of speech or silence, their choice of words, their assessment of others, their conception of their own life, what they think attractive or praiseworthy, what they think funny. (VCM 1956/EM: 80f)

In discussing the fabric of being idea, Diamond refers to “thoughts, jokes, patterns of attention, fantasies, imaginative explorations, and a thousand other things” (Diamond 2010: 72. See also Crary 2007: 47). In Metaphysics Murdoch says “Morality is and ought to be connected with the whole of our being”. (MGM 1992: 495).

Murdoch is saying that our thoughts, modes of speech, emotions, imaginings, contemplatings, and the like, are responses to our perceived reality, just as the exercise of moral agency is. If we are amused by someone making fun of a disabled person, that is part of our moral being; it reflects on us morally. Such responses are part of us, but are not always doings, exercisings of agency.

This metaphor of the fabric of being connects with Murdoch’s saying that morality is

something that goes on continually, not something that is switched off in between the occurrence of explicit moral choices. (IP: 37/329)

a key criticism of point 4 (morality consists fundamentally in choice-making in specifiable situations). We are in a constant state of moral formation, and we bring our fabric of being to (what we experience as) choice situations. Actions and other responses flow from the background fabric of being that has been constructed by this moral formation. This metaphor also connects with Murdoch’s defense of the moral importance of the inner life, of the individual’s consciousness, that is ignored or demoted in the moral philosophy of her time (point 5), a development she thinks due partly to a partial misunderstanding of Wittgenstein’s emphasis on public criteria for the meaning of concepts (IP 1970, e.g., 15/311; Wiseman 2020).

8. Seeing Replaces Doing

Nevertheless, it is not entirely clear how Murdoch is envisioning the moral formation that constructs the fabric of moral being. This unclarity emerges in Murdoch’s substituting seeing for doing as the core metaphor for human life’s most fundamental moral task. Her influential essay “The Idea of Perfection” is framed as a critique of Stuart Hampshire on this point. She sees Hampshire as articulating the most powerful case for placing action-in-the-world at the core of the moral enterprise. She suggests an alternative conception that uses a range of visual metaphors such as see, attention, perception, looking, and vision to express the fundamental task of morality. Her visual metaphors are definitely meant to retain an important place for action in the world, but to place it in a larger context than does Hampshire’s “doing” metaphor (see Moran 2012: 189). They thereby express the limitations of the practical reasoning approach to understanding Murdoch’s moral philosophy.

In particular, Murdoch employs “attention” (not entirely consistently) to mark the process by which this successful apprehension of reality—seeing—is brought about.

I have used the word “attention” which I borrow from Simone Weil, to express the idea of a just and loving gaze directed upon an individual reality. I believe this to be the characteristic and proper mark of the moral agent. (IP: 34/327; emphasis added)

9. Simone Weil

Before discussing Murdoch’s notion of attention, some remarks about Weil are in order, because of her profound impact on Murdoch, not only in relation to attention. Simone Weil (1909–1943) was a French philosopher (though never a university professor), political activist, and, in her later (short) life a kind of Christian mystic. Murdoch encountered Weil’s writings in the early 1950s, and reviewed her Notebooks in 1956 (“Knowing the Void”). Murdoch mentions her only briefly in her earlier writings; Weil, unlike Sartre, was not a figure at all familiar to British philosophy of those years, and indeed she is still little known to Anglo-American philosophers (see the Stanford Encyclopedia entry on Simone Weil). But as in the quote above, Murdoch always makes her debt to Weil evident. Weil influenced Murdoch’s turn to Platonism, and her particular interpretation of Plato. She certainly bolstered the continuing Christian elements in Murdoch’s thought, as well as Murdoch’s increasing invoking of mysticism as related to morality, especially in Metaphysics. She probably influenced Murdoch’s view of psychic energy (understood on a Freudian model) as “mechanical”, something to which we are subjected. And Murdoch made use of Weil’s notion of “void” as part her moral outlook in Metaphysics.

Weil also developed a quite original critique of Marxism that involved a strong emphasis on the dignity of manual work, an emphasis of Murdoch’s also, in her important political essay, “House of Theory”, from 1958. Murdoch refers to Weil frequently in Metaphysics, though only once in any sustained way. In 1976 she cited Weil’s Attente de Dieu (Waiting for God) as one of only three philosophical works that deeply influenced her. (The others are Plato’s Symposium and Kierkegaard’s Fear and Trembling [Broackes 2012a: 17, note 42].)

But Weil’s strongest influence on Murdoch was in the idea of attention (Weil 1942 [1977]; 1973b). Weil’s view of attention had a strong religious dimension. The proper, ultimate object of attention is God, though persons and subject matters are also objects of attention. Weil’s notion of attention also involves a kind of passive waiting in readiness for a truth to be revealed, an emptying of oneself in preparation for receiving the object. Murdoch abandoned the religious aspect of Weil’s view of attention, as she also abandoned for herself the distinctly theistic aspects of Weil’s Christianity, and also adopted a more active conception of attention than Weil. (Forsberg argues that Murdoch’s view was closer to Weil’s regarding passivity/activity [Forsberg 2017]. See also Cordner 2016.) But their notions were otherwise similar.[5]

10. Murdoch on Attention

For Murdoch, attention involves activity on our part (more so than in Weil), directing the “just and loving gaze upon an individual reality”, as M’s attempt to see D is meant to illustrate. Sometimes Murdoch suggests that seeing someone justly and lovingly is precisely what is involved in seeing them as they really are [IP: 28/321; OGG: 67/354].

But Murdoch does not regard mere accuracy as constituting this just and loving gaze (IP: 23/317). Learning more details about someone (that they like chocolate or are afraid of snakes) is not what attention as loving and just provides (Cordner 2016). Moreover, as illustrated by the character of Julius King in her novel Fairly Honorable Defeat, someone can be very perceptive, very tuned into aspects of other people’s reality, such as their vanity, and can use this knowledge to manipulate and harm those persons. Julius indeed is incapable of loving others at all, and his perceptiveness might involve accurate, but not just or loving, attention (FHD 1970).

As mentioned earlier, Murdoch thinks that fully recognizing and acknowledging that a given other person is as real as oneself does not come naturally to us. Our fantasies and self-absorption get in the way; getting past these obstacles is difficult and uncertain and constitutes a genuine moral achievement. Attention is the process by which we are potentially enabled to do so.

The “as real as oneself” formulation may be meant to capture two somewhat distinct strands in Murdoch’s view. One is the recognition of the other in her distinct otherness and difference from oneself, rather than in light of one’s projections onto the other that assimilate her to oneself. The second is that the other is seen as like oneself, for example as a human being, a person, a possessor of dignity. (Murdoch implies but does not articulate this second strand.) Murdoch wants both these strands in what constitutes a moral take on the other, and “just and loving attention”, even if it does not seem equivalent to “appreciating that others are as real as oneself”, should probably be understood as encompassing both. (Chappell adds a third strand, what it is like to be that other person [Chappell 2018: 103].)

Attention is thus a process by which human persons are enabled to access moral reality. The process is both cognitive and perceptual (Murdoch does not attempt to work out their relationship to one another) but for Murdoch those capacities are also moral in character. Our moral capacities are part of our cognitive capacities, enabling, and required for us to see, the moral and evaluative aspects of reality.[6]

10.1 Care ethics, feminism, and particularity

Murdoch’s (and through her, Weil’s) view of (loving) attention as the core moral capacity influenced the development of care ethics, especially in its early (and continuing) form as a type of feminist ethical outlook (Gilligan 1982; Noddings 1984; Grimshaw 1986; Ruddick 1989; Walker 1989; Bowden 1997). Care ethics emphasizes attentiveness and concern for the other person in her particularity, informed by knowledge of the specific needs, desires, and situation of that other person, in contrast to emphasizing a universal category such as “person” or “human being” as the appropriate target of attention and care. Murdoch’s emphasis on the reality of the particular other as the target of loving attention was drawn on to develop this form of ethical theory.

In addition both care ethics and Murdoch tend to see personal relationships as the primary domain of morality. Murdoch’s focus on personal fantasy as a prime obstacle to grasping the other’s reality suggests that she is envisioning persons with whom we have a personal relationship. But her language sometimes suggests a broader scope, perhaps to persons known to oneself but with whom one does not have a personal relationship, or even the broader category of persons one encounters in a fleeting way (e.g., fellow riders on the subway). She seldom suggests that it means needy or suffering persons distant from oneself, or members of a general category (e.g., victims of Covid). Something like that idea surfaces only in Metaphysics, where Murdoch associates it with utilitarianism.

Varieties of care ethics arose to encompass less personal forms of relationship, and some also expanded this focus to take account of institutions and structures in which care relationships do, or should, take place (Tronto 1993; Bowden 1997; Norlock 2019). Murdoch never goes in this institutional direction. At the same time, the centrality of the visual metaphor in Murdoch—attention, seeing, looking, vision—does not sit comfortably with the emphasis in much care ethics, especially in its feminist form, on the sustaining of ongoing personal relationships involving mutuality and reciprocity, and more generally on the fundamentally relational character of the self. The attentive self is not portrayed by Murdoch as actively engaging with the attended-to other in a reciprocal relationship. In Metaphysics, she actively defends the standing-apart of the moral subject against the engaged relationality present in the Jewish theologian Martin Buber’s views (MGM 1992, ch 15: 361–380. See Cordner 2019 discussion). (Murdoch’s overall relationship to feminism is complex. For extended treatments, see Lovibond 2011; Bolton forthcoming).

10.2 Particularity and particularism

One Murdochian strand in care ethics that has been influential outside the care ethics context is particularity—an emphasis on the limits of universal principle and impersonality to capture the substance of appropriate moral response. This particularity takes two forms, or at least two emphases, one on the particularity of situations—the (alleged) impossibility of coming up with a set of general moral principles or a moral code that will always prescribe the right action (McDowell’s emphasis, and the focus of what is called “particularism” [Hooker & Little 2000]). The other is on the particularity of persons as objects of moral attention and concern. (There are other typologies of particularism. See Driver 2012.) Both dimensions are present in Murdoch’s thought and in care ethics, and the person-focus is more central to both Murdoch and care ethics. Millgram finds a resource for particularism in Murdoch’s emphasis on finding the best description of a situation (Millgram 2002), but situation-particularity remains within the “action/reasons for action” framework that Murdoch definitively transcends, and person-particularity is crucial for her doing so.

10.3 Obstacles to loving attention

For Murdoch, just and loving attention, seeing the other as equally real as oneself is a difficult and infrequent moral achievement. She delineates three different stages involving attention, each yielding obstacles to its realization. First, an agent may fail to notice that an effort of attention is called for. As Murdoch says, “I can only choose within the world I can see” (IP: 37/329). What we notice, what registers with us, is an integral part of our fabric of moral being. If an agent fails to see a morally relevant feature of a person nearby (e.g., their distress), this feature will not become part of her subjectively perceived world and she will not even attempt to focus on this other person as part of an attempt at proffering just and loving attention.

But even if she does notice the morally relevant feature of the other and decides to make that attempt, as for example M does with respect to D, she may not be able to do so. Because of fantasies and resentments toward the other, or just self-absorption, the moral agent may simply not be capable of focusing on the other person beyond a very superficial level. She may genuinely try, but end up with the wrong target occupying her mind.

Third, even if the agent is able to direct her attention to the other person, she may be unsuccessful in making that attention a just and loving take on that other person. Try as she might with all sincerity (which she is unable to muster at the second stage) her fantasies about that other person, and her fabric of being more generally, may keep her from seeing the other as she really is.

Notice that “attention” is used in two different ways in this account. The first is focusing on another as part of an attempt to proffer just and loving attention. (Call this “attempt attention”, attention in its mode as an attempt at just and loving attention). The second is successfully proffering such just and loving attention. (Call this “success attention”, attention in its mode as a successful attempt.)

Only if the three hurdles are cleared has the agent achieved the success attention that Murdoch thinks morality demands. Various aspects of the agent’s fabric of ethical being can prevent that moral achievement.

11. Murdoch’s Focus on the Active Dimension of Moral Formation

We must therefore look more closely into how Murdoch understands moral formation, the creation of agents’ fabric of ethical being. She says that over time our attendings (another term for attempt attention) build up the (subjective) structures of value that largely constitute our fabric of being.

[I]f we consider what the work of attention is like, how continuously it goes on, and how imperceptibly it builds up the structures of value round about us…; (IP: 37/329)

[O]ur ability to act well “when the time comes” depends partly, perhaps largely, upon the quality of our habitual objects of attention. (OGG: 56/345; see also 67/354, 69/356, 91f/375)[7]

Murdoch is implying that by our efforts of attending to various objects (attempt attention), especially other persons, bringing them into our active mental universe, we build up the evaluative structures of our subjectively experienced or perceived world, and create our fabric of ethical being. This sets the stage for attempts at loving attention and (less frequent) successes in proffering such loving attention.

But the idea that our fabric of being and subjective structures of value are built up almost solely or even primarily through acts of attempt attention seems at odds with Murdoch’s Freudian/Kantian/Schopenhauerian moral psychology, which implies that the main forces creating our fabric of being are fantasies, other distortions, and egoistic desires infrequently aligned with moral ways of being. These do indeed build up structures of value and ways of perceiving reality. They are not merely forces operating in a mechanical way on the agent’s will, pulling her away from moral action and perception, although this dualistic image is one Murdoch often employs for the human psyche. But the values and ways of perceiving built up by these forces are usually morally bad or at least unworthy. An example from Murdoch’s novels is Julius King, the character referred to earlier, who sees many other persons in a particular way, contemptuously—Murdoch somewhat implies that he is morally damaged from being a concentration camp survivor—and often treats his acquaintances and even friends in a malicious and contemptuous way, arising from the valuational framework (part of his fabric of ethical being) within which he views them (FHD 1970). Although Murdoch’s predominant view of the psyche implies that egoistic forces do much to create our fabric of being, within which our capability for success attention comprises but a weak reed, she does not actually adopt this view. Rather she takes the view that our active, deliberate attendings (attempt attention) are the prime source of our subjective structures of value and fabric of moral being.

Thus Murdoch’s stated view privileges what can be seen as the active dimension of value or moral formation, while her theory of the psyche should have pointed her (also) toward the passive aspects thereof. Cora Diamond suggests that the “fabric of being” metaphor mixes active and passive (Diamond 2010: 72). And in a 1966 essay, “The Darkness of Practical Reason”, Murdoch criticizes Hampshire for an overly sharp distinction between passive aspects of mental life (represented by desires and fears that are not thought-dependent) and the active choosing will, aided by reason’s surveying the facts of the agent’s situation enabled by an active stepping back from that situation, that decides and takes action (DPR 1966/EM: 201). She sees (attempt) attention, and also imagination, as falling into neither of these categories. So in this particular “active/passive” framework attempt attention does not fall in the “active” category.

Nevertheless, Murdoch still sees moral agents as in genuine if limited control of their attendings. In this sense, attempt attention does fall into the “active” category, thus contrasting with the action-centric view of agency and freedom she criticizes in existentialist and analytic moral philosophies and psychologies. This attempt attention contrasts with the Freudian intrapsychic forces that contribute to our moral formation without engaging our agency in that way. And at least in one place she recognizes a form of passivity that is connected with a person’s fabric of being, in contrast with aspects of our mental or psychic universe that are not. In discussing Hampshire, she attributes to him recognition that a Freudian explanation or understanding of, say, a fear

enables us to attach the fear intelligibly to a more clearly seen structure of motivation which we may endorse or at any rate accept as ours. (DPR 1966/EM: 196)

This contrasts with a fear that besieges us but whose character we repudiate, or at least do not accept. Thus Murdoch’s view that our attendings shape our moral formation and world of perceived values draws on a view of activity reduced in scope from the Hampshirean concept, yet still distinguishable from a form of passivity that she recognizes (at least here) as part of our moral being. It is in this sense of “active” that she privileges the active (attempt attendings) over the passive in her explicit account of the formation of our fabric of moral being, resulting in the passive dimension not receiving adequate attention (Blum 2012).

12. The Absence of Social Sources of Negative Moral Formation in Murdoch’s Philosophy

Murdoch’s failure to theorize passive forces in moral formation is also expressed in a striking absence of attention to the distinctly social sources of negative moral formation. An important part of how moral formation is, as she says, going on all the time, how our fabric of being is always being constructed, arises from social rather than intrapsychic factors, for example, representations of categories of persons that block or hinder agents’ abilities to see the reality of persons in those groups. As a member of a given society, or particular subcultures within that society, we are subjected to stereotypes and other misleading representations of different groups of people, with whom we do or do not come in contact. The stereotypes are attached to race, gender, class, religion, national origin, sexual orientation, age, gender expression, professions and occupations, residence in certain neighborhoods or regions, and other social groups. These “figurations”, as Diana Meyers usefully calls them, are almost always evaluative in character (Meyers 1994). Thus they contribute to social agents’ evaluative take on the world and to the formation of their moral being. They affect whether we do, or try to, have loving attention, respect, compassion, and even mere acknowledgment toward individual members of those groups. In this respect figurations are comparable to the fantasies and other forms of egoism that Murdoch points to that block loving attention—except that they affect our responses to people unknown to us much more than these Freudian intrapsychic forces do. Social stereotypes are not the only form of socially-produced barrier to loving attention, but they are important and can represent the larger category for our purposes.[8]

We are largely passive with respect to the impact of these figurations on our moral being, often not even recognizing their existence, as recent work on “implicit bias”—unconscious ways we see members of particular groups in negative or positive lights (Saul & Brownstein 2016)—demonstrates.[9] We do not generally choose to embrace these figurations of the groups in question, nor are they generally (though perhaps they can sometimes be) generated through (attempt) attention towards groups or individuals. If we notice them at all, we often just find ourselves possessing them (Blum 2012).

Social figurations may not clear the bar for contributions to our moral formation that Murdoch sets up in the quote above from DPR. They may seem more like a fear that we do not endorse. Indeed figurations can be a source of such fears, such as a stereotype of black males as threatening, and can function even if the agent has not embraced their cognitive content. Murdoch’s notion of “fabric of being” is never sufficiently defined so as to make entirely clear whether any item in our mental universe is actually excluded from it. But we can rely on an intuitive sense that if a stereotype substantially affects how the agent perceives and experiences persons of group X, and the agent has not attempted to rid herself of the stereotype or neutralize its effect on her, then the stereotype contributes to or is part of her moral being (as a passive factor).

These social forces, explored by the more recent development of “social epistemology”, complement the intrapsychic ones as passive contributors to moral formation. The “going on all the time” that constitutes our moral formation and being is a complex combination of passive and active elements and processes. In several essays in the late 1950s Murdoch mentions the idea of “convention”, and sometimes sees conventions or conventional thinking as a barrier to adequate perception (Holland 2012). But convention does not capture the idea of distinct figurations of particular groups of persons that are powerful forces in the culture and society harming social beings’ ability to see the reality of members of those specific groups. These obstacles have an entirely different source than the intrapsychic forces with which Murdoch is concerned (Clarke 2012: 244f; Blum 2012). The two can complement and interact, as M’s class-based snobbery makes common cause with her jealousy of D to cast the latter in the negative light that Murdoch describes. There is strong support in Murdoch’s writing for Nussbaum’s claim that

Murdoch seems almost entirely to lack interest in the political and social determinants of a moral vision and in the larger social critique that ought…to be a major element in the struggle against one’s own defective tendencies. (Nussbaum 2001: 32)

This is not, however, to deny Clarke’s point that Murdoch’s view of attention and moral perception leave room for self-reflective criticism within which such a social critique could be lodged (Clarke 2012). But the point is not only that Murdoch neglects social and political factors in moral formation but that her privileging of the active and neglecting the passive is a theoretical underpinning of this neglect.

Murdoch’s stated view that our attempt attention is the virtually sole source of our fabric of being suggests an ambiguity in what she means when she says that morality or moral life is “something that goes on continually” (IP: 37/329), not only in moments of actional choice. She definitely means that moral activity is going on all the time, a view connected with her expanding the domain of “activity” beyond its conventional understanding as the public world of action, to include the inner life. She wants to say that in between public act-and-choice situations we are continually active mentally in our attempt attention and our imagination.

But she also wants to say that the moral formation that produces our fabric of being is going on all the time. This opens up the larger issue of the range of factors that contribute to moral formation, beyond attempt attention. Murdoch may partly be blinded to the passive forces in this category by a failure to keep clearly distinct the claims that moral activity goes on continually and that moral formation goes on continually. But her vital moral insight of the “fabric of being” metaphor requires taking account of the full range of contributions to that fabric of being, passive as well as active.

13. Moral Seeing as a Spiritual Achievement vs. the Unreflective Good, Non-Egoistic Person

Murdoch generally presents seeing moral reality as a difficult and lengthy mental, emotional, and spiritual achievement, never able to be fully accomplished. The defeat or transcendence of the ego is something the agent must continually work at. This idea of a spiritual journey toward moral seeing looms even larger in Metaphysics. However, Murdoch also wants to leave room for rare persons for whom appreciating the Good and the reality of other people is not achieved primarily through struggle and challenge. As she says in a oft-quoted passage, “[I]t must be possible to do justice to both Socrates and the virtuous peasant” (IP: 2/300). (The latter is not an auspicious formulation, as “peasants”, even if uneducated, can still be reflective and intentional in seeking the Good.) Murdoch follows Schopenhauer, an important historical figure for her, in marveling at meeting that rare someone in whom “the anxious avaricious tentacles of the self”, so ubiquitous in human nature, are absent [SGC: 103/385]. Of course, this is not to deny that any virtuous person must sometimes have to suppress anti-moral desire, or to struggle to see other persons in their full reality. Even if the difference is one of degree, the “constant struggle” image is quite different from the virtuous peasant, and Murdoch wants to leave room for both.

14. Virtue

Murdoch speaks often of virtue, and she has been treated as an early virtue theorist. Her Sovereignty essays were given exposure by inclusion in some early and canonical virtue ethics collections (MacIntyre & Hauerwas 1983; Crisp & Slote 1997). While she may well have helped spur interest in virtue within moral philosophy, she is not a virtue theorist. She is not putting forward a view that virtue is a more fundamental moral concept than other concepts, nor is she claiming that approaching right action through the lens of virtue is superior to doing so through a Kantian/deontological or utilitarian approach. She does not offer an “ethical theory” in either of these senses. Her invocation of virtue reflects an unsystematized recognition that virtue is part of the toolbox we use to understand the moral domain of life, as are attention, perception, love, unselfishness, and (in Metaphysics) duty. She joined with virtue theory in helping to expand the scope of ethics beyond procedures and principles of right action to include how it is good to live and to be (against point 5).

15. Metaphysics as a Guide to Morals

15.1 Duty

It is not possible to provide a full discussion of Metaphysics as a Guide to Morals in this entry, nor of Murdoch’s evolving views on art and literature, religion, politics, concepts, and the nature of philosophy, all of which bear on her view of morality. When Metaphysics treats issues of morality, most of what it says is in the spirit of her earlier moral writings, or extends it, though sometimes quite significantly. There is a great deal more emphasis in Metaphysics on purification of the individual consciousness—purifying it of its egoism—and the Platonic “ascent” to that purification, as a core moral task; but that idea is present in Sovereignty also. She also much more frequently connects morality with mysticism, spirituality, and religion. She also retains the idea that we construct our moral world through mental activity, but in Metaphysics she sometimes shifts that activity from attention to Eros, or energy (“[W]e are always deploying and directing our energy, refining or blunting it, purifying or corrupting it”. [MGM 1992: 495; emphasis in original]), and sometimes to imagination (MGM 1992: 322).

However, in Metaphysics Murdoch amends her moral philosophy in one quite substantial way. She now thinks the moral life cannot do without duty, and that duty is not simply an expression of moral vision or attention. She says that there are several different “modes of ethical being” besides moral vision/attention/Eros/purification, that co-exist with it in a larger “field of force”, involving tension between the different modes (MGM 1992: 492). Duty is the most important of these. Her conception of duty is like Kant’s in certain respects and contrary to it in others.

Duties, as Kant said, present absolute moral requirements. They are available as a bridle on contrary inclination without being routed through the individual’s moral sensibility. They can thereby “introduce order and calmness” (MGM 1992: 494). They do not leave room for flexibility of interpretation by the agent’s moral character (Hopwood 2019: 250).

But, contra Kant, duties are unsystematic, not necessarily connected with one another. The reason for not lying is different from that for not stealing. They are not all expressions of a more general principle or procedure, like the categorical imperative. Murdoch recognizes but rejects Schopenhauer’s and Wittgenstein’s view that “duty”, especially when viewed (as Murdoch does), as an unconnected “list”, is a holdover from a theological view “as arbitrary orders given by God” (MGM 1992: 301f, 303).

Murdoch is aware that this conception of duty applies more fully to “negative duties” than positive ones. “‘Don’t lie’ is a clearer command than ‘be truthful’” (MGM 1992: 302). However, although the latter does not have the clarity of direction of the former, both possess an immediate availability to the agent.

Murdoch also rejects Kant’s view that duty is the whole of morality, as she rejects Schopenhauer’s view that morality can rest solely on compassion and eschew duty (MGM 1992: 292). Purification of consciousness remains the “fundamental ‘arena’” of morality (MGM 1992: 293). The “dutiful man” may be “content with too little”, following a rule without imagining that more is required (MGM 1992: 494), more that must arise from another mode of ethical being.

Murdoch recognizes something like dutiful action in Sovereignty, when she speaks of everyday acts that we perform simply as any moral agent, and for publicly obvious reasons [IP: 43/334]. But there she does not frame these actions as “duty” as she develops that notion in MGM, but as expressions of moral perception. In Sovereignty she lacks the idea that “the concept of duty remains with us as a steady moral force” (MGM 1992: 494).

15.2 Axioms

The notion of duty is connected with a third “mode of moral being”, part of the field of force constituted by all these modes, that she calls “axioms”. Axioms are roughly the political counterpart of duties, the latter understood as operating in the terrain of personal behavior (Antonaccio 2000: 159). Axioms are (relatively) fixed and unavoidable constraints and requirements governing behavior in the political domain. Like duties, they do not form a system, but are distinct in their individual character, as illustrated by Murdoch’s most frequent example of an axiom-type, that of rights. She mentions, for example, the right to happiness, the right to vote, rights animals have (presumably not to be made to suffer), and the rights of women. Even if all are rights, they have different valuational characters. Axioms operate by being regarded as readily understood unconditional and inviolable standards, and so can be invoked and expect to be honored (Browning 2019: 185).

In contrast to (though not strictly incompatible with) what she says about duties, axioms are historical products, and this is connected with their being unsystematic and piecemeal. Women’s coming to be seen as having equal rights with men might not have happened, but it did, and now (Murdoch thinks) equal rights for women has the status of an axiom. Axioms are products of genuine, if historically contingent, moral insight.

In MGM, Murdoch sees the individual-moral and the political domains as governed by very different norms and principles, each needing to be protected from too much influence from the other.

Liberal political thought posits a certain fundamental distinction between the person as citizen and the person as moral-spiritual individual. (MGM 1992: 357)

She sees the individual-moral domain (notably excluding duty) as governed by a ‘perfectionism’ that is continuous from Sovereignty to Metaphysics. The aspiration to the highest moral goodness is the proper aim of the human person. By contrast, the polity cannot be ‘perfected’; its proper aim is to be ‘decent’ (MGM 1992: 356), to try to limit the evil contained therein (MGM 1992: 368, from Simone Weil). This view is a radical departure from Murdoch’s political thinking in her fascinating 1958 essay, “A House of Theory”, her only pre-Metaphysics political philosophy writing. There, and in occasional remarks in Sovereignty, Murdoch sees moral ideas and ideals as the appropriate normative source for sociopolitical arrangements—for example, as in “House”, the ideas of dignity in work, and the communal bonds of work. In Metaphysics this view is largely (not entirely) rejected (Blum forthcoming).

Though, in contrast to duties and moral vision, axioms concern the political rather than the individual-moral realm, Murdoch conceives of them as part of the fabric of moral being. They bear on individual conduct through the individual’s status as a citizen, wherein we recognize, support, and honor human rights, though it is the state that adopts policies that officially recognize rights (and other axioms). Civic morality is part of the individual’s moral being. The inclusion of the political as a distinct aspect of moral thinking and being does not take Murdoch in the direction of envisioning the human person as deeply embedded in a rich web of social/institutional relationships that shape her moral being and her moral requirements—for example, in social role relationships, as explored in her friend Dorothy Emmet’s 1966 Rules, Roles, and Relations (Emmet 1996). Alasdair MacIntyre (Emmet’s student and collaborator) makes this point in a review of Metaphysics:

[W]hat is absent is any conception of the achievement of the Good as a task for human beings in community, so that the transformation of the self has to be a transformation of social relationships. (MacIntyre 1993: 2)

The pluralistic conception of morality in the field of force idea goes beyond the rejection of a single principle governing conduct, such as utilitarianism, Kantianism, or certain versions of virtue theory. These monistic views concern only conduct, and their rejection (discussed earlier in relation to McDowell’s Murdochian Aristotelianism) leaves in place, in Sovereignty, a unity involved in the idea of moral vision/purification of consciousness. The pluralism in Metaphysics’s modes of ethical being idea rejects a unity of that sort as well, seeing the purification of consciousness as only one, though the most significant, aspect of morality in the overall “field of force” of our ethical being (Hopwood 2019).


A. Primary Literature: Books and Papers by Iris Murdoch

A.1 Books

Only one of her 26 novels is listed: A Fairly Honorable Defeat.

  • 1953 [1987], Sartre: Romantic Rationalist, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press. Reprinted with a new, substantial, introduction by Murdoch, New York: Penguin Books, 1987.
  • [FHD] 1970, A Fairly Honorable Defeat, New York: Penguin, 1970.
  • [SG] 1970, The Sovereignty of Good, New York: Routledge, 1970.
  • 1977, The Fire and the Sun: Why Plato Banished the Artists, Oxford: Clarendon Press; reprinted in [EM], pp. 386–463.
  • [MGM] 1992, Metaphysics as a Guide to Morals, New York: Penguin.
  • [EM] 1997, Existentialists and Mystics: Writings on Philosophy and Literature, Peter Conradi (ed.), New York: Penguin Books.

A.2 Articles

  • [KV] 1956, “‘Knowing the Void’: Review of Simone Weil’s Notebooks”, The Spectator, November 1956: 613–614; reprinted in [EM], pp. 157–160.
  • [VCM] 1956, “Vision and Choice in Morality”, Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume: Dreams and Self-Knowledge, 30: 32–58; reprinted in [EM], pp. 76–98.
  • [M&E] 1957, “Metaphysics and Ethics”, in D. F. Pears (ed.), The Nature of Metaphysics, London: Macmillan, 1957: 99–123; reprinted in [EM], pp. 59–75.
  • [HT] 1958, “A House of Theory”, in N. Mckenzie (ed.), Conviction, London: MacGibbon and Kee, 1958: 218–33; reprinted in [EM], pp. 171–186.
  • [SBL] 1959, “The Sublime and the Good”, in Chicago Review, 1959: 42–55; reprinted in [EM], pp. 205–220.
  • [IP] 1964 [1970/1997], “The Idea of Perfection”, 1962 Ballard Matthews Lecture in the University College of North Wales, first published 1964, The Yale Review, 53(3): 342–380. Collected in [SG], pp. 1–45; reprinted in [EM], pp. 299–336.
  • [DPR] 1966, “The Darkness of Practical Reason: Review of Stuart Hampshire’s Freedom of the Individual”, Encounter, July 1966: 46–50; reprinted in [EM], pp. 193–202.
  • [SGC] 1967 [1970/1997], “The Sovereignty of Good Over Other Concepts”, Leslie Stephen Lecture, 14 November 1967, first published as a pamphlet by Cambridge University Press, 1967. Collected in [SG], pp. 77–104; reprinted in [EM], 363–385.
  • [OGG] 1969 [1970/1997], “On ‘God’ and ‘Good”, first published in 1969, The Anatomy of Knowledge; Papers Presented to the Study Group on Foundations of Cultural Unity, Bowdoin College, 1965 and 1966, Marjorie Grene (ed.), Amherst, MA: University of Massachusetts Press. Collected in [SG], pp. 46–76; reprinted in [EM], pp. 337–362.

A.3 Interviews

  • 1977, “Literature and Philosophy: A Conversation with Bryan Magee”, in Bryan Magee, Men of Ideas, London: BBC Books; reprinted in [EM], pp. 3–30.
  • 2003, From a Tiny Corner in the House of Fiction: Conversations with Iris Murdoch, Gillian Dooley (ed.), Columbia, SC: University of South Carolina Press. A collection of 23 interviews by many people over the course of Murdoch’s life.

B. Secondary literature

B.1 Cited Works

  • Anscombe, G.E.M., 1958 [1997], “Modern Moral Philosophy”, Philosophy, 33(124): 1–19; reprinted in Crisp and Slote 1997: 26–44. doi:10.1017/S0031819100037943
  • Antonaccio, Maria, 1996, “Form and Contingency in Iris Murdoch’s Ethics”, in Antonaccio and Schweiker 1996: 110–137.
  • –––, 2000, Picturing the Human: The Moral Thought of Iris Murdoch, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2012, “The Virtues of Metaphysics: A Review of Murdoch’s Philosophical Writings”, in Broackes 2012b: 155–180.
  • Antonaccio, Maria and William Schweiker (eds.), 1996, Iris Murdoch and the Search for Human Goodness, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Bakhurst, David, 2020, “Analysis and Transcendence in The Sovereignty of Good”, European Journal of Philosophy, 28(1): 214–223. doi:10.1111/ejop.12539
  • Bayley, John, 1999, Elegy for Iris, New York: Picador.
  • Blum, Lawrence, 2012, “Visual Metaphors in Murdoch’s Moral Philosophy”, in Broackes 2012b: 307–324.
  • –––, forthcoming, “Murdoch and Politics”, in Hopwood and Panizza forthcoming.
  • Bolton, Lucy, forthcoming, “Murdoch and Feminism”, in Hopwood and Panizza forthcoming.
  • Bowden, Peta, 1997, Caring: Gender-Sensitive Ethics, New York: Routledge.
  • –––, 1998, “Ethical Attention: Accumulating Understandings”, European Journal of Philosophy, 6(1): 59–77. doi:10.1111/1468-0378.00050
  • Brewer, Talbot, 2009, The Retrieval of Ethics, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Broackes, Justin, 2012a, “Introduction”, in Broackes 2012b: 1–92.
  • ––– (ed.), 2012b, Iris Murdoch, Philosopher: A Collection of Essays, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Browning, Gary (ed.), 2018a, Murdoch on Truth and Love, Cham, Switzerland: Palgrave MacMillan.
  • –––, 2018b, Why Iris Murdoch Matters, London: Bloomsbury Academic.
  • –––, 2019, The Metaphysics of Morals and Politics (MGM ch 12), in Dooley and Hämäläinen 2019: 179–194.
  • Chappell, Sophie-Grace, 2018, “Love and Knowledge in Murdoch”, in Browning 2018a: 89–108.
  • Clarke, Bridget, 2012, “Iris Murdoch and the Prospects for Critical Moral Perception”, in Broackes 2012b: 227–253.
  • Conradi, Peter J., 1986 [2001], Iris Murdoch: The Saint and the Artist, Basingstoke: Macmillan; third edition printed as The Saint and the Artist: A Study of the Fiction of Iris Murdoch, London: HarperCollins, 2001.
  • –––, 2001, Iris: The Life of Iris Murdoch, London: HarperCollins.
  • Cordner, Christopher, 2009, “Waiting, Patience and Love”, in Ghassan Hage (ed.), Waiting, Melbourne: Melbourne University Press, 169–183.
  • –––, 2016, “Lessons of Murdochian Attention”, Sophia, 55(2): 197–213. doi:10.1007/s11841-016-0540-2
  • –––, 2019, “Vision and Encounter in Moral Thinking”, in Dooley and Hämäläinen 2019: 209–226.
  • Diamond, Cora, 1996, “We Are Perpetually Moralists: Iris Murdoch, Fact, and Value”, in Antonaccio and Schweiker 1996.
  • –––, 2010, “Murdoch the Explorer”, Philosophical Topics, 38(1): 51–85.
  • Crary, Alice, 2007, Beyond Moral Judgment, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Crisp, Roger and Michael Slote (eds.), 1997, Virtue Ethics, London: Oxford University Press.
  • Dooley, Gillian and Nora Hämäläinen (eds.), 2019, Reading Iris Murdoch’s Metaphysics as a Guide to Morals, Cham, Switzerland: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Driver, Julia, 2012, “’For every Foot its own shoe’: Method and Moral Theory in the Philosophy of Iris Murdoch”, in Broackes 2012b: 293–306.
  • Emmet, Dorothy, 1966, Rules, Roles, and Relations, New York: St. Martin’s Press.
  • –––, 1979, The Moral Prism, London: MacMillan.
  • –––, 1994, The Role of the Unrealisable: A Study in Regulative Ideals, New York: St. Martin’s Press.
  • –––, 1996, Philosophers and Friends: Reminiscences of Seventy Years in Philosophy, London: Macmillan.
  • Flynn, Thomas, 2004 [2013], “Jean-Paul Sartre”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2013 edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>
  • Forsberg, Niklas, 2017, “M and D and Me: Iris Murdoch and Stanley Cavell on Perfectionism and Self-Transformation”, Iride: Journal of Philosophy and Public Debate, 2017(2): 361–372.
  • Grimshaw, Jean, 1986, Philosophy and Feminist Thinking. Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Hämäläinen, Nora, 2019, “Which Void? (MGM chapter 18)”, in Dooley and Hämäläinen 2019: 261–275.
  • Hampshire, Stuart, 1959 [1982], Thought and Action, London: Chatto and Windus; new edition, Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1982.
  • –––, 1965, Freedom of the Individual, New York: Harper and Row.
  • Hare, R.M., 1952, The Language of Morals, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Holland, Margaret G., 1998, “Touching the Weights: Moral Perception and Attention”, International Philosophical Quarterly, 38(3): 299–312. doi:10.5840/ipq199838324
  • –––, 2012, “Social Convention and Neurosis as Obstacles to Moral Freedom”, in Broackes 2012b: 255–274.
  • Hooker, Brad and Margaret Little (eds.), 2000, Moral Particularism, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Hopwood, Mark, 2018, “‘The Extremely Difficult Realization That Something Other Than Oneself Is Real’: Iris Murdoch on Love and Moral Agency: Iris Murdoch on Love and Moral Agency”, European Journal of Philosophy, 26(1): 477–501. doi:10.1111/ejop.12260
  • –––, 2019, “Fields of Force: Murdoch on Axioms, Duties, and Eros (MGM chapter 17)”, in Dooley and Hämäläinen 2019: 243-260.
  • Hopwood, Mark and Silvia Panizza (eds.), forthcoming, The Murdochian Mind, New York: Routledge.
  • Lipscomb, Benjamin J.B., 2021, The Women Are Up to Something: How Elizabeth Anscombe, Philippa Foot, Mary Midgley, and Iris Murdoch Revolutionized Ethics, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oso/9780197541074.001.0001
  • Lovibond, Sabina, 2011, Iris Murdoch, Gender, and Philosophy, New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203830017
  • –––, 2020, “The Elusiveness of the Ethical: From Murdoch to Diamond”, Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplement, 87: 181–200. doi:10.1017/S1358246119000195
  • MacCumhaill, Clare and Rachael Wiseman, 2022, Metaphysical Animals: How Four Women Brought Philosophy Back to Life, London: Chatto and Windus, and New York: Doubleday.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair, 1993, “Which World Do You See?”, New York Times (Book Section), 03 January 1993; [MacIntyre 1993 available online].
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair and Stanley Hauerwas (eds.), 1983, Revisions: Changing Perspectives in Moral Philosophy, Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • MacKinnon, Donald M., 1957 [1962], A Study in Ethical Theory, London: A. & C. Black; reprinted, New York: Collier Books, 1962.
  • McDowell, John, 1979 [1997], “Virtue and Reason”, Monist, 62(3): 331–350; reprinted in Crisp and Slote 1997: 141–162. doi:10.5840/monist197962319
  • –––, 1998, Mind, Value, and Reality, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Meyers, Diana T., 1994, Subjection and Subjectivity: Psychoanalytic Feminism and Moral Philosophy, New York: Routledge.
  • Millgram, Elijah, 2002 [2005], “Murdoch, Practical Reasoning, and Particularism”, Notizie di Politeia, 18(66): 64–87; reprinted in his Ethics Done Right: Practical Reasoning as a Foundation for Moral Theory, New York: Cambridge University Press, 2005, 168–197.
  • Moran, Richard, 2012, “Iris Murdoch and Existentialism”, in Broackes 2012b: 181–196.
  • Mylonaki, Evgenia, 2019, “The Individual in Pursuit of the Individual; A Murdochian Account of Moral Perception”, The Journal of Value Inquiry, 53(4): 579–603. doi:10.1007/s10790-018-9675-4
  • Norlock, Kathryn, 2019, “Feminist Ethics”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2019 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • Nussbaum, Martha, 1990, Love’s Knowledge: Essays on Philosophy and Literature, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2001, “When She was Good/Iris Murdoch: Novelist and Philosopher” The New Republic, 31 December 2001 and 7 January 2002. [Nussbaum 2001 available online].
  • Panizza, Silvia, 2020, “Moral Perception Beyond Supervenience: Iris Murdoch’s Radical Perspective”, The Journal of Value Inquiry, 54(2): 273–288. doi:10.1007/s10790-019-09695-4
  • Putnam, Hilary, 2002, “The Collapse of the Fact/Value Dichotomy” in The Collapse of the Fact/Value Dichotomy and Other Essays, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Robjant, David, 2012, “The Earthy Realism of Plato’s Metaphysics, or: What Shall We Do with Iris Murdoch?, Philosophical Investigations, 35(1): 43–67. doi:10.1111/j.1467-9205.2011.01455.x
  • Rose, W.K., 1968 [2003], “Iris Murdoch, Informally”, interview, London Magazine, 8(3): 59–73; reprinted in Murdoch, From a Tiny Corner in the House of Fiction: Conversations with Iris Murdoch, G. Dooley (ed.), Columbia, SC: University of South Carolina Press, 2003: 16–29.
  • Rozelle-Stone, A. Rebecca and Benjamin P. Davis, 2021, “Simone Weil”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2021 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • Ruddick, Sara, 1989, Maternal Thinking: Toward a Politics of Peace, Boston, MA: Beacon Press.
  • Sartre, Jean-Paul, 1945, L’existentialisme est un Humanisme, Les Edition Nagel, Methuen and Co.; English translation, Existentialism is a Humanism, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 2007.
  • Saul, Jennifer and Ronald Brownstein (eds.), 2016, Implicit Bias and Philosophy, vols. 1 and 2, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Sandel, Michael, 2020, The Tyranny of Merit: What’s Become of the Common Good, New York: Farrar, Straus, and Giroux.
  • Setiya, Kieran, 2013, “Murdoch on the Sovereignty of Good”, Philosophers’ Imprint, 13: art. 9 (21 pages). [Setiya 2013 available online]
  • Sidgwick, Henry, 1874 [1907], The Methods of Ethics, London: Macmillan. Seventh edition, 1907.
  • –––, 1886 [1902], Outlines of the History of Ethics for English Readers, London: MacMillan; fifth edition, 1902.
  • Tronto, Joan, 1993, Moral Boundaries: A Political Argument for an Ethic of Care, New York: Routledge.
  • Velleman, J. David, 1999 [2006], “Love as a Moral Emotion”, Ethics, 109(2): 338–374; reprinted in his Self to Self: Selected Essays, New York: Cambridge University Press, 2006. doi:10.1086/233898
  • Walker, Margaret Urban, 1989, “Moral Understandings: Alternative ‘Epistemology’ for a Feminist Ethics”, Hypatia, 4(2): 15–28. doi:10.1111/j.1527-2001.1989.tb00570.x
  • Warnock, Mary, 1960, Ethics Since 1900, London: Oxford University Press.
  • Weil, Simone 1942 [1977], “La personne et le sacré”, written in 1942, published in Écrits de Londres et dernières lettres, Paris: Gallimard, 1957; translated as “Human Personality”, in George A. Panichas (ed.), The Simone Weil Reader, New York: David McKay Company, 1977, 313–339.
  • –––, 1942 [1973a], “Réflexions sur le bon usage des études scolaires en vue de l’amour de Dieu” (“Reflections on the Right Use of School Studies with a View to the Love of God”), written 1942, printed in Weil 1950 [1973b: 105–116].
  • –––, 1950 [1973b], Attente de Dieu, Paris: La Colombe. Translated as Waiting for God, Emma Craufurd (trans.), New York: Putnam, 1951; reprinted New York: Harper Colophon Books, 1973.
  • White, Frances, 2020, “Anti-Nausea: Iris Murdoch and the Natural Goodness of the Natural World”, Études Britanniques Contemporaines, 2020: art. 59. doi:10.4000/ebc.10212
  • Williams, Bernard, 1985, Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Wiseman, Rachael, 2020, “What If the Private Linguist Were a Poet? Iris Murdoch on Privacy and Ethics”, European Journal of Philosophy, 28(1): 224–234. doi:10.1111/ejop.12538
  • Wolf, Susan, 2014, “Loving Attention: Lessons in Love From The Philadelphia Story”, in Understanding Love: Philosophy, Film, and Fiction, Susan Wolf and Christopher Grau (eds.), New York: Oxford University Press, 369–386. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780195384512.003.0017

B.2 Other Secondary Literature

  • Altorf, Hannah Marije, 2008, Iris Murdoch and the Art of Imagining, New York: Continuum.
  • Antonaccio, Maria, 2012a, A Philosophy to Live By: Engaging Iris Murdoch, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2012b, “The Virtues of Metaphysics: A Review of Murdoch’s Philosophical Writings”, in Broackes 2012b: 155–180.
  • Bagnoli, Carla, 2012, “The Exploration of Moral Life”, in Broackes 2012b: 197–226.
  • Blum, Lawrence A., 1986 [1994], “Iris Murdoch and the Domain of the Moral”, Philosophical Studies, 50(3): 343–367; reprinted in Blum 1994: 12–29. doi:10.1007/BF00353837
  • –––, 1991 [1994], “Moral Perception and Particularity”, Ethics, 101(4): 701–725; reprinted in Blum 1994: 30–61. doi:10.1086/293340
  • –––, 1994, Moral Perception and Particularity, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511624605
  • Bronzwaer, W., 1988, “Images of Plato in ‘The Fire and the Sun’ and ‘Acastos’”, in R. Todd (ed.), Encounters with Iris Murdoch: Proceedings of an Informal Symposium on Iris Murdoch’s Work held at the Free University, Amsterdam, on 20 and 21 October 1986, Amsterdam: Free University Press: 55–67.
  • Foot, Philippa, 1978, Virtues and Vices, Los Angeles, CA: University of California Press.
  • Forsberg, Niklas, 2013, Language Lost and Found: On Iris Murdoch and the Limits of Philosophical Discourse, New York: Bloomsbury Academic.
  • Emmet, Dorothy, 1945, The Nature of Metaphysical Thinking, London: MacMillan.
  • Gaita, Raimond, 2004, Good and Evil: An Absolute Conception, second edition, New York: Routledge.
  • Gilligan, Carol, 1982, In a Different Voice: Psychological Theory and Women’s Development, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Gomes, Anil, forthcoming, “Moral Vision”, in Hopwood and Panizza forthcoming.
  • Hare, R.M., 1963, Freedom and Reason, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Jordan, Jessy E. G., 2013, “Thick Ethical Concepts in the Philosophy and Literature of Iris Murdoch”, The Southern Journal of Philosophy, 51(3): 402–417. doi:10.1111/sjp.12037
  • Laverty, Megan, 2007, Iris Murdoch’s Ethics: A Consideration of her Romantic Vision, New York: Continuum.
  • –––, 2019, “Iris Murdoch as Educator”, in Dooley and Hämäläinen 2019: 125–144.
  • Lloyd, Genevieve, 1982, “Iris Murdoch on the Ethical Significance of Truth”, Philosophy and Literature, 6(1–2): 62–75. doi:10.1353/phl.1982.0006
  • Lovibond, Sabina, 1983, Realism and Imagination in Ethics, Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Midgley, Mary, 2005, The Owl of Minerva: A Memoir, New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203027394
  • Noddings, 1984 [2013], Caring: A Relational Approach to Ethics and Moral Education, Berkeley, CA: University of California Press.
  • Nussbaum, Martha, 2012, “‘Faint With Secret Knowledge’: Love and Vision in Murdoch's The Black Prince”, in Broackes 2012b: 135–154.
  • Rowe, Anne, 2019, Iris Murdoch, Liverpool: Liverpool University Press.
  • Taylor, Charles, 1989, Sources of the Self: The Making of the Modern Identity, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Vice, Samantha, 2007, “Self-Concern in Iris Murdoch’s The Sovereignty of Good”, in Anne Rowe (ed.), Iris Murdoch: A Re-Assessment, London: Palgrave Macmillan, 60–71.
  • Weil, Simone, 1952 [1957], “Dieu dans Platon” Intuitions pré-chrétiennes, Paris, La Colombe, Editions du Vieux Colombier, 1951; translated as “God in Plato”, in Elizabeth C. Geissbuhler (ed.) Intimations of Christianity Among the Ancient Greeks, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1957, ch. 7: 74–88.
  • White, Frances, 2014, Becoming Iris Murdoch, Kingston-upon-Thames: Kingston University.

Other Internet Resources


I am extremely grateful to Megan Laverty, Vic Seidler, and Kieran Setiya for acute and incredibly helpful feedback on a late draft of this entry, and equally for their support. I would also like to thank Vic and Megan for our “Murdoch study group” over the past years, and to the “Murdoch reading group”, organized and guided by Mark Hopwood, during the covid period. Many thanks also to SEP editor Stephen Darwall for excellent suggestions.

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